Hume on Religion
David Hume’s various writings concerning problems of religion are among the most important and influential contributions on this topic. In these writings Hume advances a systematic, sceptical critique of the philosophical foundations of various theological systems. Whatever interpretation one takes of Hume’s philosophy as a whole, it is certainly true that one of his most basic philosophical objectives is to discredit the doctrines and dogmas of traditional theistic belief. There are, however, some significant points of disagreement about the exact nature and extent of Hume’s irreligious intentions. One of the most important of these is whether Hume’s sceptical position leads him to a view that can be properly characterized as “atheism”.
The primary aims of this article are: (1) to give an account of Hume’s main arguments as they touch on various particular issues relating to religion; and (2) to answer to the question concerning the general character of Hume’s commitments on this subject.
- 1. Religious Philosophers and Speculative Atheists
- 2. Empiricism, Scepticism and the Very Idea of God
- 3. The Cosmological Argument and God’s Necessary-Existence
- 4. The Argument from Design
- 5. The Problem of Evil
- 6. Miracles
- 7. Immortality and a Future State
- 8. Hume’s Genealogy of Religion: Causes and Dynamics of Religious Belief
- 9. Religion and Morality
- 10. Was Hume an Atheist?
- 11. Irreligion and the Unity of Hume’s Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Interpretations of Hume’s philosophy of religion are often made against the background of more general interpretations of his philosophical intentions. From this perspective, it is not unusual to view Hume’s views on religion in terms of the skepticism and naturalism that feature prominently in his Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40), his first and most ambitious philosophical work. According to an earlier scholarly consensus, prevalent throughout much of the twentieth century, Hume removed almost all the material in the Treatise that was concerned with religion because he was anxious to avoid offending the religious establishment. In his later works, beginning with the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748), Hume began to present his views on this subject in a more substantial and direct manner. This culminates in his Natural History of Religion (1757) and Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1779; published posthumously) – both of which are entirely on religion. The linkage between these various works, on this earlier scholarly account, is that the later writings on religion are simply an extension and application of the sceptical and naturalistic principles that Hume developed in his earlier writings.
In more recent scholarship, there has been a growing awareness that the earlier scholarly consensus seriously underestimates the irreligious content and aims of Hume’s earlier work - particularly in the Treatise. Moreover, the earlier consensus is liable to overlook the way in which 17th and 18th century theological controversies and debates structure and shape Hume’s entire philosophy — not just his philosophy of religion. Put another way, Hume’s philosophy of religion is now increasingly viewed as integral to his entire philosophical system, rather than as an extraneous outgrowth or extension of earlier concerns and commitments that lack any specific irreligious motivation or orientation.
In the opening paragraph of the last section of the first Enquiry (XII) Hume observes that the central philosophical debate of his day was waged between “speculative atheist[s]” and “religious philosophers” over the question of the existence of God (EU.149/12.1).
This observation highlights that the central debate that shapes Hume’s views on the subject of religion was not the empiricist/rationalist controversy or its “British”/“continental” correlate (this influential but misguided approach to early modern philosophy was introduced by nineteenth century German scholarship in the wake of Kant’s “Copernican Revolution” in epistemology; see Vanzo 2016), but rather a more fundamental dispute between philosophical defenders of Christian belief and their “atheistic” opponents. It is this divide over issues of religion that is especially important for understanding the positions and arguments that Hume presents throughout his philosophical writings.
During the 17th and early 18th centuries British philosophy gave rise to two powerful but conflicting philosophical outlooks. On one hand, this era has been described as “the golden period of English theology” (Stephen 1962, 66) because of the deepening alliance between philosophy and theology. It was, in particular, a major concern of a number of divines at this time to show that basic Christian theology could be provided with a rational defence — one that would ward off all threat of scepticism and atheism. Among the leading representatives of this tradition were Henry More, Ralph Cudworth, John Locke, Samuel Clarke, George Berkeley and Joseph Butler. (More and Cudworth were both Cambridge Platonists.) On the other hand, in opposition to this Christian tradition, there existed a sceptical tradition of which the greatest representative was Thomas Hobbes. Closely aligned with Hobbes was the work of Benedict Spinoza, whose Theological-Political Treatise (1670) and Ethics (1677) pursued a number of perceived Hobbesean themes in a more explicit and radical fashion, including anti-clericalism, biblical criticism, scepticism about miracles, materialism and necessitarianism (see Israel 2001). Almost all the defenders of basic Christian theology during this period had their arguments targeted against the “atheistic” doctrines of Hobbes and Spinoza.
Another important source of motivation for “atheistic” or irreligious thought during this period was the sceptical philosophy of Pyrrho, as presented in the writings of Sextus Empiricus. Pierre Bayle describes the significance of Pyrrhonianism in his influential Historical and Critical Dictionary (1697, 2nd ed. 1702), a work that we know was read carefully by the young Hume. In his article on “Pyrrho” Bayle argues that whereas “natural sciences” and “the state” have no reason to be afraid of Pyrrhonism, things stand otherwise as regards “divine science” (i.e. theology) and “religion,” for the latter, he says, require “certainty,” and so “collapse” when subjected to Pyrrhonian skepticism (Bayle, Dictionary, Note B; p. 195).
Bayle’s own view that philosophy and theology should be sharply separated, on the ground that the doctrines of theology could not be defended by reason and were therefore a matter of faith alone, brought his work under the suspicion of atheism. In general, it was common among Hume’s immediate predecessors and contemporaries to associate scepticism closely with atheism. (Hume’s writings allude to this at various points. See, e.g., MEM, Sect. II, #40; and D, Introduction.)
A significant development in the late 17th century relating to the war against the perceived atheism of Hobbes, Spinoza, and their followers was the establishment of the Boyle Lectures in 1691. These lectures, founded by the distinguished scientist Robert Boyle, served the purpose of defending basic Christian theology against “notorious Infidels,” in particular atheists (see MacIntosh 2006) — a project that had considerable overlap with the project outlined half a century earlier by Descartes in the Letter of Dedication of the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). By the early 18th century the Boyle lectures had become the focus for the debate between religious philosophers (amongst which the Newtonians emerged as particularly important and influential) and speculative atheists. The most influential of the Boyle lecturers was Samuel Clarke, who was a close friend of Newton’s and widely recognized as the most able defender of Newtonian philosophy and theology. Clarke’s Boyle lectures, published in 1704 as A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, developed an elaborate version of the cosmological argument (or “argument a priori” as it was then called), an argument then very much in vogue, having been sketched in influential books like John Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690). Locke and Clarke took the cosmological argument to be capable of demonstrating the existence of God with mathematical certainty. Clarke’s version of this argument enjoyed considerable prestige throughout the first half of the 18th century and found strong support among several Scottish philosophers of considerable reputation at this time. In addition to the cosmological argument, the design argument was also widely endorsed by religious philosophers and scientists at this time, including Newton himself. It is these two alleged proofs for the existence of God that Hume’s philosophical writings are particularly concerned with discrediting.
Hume’s Scottish contemporaries were heavily involved in the general British debate between “religious philosophers” and “speculative atheists.” Prominent Scottish defenders of Clarke-inspired cosmological arguments included Andrew Baxter, and prominent Scottish defenders of design arguments included the Newtonians George Cheyne and Colin Maclaurin. There is little doubt that Hume was well aware of these figures; he was a student at Edinburgh University in the 1720s, where Maclaurin was professor, and as a young man he lived in the Borders area of Scotland, where Baxter was active.
In Hume’s own lifetime his philosophy was widely viewed by Scottish, English and Continental critics in both Scotland and England as being “atheistic” in character and generally hostile to religion, not only on account of late writings like the Dialogues, but also on account of Hume’s early writings, including the Treatise. One of the most significant developments in recent Hume scholarship is the rehabilitation of this earlier view.
A good starting point for understanding Hume’s views on theism is his empiricism. The potential for empiricism to produce skeptical conclusions concerning our knowledge of God was already apparent in Hobbes’s work, which embraced similar empiricist principles concerning the foundations of human knowledge. The most striking aspect of Hobbes’s position on this subject is his claim that we have no positive idea of a God with infinite attributes.
Whatever we imagine is finite. Therefore there is no idea or conception of anything we call infinite. No man can have in his mind an image of infinite magnitude, nor conceive infinite swiftness, infinite time, or infinite force, or infinite power … And therefore the name of God is used, not to make us conceive him (for he is incomprehensible, and his greatness and power are inconceivable), but that we may honour him. Also because whatsoever … we conceive has been perceived first by sense, either all at once or by parts, a man can have no thought representing anything not subject to sense… (Hobbes, Leviathan, 3.12)
Consistent with this view Hobbes provides a minimalist and negative theology. According to Hobbes, our idea of God is like a blind man’s idea of fire. A blind man lacks any positive idea of “what kind of thing fire is,” knowing only that fire is “that somewhat” that “warm[eth] him”; analogously, we lack any positive idea of a God with infinite attributes, and understand by “God” only the cause of the world (Hobbes, Citizen, 15.14; Leviathan, 31.15). Attempts to ascribe further positive attributes to God are rejected as anthropomorphism (Hobbes, Human Nature, 11.3; Leviathan, 31.25-28; Citizen, 15.14). Clearly, then, Hobbes employs his empiricist principles to emphasize the “narrow limits of our phantasy,” putting knowledge of a God with infinite attributes beyond the scope of human understanding.
Theists responding to Hobbes’s empiricist scepticism concerning our idea of God had three basic options. One was to reject his empiricist principles concerning the origin of all our ideas and argue that our idea of God is either innate or derived from reason. Another alternative was to accept empiricism about the origin of our ideas but deny that this has any sceptical implications for our knowledge of God. This is the route Locke takes in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding, where it is argued that our idea of God is a complex idea arrived at by augmenting simple ideas acquired through reflection on our experience of the operations of our minds. A third alternative, which had been favoured by Catholic and Protestant orthodoxy, was to allow the experiential origin of ideas but then go on to say that ideas of creaturely attributes can be applied to God analogously, on the basis of a supposed degree of similarity or resemblance between God and creatures. This route was taken by, among others, the Irish theologian Peter Browne in Things Divine and Supernatural Conceived by Analogy with Things Natural and Human (1733). This issue concerning our idea of God was fundamental to the whole early 18th century theological debate as it concerned the various schools of “religious philosophers.” During this period freethinking critics (e.g. Toland and Collins) used these difficulties to argue, along the lines of Hobbes, that we have no clear idea of God. Hume’s views about the origins and nature of our ideas should be considered with reference to this controversy.
What is fundamental to Hume’s entire empiricist program in the Treatise is his “copy-principle” or the claim that “all our ideas, or weak perceptions, are derived from our impressions, or strong perceptions, and that we can never think of any thing which we have not seen without us, or felt in our minds” (TA, 16–7/ 647). Hume goes on to observe that this “discovery” is of considerable importance “for deciding all controversies concerning ideas”. “Whenever any idea is ambiguous”, he continues, we always have “recourse to the impression, which must render it clear and precise” (TA, 7/648). If we suspect that “any philosophical term has no idea annexed to it”, Hume suggests, we can always ask “from what impression that pretended idea is derived?” (TA, 7/648–9) If no impression can be produced, we must conclude “the term is altogether insignificant” (TA, 7/ 648).
Given the prominence of the copy-principle in Hume’s philosophical system, and its obvious relevance to the debate concerning our idea of God, it is surprising to find that in the Treatise Hume barely mentions our idea of God, much less provides any detailed account of the nature and origin of this idea. It would be a mistake, however, to conclude from this that theological problems, as they concern our idea of God, are far from his mind. On the contrary, neglecting this topic, in face of the ongoing debate and its obvious relevance for Hume’s philosophy in the Treatise, could be a way of suggesting a (strong) sceptical message.
In the Enquiry, Hume offers a Lockean account of the origination of the idea of God, saying that “[the] idea of God, as meaning an infinitely intelligent, wise, and good Being, arises from reflecting on the operations of our own mind, and augmenting, without limit, those qualities of goodness and wisdom” (EU, 2.6/19; and cp. TA, 26/656; EU, 7.25/72). Here our idea of God is treated as complex and derived from simple ideas based on reflection on the operations of our own minds, which we “augment without limit.” We would be misguided if we took this account at face value, however.For, to start with, we know from Hume’s private correspondence that he considered the idea of God to be problematic, writing to William Mure in 1743 (i.e., in the period between the publication of the Treatise and Enquiry) that inasmuch as God is not the object of “any Passion or Affection” or of “the Senses or Imagination,” and “very little of the Understanding” as well, it follows that God is “unknown to us” and cannot “excite any Affection” in us (LET, I, 51/#21). Hume goes on to recognize that “enthusiasts” distort God “into a Resemblance with themselves, & by that means render him more comprehensible,” but this, he notes, is a degradation of the idea of God. This take on the idea of God is clearly more Hobbesean than Lockean.
Second, in Enquiry XI Hume presents a critique of our “conjectures” about God’s nature and attributes, as based on evidence of design in this world. In this section Hume emphasizes the point that God’s being is “so different, and so much superior” to human nature that we are not able to form any clear or distinct idea of his nature and attributes, much less one based on our own qualities and characteristics.
The Deity is known to us only by his productions, and is a single being in the universe, not comprehended under any species or genus, from whose experienced attributes or qualities, we can, by analogy, infer any attribute or quality in him… (EU, 11.26 / 144)
In a later passage Hume goes on to remark that God is “a Being, so remote and incomprehensible, who bears much less analogy to any other being in the universe than the sun to a waxen taper, and who discovers himself only by some faint traces or outlines, beyond which we have no authority to ascribe to him any attribute or perfection” (EU, 11.27 / 145–6 — my emphasis). It is, evidently, Hume’s considered view that in respect of our idea of God we lack the relevant impressions that can serve as the origin of this idea.
Third, in Dialogues X Hume goes on to argue, even more radically, that the analogy between creaturely attributes and the supposed attributes of God is not only weak, but breaks down altogether in view of the evil that the theist believes God allows in the world. For since “neither man nor any animal are happy” it follows that an omnipotent God must “not will their happiness,” in which case God’s “benevolence and mercy” cannot in any significant way be said to resemble or be analogous to “the benevolence and mercy of men” (Dialogues, X, 23).
We see then that Hume is in substantial agreement with Hobbes that in respect of our idea of God, our predicament is much the same as that of a blind man trying to form the idea of fire.
In Lucretius’s The Nature of the Universe – which is the greatest classical statement of a system of atheism – it is argued that it is impossible that matter was created and that it must, therefore, be eternal and uncreated. The basis of this argument is the general causal principle: “Nothing can come from nothing” [Ex nihilo, nihil fit.] In the late 17th and early 18th centuries this principle was turned against the Epicurean atheism of thinkers such as Lucretius and his modern counterparts. More specifically, the principle “Nothing can come from nothing” was taken to ground two derived principles of causal reasoning. The first is the causal maxim: Whatever exists must have a cause or ground for its existence. The second principle is that of causal adequacy or the order of causes: No cause can produce or give rise to perfections or excellences that it does not itself possess. These two (derived) causal principles were used by religious philosophers like Cudworth, Locke and Clarke as the philosophical foundation for their own versions of the cosmological argument. It fell to Hume to argue that the causal foundations of this argument were too weak to support the philosophical weight placed upon them.
Hume’s most explicit assault on the cosmological argument appears in Part IX of his Dialogues. In this context, he specifically mentions Clarke and condenses his argument into a few sentences:
Whatever exists must have a cause or reason of its existence; it being absolutely impossible for any thing to produce itself, or to be the cause of its own existence. In mounting up, therefore, from effects to causes, we must either go on in tracing an infinite succession, without any ultimate cause at all, or must at last have recourse to some ultimate cause, that is necessarily existent… (D, 9.3/188 — Hume’s emphasis)
There cannot be an infinite succession of causes and effects without any ultimate cause at all, the argument runs, because this would fail to provide any cause or reason for the whole series or causal chain. That is to say, we need to explain “why this particular succession of causes existed from eternity, and not any other succession, or no succession at all.” Clearly the series cannot be produced by nothing. We may conclude, therefore, that the universe must have arisen from some “necessarily existent Being, who carries the Reason of his existence in himself; and who cannot be supposed not to exist without an express contradiction.” (D, 9.3/189). This necessarily existent being is God.
It is also essential to this argument to prove that the necessarily-existent being cannot be (unintelligent, inactive) matter. Clarke’s argument, as paraphrased by Hume, is based on the contingency of matter and particular form of the world.
“Any particle of matter”, it is said, “may be conceived to be annihilated; and any form may be conceived to be altered.” Such an annihilation or alteration, therefore, is not impossible. (D, 9.7/190)
Another argument that Clarke provides (not mentioned by Hume in the Dialogues) to show that it is impossible for matter to be “the final and original being” is that we cannot explain the origin of motion and intelligence in the world if matter is the first, original self-existing being. The basic principle that Clarke relies on to establish this conclusion is, once again, that “nothing can come from nothing”. In this case the principle is interpreted as implying that “in order of causes and effects, the cause must always be more excellent than the effect.” [Clarke, Demonstration, 38] It is impossible, on this account, “that any effect should have any perfection, which was not in the cause”. On the basis of this principle — the causal adequacy principle — Clarke and other like-minded thinkers maintained that it is demonstratively certain that matter and motion cannot produce thought and intelligence. Therefore, the original, self-existent being must be an intelligent, immaterial being. To suppose the contrary, they claim, would be a plain contradiction.
It is evident that the foundations of this argument rest with the related causal principles that everything must have a cause or ground for its existence and that no effect can have any perfection that is not also in its cause. To deny either of these causal principles is, on Clarke’s account, to reject the more general principle that “nothing can come from nothing” (a principle that the atheists such as Lucretius have themselves acknowledged). In the Treatise Hume develops an account of causation that directly contradicts these causal principles. Contrary to the causal maxim, Hume maintains, it is entirely possible for us to conceive of something beginning to exist without any cause. To deny this implies no contradiction and, therefore, this principle is neither intuitively nor demonstratively certain (T, 1.3.3/78–9). Granting that whatever is conceivable or non-contradictory is possible, it follows that it is possible that there exists a causal series that came into existence uncreated or has always existed without any further cause or ground for its existence.
Just as Hume rejects the claim that it is absurd or contradictory to deny that there must be a cause for everything that comes into existence, he also denies that it is impossible for an effect to have perfections that its cause lacks. Contrary to this view, Hume maintains, “any thing may produce any thing” (T, 220.127.116.11/ 173; 18.104.22.168/247–8; EU, 12.29/ 164). All that there is to causation, as we experience and know it, is the constant conjunction or regular succession of resembling objects. In other words, to say X causes Y is to say that in our experience we discover that objects resembling X’s are always prior to and contiguous with objects resembling Y’s (T, 22.214.171.124–31/ 168–70). Our idea of causation as it exists in the world reaches no further than this. (See the entry on the metaphysics of causation.) On this basis Hume argues:
Creation, annihilation, motion, reason, volition; all these may arise from one another, or from any other object we can imagine. (T, 126.96.36.199/173; cp. 188.8.131.52/247)
In this way, Hume stands Lucretius on his head with a view to refuting those “religious philosophers” who aimed to refute Lucretius’s atheism using his own causal principle:
That impious maxim of the ancient philosophy, Ex nihilo, nihil fit, by which the creation of matter was excluded, ceases to be a maxim, according to my philosophy. Not only the will of the supreme Being may create matter; but, for aught we know a priori, the will of any other being might create it, or any other cause, that the most whimsical imagination can assign. (EU, 12.29n/164n)
Clearly, however, under cover of rejecting Lucretius’s general causal principle, Hume has established that a priori it is not impossible for matter and motion to produce thought and consciousness. On the contrary, not only is it a priori possible for matter to be as “active” as thought and consciousness, and actually produce thought and consciousness, this is exactly what we discover from experience (T, 184.108.40.206/248–9). The clear implication of all this is that there is no basis for the a priori claim that the material world is incapable of activity or producing thought and consciousness. Indeed, experience shows that this claim is actually false. There is, therefore, no basis for the a priori claim that there necessarily exists an original, self-existing being that is an immaterial, intelligent being (i.e., God).
Closely related to Hume’s critique of all efforts to demonstrate the existence of any being by means of a priori reasoning, is his critique of the notion of necessary-existence in general. In the Dialogues Hume explains his position as follows:
… there is an evident absurdity in pretending to demonstrate a matter of fact, or to prove it by arguments a priori. Nothing is demonstrable, unless the contrary is a contradiction. Nothing, that is directly conceivable, implies a contradiction. Whatever we conceive as existent, we can also conceive as non-existent. There is no being, therefore, whose non-existence implies a contradiction. Consequently there is no Being whose contradiction is demonstrable. (D, 9.5/189; cp, EU,12.28–34/ 164–5)
As Hume puts the point in the Treatise, when we believe that God exists our “idea of him neither encreases nor diminishes” — we simply conceive of “the idea of such, as he is represented to us” in a more forceful or vivid manner (T, 220.127.116.11/94; cp. 18.104.22.168n/96n). We join nothing to our idea of his parts or qualities, nor do we have a distinct and separate idea of existence itself (e.g., qua abstract idea). In so far as we have any clear idea of God we can conceive of him existing or not existing. From these observations Hume draws the conclusion that the words “necessary existence, have no meaning; or what is the same thing, none that is consistent” (D, 9.6/190).
Hume applies this point directly to the claim that “the material world is not the necessarily existent Being”. If it is possible to conceive of the material world as not existing the same is true of God: we can imagine him “to be non-existent, or his attributes to be altered” (D, 9.7/190). If God’s non-existence is impossible because of some “unknown inconceivable qualities”, why should we assume that these qualities do not belong to matter? All this puts an end to the efforts of Clarke and likeminded “religious philosophers” to prove that God necessarily-exists.
Another argument that Hume presents, in criticism of the cosmological argument, concerns the assumption that an infinite series of causes and effects requires some explanation or cause for its existence.
… The WHOLE, you say, wants a cause. I answer, that the uniting of these parts into a whole, like the uniting of several distinct counties into one kingdom, or several distinct members into one body, is performed merely by an arbitrary act of mind, and has no influence on the nature of things. Did I show you the particular cause of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable, should you afterwards ask me, what was the cause of the whole twenty. This is sufficiently explained in explaining the cause of the parts. (D, 9.9/190–1)
The step in this argument that seems most questionable is the claim that because each element in the causal chain has been explained, in terms of some earlier member of the chain, we have “sufficiently explained” why there exists any such chain or why this particular chain exists. Critics will argue that this has plainly not been done. One response to this is argue that it is a philosophical mistake to look for an explanation of this kind, on the ground that a cause must be prior to its effect in time and it is evident that nothing can be prior to a series of causes and effects that is without any beginning or exists for eternity (D, 9.8/190). Related to this point, it may also be argued, more generally, that it is impossible for us to frame any idea of Creation (i.e., God creating the whole world) because our idea of causation presupposes a framework of ideas that already requires the existence of objects in the world (cp.T,22.214.171.124–10/ 173–4). That is to say, it is a mistake to conceive of the cosmological question in causal terms because this takes us beyond the scope of human ideas and understanding. Hume’s general analysis of the nature of causation, as developed in the Treatise and first Enquiry, makes clear that this is his view of this matter. For human beings, therefore, given our epistemological limits, the existence of this world must be treated as a basic brute fact that is incapable (for us) of further explanation.
Finally, Hume’s against the notion of necessary existence have obvious relevance also for Descartes’s effort, in Meditations III, to prove that God necessarily exists by way of reasoning from our (innate) idea of God. Since a priori any thing may cause any thing, it follows that even if we had an idea of a perfect being there would be no basis for the claim that God must be the source of this idea. Similarly, since we have no (abstract) idea of existence, distinct from the conception of particular objects, there is no basis for claiming, as does Descartes in Meditations V, that the idea of God implies his actual existence. Whatever idea of God we are able to frame is an idea of something that we can conceive of as either existing or not existing. Existence is not some further quality or “perfection” which a being possesses along with its other attributes. There is, therefore, no contradiction involved in denying that God exists.
An obvious limitation of the cosmological and ontological arguments is that they are highly abstract and, while they may convince a few philosophers and theologians, they cannot serve as the basis of religious belief for most ordinary people (D, 9.11/191–2). Things are very different, however, in the case of the argument from design. The defenders of this argument have often claimed that it is so obvious and convincing that even sceptics cannot seriously doubt or deny it (D,3.7/154, 12.2/214). The argument from design is discussed by Hume in Section XI of the first Enquiry and, at greater length, in the Dialogues (Parts II-VIII, XII). There are also several references to the argument from design in The Natural History of Religion (NHR, Intro, 5.2,6.1, 15.1), where Hume presents it as the most plausible and convincing of the various arguments that have been advanced on this topic (cp. LG, 24–6). It is, nevertheless, Hume’s plain intention throughout these works to expose the weaknesses and limitations of this argument.
At the beginning of Part II of the Dialogues Philo, who speaks as the “careless sceptic” and is generally identified as representing Hume’s views, presents a challenge to the orthodox theist position similar to that which Hobbes had presented.
But surely, where reasonable men treat these subjects, the question can never be concerning the being, but only the nature of the Deity. The former truth, as you well observe, is unquestionable and self-evident. Nothing exists without a cause; and the original cause of this universe (whatever it be) we call GOD; and piously ascribe to him every species of perfection. … But as all perfection is entirely relative, we ought never to imagine, that we comprehend the attributes of this divine Being, or to suppose, that his perfections have any analogy or likeness to the perfections of a human creature. (D,2.3/142)
In this way, it is Philo’s position that all we know about God is that he exists (qua cause of the universe) but beyond this we have no idea or understanding of his nature or attributes. “Our ideas”, says Philo, “reach no further than experience: We have no experience of divine attributes and operations: I need not conclude my syllogism: You can draw the inference yourself.” The conclusion is that God’s nature is “adorably mysterious and incomprehensible.” (D,2.4/143)
Philo’s sceptical challenge is met by Cleanthes, who has the role in the Dialogues of presenting and defending the argument from design.
Look around the world: Contemplate the whole and every part of it: You will find it to be nothing but one great machine, subdivided into an infinite number of lesser machines… All these various machines, and even their most minute parts, are adjusted to each other with an accuracy, which ravishes into admiration all men, who have ever contemplated them. The curious adapting of means to ends, exceeds the productions of human contrivance; of human design, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man; though possessed of much larger faculties, proportioned to the grandeur of the work, which he has executed. (D, 2.5/143 — our emphasis)
The structure of this argument seems clear. (1) There is an analogy or resemblance between the world and man-made machines in respect of their shared features of order, structure, harmony and the evident way that their parts are suited to perform some function or serve certain ends. (2) When we discover an object that has these features (i.e. order, structure, harmony, etc.) we infer that these objects have not just come together by chance. For example, if we discover a watch or a house our experience leads us to believe “that there is an original principle of order in mind, not in matter” (D, 2.14/146; cp. EU, 4.4/26; 5.7/45). (3) The principle that guides this inference is that similar effects must arise from similar causes. (4) It follows from these premises that we can (rationally) infer the existence of God and “his similarity to human mind and intelligence” (D, 2.5/143).
Philo maintains that this argument, although methodologically sound in so far as it is based on experience and not on a priori reasoning, nevertheless falls well short of what it claims to prove. The first point that Philo draws our attention to is the weakness of the analogy between the world and “human productions”. When there is a close resemblance or “exact similarity” among objects then we may infer a similar cause.
The exact similarity of the cases gives us a perfect assurance of a similar event; and a stronger evidence is never desired nor sought after. But wherever you depart, in the least, from the similarity of the cases, you diminish proportionably the evidence: and may at last bring it to a very weak analogy, which is confessedly liable to error and uncertainty. (D, 2.7/144; cp. T, 126.96.36.199/142)
The importance of this for the argument from design is clear. The gap between human artifacts and the whole universe is “vast” (D, 2.8/144, 12.6/216–7, 12.33/227). Any resemblance or similarity of this kind is so remote and slight that all reasoning on this basis is “both uncertain and useless” (EU, 11.23 /142). When we use analogies that are this weak and imperfect then only doubt and uncertainty can result (D, 2.17/147,5.1/165; T, 188.8.131.52/142).
In order to bring out the particular difficulties of the argument from design, and the way in which it has only the façade of ordinary experimental reasoning, Hume suggests the analogy of a house. When we see a house we naturally and reasonably conclude (i.e., with moral certainty) that “it had an architect or builder; because this is precisely that species of effect, which we have experienced to proceed from that species of cause” (D, 2.8/144). When we consider the universe, however, things are very different. In this case, we have experience of a unique effect: the universe. Moreover, our experience of this effect is limited to a small part or a “narrow corner” of it — from which we must make conjectures about the whole. Beyond this, we have no experience at all of its cause. Clearly, then, in a case of this kind we have no experience of “two species of objects” that are constantly conjoined on the basis of which we may draw some (reliable) inference (EU, 11.30/148; D, 2.24/149–50).
The contrast between ordinary cases of inference (e.g., house to human builder) and the design argument may be illustrated this way.
X = causes (builders, architects, etc.) Y = effects (houses)
1. Y1 ---- X1 2. Y2 ---- X2 3. Y3 ---- X3 … *. Yn / [Xn] ?
In this case our experience of the constant conjunction of Xs/Ys enables us to draw the inference to Xn, the unobserved cause of Yn. Our experience is of a series of conjunctions (1,2,3) where there is a close resemblance within each species of objects (i.e., among Xs and among Ys). We have direct experience of both kinds of objects (i.e., both Xs and Ys). In the case of the design argument our inference has this form.
Z = cause (God/creator) W = effect (world/universe)
* <W> / [Z*] ?
We have experience of only one W (i.e., our experience of W is unique). Our experience of W is partial and incomplete (hence <W>), since we know only a small part of it in both spacial and temporal terms. We have no experience of any Zs at all. In these circumstances the only basis for drawing any conclusion about the nature of Z* from our (unique and partial) experience of W is by supposing that W bears some resemblance to objects such as Ys, broadly conceived to cover all human artifacts and productions. There is, however, a vast difference between these effects. It follows that there is little or no basis for assuming that Z resembles something like Xs (i.e., human mind or intelligence). God’s nature, therefore, remains altogether “mysterious and incomprehensible” from the point of view of human understanding.
Cleanthes responds to this set of objections with a counter-example that is meant to discredit these criticisms and doubts. Suppose we heard an articulate voice coming from the clouds and the words uttered contain a message instructing us in a way that is worthy of a great, superior being. It is not possible, Cleanthes argues, that we would hesitate for a moment to ascribe some design or purpose to the cause of this voice and conclude that it bears some resemblance to the intelligent source of a human voice (D, 3.2–3/152–3). The situation is not so dissimilar as “when we hear an articulate voice in the dark and thence infer a man” (D, 3.3/152; cp. EU, 4.4/27). According to Cleanthes, it is similarly perverse and unnatural to deny that the various parts of the body and the way in which they are suited to our environment (e.g., legs for walking) are “incontestable proof of design and intention” (D, 3.8/155; cp. 2.9/144–5).
The fundamental difficulty with Cleanthes’s example is, however, that it suggests a non-traditional, anthropomorphic conception of God’s nature that cannot be overcome other than by arbitrary stipulation. Given the nature of the analogy, how are we to understand the nature of God’s mind? Does it have successive, distinct thoughts? If so, what sense can we make of God’s simplicity and immutability (D, 4.3/159)? Why should we not assume that God has other human features such as passions and sentiments, or physical features such as a mouth or eyes (D, 3.13/156, 5.11/168)? In all cases that we have experience of, human intelligence is embodied, so why not also assume that God has a body (D, 6.4–5/171–2)? What this plainly manifests is that the anthropomorphic conception of God, as defended by Cleanthes, reflects an egocentric outlook and delusions about the significance of human life in the universe.
Any experimental reasoning of the kind that the argument from design employs must ensure that the cause is proportioned to the effect. That is to say, we cannot “ascribe to the cause any qualities, but what are exactly sufficient to produce them” (EU, 11.12–3/136; D, 5.8/168). If we follow this principle, however, we are no longer in a position to assign several fundamental attributes to God. We cannot, for example, attribute any thing infinite to God based on our observation and experience of finite effects. Nor can we attribute unity to the original cause of the universe on the basis of any analogy to human artifacts such as houses; as they are often built by a number of people working together. Perhaps, therefore, there is more than one God involved in the creation of the universe? More importantly, we are in no position to attribute perfection to God unless we observe perfection in his creation. Since there are evidently “many inexplicable difficulties in the works of nature” we are not justified in making any inference of this kind (D, 5.6/166–7).
The mistake that Hume particularly warns against, in respect of the issue of God’s perfection, is that we cannot begin from the assumption that God is perfect, then assume that his creation is worthy of him, and then argue, on this basis, that we have evidence that God is perfect.
You find certain phenomena in nature. You seek a cause or author. You imagine that you have found him. You afterwards become so enamored of this offspring of your brain, that you imagine it impossible, but he must produce something greater and more perfect than the present scene of things, which is so full of ill and disorder. You forget, that this superlative intelligence and benevolence are entirely imaginary, or, at least, without any foundation in reason; and that you have no ground to ascribe to him any qualities, but what you see he has actually exerted and displayed in his productions. (EU, 11.15/ 137–8)
This problem is, of course, most acute when it comes to the “reality of evil” that we observe in the world. How do we vindicate God’s “infinite power and goodness” when we are faced with overwhelming evidence of (unnecessary and inexplicable) evil in the world? What we cannot do, Hume argues, is explain away all evidence of this kind by way of assuming that this world is the perfect creation of a perfect being. It is this assumption that needs to be established, so we must not assume it in our reasoning.
Hume’s aim, in this context, is not to argue that it is impossible that God is perfect but only that we are in no position to infer this unless our experience of this world, which is the sole source of our evidence concerning this issue, is both sufficiently comprehensive and uniformly consistent with the hypothesis. Plainly, however, it is neither. It follows from this that many other hypotheses and conjectures, consistent with the evidence presented, may be considered as no less plausible. Philo puts this point to Cleanthes:
In a word, Cleanthes, a man who follows your hypothesis is able, perhaps, to assert, or conjecture, that the universe, sometime, arose from something like design: But beyond that position he cannot ascertain one single circumstance, and is left afterwards to fix every point of his theology, by the utmost license of fancy and hypothesis. (D, 5.12/169 — our emphasis)
Philo goes on to suggest that, for all we know, this world “is very faulty and imperfect, compared to a superior standard”. Given this, we may also conjecture that this world was created by “some infant Deity, who afterwards abandoned it, ashamed of his lame performance” or it is “the production of old age and dotage in some superannuated Deity”, and so on (D, 5.12/169). The general point being made is that in the absence of clear evidence of perfection in this world we must “proportion the cause to the effect” and resist the temptation of “exaggeration and flattery to supply the defects of argument and reasoning” (EU, 11.14/137).
Hume’s line of reasoning criticizing the argument from design presents theists with a basic and seemingly intractable dilemma in respect of their idea of God. On the one hand, theists such as Cleanthes want to insist that the analogy between this world and human productions is not so slight and maintains, on this basis, that God in some significant degree resembles human intelligence (D, 3.7–8/154–5). The difficulty with this view, as we have seen, is that it leads to “a degradation of the supreme being” by way of an anthropomorphism which from the standpoint of traditional theism involves idolatry and is no better than atheism (D,2.15/146,3.12–3/156, 4.4–5/160, 5.11/168). On the other hand, if we follow mystics, such as Demea, we end up no better off than sceptics and atheists who claim that we know nothing of God’s nature and attributes and that everything about him is “unknown and unintelligible” (D, 4.1/158). Hume’s sceptical technique in the Dialogues, therefore, is to play one group of theists off against the other, showing that both their positions end up as nothing better or different from the atheism that they both claim to abhor.
On the interpretation provided, it is clear that Hume’s critique of the argument from design is deep and radical. There are, however, several passages in the final Part of the Dialogues (XII) that suggest that Philo (Hume) reverses or at least moderates his position — making some significant concessions to Cleanthes’s position. The most important evidence of this appears in a passage at the beginning of Part XII where Philo says that no one can be so stupid as to reject the view that there are signs of intention and design in this world and that it is evident, as Cleanthes has argued, “that the works of nature bear a great analogy to the productions of art” (D, 12.6/216–7 — my emphasis). Immediately after this, however, Philo proceeds to reverse his reversal (i.e., he performs a double-reversal). He insists, in particular, on the verbal or trivial nature of the whole dispute about whether we should call God a “mind” or “intelligence” and emphasizes, once again, “the vast difference, which may reasonably be supposed between him and human minds” (D, 12.6/216–7 — my emphasis). In an especially important passage, which was inserted into the Dialogues shortly before Hume died, Philo elaborates on his view. The truly pious, he argues, will acknowledge “that there is a great and immeasurable, because incomprehensible, difference between the human and the divine mind” (D, 12.7/218 — my emphasis). On the other hand, the atheist may allow that there is some “remote analogy” among the various operations of nature, including “the rotting of a turnip, the generation of an animal, and the structure of human thought” (D, 12.7/218). In other words, the atheist can concede that there is some remote analogy between the first principle of the universe and several other parts of nature—only one of which is human thought and mind (D, 12.7/218; and cp. 7.1/176–7). Hume’s point is that there are other analogies that are no less plausible than that which Cleanthes has suggested. These other analogies do not suggest that the cause of this world is something like mind or human intelligence. Clearly, then, the atheist may concede that there is some remote analogy between God and human minds and still insist that there remain other analogies and hypotheses that are no less plausible. The conclusion to be drawn from this is that all such analogies are so weak and “remote” that God’s nature remains an “inexplicable mystery” well beyond the scope of human understanding (D, 12.33/227; cp. NHR, 15.13).
Hume never retreats from the view stated in the first Enquiry that God (i.e., the cause of the world) is “a Being, so remote and incomprehensible, who bears much less analogy to any other being in the universe than the sun to a waxen taper, and who discovers himself only by some faint traces or outlines, beyond which we have no authority to ascribe to him any attribute or perfection” (EU, 11.27/146). This position is indistinguishable from the scepticism that Hume’s contemporaries associated with Hobbes’s perceived atheism.
The arguments of Hume’s that we have considered so far may all be described as sceptical arguments that are critical of efforts to prove the existence of God. No argument considered so far aims to prove that God does not or cannot exist. However, in the Dialogues Hume considers an ancient argument based on the existence of evil that is intended to establish this negative conclusion. It comes in the form of “Epicurus’s old questions” which remain “unanswered” (D, 10.25/198). The questions are these: Is God willing to prevent evil but unable to do so? Then he is not omnipotent. Is God able to prevent evil but unwilling to do so? Then he is malevolent (or at least less than perfectly good). If God is both willing and able to prevent evil then why is there evil in the world? (See the entry on the problem of evil.) What is at stake here is the possibility of vindicating God’s moral attributes in face of the existence of evil in this world. It is clear, as Cleanthes acknowledges, that if this cannot be done then the case for theism in any traditional form will collapse (D, 10.28/199).
Several different strategies are available to the theist to defuse this problem — that is, theodicies of various kinds. One strategy is to deny the reality of evil and insist that the evils we experience or observe in the world are really “goods to the universe” which are essential for a perfectly good whole. In other words, these are only evils relative to our individual, narrow, human perspective. From the divine perspective, viewing the universe as one system, the removal of such ills or afflictions would produce greater ill or diminish the total amount of good in the world. This strategy may be interpreted as arguing either that there are no real evils in the world (i.e., only apparent evils) or that there are real evils in the world but they are all necessary evils — without which the whole system of nature would not be so perfect (Cp. D, 10.5–7/194; EU, 8.34/101).
In respect of the first view, that there is no real evil, Hume takes the view that it is plainly contrary to human experience. The reality of the distinction between good and evil — whether physical or moral — depends on “the natural sentiments of the human mind”. These distinctions, based on feeling, cannot be altered or amended “by any philosophical theory or speculation whatsoever” (EU, 8.34–5/101–03). In the Dialogues Hume opens his discussion of the problem of evil by having Philo (the sceptic) run through a long catalogue of the variety and extent of misery and suffering in this world. He begins with animal suffering of various kinds (the strong preying on the weak etc.) and moves on to human suffering in its numerous forms (illness, emotional torments, war etc.). Even religion (i.e., “superstition”) is a source of fear and anxiety. Despite this catalogue of human suffering and grief, we find ourselves too afraid of death to put an end to our miserable existence. “We are terrified, not bribed to the continuance of our existence.” (D, 10.17/197) The conclusion that Philo draws from all this is that “the course of nature tends not to human or animal felicity” –which brings us back to “Epicurus’s old questions” (D, 10.25/198).
The first line of reply to this comes from Demea (the mystic) who argues that “the present evil phenomena … are rectified in other regions, and in some future period of existence” (D, 10.29/199). This is a view that is immediately corrected by Cleanthes along similar lines to those that Hume also presents in the first Enquiry. The problem here is that if we grant, with Demea, the reality of evil in this world then in so far as our understanding of God’s attributes is based on the evidence of his creation in this world, we are in no position to infer the “perfect goodness of the Deity”.
Now without some such license of supposition, it is impossible for us to argue from the cause, or infer any alteration in the effect, beyond what has immediately fallen under our observation. Greater good produced by this Being must still prove a greater degree of goodness: a more impartial distribution of rewards and punishments must proceed from a greater regard to justice and equity. Every supposed addition to the works of nature makes an addition to the attributes of the Author of nature; and consequently, being entirely unsupported by any reason or argument, can never be admitted but as a mere conjecture and hypothesis. (EU, 11.26/ 145)
Hume’s point is not that the reality of evil proves that God cannot be both omnipotent and perfectly good but that we are in no position to claim that we know that God will “rectify” the evil of this world (e.g., its unjust distribution of good and evil) in a future state, since the evidence of this world does not support such a conjecture. Our predicament is like that of a person who stands in the porch that leads into a very different building or structure and must conjecture what the complete or whole plan is like. We may hope or imagine that something better awaits us but the present phenomena do not license a conjecture or hypothesis of this kind (EU, 11.21,24/ 141,143).
Faced with this difficulty, Cleanthes insists that contrary to all that Philo and Demea have claimed, we must allow that there is more happiness than misery, more pleasure than pain, in this world. Failing this, “there is an end at once of all religion” (D, 10.28/199). Philo’s response is that this is a fatal concession. Not only will it be hard to prove that there is more happiness than misery in the world, much more than this is needed to vindicate God’s moral attributes. Unless all evil is essential or necessary the religious position will collapse. Any degree or kind of unnecessary evil — however small — would tell against the existence of God as an infinitely powerful and perfectly good being. The usual reply to this (echoing God’s answer to Job) is that we humans are in no position to tell whether there is any unnecessary evil in this world –for all we know, all the evil in this world is indeed necessary evil. It is arrogance to question God’s existence and goodness when we lack understanding of the infinite complexities of his creation.
The central thrust of Hume’s discussion of evil in the Dialogues is to show that this kind of theodicy fails.
I will allow, that pain or misery in man is compatible with infinite power and goodness in the Deity, even in your sense of these attributes: What have you advanced by all these concessions? A mere possible compatibility is not sufficient. You must prove these pure unmixed, and uncontrollable attributes from the present mixed and confused phenomena, and from these alone. (D,10.35/201)
Philo goes on to point out that even if the phenomena of nature were “pure and unmixed” (i.e., entirely good) they are still finite and so insufficient to prove God’s infinite perfection and goodness. The phenomena of nature are, in any case, not only finite, they are a mixture of good and evil, so any effort to prove God’s “infinite power and goodness” on this basis is a hopeless task. Here Philo claims to “triumph” (D, 10.36/201). Further on, Philo returns to this point.
… as this goodness is not antecedently established, but must be inferred from the phenomena, there can be no grounds for such an inference, while there are so many ills in the universe, and while these ills might so easily have been remedied, as far as human understanding can be allowed to judge on such a subject. I am sceptic enough to allow, that the bad appearances, notwithstanding all my reasonings, may be compatible with such attributes as you suppose: But surely they can never prove these attributes. (D, 11.12/211)
Clearly, then, the task required of traditional theism cannot be to establish merely the possibility that the existence of evil is consistent with God’s existence, it is to explain how we can infer God’s infinite power and goodness on the basis of our experience of finite phenomena that presents us with a mixture of good and evil in this world. It is this task, Philo maintains, that Cleanthes has failed to perform.
The subtlety of Hume’s argument is now clear. There is no need for the sceptic to launch a strong argument that aims to prove that God cannot exist on the basis of the real existence of evil in this world. All that the sceptic needs to do is to show that the theist is unable to prove or establish God’s attributes of infinite power and goodness given the evidence of creation as we observe it. What the theist must do, in order to meet this challenge, is to show that all the evil that exists in this world (i.e., every last degree and measure of it) is necessary and unavoidable. It is clear that the theist is in no position to support this claim. The mere possibility that this is the case will not suffice to justify the inference to God’s infinite power and goodness. We cannot, therefore, establish God’s moral attributes along the lines that Cleanthes has suggested.
Hume’s “concession” that evil and God’s existence are compatible may have the appearance of (another) “retreat” from a stronger sceptical position. The significance of this concession should not be exaggerated. While the sceptic cannot prove that there does indeed exist some unnecessary evil in the world, it is nevertheless possible to show that this view of things is in no way unreasonable. Hume describes a fourfold catalogue of causes of evil in this world none of which “appear to human reason, in the least degree, necessary or unavoidable” (D, 11.5/205). He asks, for example, why animal creation is not animated entirely by pleasure, as it appears “plainly possible to carry on the business of life without any pain” (D, 11.6/206). Similarly, why could God not have been more generous in providing his creatures with better endowments for their survival and happiness (i.e., why is God not more of an “indulgent parent”)? (D, 11.9/208) Again, why does nature run into such extremes in relation to heat and cold, rains, winds, and so on? Surely things could have been arranged so that these extremes and their destructive consequences could be avoided? Finally, Hume asks why God does not act through particular volitions to prevent specific catastrophes and disasters (e.g., why not ensure there is no storm blowing when a fleet is out at sea)? (D,11.8/206) In all these cases, Hume grants, there may “be good reasons, why providence interposes not in this manner; but they are unknown to us” (D, 11.8/207). The implication of all this is not just that we have no reason to infer the existence of an infinitely powerful and good God but that we have considerable reason for doubting it.
Given these considerations regarding the causes of evil, and the limits of human understanding, what is the most reasonable hypothesis concerning the first cause of the universe? Philo dismisses the suggestion that the first cause is either perfectly good or perfectly malevolent on the ground that “mixed phenomena” can never prove either of the unmixed principles as the first cause. This leaves only two other possibilities. Either the first cause has both goodness and malice or it has neither. Philo argues that the steady and orderly nature of the world suggests that no such (Manichean) “combat” between good and evil is going on. So the most plausible hypothesis is that “the original source of all things” is just as indifferent about “good above ill” as it is about heat above cold (D, 11.14/211–2). Nature is blind and uncaring regarding such matters and there is no basis for the supposition that the world has been created with human or animal happiness or comfort in mind. Any supposition of this kind is nothing better than an anthropomorphic prejudice (EU, 11.27/146; cp. D, 10.31/200).
The tendency of Hume’s discussion of evil, in both the Enquiry and Dialogues, is to insist on the reality of evil and the doubts that this casts on any claim that the beauty, harmony and order of this world provides us with clear evidence that an infinitely powerful and good being created and governs it. As we have noted, Hume’s argument falls short of categorically denying that God exists on the ground that there is unnecessary evil in this world. What Hume’s arguments do show, however, is that while it is possible that the reality of evil is consistent with the existence of God this leaves theism with a large and significant problem that remains unanswered. The enormous degree of evil in this world, and the vast range of forms that it takes, are impossible to explain or justify from our human perspective (i.e., given the limits of human understanding). There is, therefore, no basis for inferring the existence of an infinitely powerful and good God in face of contrary evidence of this kind — evidence that provides us with considerable grounds for doubting this conjecture or hypothesis.
Miracles are an essential and fundamental element of the major monotheistic religions (i.e., Judaism, Christianity, Islam). The accounts of miracles, as presented in scripture and elsewhere, are supposed to confirm the authenticity and authority of scripture and the prophets and, more importantly, establish that God has revealed himself to human beings through these special acts or events. From the point of view of Christianity, one miracle of particular significance is the resurrection of Jesus Christ. To doubt or question the truth of this event is to doubt the core and distinct meaning and doctrine of the Christian religion. It would be to cast doubt on the claim that Christ is God and the saviour of human kind. A major concern of Hume’s, especially as presented in Section X of the first Enquiry, was to discredit miracle claims of this kind — a concern Hume shared with many other religious critics of his day (see Burns 1981).
According to Hume’s account, “a miracle is a violation of a law of nature” (EU, 11.12/114). More specifically, it is “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity, or by the interposition of some invisible agent” (EU, 11.12n/115n). As defined, a miracle may occur without any person observing it (i.e., it may be completely unknown). Hume’s additional proviso that a miracle is not only a violation of a law of nature but also requires the direct activity of God (or some “invisible agent”) is a significant qualification. It follows from this that we cannot establish that a miracle has occurred by showing only that the laws of nature have been violated, as this may only be a chance or capricious event (EU, 8.25/96; cp. T, 184.108.40.206/171). Nevertheless, the key issue, for Hume’s critique of miracles, is whether or not we ever have reason to believe on the basis of testimony that a law of nature has been violated. Hume’s arguments lead to the conclusion that we never have reason to believe miracle reports as passed on to us.
A law of nature, as Hume interprets it, involves a uniform regularity of events. We discover laws of nature on the basis of our experience of constant conjunctions of events or objects. An obvious example of this, provided by Hume, is that “all men must die” (EU, 11.12/114). It would, therefore, be “a miracle, that a dead man should come to life” because we have “uniform experience” that tells against such a claim (EU, 11.12/ 115). When we have uniform experience that confirms the existence of regularities of this kind we have, says Hume, “a direct and full proof, from the nature of the fact, against the existence of the miracle” (EU, 11.12/115). The point that Hume is concerned to make here is that the “ultimate standard” by which we must judge whether a miracle has occurred is (much) higher than it is in the case of other reports claiming to establish some unusual or unexpected event. It is, for example, no miracle that a man in good health should suddenly die. Although an event of this kind may be improbable, it does sometimes occur. In the case of miracles, however, we are asked to believe something that is contrary to all other experience and observation (e.g., resurrection from the dead). Miracles must be unique (or nearly unique) events otherwise they fall within the “common course of nature”, no matter how rare and unusual the event may be.
Given this account of miracles, understood as violations of laws of nature, how should we evaluate claims that miracles have occurred? The principle that Hume relies on, for this purpose, is that a reasonable person “proportions his belief to the evidence” (EU, 11.4/110). In the case of miracles, the relevant evidence that we need to weigh comes from two distinct sources that must be balanced against each other. On one side, there is the question of the credibility of the witnesses to the event. That is to say, we need to ask if we can rely on the truthfulness and judgment of the individual(s) who report that the relevant event took place. On the other side, there is the question of the credibility of the fact itself (i.e., that a violation of a law of nature occurred). Clearly, in circumstances where there is some opposition between these two sets of considerations, the reasonable person will believe that which has the superior evidence in its support.
If we follow this procedure, Hume claims, we must conclude that “no testimony for any kind of a miracle has ever amounted to a probability, much less to a proof; and that, even supposing it amounted to a proof, it would be opposed by another proof….” (EU, 11.35/ 127). Hume establishes this general point in two related moves. The evidence telling against the occurrence of a miracle must always constitute a full proof — since we have uniform human experience in support of the laws of nature (EU, 11.12/115). It follows from this:
That no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavours to establish; and even in that case there is a mutual destruction of arguments… (EU, 11.13 / 116)
The only basis for giving any credibility to miracle reports – since by their nature they are wholly unlikely — is to give weight and credibility to the character and authority of the witnesses to the event(s). However, even in the optimal case, where the credibility of the witnesses and their reports are judged to be beyond doubt and wholly reliable, we are faced with evidence that is equally opposed — “proof against proof”.
Hume’s argument, up to this point, supposes that the testimony in support of a miracle “amounts to an entire proof” and is wholly reliable. However, the fact is, Hume argues, that this concession is “a great deal too liberal”. If we consider the specific circumstances and conditions in which miracle reports generally occur, and the sources they come from, Hume believes we will have to conclude that testimony in support of actual historical miracles, of the kind that the major religions rely on, are far from reliable. The relevant standards by which we judge the reliability of testimony (i.e. in ordinary life — including law and history, as well as religion) involve several different considerations. Hume mentions four categories of consideration about the reliability of testimony. Each of them is such that the credibility of the testimony may be diminished when we give due weight to these factors.
The first category concerns the witnesses to the event. Obviously the credibility of an event increases when more witnesses attest to it. We also need to know about the character and competence of the witness(es). If they are educated, sensible and critical we will more readily believe them than if they are ignorant and gullible. A second category of consideration that Hume mentions is that there is a general psychological weakness in human nature whereby we want to believe in events that produce feelings of surprise and wonder because these are “agreeable emotions” (EU, 11.16/117).
As belief is almost absolutely requisite to the exciting our passions, so the passions in their turn are very favourable to belief… Admiration and surprise have the same effect as the other passions; and accordingly we may observe, that among the vulgar, quacks and projectors meet with a more easy faith upon account of their magnificent pretensions, than if they kept themselves within the bounds of moderation. The first astonishment, which naturally attends their miraculous relations, spreads itself over the whole soul, and so vivifies and enlivens the idea that it resembles the inferences we draw from experience. (T, 220.127.116.11 / 120)
This natural disposition leads to credulity and “subdues the understanding” (EU, 11.17/ 117–8; T, 18.104.22.168 / 113). “Love of wonder” is often joined with “the spirit of religion” whereby the religionist, “with the best intentions in the world, for the sake of promoting so holy a cause”, is more powerfully drawn to belief (EU, 11.17 / 117–8). Hume also notes that lies have been told in all ages and that the frequent repetition of lies promotes belief (T, 22.214.171.124 / 117; cp. T, 126.96.36.199 / 86). More generally, custom and education influence belief and in many cases “take such deep root that ‘tis impossible for us, by all the powers of reason and experience to eradicate them” (T, 188.8.131.52 / 116). The third range of factors Hume mentions are the variable historical and social conditions that affect credulity. Although there is a universal propensity to credulity, Hume notes that miraculous and supernatural events “are observed chiefly to abound among ignorant and barbarous nations” (EU, 11.20 / 119). Finally, the authority of miracle reports is diminished by the consideration that the miracle reports coming from rival religions tend to diminish the authority and credibility of all of them (EU, 11.24 / 121–2). The result of giving weight to these various considerations is that the credulity of actual historical miracle claims is radically diminished. Hume believes that there is no probability left in support of them.
Hume’s views on miracles have been criticized from a variety of perspectives. Some critics have claimed that Hume, in laying down that miracles run up against uniform experience, is simply assuming at the outset that the probability of miracle occurrences is equal to zero (see Johnson 1999 and Earman 2003). In response to this is has been pointed out that Hume’s concern is not with the factual question as to whether miracles have occurred or not, but with the epistemic question of whether it can be rational to believe miracle reports (see, e.g., Fogelin 2003). An even more problematic line of criticism consists in claiming that Hume denies the very possibility of miracles occurring. As it stands, this misrepresents his view. According to Hume, miracles are entirely possible in the sense that there is no absurdity or contradiction involved in suggesting that the laws of nature are violated — this is at least conceivable. Nor does Hume deny that rare, unusual, surprising and wonderous events do actually occur. There may even be circumstances when extraordinary events of this kind may be justifiably believed on the basis of testimony (EU, 11.36 /127–8). Moreover, Hume also recognizes that events frequently occur that are unexpected and which we do not know the cause(s) of (EU, 8.12–4 / 86–7). None of these considerations, however, show that the laws of nature have actually been violated. On the contrary, our experience shows that when “irregular and extraordinary” events do occur a closer examination and investigation generally uncovers the relevant “hidden” or “concealed” causes that were at work. Only the ignorant and vulgar conclude, in circumstances of this kind, that the laws of nature have been violated or that a miracle has occurred. It is in this sense that Hume maintains that miracles do not occur. In this way, the evidence of experience shows us, Hume suggests, that nature is uniform and regular. When this appears not to be so, subsequent experience and closer investigation reveals that this is a sign only of human ignorance and credulity, not of any (incomprehensible) divine activity.
What really matters for assessing Hume’s critique of miracles is to keep in mind that his primary aim is to discredit the actual historical miracle claims that are supposed to provide authority and credibility for the major established religions — most obviously, Christianity. From this perspective, the central issue is not whether Hume is right in claiming that it is impossible for any miracle claim to be established as morally certain (i.e., “proved”), but if he is right in claiming that the historical miracle claims supporting the major religions such as Christianity pass this standard. It is Hume’s judgment that when we weigh the relevant evidence, and proportion our belief accordingly, we will find that these claims are rationally unbelievable.
According to Joseph Butler, an influential contemporary of Hume’s, the most important question that can possibly be asked is whether we are to live in a future state. It was Butler’s view that the doctrine of future rewards and punishments is fundamental to religion and essential for its practical influence over human life and conduct. This view of the importance of the doctrine of future rewards and punishments was accepted by almost all the leading theologians at this time (and is, of course, still widely accepted among religious thinkers today). It is evident that the immortality of the soul is an essential part of this doctrine. For Hume’s contemporaries, proofs of the immortality of the soul generally depended upon showing that the soul is immaterial.
There are two “metaphysical” arguments that aim to establish the immateriality of the soul that Hume is especially concerned with. The first argument, which is Platonic in origin, maintains that whereas mind is simple, unitary and indivisible, matter is compounded and infinitely divisible. It follows from this, according to this argument, that mind is distinct from matter and that only an immaterial being or substance is capable of thought and consciousness. Moreover, since immaterial minds are simple and indivisible they are incapable of destruction and continue to exist eternally (unless annihilated by divine power). A second and related argument is that it is impossible for matter and motion to produce thought and consciousness. For this to be possible we must suppose that a cause can produce effects that possess perfections that it lacks. Once again, this would be to suppose that something could be produced by nothing, which is absurd and contradictory.
Hume rejects both these metaphysical arguments for the immateriality and immortality of the soul. His refutations are presented, first, in the Treatise 1.4.5–6 and, later and more briefly, in his essay “Of the Immortality of the Soul”. (It is possible that this essay contains material that was originally intended for publication in the Treatise but was withdrawn.) Regarding the suggestion that thought and consciousness must belong to or inhere in an immaterial substance, Hume objects that we have no idea of either immaterial or material substance.
But just as metaphysics teach us, that the notion of substance is wholly confused and imperfect, and that we have no other idea of any substance than as an aggregate of particular qualities, inhering in an unknown something. Matter, therefore, and spirit are at bottom equally unknown; and we cannot determine what qualities may inhere in the one or in the other. (ESY, 591)
The important and intelligible issue, according to Hume, is not the question of the substance of thought but that concerning the cause of our perceptions (T, 184.108.40.206/ 246f). In respect of this issue, Hume invokes his general causal maxim that “any thing may produce any thing” in order to establish that a priori it is possible that matter may be the cause of thought (T, 220.127.116.11 / 247). Furthermore, experience shows us, Hume maintains, that there do exist constant conjunctions between matter and motion, on one side, and thought and consciousness on the other. Clearly, then, in so far as we have any idea of causation as it exists in the world, we must conclude that thought and consciousness can indeed arise from matter and motion (as the materialists maintain). In his essay on “Immortality” Hume expands on these points to argue that the evidence of experience shows us that thought and consciousness depends on our bodily existence and, therefore, bodily death must imply death of the mind as well (ESY, 596; cp. D, 6.5/171).
Apart from Hume’s sceptical arguments directed against the immateriality and immortality of the soul, he also advances sceptical arguments concerning the doctrine of future rewards and punishments. In the context of Section XI of the first Enquiry, as we have already noted, Hume argues that we have no adequate evidence, “derived from the present phenomena” of this world, that a future state will correct the injustices of this world. Hume presents the “religionist” with the following difficulty:
Are there any marks of a distributive justice in this world? If you answer in the affirmative, I conclude that, since justice here exerts itself, it is satisfied. If you reply in the negative, I conclude, that you have then no reason to ascribe justice, in our sense of it, to the gods. If you hold a medium between affirmation and negation, by saying, that the justice of the gods, at present, exerts itself in part but not to its full extent; I answer, that you have no reason to give it any particular extent, but only so far as you see it, at present, exert itself. (EU, 11.22 / 141–2 — Hume’s emphasis)
In the Treatise Hume advanced another set of arguments against the doctrine of a future state. In this context he argues that any idea or belief in life in a future state is too faint and weak to have any practical influence over our passions and conduct.
A future state is so far remov’d from our comprehension, and we have so obscure an idea of the manner, in which we shall exist after the dissolution of the body, that all the reasons we can invent, however strong in themselves, and however much assisted by education, are never able with slow imaginations to surmount this difficulty, or bestow a sufficient authority and force on the idea. (T, 18.104.22.168 / 114)
In general, says Hume, the lack of resemblance between this life and a future state destroys belief and, consequently, has little influence on our passions and conduct. Hume claims “there scarce are any, who believe the immortality of the soul with a true and established judgment” (T, 22.214.171.124 / 114–5). The evidence for this is that our conduct is usually guided with a view to the pleasures and pains, rewards and punishments, of this life and not a future state (T, 126.96.36.199 / 115; cp. D, 12.13/220–01).
Hume adds a further set of objections relating to the morally pernicious aspects of the doctrine of a future state of rewards and punishments. Among the several arguments that he puts forward on this score, four points are especially important. In the first place, Hume asks, what is the point or purpose of punishment in a future state? In this life we assume that punishment must not only be deserved, it must also achieve some relevant social end or value (e.g., contribute to the stability and peace of society). When we are removed from this world these goals are taken away and punishment becomes pointlessly retributive (ESY, 594). The implication of this is that punishment without any further point or purpose is mere vengeance that lacks any proper justification. Second, Hume asks on what basis God determines the extent of our merit and demerit. Among human beings the standard of merit and demerit depends on our moral sentiments and our sense of pleasure and pain. Are we to suppose that God also has human passions and feelings of this kind? (ESY, 594,595; cp. LET, I, 40 [#16]; D, 3.13/156) Third, the doctrine of eternal damnation clearly involves excessive punishment — even for the worst of crimes. Finally, the split between Heaven and Hell supposes “two distinct species of men, the good and the bad. But the greatest part of mankind float between vice and virtue.” (ESY, 594)
Hume’s position on the doctrine of a future state is clear. From every point of view this doctrine is considered unsound. It depends on metaphysical assumptions about the nature of mind (soul) that are philosophically unconvincing, involving obscure ideas that are plainly at odds with our everyday experience and observations concerning the relationship between mind and body. It also depends on assumptions about God’s goodness and justice that lack any adequate philosophical justification. Moreover, because the ideas and arguments involved in this doctrine are considered by Hume to be obscure and unconvincing, we find, in practice, that the doctrine has little or no influence in directing human conduct. Finally, not only is this doctrine considered by Hume to be philosophically flawed and psychologically feeble, it depends on moral principles that are both unjust and corrupting.
In 1757 Hume published “The Natural History of Religion”, a work that proposes to identify and explain the origins and evolution of religious belief. This project follows lines of investigation and criticism that had already been laid down by a number of other thinkers, including Lucretius, Hobbes and Spinoza. Hume’s primary objective in this work is to show that the origins and foundations of religious belief do not rest with reason or philosophical arguments of any kind but with aspects of human nature that reflect our weaknesses, vulnerabilities and limitations (i.e., fear and ignorance). Related to this point, Hume also wants to show that the basic forces in human nature and psychology that shape and structure religious belief are in conflict with each other and that, as a result of this, religious belief is inherently unstable and variable. In arguing for these points, Hume is directly challenging an opposing view, one that was widely held among his own orthodox contemporaries. According to this view (e.g., as presented by Cleanthes), the evidence of God’s existence is so obvious that no one sincerely and honestly doubts it. Belief in an intelligent, invisible creator and governor of the world is a universal belief rooted in and supported by reason. From this perspective, no person sincerely accepts “speculative atheism”. Hume’s “naturalistic” approach to religion aims to discredit these claims and assumptions of theism.
According to Hume, all that the various religions in the world have in common is belief that there is an invisible, intelligent power in the world (NHR, Intro, 4.1). Although there is a “universal propensity to believe in invisible, intelligent power” (NHR, 15.5), even religious belief of this limited kind is not entirely universal or any sort of “original instinct”. Hume also points out that religion of this most general kind is not to be confused with “genuine theism”. Genuine theism involves a more specific set of beliefs: that there is only one god and that god is the invisible, intelligent creator and governor of the world (NHR, 4.2). In several different contexts in The Natural History of Religion Hume suggests that the argument from design — based on our observation of beauty and order in the world — is a convincing and plausible basis for genuine theism (NHR, Intro, 6.1, 15.1). However, despite this veil of orthodoxy, his objective throughout this work is to show that the actual foundation of genuine theism, as we find it in the world, does not rest with reasoning or arguments of any kind. The true roots of genuine theism can be discovered in the psychological dynamics that first give rise to polytheism. The same (irrational) forces that shape polytheism serve to explain the rise of theism and the instability and variations that we discover within it.
Hume maintains that “polytheism or idolatry was, and must have been, the first and most ancient religion of mankind” (NHR, 1.1). Not only does the evidence of history make this clear (Hume discounts the historical reliability of the Hebrew Bible, which, as is well-known, presents a different picture), we know as well that if theism, based on the (obvious and convincing) argument of design, were the original religion then it would be impossible to explain how polytheism could have ever arisen out of it. That is to say, the argument from design would continue to have the same force and so we should not expect any deviation from it. What, then, is the origin of polytheism? The basis of polytheism is not the beauty and order we discover in the works of nature, as that leads us to genuine theism, it is rather “the various and contrary events of human life”. These are events (e.g., weather, illness, wars, etc.) that are unpredictable but important to us because they directly influence human happiness and misery. In respect of these events, which engage our deepest hopes and fears, we are generally ignorant of the causes that are involved in producing them — especially when human beings are in a more primitive and backward state of society. In these circumstances, the “ignorant multitude” conceives of these unknown causes as depending on invisible, intelligent agents who they may influence by means of prayers and sacrifice. By this means, human beings hope to control what they do not understand and are afraid of. As a result of this process, as shaped by human fears and ignorance, the world becomes populated with human-like invisible, intelligent powers that are objects of worship.
The religion of polytheism is very different from genuine theism in so far as it does not concern itself with the (abstract and speculative) question concerning the origin or supreme government of the universe. These are questions that primitive people who are struggling for their daily survival do not have time to speculate about. To this extent, therefore, polytheists and idolaters may be regarded as “superstitious atheists”, as they plainly have no idea of a being that corresponds to our idea of God (NHR, 4.2). From their perspective, however, genuine theists are guilty of atheism, since they deny the existence of the “subordinate deities” that polytheists worship (NHR, 4.10n27). The clear implication of these observations is that the notion of “atheism” — along with its negative connotations – is entirely relative to a particular religion and its particular conception of god or gods.
The question that Hume now turns to is how theism arose from polytheism. In respect of this issue, Hume observes that there are two conflicting tendencies in human nature.
And thus, however strong men’s propensity to believe invisible, intelligent power in nature, their propensity is equally strong to rest their attention on sensible, visible objects; and in order to reconcile these opposite inclinations, they are led to unite the invisible power with some visible object. (NHR, 5.2)
These conflicting demands are best satisfied by representing the various gods as something like ourselves and attributing particular qualities and attributes to them that are relevant to their specific sphere of influence (e.g., the god of war is cruel and ferocious etc.). Over time, among the vulgar, one of these gods will gradually emerge as a particular object of veneration and worship. In their anxiety to please and praise this god, worshippers will continually try to outdo their predecessors by attributing greater and greater powers and perfections to him. At last they will reach a point where they represent this god as infinite and entirely perfect, whereby they render his nature inexplicable and mysterious. The irony about this, Hume wryly observes, is that the vulgar arrive at a more “philosophical” conception of God by way of a process that is shaped by principles that are entirely unguided by reason.
At this stage, Hume’s genealogy of religion presents us with an account of the same general conflict that he portrays in Dialogues between Cleanthes’s anthropomorphism and Demea’s mysticism. This conflict, as Hume explains it, has deep roots in the dynamics of human nature and our conflicting propensities. The result of this process is an inherent instability in theism itself. On the one side, there is a tendency, originally present in polytheism, to anthropomorphize the gods in the hope of placating and controlling them. On the other side, our “exaggerated praise and compliments” produce a refined and abstract idea of god that no longer satisfies the vulgar imagination. The result of this situation is that there is “a kind of flux and reflux in the human mind, and that men have a natural tendency to rise from idolatry to theism, and to sink again from theism into idolatry” (NHR, 8.1).
The feeble apprehensions of men cannot be satisfied with conceiving their deity as a pure spirit and perfect intelligence; and yet their natural terrors keep them from imputing to him the least shadow of limitation and imperfection. They fluctuate between these opposite sentiments. (NHR, 8.2)
This influence of the human passions and propensities affects the stability of our idea of God in another way. Our natural fear of future events encourages a conception of God that is severe and cruel. At the same time, “the spirit of praise and eulogy” promotes an entirely contrary view (NHR, 176). Clearly, the general point that Hume aims to establish by means of these observations is that the natural sources of religion are in conflict with one another and generate a continual cycle of opposition and instability in our religious beliefs and idea of god.
Hume’s primary aim in The Natural History of Religion, as we have noted, is to show that the origin and foundations of religious belief does not rest with reason or philosophical argument. The origins of religious belief rest with human fear and ignorance, which gives rise, in the first place, to polytheism. The same psychological forces that give rise to polytheism gradually transform it into a system of theism. This system of theism is, however, itself a product of conflicting tendencies in human nature that result in an unstable oscillation between anthropomorphic and mystical ideas of god. As a result of this instability, there is a natural tendency for theism to slide back into some form of polytheism that postulates “demi-gods”, in order to satisfy the human need to have some image or impression of God (NHR, 8.2, 15.5). Hume’s remarks on this tendency allude, clearly enough, to the case of Jesus Christ understood as the (human) incarnation of God.
The conclusion that Hume draws from all this is that religion generally rests on human weaknesses and vulnerabilities and that reason has little influence over its evolution or stability. While “genuine theism” presents a view of God that is sublime and magnificent, most religion degrades and disfigures the idea of god.
Survey most nations and most ages. Examine the religious principles, which have, in fact, prevailed in the world. You will scarcely be persuaded, that they are any thing but sick men’s dreams. Or perhaps will regard them more as the playsome whimsies of monkeys in human shape, than the serious, positive, dogmatical assertions of a being who dignifies himself with the name of rational. (NHR, 184)
Richard Bentley, the first Boyle lecturer, neatly states the view that many theists hold concerning the relationship between religion and morality:
And if Atheism should be supposed to become universal in this nation… farewell all ties of friendship and principles of honor; all love for our country and loyalty to our prince; nay, farewell all government and society itself, all professions and arts, and conveniences of life, all that is laudable or valuable in the world. [Bentley, Folly of Atheism, in Works, III, 25]
The general view defended by Bentley, and many other apologists for religion, is that without religious principles and institutions to guide and motivate us, the moral world will collapse into nihilism, egoism and the arbitrary rule of power. This view of things was further confirmed, as Hume’s near contemporaries saw it, by the philosophy of Hobbes. Hobbes’s basic philosophical project was to advance a secular, scientific account of moral and political life. The foundation of this, however, rests with egoism and moral scepticism. That is to say, according to Hobbes, human nature is driven by psychological egoism and there is no real distinction between good and evil, right and wrong, just or unjust. It was a major task of Hume’s philosophy — particularly as presented in the Treatise — to reconstruct Hobbes’s secular, scientific account of morality while at the same time avoiding the extreme (undiluted) elements of moral scepticism and egoism present in it. Another way of stating these aims, is to say that Hume wanted to show that “speculative atheism” did not imply “practical atheism” or moral licentiousness.
As already noted, Hume’s Treatise appears to be modelled after the same plan as Hobbes’s project of a “science of man” as presented in The Elements of Law and Leviathan. On the basis of a naturalistic and necessitarian conception of human nature, Hume aims to show how moral motivation and practice is possible (i.e., to describe the possibility and reality of “virtuous atheism”). There are several key elements in Hume’s system of secular ethics. One important element is the role of the indirect passions in accounting for the sanctions and support provided to moral life. On Hume’s theory the virtues and vices are understood as simply pleasurable or painful qualities of mind (cp. T, 3.1.2). A vicious character, he argues, produces hate and humility (dishonour and shame) that makes us unhappy. In contrast with this, virtue produces love and pride, which makes us happy. This is the fundamental mechanism by which virtue is rewarded and vice is punished. This mechanism operates no less effectively among atheists, who have no belief in God or a future state, as it does among those with traditional theistic beliefs.
Another key element in Hume’s system of secular ethics is the role of sympathy. We are naturally constituted, Hume maintains, to share the emotions of our fellow human beings. The closer our relationship, and the more we resemble each other, the stronger the communication of emotion will be (T, 2.1.11; 188.8.131.52–21/362–5). By means of this principle of sympathy, human beings naturally take an interest in the happiness and welfare of others — especially our family, friends and neighbours. Hume denies, therefore, that human nature is wholly selfish or without any benevolent concerns or dispositions. At the same time, Hume also emphasizes the point that our sympathetic and benevolent tendencies are limited and highly partial — both of which pose serious obstacles for social peace and cooperation. Hume denies, in particular, that there is any “such passion in human minds, as love of mankind, merely as such, independent of personal qualities, of services, or of relation to oneself” (T, 184.108.40.206/ 481). In this way, while Hume plainly rejects Hobbist egoism and allows that we are naturally social beings in a number of significant respects (i.e., family, friends etc.), he also insists that our human nature is such that self-love and partiality are extremely strong and can and do lead to competition and conflict. This is something that we must find a solution to if we are to be able to live together in groups larger than families and small clans.
Our human nature, combining both passions and reason, provides a remedy for this problem. In the first place, Hume denies that we lack any real standard of right and wrong or good and evil. The relevant standard depends on our sentiments of pleasure and uneasiness (T, 220.127.116.11 / 469). More specifically, our moral sentiments, understood as calm forms of love and hate, enable us to draw the relevant distinctions in this sphere. Hume also claims that in forming these judgments we place ourselves in “a steady and general point of view”, which prevents partiality and variation in our circumstances from prejudicing or distorting our moral evaluations (T, 18.104.22.168–18 / 581–3).
It is evident that Hume aims to describe a standard of merit and demerit that, although it depends on our given human nature, is in no way arbitrary or without rational constraints. At the same time, Hume’s account of justice and the artificial virtues does point to the importance of human conventions, which create or invent the institutions and practices associated with property and promising. There are no obligations that we have in respect of these institutions and practices that are prior to or independent of these conventions. The general basis of our commitment to these conventions is that they serve our individual and collective interest. Failing this, we would have no relevant motive to obey these rules of justice. Clearly, then, with respect to property, there are no natural rights or claims of justice outside our created, conventional practices. It is in this sense that Hume’s views on justice and the artificial virtues follow the same general lines of thought already laid down by Hobbes and his followers.
The details and specifics of Hume’s system of secular ethics are not our particular concern in this context. What is our concern, however, is to make clear that what Hume aims at, in both the Treatise and the second Enquiry, is to defend the “autonomy” of morality in relation to religion. On this view of things, God and a future state are wholly unnecessary for moral life and human society. The relevant foundation for moral life and conduct rests with the key elements of human nature that we have mentioned — pride, sympathy, moral sense, and conventions. Moreover, the psychological mechanisms involved are strong and steady enough in their influence to ensure that there exists a reliable correlation between virtue and happiness and vice and misery. By these means, we find that human beings are constituted in such a way that they are capable of moral conduct and able to sustain social cooperation and harmony. In so far as religion plays any role here, Hume maintains, it is more likely to corrupt and disturb, than to contribute, to morality or social stability.
Hume’s account of the autonomy of morals and its foundations in human nature constitutes the constructive aspect of his views on the religion/morality relationship. In developing this account, Hume draws heavily from earlier work by other freethinking, irreligious, and radical philosophers, such as Hobbes, Spinoza, Bayle, and (especially) Shaftesbury. There is, however, a much more critical aspect to Hume’s views on the religion/morality relationship. While it is evident that Hume believes that religion is not necessary for morality, he stops short of claiming that religion is always destructive of morality — even though this is a view that would be no more extreme than the contrary view frequently advanced by religious apologists (i.e., that atheists are incapable of moral conduct etc.). Nevertheless, in a variety of contexts, Hume does maintain that religion — especially monotheism — has pernicious and corrupting tendencies.
One of the most sustained discussions of this general theme is in The Natural History of Religion, where Hume compares the effects of polytheism and theism on their believers (Sects. IX-XIV). In this context., Hume points out that while theism may avoid some of the absurdities and barbarisms of polytheism, it is by no means free of these problems. On the contrary, it is Hume’s view that theism is prone to intolerance and persecution of its opponents; that it encourages its followers to abase themselves and pursue useless forms of self-denial; that it corrupts and perverts philosophy; that although it is plagued with doubts, it presents a dogmatic attitude to the world; and, finally, that it breeds serious moral vices, including hypocrisy, fraud and cruelty. The tendencies of theism that most concern Hume, however, are its intolerance and opposition to liberty, its distorted moral standard, and its willingness to sanction the “greatest crimes” in the name of piety and devotion (NHR, 14.7). Hume leaves his readers with the clear view that religion, far from being a source of support for moral practice, is in fact a major source of moral sickness in the world.
Hume returns to these same general themes in the closing passages of the Dialogues. In this context Philo emphasizes the point that the doctrine of a future state has little practical influence over human conduct (D, 12.13–20/220–23).
This is well understood in the world; and none but fools ever repose less trust in a man, because they hear, that from study and philosophy, he has entertained some speculative doubts with regard to theological subjects. And when we have to do with a man, who makes a great profession of religion and devotion; has this any other effect upon several, who pass for prudent, than to put them on their guard, lest they be cheated and deceived by him? (D, 12.14/221)
Hume makes the further observation that even if religion does not put itself “in direct opposition to morality”, it nevertheless puts forward a “frivolous species of merit” that suggests “a preposterous distribution” of praise and blame based upon a perverted moral standard that is disconnected from any real human needs and interests (D, 12.16/222; cp. EM, 3.38 199; 9.3/ 270; 9.15 / 279). Beyond all this, he also points out the particular dangers to society of the clergy when they gain too much power and influence (D, 12.21/223). This is a theme that Hume also touches on throughout many of his other writings, including The Natural History of Religion, several of his essays, and his History of England. (See, e.g., NHR, 9.6; “Of National Characters,” ESY, 199n3; and HE, III,135f.)
The relationship between religion and morality on Hume’s account seems clear. At best, religion has little practical influence in guiding or supporting moral conduct. The most effective and reliable levers for this purpose rest with various elements of human nature that operate independently from our religious beliefs (i.e., pride, sympathy, moral sense etc.). At its worst, which is how we commonly find it, religious principles and institutions disturb and pervert that natural and reasonable moral standards that human nature has provided us with.
One of the most hotly debated issues arising out of Hume’s philosophy is whether or not he was an atheist. Two methodological and historical caveats should be briefly noted before addressing this question. First, as already noted, many of Hume’s own contemporaries regarded him in these terms. Our own contemporaries have tended to dismiss these claims as coming from religious bigots who did not understand Hume’s philosophy. While there may be some basis for these concerns, this is not true of all of Hume’s early critics (e.g. Thomas Reid) and, even if it were, it would not show that his critics were wrong about this matter. Second, and related to the first point, Hume lived and wrote at a time of severe religious persecution, by both the church and the state. Unorthodox religious views, and more especially any form of open atheism, would certainly provoke strong reactions from the authorities. Caution and subterfuge in these circumstances was essential if difficulties of these kinds were to be avoided. (For this reason it is especially ironic to find religious apologists who confidently read Hume’s professions of orthodoxy as entirely sincere but who never mention the awkward conditions in which he had to express his views.) While conditions of suppression do not themselves prove a writer or thinker such as Hume had a concealed doctrine, this possibility should be seriously and carefully considered.
The view that has, perhaps, been most dominant during the past century has been that Hume was a skeptic and, as such, stands in a position that endorses neither theism nor atheism. On this reading Hume’s skeptical principles commit him to the view that human understanding is weak and imperfect and, so considered, we should avoid all dogmatism and also refrain from pursuing our investigations beyond the narrow sphere of “common life”. More specifically, the skeptic, it is argued, must resist the temptation to address questions relating to the “two eternities”, as this concerns “the origin of worlds, and the situation of nature, from, and to eternity” (D, 1.10/134; EU, 12.25). Read this way, Hume is what we may describe as a “soft skeptic” with respect to the issue of theism. Throughout his writings, while he is certainly concerned to discredit various (dogmatic) proofs for the existence of God, he also avoids advancing or endorsing any (dogmatic) atheistic arguments and their conclusions – preferring to suspend all belief on such matters (NHR, 15.13; D, 1.3–11/131–36, 12.33–4/227–8).
Against this (soft) skeptical reading critics have argued both that it exaggerates and that it underestimates Hume’s skeptical commitments. One way of assessing Hume’s position on this issue is to begin with Hume’s suggestion that “genuine theism” involves the minimal claim that there exists some (invisible) “supreme intelligence” that is the origin, creator and governor of this world (NHR, 4.2). So described, genuine theism involves what we may call a “thin” conception of God. There is, on this account, no commitment to some further, more specific, set of attributes. In contrast with thin theism, “robust” theism presupposes a richer set of attributes, such as infinity, omniscience, omnipotence, and moral perfection. Whether one is judged an atheist or not may depend, not only on whether the standard of theism is robust or thin, it may also depend on what particular set of “thick” attributes are considered essential for belief in God.
Clearly major religions like traditional Christianity require a robust conception of God. With regard to robust theism, Hume is sharply critical and goes well beyond the bounds of a more limited soft skepticism. That is to say, Hume pursues what we may call the hard skeptical aim of providing grounds for denying the theist hypothesis in its various robust forms. For example, in a number of passages of the Dialogues Hume suggests that the abundant evidence of unnecessary evil provides us with compelling grounds for denying that there exists an omnipotent, morally perfect being who is the creator and governor of this world. In light of these considerations, we may conclude that with respect to robust theism Hume is a hard skeptic who defends a non-dogmatic form of atheism.
While Hume may be a hard skeptic about robust theism, it does not follow that he is either a hard or a soft skeptic about thin theism. Against views of this kind, it has been argued by a number of scholars that Hume is committed to some form of thin theism or “attenuated deism”. (See, e.g., Gaskin 1988.) The key passages that are generally relied on in support of this view are found in the last section of the Dialogues (XII). It is in this context that Philo is understood to “reverse” his opposition to the design argument and concede to Cleanthes “that the works of nature bear a great analogy” to human productions and that a “purpose, intention, or design strikes everywhere the most careless, the most stupid thinker” (D, 12.2/214, 12.6/216–7 – my emphasis; cp. NHR, Intro.1, 15.1). There are, however, several important points to note in response to this aspect of Hume’s discussion.
First, Hume makes clear that this mode of (thin) theism leaves us still in a state of “profound ignorance” and that it provides us with “no inference that affects human life” (D, 12.33/227; cp. EU, 11.23). Second, although Philo does make some concessions to Cleanthes, he immediately goes on to perform a “double reversal” – retracting his original concessions and returning to his original claim that there is a “vast” and “incomprehensible” difference that must be supposed between the human and divine mind (D, 12.6–7/217–9). All of which terminates in the (vague) conclusion “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (D, 12.33/227 – my emphasis; see also EU, 11.27, where Hume observes that the analogy involved here may be compared to that between “the sun and a waxen taper” [candle]). To strengthen the skeptical side of these reflections Hume has Philo point out that there are other analogies available to us (e.g. the rotting of a turnip or the generation of an animal: D, 12.7/217–9) which may suggest very different inferences and conclusions. Finally, to all this we may add that Hume’s theory of belief, as presented in his earlier works, plainly implies that in these circumstances there can be no belief in any such being. More specifically, it is a feature of Hume’s analysis of the mechanics of belief that when the analogy we are relying on is remote and imperfect, and the ideas involved are obscure and vague, belief will be weakened if not completely erased (see, e.g., T, 22.214.171.124–4; 126.96.36.199).
In light of these observations, we may conclude that it is highly problematic to present Hume as any kind of theist, either robust or thin. The question remains, however, whether his final skeptical attitude to thin theism is better understood as hard or soft in character? Hume’s concluding remarks in the Dialogues may suggest that the soft reading – stopping short of any (atheistic) denial – is his final view (D, 12.33/227–8). According to this interpretation, we should accept our epistemological predicament and avoid any final judgment on such matters.
The whole is a riddle, an enigma, an inexplicable mystery. Doubt, uncertainty, suspense of judgment appear the only result of our most accurate scrutiny, concerning this subject. (NHR, 15.13)
While it is tempting to leave this matter here, settling on the view that Hume is a hard skeptic about robust theism and a soft skeptic about thin theism, there are, nevertheless, grounds for pushing the matter further for the case for Hume’s hard skepticism regarding thin theism. That is to say, if we examine Hume’s remarks more carefully, we will find some clear arguments of a hard skeptical variety as they concern the thin theist hypothesis.
There are two hard skeptical arguments concerning this hypothesis that are especially important. The first is that Hume points out that our experience suggests that mind is always accompanied by body (D, 5.11/68-, 6.6/171-2, 8.11/186-7). Any reasonable hypothesis, therefore, should be consistent with this aspect of human experience. Although our experience may be narrow and limited, given the nature of the object of our investigations, it nevertheless provides some (substantial) basis for rejecting or denying the hypothesis of theism, including the thin version. Second, Hume also argues that there are alternative hypotheses that are available to us that are more plausible and consistent with human experience. In particular, we may easily revise the old Epicurean hypothesis of eternal matter that generates cycles of chaos and order (D, 6.12/174, 8.2/182). This is a hypothesis that provides us with natural explanations for forms and orders of life and existence in a manner that clearly anticipates important features of Darwinian theory. Arguments of these kinds suggest that, even with respect to the minimalism of thin theism, Hume goes well beyond a soft skepticism that simply “suspends belief” on these issues. His arguments are harder than this and present grounds for denying theism, both robust and thin. On this basis we may conclude that Hume’s skeptical commitments are hard and not soft with respect to the theist hypothesis in all its forms and, as such, constitute a non-dogmatic form of atheism.
In the previous section it was suggested that Hume may be properly described as a hard sceptic who is a non-dogmatic atheist. It remains an open question, however, whether “atheism” is the most suitable label for Hume’s general position on this subject – apt as it may be. One important consideration here is that Hume’s (apparent) concessions to theism in the last section of the Dialogues are indicative of significant features of his practical aims and objectives. More specifically, Hume’s final position is not aggressively atheistic in any familiar sense, not only because it is non-dogmatic, but also because his final position is one that aims to reconcile a broad group of views. According to Hume’s analysis, the practical consequences of both soft and hard scepticism, as well as thin theism, are all much the same. While the thin theist may want to emphasize the (remote) basis for some inference to a being that resembles human intelligence, they must nevertheless grant that we are left in a state of “profound ignorance” with a (weak and vague) idea that cannot serve to guide our lives in any way (D, 12.33/227). This returns us to a point that Hume had made earlier in the Dialogues; namely, that in both theoretical and practical terms a mystical form of theism – lacking any significant anthropomorphic features – is indistinguishable from a form of scepticism, where all conjectures about the nature of God remain entirely undecided, unknowable and irrelevant to human life (D, 6.1/158, 12.7/217). With this general point in mind, Hume is happy to emphasize the “verbal” nature of the dispute among those who may fall on the spectrum lying between thin theism and non-dogmatic hard scepticism (D, 12.6-7/216-7). What really matters, Hume suggests, is that the falsehoods, frauds, hypocrisies and cruelties of religion in the various (robust) forms that it almost always takes are firmly resisted and rejected. This is a point that both hard and soft skeptics, as well those who embrace religion of a genuinely “philosophical and rational kind” (D, 12.13/ 220), can all accept.
Given the more open-ended and inclusive nature of Hume’s outlook and aims, the label of “atheism” perhaps suggests a more narrow and doctrinaire position than Hume is comfortable with or concerned to champion. Granted that the label of “atheism” is in these respects potentially misleading, and that “scepticism” and “agnosticism” fail to properly identify and highlight Hume’s wholly hostile and critical attitude towards religious dogma and doctrine (in its orthodox forms), what alternative label is available to us? The most accurate and informative label for describing Hume’s views on this subject is perhaps irreligion. This is a term that both Hume’s contemporaries and our own would understand and can apply to Hume’s arguments and outlook without any serious misrepresentation. On one side, calling Hume’s views on this subject irreligious avoids any connotations of a dogmatic or rigid atheism, one that is unwilling to accommodate or make common cause with soft scepticism (agnosticism) or thin theism. On the other side, the label of irreligion also makes clear that Hume’s fundamental attitude towards religion (qua various forms of robust theism) is one of systematic hostility – that is, he believes we are better off without religion and religious hypotheses and speculations.
The term irreligion has several other specific advantages. This term makes clear that it is not simply (robust) “theism” that Hume aims to discredit and undermine but religion broadly conceived as including related doctrines (miracles, a future state, etc.) and institutions (church, clergy, etc.). The label of irreligion serves effectively to identify these wider concerns and places appropriate emphasis on Hume’s destructive intent to leave religious doctrine without any solid philosophical grounds or significant content – much less any practical value or influence. Related to this point, by widening our scope of interest in religion, and avoiding a narrow focus on arguments concerning the existence of God, we are encouraged to consider works other than the Dialogues when assessing the nature and character of Hume’s views on this subject. It is, for example, especially important that proper weight be given to Hume’s effort in the Treatise to discredit the metaphysical and moral paraphernalia of traditional theistic systems and to redirect our philosophical investigations to “the study of man”, whereby we may develop a secular, scientific account of the true foundations of moral and social life. Insofar as we consider Hume’s views as advancing a “philosophy of irreligion”, rather than simply atheism, we are more likely to capture these more diverse, complex and subtle aspects of his thinking on this subject. More importantly, when we consider Hume’s thought from the point of view of the wider framework of irreligion, and not just the question of the existence of God, we are better placed to recognize that his critique of religion constitutes the unifying motivation and central theme running throughout his entire philosophy.
In the entry above, we Follow the convention given in the Nortons’ Treatise and Beauchamp’s Enquiries: we cite Book . Part . Section . Paragraph; followed by page references to the Selby-Bigge/Nidditch editions. Thus T,188.8.131.52/ 34: will indicate Treatise Bk.1, Pt.2, Sec.3, Para.4/ Selby-Bigge pg.34. References to the Abstract [TA] are to the two editions of the Treatise mentioned above (paragraph/page). In the case of the Enquiries I cite Section and Paragraph; followed by page reference to the Selby-Bigge edition. Thus EU, 12.1/ 149 refers to Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Sect.12, Para. 1 / Selby-Bigge pg. 149.
T A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd edition, revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000. MEM “Hume’s Early Memoranda, 1729–1740”, edited with a forward by E.C. Mossner, Journal of the History of Ideas, 9 (1948): 492–518. EF “An early fragment on evil,” in Hume and Hume’s Connexions, ed. by M.A. Stewart & J. P. Wright, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1994, 160–70. LG A Letter from a Gentleman to his friend in Edinburgh, ed. by E.C. Mossner and J.V. Price, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1967. EU Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999. EM Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998 ESY Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, revised edition by E.F. Miller, Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1985. NHR The Natural History of Religion (1757) in, A Dissertation on the Passions, The Natural History of religion: A Critical Edition, edited by T.L. Beauchamp, Oxford & New York: Clarendon Press, 2007. Section and paragraph references are to this edition. The Natural History of Religion (1757) in: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, edited by J.A.C. Gaskin, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993. The Natural History of Religion, edited with an introduction by James Fieser, New York: Macmillan, 1992. D Dialogues concerning Natural Religion and Other Writings (1779), edited by D. Coleman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. References are to the Part and paragraph numbers as provided in this edition. Page references after the slash are provided to: Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, 2nd edition, edited by N. Kemp Smith, Edinburgh: Nelson & Sons, 1947. Dialogues concerning Natural Religion in Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, edited by J.A.C. Gaskin, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and the Posthumous Essays, edited and introduced by R.H. Popkin, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1980. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, edited and introduced by Martin Bell, London: Penguin, 1990. David Hume Writings on Religion, edited and introduced by A. Flew, La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 1992. [This collection contains the complete Dialogues along with a number of other works by Hume concerned with religion.] LET The Letters of David Hume, 2 Vols., edited by J.Y.T. Greig, Oxford: Clarendon, 1932. HE The History of England, 6 Vols., edited by William B. Todd, Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1983.
- Baxter, Andrew, Enquiry into the Nature of the Human Soul, 2nd edition, 2 Vols., London, 1737; reprinted, Bristol: Thoemmes, 1990.
- Bayle, Pierre, Historical and Critical Dictionary, 1702; selections translated and introduced by Ruchard Popkin, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1965.
- Bentley, Richard, Folly of Atheism, in Works of Richard Bentley, 3 Vols., London, 1838, Vol. III; reprinted, New York: AMS Press, 1966.
- Berkeley, George, A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Knowledge, 1710; edited with an introduction by Jonathan Dancy, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1998.
- –––, Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous, 1713; edited with an introduction by Jonathan Dancy, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1998.
- –––, Alciphron, or the Minute Philosopher, 1732; selections in Alciphron in focus, edited and introduced by David Berman, London: Routledge, 1993.
- Browne, Peter, Things Divine and Supernatural Conceived by Analogy with Things Natural and Human, London, 1733.
- Butler, Joseph, The Analogy of Religion, 1736; in The Works of Joseph Butler, edited by S. Halifax, 2 Vols., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1849, Vol. I.
- Clarke, Samuel, A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, 1704; introduced and edited with other writings by E. Vailati, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
- Cudworth, Ralph, True Intellectual System of the Universe, 2 Vols., London, 1678; reprinted, New York & London: Garland, 1978.
- Descartes, Rene, Meditations on First Philosophy, Paris, 1641; in The Philosophical Writings of Decartes, translated by J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, D. Murdoch, 3 Vols., Cambridge: Cambridge Univesity Press, 1984, Vol. II.
- Hobbes, Thomas, Human Nature and De Corpore Politico [The Elements of Law], 1640; edited with an introduction by J.C.A. Gaskin, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
- –––, Leviathan, London, 1651; edited with an introduction by E. Curley, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
- –––, The Citizen [Philosophical Rudiments Concerning Govrnment and Society], 1642; edited and introduced by B. Gert, Man and Citizen, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1991.
- Leibniz, G.W., Theodicy, 1710; translated. E.M. Huggard, edited with an introduction by A. Farrer, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1951.
- Locke, John, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, London, 1690; edited with a foreword by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
- Lucretius, The Nature of the Universe, 55 B.C.E.; translated and introduced by R.E. Latham, Harmondsworth, Middx.: Penguin, 1951.
- Malebranche, Nicolas, Philosophical Selections, edited by S. Nadler, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
- Spinoza, Theological-Political Treatise, 1670; translated with an introduction by R.H.M. Elwes, The Chief Works of Spinoza, New York: Dover, 1951.
- –––, Ethics, 1677; translated by S. Shirley and edited with an introduction by S. Feldman, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1991.
Early Responses to Hume’s Philosophy of Religion
- Fieser, James (ed.), Early Responses to Hume’s Writings on Religion, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2001. [Vols. 5 and 6 of the series Early Responses to Hume.]
- Tweyman, Stanley (ed.), Hume on Miracles, Bristol: Thoemmes, 1996.
- Bailey, Alan, and Dan O’Brien (eds.),2012, The Continuum Companion to Hume, London & New York: Continuum. [See, in particular, the contributions by Pritchard & Richmond, Pyle and O’Connor.]
- Bailey, Alan, and Dan O’Brien, 2014, Hume’s Critique of Religion: &RSQUO;Sick Men’s Dreams’, Dordrecht: Springer.
- Burns, R.M., 1981, The Great Debate on Miracles: From Joseph Glanville to David Hume, Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
- Earman, John, 2000, Hume’s Abject Failure: The Argument Against Miracles, Oxford; New York: Clarendon Press.
- Ferreira,M. Jamie, 1986, Scepticism and Reasonable Doubt: The British Naturalist Tradition in Wilkins, Hume Reid and Newman, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Fogelin, Robert J., 2003, A Defense of Hume on Miracles, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Gaskin, J.C.A., 1988, Hume’s Philosophy of Religion, 2nd ed., London: Macmillan.
- Herdt, Jennifer, 1997, Religion and Faction in Hume’s Moral Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Holden, Thomas, 2010, Spectres of False Divinity: Hume’s Moral Atheism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Hurlbutt, Robert H., 1985, Hume, Newton and the Design Argument, revised edition, Lincoln & London: University of Nebraska Press.
- Israel, Jonathan, 2001, Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity 1650-1750, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Jeffner, Anders, 1966, Butler and Hume on Religion: A Comparative Analysis, Stockholm: Diakonistyrelsens Bokforlag.
- Johnson, David, 1999, Hume, Holism, and Miracles , Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Kemp Smith, Norman, 1947, Introduction to his edition of Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, 2nd edition, Edinburgh: Nelson.
- Levine, Michael P., 1989, Hume and the Problem of Miracles: A Solution, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- MacIntosh, J.J., 2006, Boyle on Atheism, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Mackie, J.L., 1982, The Miracle of Theism: Arguments for and against the Existence of God, Oxford: Clarendon Press. [This book is not directly on Hume’s philosophy of religion but discusses his views on various relevant topics at some length in several chapters.]
- Millican, Peter (ed.), 2002, Reading Hume on Human Understanding, Oxford: Clarendon Press. [See, in particular, the articles by Millican, Garrett and Gaskin.]
- O’Connor, David, 2001, Hume On Religion, London & New York: Routledge.
- Penelhum, Terence, 2000, Themes in Hume: The Self, the Will, Religion, Oxford: Clarendon Press, esp. Ch. 9–13.
- Phillips, D.Z., and Timothy Tessin, eds.,1999, Religion and Hume’s Legacy, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Radcliffe, Elizabeth S. (ed.), 2011, A Companion to Hume, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell. [See, in particular, the contributions by Penelhum, Bell and Levine.]
- Russell, Paul, 2008, The Riddle of Hume’s Treatise: Scepticism, Naturalism and Irreligion, Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press.
- Russell, Paul (ed.), 2016, The Oxford Handbook of David Hume, New York: Oxford University Press. [See, in particular, the contributions by Russell, Bell, Newlands, Levine, Yandell and Lecaldano.]
- Sennett, James F., and Douglas Groothuis (eds.), 1986, In Defence of Natural Theology: A Post-Humean Assessment, Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
- Siebert, Donald. T., 1990, The Moral Animus of David Hume, Newark: University of Delaware Press.
- Stephen, Leslie, 1962 , History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, 3rd edition, London: Harcourt, Brace & World.
- Tweyman, Stanley, 1986, Scepticism and Belief in Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff.
- Vanzo, Alberto, 2016, “Empiricism and Rationalism in Nineteenth-Century Histories of Philosophy”, Journal of the History of Ideas 77, 253-282.
- Yandell, Keith E., 1990, Hume’s “Inexplicable Mystery”: His Views on Religion, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
- Hume Studies. [This journal provides a comprehensive review of Hume literature, updated annually.]
- Morris, William, “David Hume,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2012/entries/hume/>. [Contains an excellent bibliography relating to Hume’s philosophy in general.]
- A helpful bibliography of readings relating to Hume’s views on religion, including many important articles on this topic, may be found in Bailey & O’Brien (eds.), The Continuum Companion to Hume, as cited above.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- davidhume.org, University of Leeds Electronic Text Centre and Hertford College/Oxford.
- The Hume Society
- David Hume, by James Fieser (entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy).
- Philosophy: The Classics, web page with a link to an audio stream of Nigel Warburton giving his summary of Hume’s Dialogues, from his book Philosophy: The Classics.
- Philosophy Bites: Paul Russell on David Hume’s Philosophy of Irreligion, web page with a link to audio file.
- Philosophy Bites: Peter Millican on Hume’s Significance, web page with link to audio file.
- Philosophy Bites: Stewart Sutherland on Hume on Design, web page with link to audio file.
The author and editors are grateful to Doug Jesseph for comments on an earlier version of this article.