First published Mon Mar 31, 2008; substantive revision Thu Jun 27, 2019

The concept of empathy is used to refer to a wide range of psychological capacities that are thought of as being central for constituting humans as social creatures allowing us to know what other people are thinking and feeling, to emotionally engage with them, to share their thoughts and feelings, and to care for their well–being. Ever since the eighteenth century, due particularly to the influence of the writings of David Hume and Adam Smith, those capacities have been at the center of scholarly investigations into the underlying psychological basis of our social and moral nature. Yet, the concept of empathy is of relatively recent intellectual heritage. Moreover, since researchers in different disciplines have focused their investigations on very specific aspects of the broad range of empathy-related phenomena, one should probably not be surprised by a certain amount of conceptual confusion and a multiplicity of definitions associated with the empathy concept in a number of different scientific and non-scientific discourses. The purpose of this entry is to clarify the empathy concept by surveying its history in various philosophical and psychological discussions and by indicating why empathy was and should be regarded to be of such central importance in understanding human agency in ordinary contexts, in the human sciences, and for the constitution of ourselves as social and moral agents. More specifically, after a short historical introduction articulating the philosophical context within which the empathy concept was coined, the second and third sections will discuss the epistemic dimensions associated with our empathic capacities. They will address the contention that empathy is the primary epistemic means for knowing other minds and that it should be viewed as the unique method distinguishing the human from the natural sciences. Sections 4 and 5 will then focus on claims that view empathy as the fundamental social glue and that understand empathy as the main psychological mechanism enabling us to establish and maintain social relations and taking an evaluative stance towards each other.

1. Historical Introduction

Before the psychologist Edward Titchener (1867–1927) introduced the term “empathy” in 1909 into the English language as the translation of the German term “Einfühlung” (or “feeling into”), “sympathy”was the term commonly used to refer to empathy-related phenomena. If one were to point to a conceptual core for understanding these phenomena, it is probably best to point to David Hume’s dictum that “the minds of men are mirrors to one another,”(Hume 1739–40 [1978], 365) since in encountering other persons, humans can resonate with and recreate that person’s thoughts and emotions on different dimensions of cognitive complexity. While, as we will see, not everybody shares such resonance conception of empathy(some philosophers in the phenomenological tradition emphatically reject it), it certainly constitutes the center of Theodor Lipps’s understanding, who Titchener had in mind in his translation of “Einfühlung” as “empathy.”

Theodor Lipps (1851–1914)was also very familiar with the work of David Hume (see the introduction to Coplan and Goldie 2011 in this respect). More importantly, it was Theodor Lipps, whose work transformed empathy/Einfühlung from a concept of nineteenth century German aesthetics into a central category of the philosophy of the social and human sciences. To understand this transformation we first need to appreciate the reasons why philosophers of the nineteenth century thought it necessary to appeal to empathy in order to account for our ability to appreciate natural objects and artefacts in an aesthetic manner. According to the dominant (even though not universally accepted) positivistic and empiricist conception, sense data constitute the fundamental basis for our investigation of the world. Yet from a phenomenological perspective, our perceptual encounter with aesthetic objects and our appreciation of them as being beautiful—our admiration of a beautiful sunset, for example—seems to be as direct as our perception of an object as being red or square. By appealing to the psychological mechanisms of empathy, philosophers intended to provide an explanatory account of the phenomenological immediacy of our aesthetic appreciation of objects. More specifically, for Lipps, our empathic encounter with external objects trigger inner “processes” that give rise to experiences similar to ones that I have when I engage in various activities involving the movement of my body. Since my attention is perceptually focused on the external object, I experience them—or I automatically project my experiences—as being in the object. If those experiences are in some way apprehended in a positive manner and as being in some sense life-affirming, I perceive the object as beautiful, otherwise as ugly. In the first case, Lipps speaks of positive; in the later of negative empathy. Lipps also characterizes our experience of beauty as “objectified self-enjoyment,” since we are impressed by the “vitality” and “life potentiality” that lies in the perceived object (Lipps 1906, 1903 a,b. For the contemporary discussion of empathy’s role in aesthetics see particularly Breithaupt 2009; Coplan and Goldie 2011 (Part II); Curtis & Koch 2009; and Keen 2007. For a recent history of the empathy concept see also Lanzoni 2018).

In his Aesthetik, Lipps closely links our aesthetic perception and our perception of another embodied person as a minded creature. The nature of aesthetic empathy is always the “experience of another human” (1905, 49). We appreciate another object as beautiful because empathy allows us to see it in analogy to another human body. Similarly, we recognize another organism as a minded creature because of empathy. Empathy in this context is more specifically understood as a phenomenon of “inner imitation,” where my mind mirrors the mental activities or experiences of another person based on the observation of his bodily activities or facial expressions. Empathy is ultimately based on an innate disposition for motor mimicry, a fact that is well established in the psychological literature and was already noticed by Adam Smith (1853). Even though such a disposition is not always externally manifested, Lipps suggests that it is always present as an inner tendency giving rise to similar kinaesthetic sensations in the observer as felt by the observed target. In seeing the angry face of another person we instinctually have a tendency of imitating it and of “imitating” her anger in this manner. Since we are not aware of such tendencies, we see the anger in her face (Lipps 1907). Despite the fact that Lipps’s primary examples of empathy focus on the recognition of emotions expressed in bodily gestures or facial expressions, his conception of empathy should not be understood as being limited to such cases. As his remarks about intellectual empathy suggest (1903b/05), he regards our recognition of all mental activities—insofar as they are activities requiring human effort—as being based on empathy or on inner imitation (See also the introductory chapter in Stueber 2006).

2. Empathy and the Philosophical Problem of Other Minds

It was indeed Lipps’s claim that empathy should be understood as the primary epistemic means for gaining knowledge of other minds that was the focus of a lively debate among philosophers at the beginning of the 20th century (Prandtl 1910, Stein 1917, Scheler 1973). Even philosophers, who did not agree with Lipps’s specific explication, found the concept of empathy appealing because his argument for his position was closely tied to a thorough critique of what was widely seen at that time as the only alternative for conceiving of knowledge of other minds, that is, Mill’s inference from analogy. Traditionally, the inference from analogy presupposes a Cartesian conception of the mind according to which access to our own mind is direct and infallible, whereas knowledge of other minds is inferential, fallible, and based on evidence about other persons’ observed physical behavior. More formally one can characterize the inference from analogy as consisting of the following premises or steps.

i.) Another person X manifests behavior of type B.
ii.) In my own case behavior of type B is caused by mental state of type M.
iii.) Since my and X’s outward behavior of type B is similar, it has to have similar inner mental causes. (It is thus assumed that I and the other persons are psychologically similar in the relevant sense.)
Therefore: The other person’s behavior (X’s behavior) is caused by a mental state of type M.

Like Wittgenstein, but predating him considerably, Lipps argues in his 1907 article “Das Wissen von fremden Ichen” that the inference from analogy falls fundamentally short of solving the philosophical problem of other minds. Lipps does not argue against the inference from analogy because of its evidentially slim basis, but because it does not allow us to understand its basic presupposition that another person has a mind that is psychologically similar to our own mind. The inference from analogy thus cannot be understood as providing us with evidence for the claim that the other person has mental states like we do because, within its Cartesian framework, we are unable to conceive of other minds in the first place. For Lipps, analogical reasoning requires the contradictory undertaking of inferring another person’s anger and sadness on the basis of my sadness and anger, yet to think of that sadness and anger simultaneously as something “absolutely different” from my anger and sadness. More generally, analogical inference is a contradictory undertaking because it entails “entertaining a completely new thought about an I, that however is not me, but something absolutely different” (Lipps 1907, 708, my translation).

Yet while Lipps diagnoses the problem of the inference of analogy within the context of a Cartesian conception of the mind quite succinctly, he fails to explain how empathy is able to provide us with an epistemically sanctioned understanding of other minds or why our “feeling into” the other person’s mind is more than a mere projection. More importantly, Lipps does not sufficiently explain why empathy does not encounter similar problems to the ones diagnosed for the inference from analogy and how empathy allows us to conceive of other persons as having a mind similar to our own if we are directly acquainted only with our own mental states(See Stueber 2006). Wittgenstein’s critique of the inference from analogy is in the end more penetrating because he recognizes that its problem depends on a Cartesian account of mental concepts. If my grasp of a mental concept is exclusively constituted by me experiencing something in a certain way, then it is impossible for me to conceive of how that very same concept can be applied to somebody else, given that I cannot experience somebody else’s mental states. I therefore cannot conceive of how another person can be in the same mental state as I am because that would require that I can conceive of my mental state as something, which I do not experience. But according to the Cartesian conception this seems to be a conceptually impossible task. Moreover, if one holds on to a Cartesian conception of the mind, it is not clear how appealing to empathy, as conceived of by Lipps, should help us in conceiving of mental states as belonging to another mind.

Within the phenomenological tradition, the above shortcomings of Lipps’s position of empathy were quite apparent (see for example Stein 1917, 24 and Scheler 1973, 236). Yet despite the fact that they did not accept Lipps’s explication of empathy as being based on mechanisms of inner resonance and projection, authors within the phenomenological tradition of philosophy were persuaded by Lipps’s critique of the inference from analogy. For that very reason, Husserl and Stein, for example, continued using the concept of empathy and regarded empathy as an irreducible “type of experiential act sui generis” (Stein 1917, 10), which allows us to view another person as being analogous to ourselves without this “analogizing apprehension” constituting an inference of analogy (Husserl 1931 [1963], 141). Scheler went probably the furthest in rejecting the Cartesian framework in thinking about the apprehension of other minds, while keeping committed to something like the concept of empathy.[1] (In order to contrast his position from Lipps, Scheler however preferred to use the term “nachfühlen” rather than “einfühlen.”) For Scheler, the fundamental mistake of the debate about the apprehension of other minds consists in the fact that it does not take seriously certain phenomenological facts. Prima facie, we do not encounter merely the bodily movements of another person. Rather, we are directly recognizing specific mental states because they are characteristically expressed in states of the human body; in facial expressions, in gestures, in the tone of voice, and so on. Empathy within the phenomenological tradition then is not conceived of as a resonance phenomenon requiring the observer to recreate the mental states of the other person in his or her own mind but as a special perceptual act (See Scheler 1973, particularly 232–258; For a succinct explication of the debate about empathy in the phenomenological tradition consult Zahavi 2010)

2.1 Mirror Neurons, Simulation, and the Discussion of Empathy in the Contemporary Theory of Mind Debate

The idea that empathy understood as inner imitation is the primary epistemic means for understanding other minds has however been revived in the 1980’s by simulation theorists in the context of the interdisciplinary debate about folk psychology; an empirically informed debate about how best to describe the underlying causal mechanisms of our folk psychological abilities to interpret, explain, and predict other agents. (See Davies and Stone 1995). In contrast to theory theory, simulation theorists conceive of our ordinary mindreading abilities as an ego-centric method and as a “knowledge–poor” strategy, where I do not utilize a folk psychological theory but use myself as a model for the other person’s mental life. It is not the place here to discuss the contemporary debate extensively, but it has to be emphasized that contemporary simulation theorists vigorously discuss how to account for our grasp of mental concepts and whether simulation theory is committed to Cartesianism. Whereas Goldman (2002, 2006) links his version of simulation theory to a neo-Cartesian account of mental concepts, other simulation theorists develop versions of simulation theory that are not committed to a Cartesian conception of the mind. (Gordon 1995a, b, and 2000; Heal 2003; and Stueber 2006, 2012).

Moreover, neuroscientific findings according to which so called mirror neurons play an important role in recognizing another person’s emotional states and in understanding the goal-directedness of his behavior have been understood as providing empirical evidence for Lipps’ idea of empathy as inner imitation. With the help of the term “mirror neuron,” scientists refer to the fact that there is significant overlap between neural areas of excitation that underlie our observation of another person’s action and areas that are stimulated when we execute the very same action. A similar overlap between neural areas of excitation has also been established for our recognition of another person’s emotion based on his facial expression and our experiencing the emotion. (For a survey on mirror neurons see Gallese 2003a and b, Goldman 2006, chap. 6; Keysers 2011; Rizzolatti and Craighero 2004; and particularly Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia 2008). Since the face to face encounter between persons is the primary situation within which human beings recognize themselves as minded creatures and attribute mental states to others, the system of mirror neurons has been interpreted as playing a causally central role in establishing intersubjective relations between minded creatures. For that very reason, the neuroscientist Gallese thinks of mirror neurons as constituting what he calls the “shared manifold of intersubjectivity” (Gallese 2001, 44). Stueber (2006, chap. 4)—inspired by Lipps’s conception of empathy as inner imitation—refers to mirror neurons as mechanisms of basic empathy;[2] as mechanisms that allow us to apprehend directly another person’s emotions in light of his facial expressions and that enable us to understand his bodily movements as goal-directed actions, that is, as being directed towards an external object like a person reaching for the cup. The evidence from mirror neurons—and the fact that in perceiving other people we use very different neurobiological mechanisms than in the perception of physical objects—does suggest that in our primary perceptual encounter with the world we do not merely encounter physical objects. Rather, even on this basic level, we distinguish already between mere physical objects and objects that are more like us (See also Meltzoff and Brooks 2001). The mechanisms of basic empathy have to be seen as Nature’s way of dissolving one of the principal assumptions of the traditional philosophical discussion about other minds shared by opposing positions such as Cartesianism and Behaviorism; that is, that we perceive other people primarily as physical objects and do not distinguish already on the perceptual level between physical objects like trees and minded creatures like ourselves. Mechanisms of basic empathy might therefore be interpreted as providing us with a perceptual and non-conceptual basis for developing an intersubjectively accessible folk psychological framework that is applicable to the subject and observed other (Stueber 2006, 142–45).

It needs to be acknowledged however that this interpretation of mirror neurons crucially depends on the assumption that the primary function of mirror neurons consists in providing us with a cognitive grasp of another person’s actions and emotions. This interpretation has however been criticized by researchers and philosophers who think that neural resonance presupposes rather than provides us with an understanding of what is going on in the minds of others (Csibra 2007, Hickok 2008 and 2014). They have also pointed out that in observing another person’s emotion or behavior, we never fully “mirror” another person’s neural stimulation. The neuroscientist Jean Decety has argued that in observing another person’s pain our vicariously stimulated pain matrix is not sensitive to the phenomenal quality of pain. Rather it is sensitive to pain as an indicator of “aversion and withdrawal when exposed to danger and threats”(Decety and Cowell 2015, 6 and Decety 2010). At least as far as empathy for pain is concerned, our neural resonance is also modulated by a variety of contextual factors, such as how close we feel to the observed subject, whether we regard the pain to be morally justified (as in the case of punishment, for example) or whether we regard it as unavoidable and necessary, such as in a medical procedure (Singer and Lamm 2009; but see also Allen 2010, Borg 2007, Debes 2010, Gallese 2016, Goldman 2009, Iacoboni 2011, Jacob 2008, Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia 2016, and Stueber 2012a).

Yet it should be noted that everyday mindreading is not restricted to the realm of basic empathy. Ordinarily we not only recognize that other persons are afraid or that they are reaching for a particular object. We understand their behavior in more complex social contexts in terms of their reasons for acting using the full range of psychological concepts including the concepts of belief and desire. Evidence from neuroscience shows that these mentalizing tasks involve very different neuronal areas such as the medial prefrontal cortex, temporoparietal cortex, and the cingulate cortex. (For a survey see Kain and Perner 2003; Frith and Frith 2003; Zaki and Ochsner 2012). Low level mindreading in the realm of basic empathy has therefore to be distinguished from higher levels of mindreading (Goldman 2006). It is clear that low level forms of understanding other persons have to be conceived of as being relatively knowledge– poor as they do not involve a psychological theory or complex psychological concepts. How exactly one should conceive of high level mindreading abilities, whether they involve primarily knowledge–poor simulation strategies or knowledge–rich inferences is controversially debated within the contemporary debate about our folk psychological mindreading abilities(See Davies and Stone 1995, Gopnik and Meltzoff 1997, Gordon 1995, Currie and Ravenscroft 2002, Heal 2003, Nichols and Stich 2003, Goldman 2006, and Stueber 2006). Simulation theorists, however, insist that even more complex forms of understanding other agents involve resonance phenomena that engage our cognitively intricate capacities of imaginatively adopting the perspective of another person and reenacting or recreating their thought processes (For various forms of perspective-taking see Coplan 2011 and Goldie 2000). Accordingly, simulation theorists distinguish between different types of empathy such as between basic and reenactive empathy (Stueber 2006) or between mirroring and reconstructive empathy (Goldman 2011). Interestingly, the debate about how to conceive of these more complex forms of mindreading resonates with the traditional debate about whether empathy is the unique method of the human sciences and whether or not one has to strictly distinguish between the methods of the human and the natural sciences. Equally noteworthy is the fact that in the contemporary theory of mind debate voices have grown louder that assert that the contemporary theory of mind debate fundamentally misconceives of the nature of social cognition. In light of insights from the phenomenological and hermeneutic traditions in philosophy, they claim that on the most basic level empathy should not be conceived of as a resonance phenomenon but as a type of direct perception. (See particularly Zahavi 2010; Zahavi and Overgaard 2012, but Jacob 2011 for a response). More complex forms of social cognition are also not to be understood as being based on either theory or empathy/simulation, rather they are better best conceived of as the ability to directly fit observed units of actions into larger narrative or cultural frameworks (For this debate see Gallagher 2012, Gallagher and Hutto 2008, Hutto 2008, and Seemann 2011, Stueber 2011 and 2012a, and various articles in Matravers and Waldow 2018). For skepticism about empathic perspective-taking understood as a complete identification with the perspective of the other person see also Goldie 2011). Regardless of how one views this specific debate it should be clear that ideas about mindreading developed originally by proponents of empathy at the beginning of the 20th century can no longer be easily dismissed and have to be taken seriously.

3. Empathy as the Unique Method of the Human Sciences

At the beginning of the 20th century, empathy understood as a non-inferential and non-theoretical method of grasping the content of other minds became closely associated with the concept of understanding (Verstehen); a concept that was championed by the hermeneutic tradition of philosophy concerned with explicating the methods used in grasping the meaning and significance of texts, works of arts, and actions. (For a survey of this tradition see Grondin 1994). Hermeneutic thinkers insisted that the method used in understanding the significance of a text or a historical event has to be fundamentally distinguished from the method used in explaining an event within the context of the natural sciences. This methodological dualism is famously expressed by Droysen in saying that “historical research does not want to explain; that is, derive in a form of an inferential argument, rather it wants to understand” (Droysen 1977, 403), and similarly in Dilthey’s dictum that “we explain nature, but understand the life of the soul” (Dilthey 1961, vol. 5, 144). Yet Droysen and authors before him never conceived of understanding solely as an act of mental imitation or solely as an act of imaginatively “transporting” oneself into the point of view of another person. Such “psychological interpretation” as Schleiermacher (1998) used to call it, was conceived of as constituting only one aspect of the interpretive method used by historians. Other tasks mentioned in this context involved critically evaluating the reliability of historical sources, getting to know the linguistic conventions of a language, and integrating the various elements derived from historical sources into a consistent narrative of a particular epoch. The differences between these various aspects of the interpretive procedure were however downplayed in the early Dilthey. For him, grasping the significance of any cultural fact had to be understood as a mental act of “transposition.” (See for example Dilthey 1961, vol. 5, 263–265). .

Ironically, the close association of the concepts of empathy and understanding and the associated claim that empathy is the sole and unique method of the human sciences also facilitated the decline of the empathy concept and its almost utter disregard by philosophers of the human and social sciences later on, in both the analytic and continental/hermeneutic traditions of philosophy. Within both traditions, proponents of empathy were—for very different reasons—generally seen as advocating an epistemically naïve and insufficiently broad conception of the methodological proceedings in the human sciences. As a result, most philosophers of the human and social sciences maintained their distance from the idea that empathy is central for our understanding of other minds and mental phenomena. Notable exceptions in this respect are R.G. Collingwood and his followers, who suggested that reenacting another person’s thoughts is necessary for understanding them as rational agents (Collingwood 1946, Dray 1957 and 1995). Notice however that in contrast to the contemporary debate about folk psychology, the debate about empathy in the philosophy of social science is not concerned with investigating underlying causal mechanisms. Rather, it addresses normative questions of how to justify a particular explanation or interpretation.

3.1 The Critique of Empathy in the Context of a Hermeneutic Conception of the Human Sciences

Philosophers arguing for a hermeneutic conception of the human and social sciences insist on a strict methodological division between the human and the natural sciences.[3] Yet they nowadays favor the concept of understanding (Verstehen) and reject the earlier identification of understanding and empathy for two specific reasons. First, empathy is no longer seen as the unique method of the human sciences because facts of significance, which a historian or an interpreter of literary and non-literary texts are interested in, do not solely depend on facts within the individual mind. A historian, for example, is not bound by the agent’s perspective in telling the story of a particular historical time period(Danto 1965). Similarly, philosophers such as Hans Georg Gadamer, have argued that the significance of a text is not tied to the author’s intentions in writing the text. In reading a text by Shakespeare or Plato we are not primarily interested in finding out what Plato or Shakespeare said but what these texts themselves say.(Gadamer 1989; for a critical discussion see Skinner (in Tully 1988); “Introduction” in Kögler and Stueber 2000; and Stueber 2002).

The above considerations, however, do not justify the claim that empathy has no role to play within the context of the human sciences. It justifies merely the claim that empathy cannot be their only method, at least as long as one admits that recognizing the thoughts of individual agents has to play some role in the interpretive project of the human sciences. Accordingly, a second reason against empathy is also emphasized. Conceiving of understanding other agents as being based on empathy is seen as an epistemically extremely naïve conception of the interpretation of individual agents, since it seems to conceive of understanding as a mysterious meeting of two individual minds outside of any cultural context. Individual agents are always socially and culturally embedded creatures. Understanding other agents thus presupposes an understanding of the cultural context within which an agent functions. Moreover, in the interpretive situation of the human sciences, the cultural background of the interpreter and the person, who has to be interpreted, can be very different. In that case, I can not very easily put myself in the shoes of the other person and imitate his thoughts in my mind. If understanding medieval knights, to use an example of Winch (1958), requires me to think exactly as the medieval knight did, then it is not clear how such a task can be accomplished from an interpretive perspective constituted by very different cultural presuppositions. Making sense of other minds has, therefore, to be seen as an activity that is a culturally mediated one; a fact that empathy theorists according to this line of critique do not sufficiently take into account when they conceive of understanding other agents as a direct meeting of minds that is independent of and unaided by information about how these agents are embedded in a broader social environment. (See Stueber 2006, chap.6, Zahavi 2001, 2005; for the later Dilthey see Makreel 2000. For a critical discussion of whether the concept of understanding without recourse to empathy is useful for marking an epistemic distinction between the human and natural sciences consult also Stueber 2012b. Within the context of anthropology, Hollan and Throop argue that empathy is best understood as a dynamic, culturally situated, temporally extended, and dialogical process actively involving not only the interpreter but also his or her interpretee. See Hollan 20012; Hollan and Throop 2008, 2001; Throop 2010).).

3.2 The Critique of Empathy within the Context of a Naturalist Conception of the Human Sciences

Philosophers, who reject the methodological dualism between the human and the natural sciences as argued for in the hermeneutic context, are commonly referred to as naturalists in the philosophy of social science. They deny that the distinction between understanding and explanation points to an important methodological difference. Even in the human or social sciences, the main point of the scientific endeavor is to provide epistemically justified explanations (and predictions) of observed or recorded events (see also Henderson 1993). At most, empathy is granted a heuristic role in the context of discovery. It however can not play any role within the context of justification. As particularly Hempel (1965) has argued, to explain an event involves—at least implicitly—an appeal to law-like regularities providing us with reasons for expecting that an event of a certain kind will occur under specific circumstances. Empathy might allow me to recognize that I would have acted in the same manner as somebody else. Yet it does not epistemically sanction the claim that anybody of a particular type or anybody who is in that type of situation will act in this manner.

Hempel’s argument against empathy has certainly not gone unchallenged. Within the philosophy of history, Dray (1957), following Collingwood, has argued that empathy plays an epistemically irreducible role, since we explain actions in terms of an agent’s reasons. For him, such reason explanations do not appeal to empirical generalizations but to normative principles of actions outlining how a person should act in a particular situation. Similar arguments have been articulated by Jaegwon Kim (1984, 1998). Yet as Stueber (2006, chap. 5) argues such a response to Hempel would require us to implausibly conceive of reason explanations as being very different from ordinary causal explanations. It would imply that our notions of explanation and causation are ambiguous concepts. Reasons that cause agents to act in the physical world would be conceived of as causes in a very different sense than ordinary physical causes. Moreover, as Hempel himself suggests, appealing to normative principles explains at most why a person should have acted in a certain manner. It does not explain why he ultimately acted in that way. Consequently, Hempel’s objection against empathy retain their force as long as one maintains that reason explanations are a form of ordinary causal explanations and as long as one conceives of the epistemic justification of such explanations as implicitly appealing to some empirical generalizations (For Kim’s recent attempt to account for the explanatory character of action explanations by acknowledging the centrality of the first person perspective see also Kim 2010).

Despite these concessions to Hempel, Stueber suggests that empathy (specifically reenactive empathy) has to be acknowledged as playing a central role even in the context of justification. For him, folk psychological explanations have to be understood as being tied to the domain of rational agency. In contrast to explanations in terms of mere inner causes, folk psychological explanations retain their explanatory force only as long as agents’ beliefs and desires can also be understood as reasons for their actions. The epistemic justification of such folk psychological explanations implicitly relies on generalizations involving folk psychological notions such as belief and desire. Yet the existence of such generalizations alone does not establish specific beliefs and desires as reasons for a person’s actions. Elaborating on considerations by Heal (2003) and Collingwood (1946), Stueber suggests that recognizing beliefs and desires as reasons requires the interpreter to be sensitive to an agent’s other relevant beliefs and desires. Individual thoughts function as reasons for rational agency only relative to a specific framework of an agent’s thoughts that are relevant for consideration in a specific situation. Most plausibly—given our persistent inability to solve the frame problem—recognizing which of another agent’s thoughts are relevant in specific contexts requires the practical ability of reenacting another person’s thoughts in one’s own mind. Empathy’s central epistemic role has to be admitted, since beliefs and desires can be understood only in this manner as an agent’s reasons (See Stueber 2006, 2008, 2013. For a related discussion about the role of understanding in contemporary epistemology and philosophy of science see Grimm 2016 and Grimm, Baumberger, and Ammon 2017).

4. Empathy as a Topic of Scientific Exploration in Psychology

The discussion of empathy within psychology has been largely unaffected by the critical philosophical discussion of empathy as an epistemic means to know other minds or as the unique method of the human sciences. Rather, psychologists’ interest in empathy–related phenomena harks back to eighteenth century moral philosophy, particularly David Hume and Adam Smith (See also Wispe 1991). Here empathy, or what was then called sympathy, was regarded to play a central role in constituting human beings as social and moral creatures allowing us to emotionally connect to our human companions and care for their well-being. Throughout the early 20th century, but particularly since the late 1940’s, empathy has, therefore, been an intensively studied topic of psychological research.

More broadly one can distinguish two psychological research traditions studying empathy–related phenomena; that is, the study of what is currently called empathic accuracy and the study of empathy as an emotional phenomenon in the encounter of others. The first area of study defines empathy primarily as a cognitive phenomenon and conceives of empathy in general terms as “the intellectual or imaginative apprehension of another’s condition or state of mind,” to use Hogan’s (1969) terminology. Within this area of research, one is primarily interested in determining the reliability and accuracy of our ability to perceive and recognize other persons’ enduring personality traits, attitudes and values, and occurrent mental states. One also investigates the various factors that influence empathic accuracy. One has, for example, been interested in determining whether empathic ability depends on gender, age, family background, intelligence, emotional stability, the nature of interpersonal relations, or whether it depends on specific motivations of the observer. (For a survey see Ickes 1993 and 2003; and Taft 1955). A more detailed account of the research on empathic accuracy and some of its earlier methodological difficulties can be found in the

Supplementary document on the Study of Cognitive Empathy and Empathic Accuracy.

Philosophically more influential has been the study of empathy defined primarily as an emotional or affective phenomenon, which psychologists in the middle of the 1950’s started to focus on. In this context, psychologists have also addressed issues of moral motivation that have been traditionally topics of intense discussions among moral philosophers. They were particularly interested in investigating (i) the development of various means for measuring empathy as a dispositional trait of adults and of children and as a situational response in specific situations, (ii) the factors on which empathic responses and dispositions depend, and (iii) the relation between empathy and pro-social behavior and moral development. Before discussing the psychological research on emotional empathy and its relevance for moral philosophy and moral psychology in the next section, it is vital to introduce important conceptual distinctions that one should keep in mind in evaluating the various empirical studies.

Anyone reading the emotional empathy literature has to be struck by the fact that empathy tended to be incredibly broadly defined in the beginning of this specific research tradition. Stotland, one of the earliest researcher who understood empathy exclusively as an emotional phenomenon, defined it as “an observer’s reacting emotionally because he perceives that another is experiencing or is about to experience an emotion” (1969, 272). According to Stotland’s definition very diverse emotional responses such as feeling envy, feeling annoyed, feeling distressed, being relieved about, feeling pity, or feeling what Germans call Schadenfreude (feeling joyful about the misfortune of another) have all to be counted as empathic reactions. Since the 1980’s however, psychologists have fine tuned their understanding of empathy conceptually and distinguished between different aspects of the emotional reaction to another person; thereby implicitly acknowledging the conceptual distinctions articulated by Max Scheler (1973) almost a century earlier. In this context, it is particularly useful to distinguish between the following reactive emotions that are differentiated in respect to whether or not such reactions are self or other oriented and whether they presuppose awareness of the distinction between self and others. (See also the survey in the Introduction to Eisenberg/Strayer 1987 and Batson 2009)

  1. Emotional contagion: Emotional contagion occurs when people start feeling similar emotions caused merely by the association with other people. You start feeling joyful, because other people around you are joyful or you start feeling panicky because you are in a crowd of people feeling panic. Emotional contagion however does not require that one is aware of the fact that one experiences the emotions because other people experience them, rather one experiences them primarily as one’s own emotion (Scheler 1973, 22). A newborn infant’s reactive cry to the distress cry of another, which Hoffman takes as a “rudimentary precursor of empathic distress” (Hoffman 2000, 65), can probably be understood as a phenomenon of emotional contagion, since the infant is not able to properly distinguish between self and other.

  2. Affective and proper Empathy: More narrowly and properly understood, empathy in the affective sense is the vicarious sharing of an affect. Authors however differ in how strictly they interpret the phrase of vicariously sharing an affect. For some, it requires that the empathizers and the persons they empathize with need to be in very similar affective states (Coplan 2011; de Vignemont and Singer 2006; Jacob 2011). For Hoffman, on the other hand, it is an emotional response requiring only “the involvement of psychological processes that make a person have feelings that are more congruent with another’s situation than with his own situation” (Hoffman 2000, 30). According to this definition, empathy does not necessarily require that the subject and target feel similar emotions (even though this is most often the case). Rather the definition also includes cases of feeling sad when seeing a child who plays joyfully but who does not know that it has been diagnosed with a serious illness (assuming that this is how the other person himself or herself would feel if he or she would fully understand his or her situation). In contrast to mere emotional contagion, genuine empathy presupposes the ability to differentiate between oneself and the other. It requires that one is minimally aware of the fact that one is having an emotional experience due to the perception of the other’s emotion, or more generally due to attending to his situation. In seeing a sad face of another and feeling sad oneself, such feeling of sadness should count as genuinely empathic only if one recognizes that in feeling sad one’s attention is still focused on the other and that it is not an appropriate reaction to aspects of one’s own life. Moreover, empathy outside the realm of a direct perceptual encounter involves some appreciation of the other person’s emotion as an appropriate response to his or her situation. To be happy or unhappy because one’s child is happy or sad should not count necessarily as an empathic emotion. It cannot count as a vicarious emotional response if it is due to the perception of the outside world from the perspective of the observer and her desire that her children should be happy. My happiness about my child being happy would therefore not be an emotional state that is more congruent to his situation. Rather, it is an emotional response appropriate to my own perspective on the world. In order for my happiness or unhappiness to be genuinely empathic it has to be happiness or unhappiness about what makes the other person happy. Accordingly, if I share another person’s emotion vicariously I do not merely have to be in an affective state with a similar phenomenal quality. Rather my affective state has to be directed toward the same intentional object. (See Sober and Wilson 1998, 231–237 and Maibom 2007. For a critical discussion of how and whether such vicarious sharing is possible see also Deonna 2007 and Matravers 2018). It should be noted, however, that some authors conceive of proper empathy more broadly as not merely being concerned with the vicarious reenactment of affective states but more comprehensively as including non-affective states such as beliefs and desires. This is especially true if they are influenced by the discussion of of empathy as an epistemic means such as Goldman (2011) and Stueber (2006). However, already Adam Smith (1853) constitutes a good example for such broad understanding of proper empathy. Finally, others suggest that it is best to distinguish between affective sharing and perspective taking (Decety and Cowell 2015).

  3. Sympathy: In contrast to affective empathy, sympathy—or what some authors also refer to as empathic concern—is not an emotion that is congruent with the other’s emotion or situation such as feeling the sadness of the other person’s grieving for the death of his father. Rather, sympathy is seen as an emotion sui generis that has the other’s negative emotion or situation as its object from the perspective of somebody who cares for the other person’s well being (Darwall 1998). In this sense, sympathy consists of “feeling sorrow or concern for the distressed or needy other,” a feeling for the other out of a “heightened awareness of the suffering of another person as something that needs to be alleviated.” (Eisenberg 2000a, 678; Wispe 1986, 318; and Wispe 1991).

    Whereas it is quite plausible to assume that empathy—that is, empathy with negative emotions of another or what Hoffman (2000) calls “veridical empathic distress”—under certain conditions (and when certain developmental markers are achieved) can give rise to sympathy, it should be stressed that the relation between affective empathy and sympathy is a contingent one; the understanding of which requires further empirical research. First, sympathy does not necessarily require feeling any kind of congruent emotions on part of the observer, a detached recognition or representation that the other is in need or suffers might be sufficient. (See Scheler 1973 and Nichols 2004). Second, empathy or empathic distress might not at all lead to sympathy. People in the helping professions, who are so accustomed to the misery of others, suffer at times from compassion fatigue. It is also possible to experience empathic overarousal because one is emotionally so overwhelmed by one’s empathic feelings that one is unable to be concerned with the suffering of the other (Hoffman 2000, chap. 8). In the later case, one’s empathic feeling are transformed or give rise to mere personal distress, a reactive emotional phenomenon that needs to be distinguished from emotional contagion, empathy, and sympathy.

  4. Personal Distress: Personal distress in the context of empathy research is understood as a reactive emotion in response to the perception/recognition of another’s negative emotion or situation. Yet, while personal distress is other-caused like sympathy, it is, in contrast to sympathy, primarily self-oriented. In this case, another person’s distress does not make me feel bad for him or her, it just makes me feel bad, or “alarmed, grieved, upset, worried, disturbed, perturbed, distressed,and troubled;” to use the list of adjectives that according to Batson’s research indicates personal distress (Batson et al. 1987 and Batson 1991). And, in contrast to empathic emotions as defined above, my personal distress is not any more congruent with the emotion or situation of another. Rather it wholly defines my own outlook onto the world.

While it is conceptually necessary to differentiate between these various emotional responses, it has to be admitted that it is empirically not very easy to discriminate between them, since they tend to occur together. Think or imagine yourself attending the funeral of the child of a friend or good acquaintance. This is probably one reason why early researchers tended not to distinguish between the above aspects in their study of empathy related phenomena. Yet since the above distinctions refer to very different psychological mechanisms, it is absolutely central to distinguish between them when empirically assessing the impact and contribution of empathy to an agent’s pro-social motivation and behavior. Given the ambiguity of the empathy concept within psychology—particularly in the earlier literature—in evaluating and comparing different empirical empathy studies, it is always crucial to keep in mind how empathy has been defined and measured within the context of these studies. For a more extensive discussion of the methods used by psychologists to measure empathy see the

Supplementary document on Measuring Empathy.

5. Empathy, Moral Philosophy, and Moral Psychology

Moral philosophers have always been concerned with moral psychology and with articulating an agent’s motivational structure in order to explicate the importance of morality for a human life. After all, moral judgments supposedly make demands on an agent’s will and are supposed to provide us with reasons and motivations for acting in a certain manner. Yet moral judgments, at least in the manner in which we conceive of them in modern times, are also regarded to be based on normative standards that, in contrast to mere conventional norms, have universal scope and are valid independent of the features of specific social practices that agents are embedded in. One only needs to think of statements such as “cruelty to innocent children or slavery is morally wrong,” which we view as applying also to social practices where the attitude of its population seem to condone such actions. Moral judgements thus seem to address us from the perspective of the moral stance where we leave behind the perspective of self-love and do not conceive of each other either as friends or foes (see Hume 1987, 75) or as belonging to the in–group or out–group, but where we view each other all to be equal part of a moral community. Finally, and relatedly, in order to view morality as something that is possible for human beings we also seem to require that our motivations based on or associated with moral reasons have a self-less character. Given to charity for merely selfish reasons, for example, seems to clearly diminish its moral worth and implicitly deny the universal character of a moral demand. Philosophically explicating the importance of morality for human life then has to do the following: It has to explain how it is that we humans as a matter of fact do care about morality thusly conceived, it has to address the philosophically even more pertinent question of why it is that we should care about morality or why it is that we should regard judgments issued from the perspective of the moral stance to have normative authority over us; and it has to allow us to understand how it is that we can act self-lessly in a manner that correspond to the demands made on us from the moral stance. Answering all of these questions however necessitates at one point to explain how our moral interests are related to our psychological constitution as human beings and how moral demands can be understood as being appropriately addressed to agents who are psychologically structured in that manner.

Prima facie, the difficulty of this enterprise consists in squaring a realistic account of human psychology with the universal scope and intersubjective validity of moral judgments, since human motivation and psychological mechanisms seem to be always situational, local, and of rather limited scope. Moreover, as evolutionary psychologists tell us in–group bias seems to be a universal trait of human psychology. One of the most promising attempts to solve this problem is certainly due to the tradition of eighteenth century moral philosophy associated with the names of David Hume and Adam Smith who tried to address all of the above philosophical desiderata by pointing to the central role that our empathic and sympathetic capacities have for constituting us as social and moral agents and for providing us with the psychological capacities to make and to respond to moral judgments. While philosophers in the Kantian tradition, who favor reason over sentiments, have generally been skeptical about this proposal, more recently the claim that empathy is central for morality and a flourishing human life has again been the topic of an intense and controversial debate. On the one hand, empathy has been hailed by researchers from a wide range of disciplines and also by some public figures, President Obama most prominently among them. Slote (2010) champions empathy as the sole foundation of moral judgment, de Waal (2006) conceives of it as the unique evolutionary building block of morality, Rifkin (2009) regards it even as a force whose cultivation has unique revolutionary powers to transform a world in crisis, and Baron-Cohen (2011, 194) views it as a “universal solvent” in that “any problem immersed in empathy becomes soluble.” On the other hand, such empathy enthusiasm has encountered penetrating criticism by Prinz (2011 a,b) and Bloom (2016), who emphasize its dark side, that is, its tendency to fall prey to so–called “here and now” biases. The following subsections will address these issues by surveying the relevant empirical research on the question whether empathy motivates us in a self-less manner, the question of whether empathy is inherently biased and partial to the in-group, and it will discuss how we might think of the normative character of moral judgments in light of our empathic capacities.(For a survey of other relevant issues from social psychology, specifically social neuroscience, consult also Decety and Lamm 2006; Decety and Ickes 2009, and Decety 20012. For a discussion of the importance empathy for medical practice see Halpern 2001)

5.1 Empathy and Altruistic Motivation

In a series of ingeniously designed experiments, Batson has accumulated evidence for what he calls the empathy-altruism thesis. In arguing for this thesis, Batson conceives of empathy as empathic concern or what others would call sympathy. More specifically, he characterized it in terms of feelings of being sympathetic, moved by, being compassionate, tender, warm and soft-hearted towards the other’s plight (Batson et al. 1987, 26) The task of his experiments consists in showing that empathy/sympathy does indeed lead to genuinely altruistic motivation, where the welfare of the other is the ultimate goal of my helping behavior, rather than to helping behavior because of predominantly egoistic motivations. According to the egoistic interpretation of empathy–related phenomena, empathizing with another person in need is associated with a negative feeling or can lead to a heightened awareness of the negative consequences of not helping; such as feelings of guilt, shame, or social sanctions. Alternatively, it can lead to an enhanced recognition of the positive consequences of helping behavior such as social rewards or good feelings. Empathy according to this interpretation induces us to help through mediation of purely egoistic motivations. We help others only because we recognize helping behavior as a means to egoistic ends. It allows us to reduce our negative feelings (aversive arousal reduction hypothesis), to avoid “punishment,” or to gain specific internal or external “rewards” (empathy-specific punishment and empathy-specific reward hypotheses).

Notice however that in arguing for the empathy-altruism thesis, Batson is not claiming that empathy always induces helping behavior. Rather, he argues against the predominance of an egoistic interpretation of an agent’s motivational structure. He argues for the existence of genuinely altruistic motivations and more specifically for the claim that empathy causes such genuinely altruistic motivation. These genuinely altruistic motives (together with other egoistic motives) are taken into account by the individual agent in deliberating about whether or not to help. Even for Batson, the question of whether the agent will act on his or her altruistic motivations depends ultimately on how strong they are and what costs the agent would incur in helping another person.

The basic set up of Batson’s experiments consists in the manipulation of the situation of the experimental subjects (dependent on the egoistic alternative to be argued against) and the manipulation of empathy/sympathy felt for an observed target in need. The decisive evidence for the empathy/sympathy-altruism thesis is always the recorded behavior of the subject, who is in a high empathy condition and in a situation where his helping behavior can not plausibly be seen as a means for the satisfaction of a personal goal. Since here is not the place to extensively describe the details of Batson’s experiments, a brief description of the experimental set up—focusing on Batson’s argument against the aversive arousal interpretation of empathy—and a brief evaluation of the success of his general argumentative strategy has to suffice (for more details see Batson 1991 and 2011). In all of his experiments, Batson assumes—based on Stotland (1969) and others—that empathy/sympathy can be manipulated either by manipulating the perceived similarity between subjects and targets or by manipulating the perspective taking attitude of the subjects. Empathy according to these assumptions can be increased by enhancing the perceived similarity between subject and target or by asking the subject to imagine how the observed person would feel in his or her situation rather than asking the subject to attend carefully to the information provided. [Note also that instructing the subject to imagine how they themselves would feel in the other’s situation, rather than instructing them to imagine how the other feels, is associated with an increase in personal distress and not only sympathetic feelings. (Batson et al. 1997b and Lamm, Batson, and Decety 2007).]

In trying to argue against the aversive arousal reduction interpretation, Batson also manipulates the ease with which a subject can avoid helping another person (in this case taking his place when they see him getting electric shocks). He reasons that if empathy leads to genuinely altruistic motivations, subjects in the high empathy/easy escape condition should still be willing to help. If they were only helping in order to reduce their own negative feelings, they would be expected to leave in this situation, since leaving is the less costly means for reaching an egoistic goal. As Batson was happy to report, the results confirmed his empathy/sympathy-altruism hypothesis, not only in the above experiments but also in experiments testing other alternative interpretations of empathy such as the empathy- specific punishment and the empathy-specific award hypotheses.

Researchers generally agree in finding Batson’s experimental research program and the accumulated evidence for the empathy-altruism thesis to be impressive. Yet they disagree about how persuasive one should ultimately regard his position. In particular it has been pointed out that his experiments have limited value, since they target only very specific egoistic accounts of why empathy might lead to helping behavior. Batson is not able to dismiss conclusively every alternative egoistic interpretation. In addition, it has been claimed that egoism has the resources to account for the result of his experiments. For example, one might challenge the validity of Batson’s interpretation by speculating whether empathy/sympathy leads to a heightened awareness of the fact that one will be troubled by bad memories of seeing another person in need, if one does nothing to help him or her. In this case even an egoistically motivated person would help in the high empathy/easy escape condition. (For this reply and various other egoistic interpretations of Batson’s experiments see Sober and Wilson 1998, 264–271).

Cialdini and his collaborators have suggested an even more elaborate non-altruistic interpretation of helping behavior in high empathy/easy escape conditions. According to their suggestions, conditions of high empathy are also conditions of increased “interpersonal unity, wherein the conception of self and other are not distinct but are merged to some degree” (Cialdini et al. 1997, 490). It is this increased feeling of oneness rather than empathy that is causally responsible for motivating helping behavior (See however Batson et al. 1997a, Neuberg et al. 1997, and Batson 1997 and 2011 for a plausible reply and May 2018, 144–153 for a probing discussion of the relation between empathic concern and oneness). One therefore has to be cautious in claiming that Batson has conclusively proven that the empathy/sympathy-altruism hypothesis is true, if that means one has logically excluded every egoistic alternative in accounting for helping behavior. But it has to be acknowledged that Batson has radically changed the argumentative dialectic of the egoism-altruism debate by forcing the egoistic account of human agency to come up with ever more elaborate alternative interpretations in order to account for helping behavior within its framework. Egoism was supposed to provide a rather unified and relatively simple account of the motivational structure of human agency. In challenging the predominance and simplicity of this framework in an empirically acute fashion, Batson has at least established altruism—claiming that besides egoistic motivations we are also motivated by genuinely altruistic reasons—as an empirically plausible hypothesis. He has shown it to be a hypothesis one is almost persuaded to believe that it is true, as he himself recently has characterized his own epistemic attitude (Batson 1997, 522.) More positively expressed, Batson’s research has at least demonstrated that empathy/sympathy is a causal factor in bringing about helping behavior. Regardless of the question of the exact nature of the underlying motivation for helping or prosocial behavior, psychologists generally assume that in adults and children a positive, even if weak, correlation between empathy—measured in a variety of ways—and prosocial behavior has been established; and this despite the fact that the above aspects of emotional responding to another person have not always been sufficiently distinguished.(For a survey see Eisenberg and Miller 1987; Eisenberg/Fabes 1998, Spinrad and Eisenberg 2014. For a general survey of the various factors contributing to prosocial behavior see Bierhoff 2002).

Regardless of how exactly one views the strength of Batson’s position, his research alone does not validate the thesis, articulated by various traditional moral philosophers, that sympathy or empathy is the basis of morality or that it constitutes the only source for moral motivation. First, nothing in his research has shown that empathy/sympathy is empirically necessary for moral agency. Second, some of Batson’s own research casts doubt on the claim that sympathy/empathy is the foundation of morality as empathy induced altruism can lead to behavior that conflicts with our principles of justice and fairness. One, for example, tends to assign a better job or a higher priority for receiving medical treatment to persons with whom one has actually sympathized, in violation of the above moral principles (See Batson et al. 1995). For that very reason, Batson himself distinguishes between altruistic motivation concerned with the well-being of another person and moral motivation guided by principles of justice and fairness (Batson 2011). Unfortunately we do not always realize this fact when we abstractly contrast moral motivation broadly with egoistic motivation. For that very reason, we also do not realize that we need to be more conscious in “orchestrating” the relationship between altruistic and moral motivations in order to fully utilize the motivational power of altruism for moral purposes (Batson 2014). Finally, the research discussed so far is not relevant for deciding the question of whether sophisticated mindreading abilities are required for full blown moral agency, since Batson understands empathy primarily as an emotional phenomenon. (See Nichols 2001 and Batson et al. 2003 in this respect.)

5.2 Empathy, Its Partiality, Susceptibility to Bias, and Moral Agency

Within the psychological literature, one of the most comprehensive accounts of empathy and its relation to the moral development of a person is provided by the work of Martin Hoffman (for a summary see his 2000). Hoffman views empathy as a biologically based disposition for altruistic behavior (Hoffman 1981). He conceives of empathy as being due to various modes of arousal allowing us to respond empathically in light of a variety of distress cues from another person. Hoffman mentions mimicry, classical conditioning, and direct association—where one empathizes because the other’s situation reminds one of one’s own painful experience—as “fast acting and automatic” mechanisms producing an empathic response. As more cognitively demanding modes, Hoffman lists mediated association—where the cues for an empathic response are provided in a linguistic medium—and role taking.

Hoffman distinguishes between six (or more) developmental stages of empathic responses ranging from the reactive newborn cry, egocentric empathic distress, quasi-ego-centric empathic distress, to veridical empathy, empathy for another beyond the immediate situation, and empathy for whole groups of people. Accordingly, empathic responses constitute a developmental continuum that ranges from emotional contagion (as in the case of a reactive newborn cry) to various forms of proper empathy reached at the fourth stage. At the developmentally later stages, the child is able to emotionally respond to the distress of another in a more sophisticated manner due to an increase of cognitive capacities, particularly due to the increased cognitive ability to distinguish between self and other and by becoming aware of the fact that others have mental states that are independent from its own. Only at the fourth stage of empathic development (after the middle of the second year) do children acquire such abilities. They do no longer try to comfort themselves, when emotionally responding to another child’s distress—like seeking comfort from their own mother—, or use helping strategies that are more appropriate to comfort themselves than the other person—like using their own teddy-bear in trying to comfort the other child. Only at the fourth stage does empathy become also transformed or associated with sympathy leading to appropriate prosocial behavior. Hoffman’s developmental view is further supported by Preston and DeWaal’s account of empathy as a phenomenon to be observed across species at various levels of complexities related to different degrees of cognitive development. (Preston and DeWaal 2002a,b. For a discussion of the philosophical relevance of DeWaal’s view see also DeWaal 2006).

Significantly, Hoffman combines his developmental explication of empathy with a sophisticated analysis of its importance for moral agency. He is thereby acutely aware of the limitations in our natural capacity to empathize or sympathize with others, particularly what he refers to as “here and now” biases, that is, the fact that we tend to empathize more with persons that are in some sense perceived to be closer to us. (For a neuro-scientific investigation of how racial bias modulates empathic responses see Xuo, Zuo, Wang and Han 2009). Like Batson, Hoffman does not regard the moral realm as being exclusively circumscribed by our ability to empathize with other people. Besides empathic abilities, moral agency requires also knowledge of abstract moral principles, such as the principles of caring and justice. Hoffman seems to conceive of those principles as being derived from cognitive sources that are independent from our empathic abilities. Yet Hoffmann is rather optimistic about the natural compatibility of empathic motivation and our commitment to moral principles. He regards stable and effective moral agency as requiring empathy so that moral principles can have a motivational basis in an agent’s psychology. Within this context, he has lately emphasized a final stage of empathy development or what he calls “witnessing”, an empathic response to the suffering of others that is so intense that we “become fully committed to help”(Hoffman 2014, 82). As he explains—in light of examples from the history of abolitionism, the civil rights movement, serfdom reform in Russia, and various cases before the Supreme Court— it is particularly such witnessing that has contributed towards bending the arc of the moral universe towards justice. Accordingly, and despite our natural limitations in empathizing with others, Hoffman still regards empathy as the “bedrock of morality” and “the glue of society”(Hoffman 2014, 96. Besides Hoffman 2011 and 2014, see also Deigh 2011 for a measured evaluation of empathy in the legal context ).

More recently, such ultimately positive evaluation of empathy’s contributing role in constituting us as moral agents, as agents who address each other from the moral stance, has encountered penetrating criticism, particularly by Prinz (2011a,b) and Bloom (2016). Both emphasize the dark side of empathy, that is, the aforementioned “here and now” biases. More specifically Prinz mentions explicitly the cuteness, salience, and proximity effects—the fact that we tend to empathize more easily with attractive persons, with persons that are in close proximity and only if their suffering is particularly noteworthy— similarity biases and the fact that we tend to be rather selective in choosing whom to empathize with. Empathy is also very easily modulated by a variety of top-down factors that influence our perception of the social world and that let us register social divisions that seem to be prima facie incompatible with the more impartial stance demanded by the moral perspective. Research has documented these biases in a more fine-grained manner and shown that subjects generally “reported experiencing more empathy for the in–group then the out–group targets and more counter–empathy for the out–group than in–group targets”(Cikara et. al. 2014, 120), counter–empathy here being understood as the feeling of pleasure at the misfortune of another (Schadenfreude) or the feeling displeasure at something fortunate happening to another (Glückschmerz). This is particularly true if the other group is viewed to be in competition with one’s own group. Empathy can also be further reduced through various dehumanizing and objectifying strategies, strategies that have certainly employed in the context of the genocides of the twentieth century and the system of racial slavery in the United States (See Fuchs 2019, Kteily and Bruneau 2017). Heightened empathy for perceived wrongs done to members of the in–group can also lead to violent and immoral behavior (Bloom 2016, chap. 5). In addition, empathy tends to focus on the one (particularly if he or she is identifiable) rather than the many, what Bloom refers to as its spotlight feature. Empathy can mislead us particularly in contexts where we need to take into account statistically relevant information when addressing a moral or social problem, such as when thinking about the benefits of vaccination where it is more appropriate to think about the large numbers of children saved rather than empathizing with the bad effects such vaccination might have on one specific child. For all of these reasons, Prinz favors the moral emotions such as anger, guilt and shame as the foundation for morality, while Bloom prefers sympathy guided by reason as a more viable means than empathy to steer us in moral matters.

Here is not the place for a final evaluation of empathy’s contribution in regard to pro-social and moral motivation or moral and pro-social behavior, since this question is still very much the topic of an ongoing empirical investigation. Yet the following observations are certainly justified in light of the empirical evidence so far and might help to further clarify the debate. First, it seems to be pretty well established that however one defines our natural capacity for empathy, it is on its own not sufficient to keep us reliably on the path of morality (See also Decety and Cowell 2015). Whether that ultimately means that we should think of our capacity for empathy as a limited resource or whether it would be better to think of empathy as a motivated phenomenon and its limitations as being due to our reluctance to activate that capacity (Zaki 2014), is certainly another intriguing question for further empirical inquiry. One might also wonder why we should expect that the emotions such as sympathy and anger, which Bloom and Prinz point to, are less prone to bias and less affected by a universal human tendency to favor the in–group. Certainly sympathy within the context of Buddhism, to which Bloom appeals to is a highly regulated emotion, controlled through mindfulness practices or meditation and guided by an intellectual grasp about the detriments of various forms of attachment to this world. Persson and Savulescu (2018) therefore suggest that rather than giving up on empathy completely one should reform empathy by regulating it through one’s reflective capacities in light of our knowledge of its natural shortcomings or focus one’s empathy (cognitive and affective) particularly on another person’s concerns for his or her well-being as such empathy includes sympathy for the other (Simmons 2014). Such suggestions are also very much in line with proposals by David Hume and Adam Smith, who suggested already in the eighteenth century that we need to regulate empathy with the help of certain corrective mechanisms such as “some steady and general points of view” or the perspective of the“impartial spectator” in order to compensate for empathy’s limited scope. (For a good analysis of the philosophical discussion about empathy/sympathy in the eighteenth century see Frazer 2010).

Most importantly, in order to evaluate the empirical discussion about empathy’s role for morality, one needs to be very sensitive to how researchers define and measure empathy in arguing for and against empathy’s relation to moral motivation or moral judgment. Prinz and Bloom are quite explicit in defining empathy merely as an affective phenomenon, as our ability to feel what the other person feels. Evidence suggests indeed that merely sharing another person’s emotion empathically does not increase our concern or motivation for moral or pro-social action. Interestingly, however, perspective–taking and empathic concern/sympathy, which have always been seen as an integral part of empathy-related phenomena, are a slightly different matter. They do seem to be positively related to cooperation and charitable giving (Jordon et. al. 2016), to reducing prejudices against particular groups (Galinski and Morowitz 2011), and to an increase in one’s sensitivity to injustices done to others (Decety and Yoder 2015). Yet even here further research is needed as the effects of such perspective–taking could be modulated by the power differential between groups. It has, for example, been shown that in active intergroup conflicts, positive intergroup interaction can increase empathy for the other group. Yet within such contexts, taking the perspective of a person from the other group while interacting with them might also hinder the development of intergroup empathy if the dominant group is reminded through such perspective–taking of how they might be viewed by the non-dominant group. Even perspective taking by the non–dominant group might increase rather than decrease established negative stereotypes in thinking about the other group (Cikara et. al. 2014). It seems more effective if the non–dominant group is asked to articulate the difficulties of their lives (perspective–giving) and the dominant group is asked to translate that description into their own words (perspective–taking), even if the positive effects of such interaction is relatively short-lived (Bruneau and Saxe 2012).

5.3 Empathy, Moral Judgment, and the Authority of Moral Norms

So far, this entry has discussed mainly research exploring the relation between empathy and prosocial/moral behavior or motivation. Other important areas for considering empathy’s role in moral matters have to do with addressing the questions of how and whether empathy contributes to our ability to distinguish between moral and conventional norms, to the making of moral judgments, and how empathy can be appealed to in explicating the normative authority of such judgments. In considering the first question, psychologists and philosophers have generally followed Turiel in understanding moral norms as expressing concerns for “rights, justice, and the welfare of other people” (Turiel 1983, 3) and as having a very specific “signature response patterns” (Kelly et. al. 2007) associated with it. Moral norms are generally regarded to be more important than conventional norms in that their normative validity is conceived as being independent of social authority or specific social practices and agreements. Their scope is also judged to be much broader—they are thought of to be valid in other countries, for example—, and violation of moral norms is generally understood to be a more serious offense than the violation of other norms. Notice however that in distinguishing between moral and conventional norms subjects do not necessarily associate a strict universality in the Kantian sense with moral norms and view them as applicable to all rational beings. Indeed there is some evidence that 6–9 year old children, for example, view the moral/conventional distinction as being fully applicable only to behavior of individuals in the in-group and view prescription against harming members of the out-group to be more like conventional norms (Rhodes and Chalik 2013). Accordingly, the fact that empathy shows considerable in-group bias, as discussed above, does not automatically count as evidence against it playing a role in allowing humans to distinguish between moral and conventional norms within a social context.

Of central importance for assessing the role of empathy for grasping the moral/conventional distinction has been the research on the nature of psychopathy and autism. Both pathologies are seen as involving deficits in different dimensions of empathy but only psychopaths have great difficulties in living up to moral standards of their societies and only they were originally thought of as having difficulties in appropriately distinguishing between moral and conventional norms (Blair 1995 and 1996). More specifically, psychopaths show a selective deficit in affective or emotional empathy particularly in “processing fearful, sad, and possibly disgusted facial expressions”(Blair 2010, 710). In contrast to persons with autism they however do not show similar deficits in perspective taking or theory of mind capacities. In his 1995 article, Blair therefore blames the absence of what he calls the Violence Inhibition Mechanism(VIM) that allows us to respond appropriately to the observed distress cues in others for the psychopaths’ moral deficits and their inability to draw the moral/conventional distinction. In his later work, he speaks more broadly of a dysfunction of our Integrated Emotion System (IES), caused by a deficit in the amygdala to properly represent negative emotions. (Blair, Mitchel, and Blair 2005, for a recent survey regarding the very specific deficit of psychopaths in feeling and recognizing fear see also Marsh 2014). Yet one has to tread very carefully in drawing definite conclusions about the role of empathy for morality from the empirical research about psychopathy. The results of the empirical investigations are far from unified and do not point in the same direction (For a concise survey see Maibom 2017). Newer studies, for example, seem to suggest that psychopaths, as measured by the overall score of the revised psychopathy checklist (PCL–R), are able to understand the distinction between moral and conventional norms if tested under a forced choice paradigm (Aharoni et. al 2012.)Nevertheless even that study seems to allow for the possibility that emotional deficits are responsible for the psychopath’s shortcomings in accurately drawing the distinction since they are somewhat linked to the affective and antisocial facets of the PCL–R. Given the inconsistent results of the various studies, other researchers prefer to view a psychopath’s immorality not as a specific deficit in empathy, but understand it to be caused by their general inability to feel strong emotions, by their general coldheartedness, or even by shortcomings in their rational and prudential capacities. From that perspective, a psychopath might understand in an abstract manner that certain things are morally wrong to do, but he just does not care for morality, the welfare of another person, or even for himself. (For further discussion see Maibom 2005 and 2009, Nichols 2004, and Prinz 2011a,b). Similar considerations apply also to research regarding subjects with autism. Kennett (2002)has argued that evidence from autistic individuals, whose imaginative role-play and thus empathic capacities are diminished, does not support the claim that empathy is necessary for moral agency. Yet in her arguments she only considers the fact that persons with autism have difficulties with putting themselves in another person’s shoes but does not consider that they seem to have some ability to pick up on the emotional states of other people as revealed by their facial expressions. Moreover, while autistic subjects in general can distinguish between moral and conventional norms they do seem to lack a certain flexibility in evaluating the seriousness of the violation of a moral norm when they reflect on moral dilemmas or when they encounter an accidental or unintentional violation of such norms. (See McGeer 2008, Zalla et. al 2011, but see also Kennett 2011 and Leslie et. al. 2006 in response).

Philosophers have however not been merely be interested in appealing to empathy for explicating the psychological basis for our thinking that certain norms have moral status. Within the general framework of moral sentimentalism, which sees morality generally linked to our emotional responsiveness to the actions of others and ourselves, they have also appealed to empathy in explicating more generally the nature of moral judgments (see also Kauppinen 2014 and 2017a). David Hume, for example, has suggested that moral judgments are based on peculiar sentiments of moral approbations and disapprobation, which are causally mediated by our ability to empathize— or what he called sympathy— with the pain and pleasures of others (See also Sayre-Mcord 1994 and 2014). More specifically, sentiments of moral approbations arise in response to our ability to think about and enliven the pleasure and pain that others feel with the help of our empathic/sympathetic capacities when we consider the benefits (the pleasure and pain) which a person’s character traits and actions provide to himself and others. Yet Hume was already quite aware of some of the above mentioned limitations and biases of our natural willingness and capacity to empathize with others. Accordingly, he insisted that sentiments of approbations can only be conceived of as moral approbation if empathy/sympathy is regulated or corrected by what he refers to as “steady and general points of view” (Hume 1739–40 [1978], 581/2) so that our capacity for sympathy enables us to “touch a string, to which all mankind have an accord and symphony” (Hume 1748 [1983], 75). There are certainly a number of issues that can be raised in response to Hume’s proposal. Suffice it here to point out that it is difficult to fully understand how Hume is ultimately able distinguish between judgments about something being bad and something being morally wrong. Certainly natural disasters also cause us to sympathize/empathize with the pain it causes others, yet such sympathy is not mediating any judgments about the moral impermissibility of natural disasters. Hume himself might have thought to have solved this problem by thinking that sentiments of moral approbation have a peculiar or distinct character (see in this respect particularly Debes 2012). Yet pointing to the peculiarity of such sentiments seems to be rather unsatisfying for answering this challenge.

Michael Slote, one of the main contemporary proponents of the claim that empathy plays a constitutive role for moral judgments, does not follow Hume in thinking that empathy plays a moral role in allowing us to pick up on a subject’s pleasure and pain. Rather Slote, who also has been influenced by a feminist ethics of care (Slote 2007, 2010), suggests that empathy is central for moral approval in that we as spectators empathically pick up on whether or not an agent acted out of empathic concern for another subject. Moral approval of an action consists then in the subsequent reflective feeling of warmth when empathizing with an agent’s empathic concern, while moral disapproval is equivalent with a reflective feeling of chill due to our recognition that the agent acted without any empathic concern. Actions are then judged to be morally right or wrong in terms of whether they can be conceived of the actions of an agent we would morally approve of in that they are actions done out of empathic concern. Notice also that while Slote does regard empathy in the above sense to be constitutive of moral approval only if it is fully or well–developed, he does not follow Hume in thinking that empathy needs to be regulated in order to correct for some of its natural partiality. Indeed Slote thinks that this is a virtue of his account since he regards such partiality reflected in our moral intuitions. For example, he thinks that we have a greater moral obligation to help the child in front of us or members of our family rather than people who are more removed from us. Slote certainly deserves credit for reviving the debate about the role of empathy for morality in contemporary metaethics. Yet his conception of the relation between empathy and morality has also encountered some skepticism. First of all, it is questionable that only motivations of empathic concern, rather than the thought that one is doing the right thing, constitute proper moral motivations. Second, in light of the above research on empathy’s bias and natural shortcomings, it is rather questionable to maintain that all aspects of empathy’s partiality are sanctioned by our our moral intuitions. It is therefore hard to see how empathy’s moral role can be justified without appeal to some form of corrective mechanism. Third, phenomenologically speaking, moral disapproval is not necessarily based on a “chilly” feeling. At times we are rather upset and angry in encountering violations of moral norms. Finally, Slote’s proposed empathic mechanism underlying moral approval seems to lack a certain psychological plausibility. For Slote, we approve of an action because we recreate the empathic concern that the agent feels towards his or her subjects and that causes us to feel warmly towards the agent. Yet if a positive moral judgment of an actions is tied to providing us with the motivation or with a reason for doing a specific action, it is hard to see how moral approval, consisting in us feeling warmly towards the agent, should help us accomplish this. If Slote is right, it would rather provide us with a reason for merely praising or being nice towards the agent (See D’Arms 2011, Kauppinen 2014 and 2017a, Prinz 2001a,b, and Stueber 2011c).

There is one additional element to consider when debating empathy’s contribution to morality. Philosophers are not merely interested in answering factual and causal questions of why we care about morality, what causal role empathy plays in this respect, or how empathy causally contributes in allowing us to distinguish between moral and conventional norms and judging what is morally right or wrong. Rather they are also interested in genuinely normative questions in attempting to answer the question of why we should care about morality and why we should regard moral judgments as making normative demands on us. In morally blaming other persons we do assume that we evaluate their behavior according to standards that they as persons are in some sense already committed to. We assume that these standards are their own standards rather than standards that we impose from an external perspective on them. Unfortunately, even if one would agree with either David Hume or Michael’s Slote’s account of the causal role of empathy outlined above, it is doubtful that their account would help us to answer the genuinely normative question appropriately. Why exactly should I take a particular emotional reaction of another person towards me and my action, even if it is a feeling of warmth caused by empathy, as something that is normatively relevant for me. Certainly we all like to be liked and try to fit in with our peer group, but then moral judgments would be nothing more than a glorified form of peer pressure. Hume might respond that we should take them seriously because they are responses from the general point of view, but that in itself seems to be begging the question of why such perspective is articulating the appropriate normative standard for judging our behavior and character. This is also exactly the reason, why philosophers with Kantian inclinations have been in general skeptical about moral sentimentalism and positions that think of empathy as a foundation of morality (for a nice explication of Kant’s critical view of sympathy see Deimling 2017). Contemporary “Kantians” do at times, however, admit that empathy and perspective taking is epistemically relevant for moral deliberations, even if it is not solely constitutive for moral agency (Deigh 1996 and 2018; Darwall 2006, Shermann 1998, For a review see also Oxley 2011). Interestingly, philosophers sympathetic to moral sentimentalism have particularly turned to Adam Smith for inspiration in developing empathy based accounts of morality and in responding to the above normativity problem. In contrast to Hume, Smith conceives of empathy/sympathy not merely as the enlivening of a perceived emotion or feeeling but as imaginative perspective–taking. In taking up another person’s perspective we put ourselves in his situation and imagine how he would respond to the situation, how he would think and feel about it. If in bringing another person’s point of view “home to ourselves” in this manner, we recognize that we ourselves might have felt or acted like the other person, then we approve of the other person’s sentiment or action, otherwise we disapprove. Moreover, such approval constitutes moral approval if we have empathized with the other from the perspective of the impartial spectator, a perspective that Smith, like Hume, appeals to in order to correct for empathy’s natural shortcomings. More importantly, some authors think that within the Smithian framework we also find some answers to the normativity problem. They think that the impartial spectator perspective can be recast as an implicit commitment of our ordinary practice of making sense of each other as rational and emotional creatures with the help of empathic perspective taking (Stueber 2017) or argue that Smithian perspective–taking involves quasi-Kantian commitments to the dignity of a person, including his or her affective dimension. (Debes 2017, but see also Fricke 2005, Kauppinen 2017b, and Roughley 2018).


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Further Important Surveys of Empathy

  • Maibom, H. (ed.), 2017. The Routledge Handbook of the Philosophy of Empathy, New York: Routledge.
  • Matraver, D., 2017. Empathy, Cambridge: Polity Press.

Other Internet Resources

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