Photo of William James
(ca. 1895, in The Letters of William James, ed. by Henry James, Boston, 1920)

William James

First published Thu Sep 7, 2000; substantive revision Wed Nov 3, 2021

William James was an original thinker in and between the disciplines of physiology, psychology and philosophy. His twelve-hundred page masterwork, The Principles of Psychology (1890), is a rich blend of physiology, psychology, philosophy, and personal reflection that has given us such ideas as “the stream of thought” and the baby’s impression of the world “as one great blooming, buzzing confusion” (PP 462). It contains seeds of pragmatism and phenomenology, and influenced generations of thinkers in Europe and America, including Edmund Husserl, Bertrand Russell, John Dewey, and Ludwig Wittgenstein. James studied at Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School and the School of Medicine, but his writings were from the outset as much philosophical as scientific. “Some Remarks on Spencer’s Notion of Mind as Correspondence” (1878) and “The Sentiment of Rationality” (1879, 1882) presage his future pragmatism and pluralism, and contain the first statements of his view that philosophical theories are reflections of a philosopher’s temperament.

James hints at his religious concerns in his earliest essays and in The Principles, but they become more explicit in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (1897), Human Immortality: Two Supposed Objections to the Doctrine (1898), The Varieties of Religious Experience (1902) and A Pluralistic Universe (1909). James oscillated between thinking that a “study in human nature” such as Varieties could contribute to a “Science of Religion” and the belief that religious experience involves an altogether supernatural domain, somehow inaccessible to science but accessible to the individual human subject.

James made some of his most important philosophical contributions in the last decade of his life. In a burst of writing in 1904–5 (collected in Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912)) he set out the metaphysical view most commonly known as “neutral monism,” according to which there is one fundamental “stuff” that is neither material nor mental. In “A Pluralistic Universe” he defends the mystical and anti-pragmatic view that concepts distort rather than reveal reality, and in his influential Pragmatism (1907), he presents systematically a set of views about truth, knowledge, reality, religion, and philosophy that permeate his writings from the late 1870s onwards.

1. Chronology of James’s Life

  • 1842. Born in New York City, first child of Henry James and Mary Walsh. James. Educated by tutors and at private schools in New York.
  • 1843. Brother Henry born.
  • 1848. Sister Alice born.
  • 1855–8. Family moves to Europe. William attends school in Geneva, Paris, and Boulogne-sur-Mer; develops interests in painting and science.
  • 1858. Family settles in Newport, Rhode Island, where James studies painting with William Hunt.
  • 1859–60. Family settles in Geneva, where William studies science at Geneva Academy; then returns to Newport when William decides he wishes to resume his study of painting.
  • 1861. William abandons painting and enters Lawrence Scientific School at Harvard.
  • 1864. Enters Harvard School of Medicine.
  • 1865. Joins Amazon expedition of his teacher Louis Agassiz, contracts a mild form of smallpox, recovers and travels up the Amazon, collecting specimens for Agassiz’s zoological museum at Harvard.
  • 1866. Returns to medical school. Suffers eye strain, back problems, and suicidal depression in the fall.
  • 1867–8. Travels to Europe for health and education: Dresden, Bad Teplitz, Berlin, Geneva, Paris. Studies physiology at Berlin University, reads philosophy, psychology and physiology (Wundt, Kant, Lessing, Goethe, Schiller, Renan, Renouvier).
  • 1869. Receives M. D. degree, but never practices. Severe depression in the fall.
  • 1870–1. Depression and poor health continue.
  • 1872. Accepts offer from President Eliot of Harvard to teach undergraduate course in comparative physiology.
  • 1873. Accepts an appointment to teach full year of anatomy and physiology, but postpones teaching for a year to travel in Europe.
  • 1874–5. Begins teaching psychology; establishes first American psychology laboratory.
  • 1878. Marries Alice Howe Gibbens. Publishes “Remarks on Spencer’s Definition of Mind as Correspondence” in Journal of Speculative Philosophy.
  • 1879. Publishes “The Sentiment of Rationality” in Mind.
  • 1880. Appointed Assistant Professor of Philosophy at Harvard. Continues to teach psychology.
  • 1882. Travels to Europe. Meets with Ewald Hering, Carl Stumpf, Ernst Mach, Wilhelm Wundt, Joseph Delboeuf, Jean Charcot, George Croom Robertson, Shadworth Hodgson, Leslie Stephen.
  • 1884. Lectures on “The Dilemma of Determinism” and publishes “On Some Omissions of Introspective Psychology” in Mind.
  • 1885–92. Teaches psychology and philosophy at Harvard: logic, ethics, English empirical philosophy, psychological research.
  • 1890. Publishes The Principles of Psychology with Henry Holt of Boston, twelve years after agreeing to write it.
  • 1892. Publishes Psychology: Briefer Course with Henry Holt.
  • 1897. Publishes The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, with Longmans, Green & Co. Lectures on “Human Immortality” (published in 1898).
  • 1898. Identifies himself as a pragmatist in “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results,” given at the University of California, Berkeley. Develops heart problems.
  • 1899. Publishes Talks to Teachers on Psychology: and to Students on Some of Life’s Ideals (including “On a Certain Blindness in Human Beings” and “What Makes Life Worth Living?”) with Henry Holt. Becomes active member of the Anti-Imperialist League, opposing U. S. policy in Philippines.
  • 1901–2. Delivers Gifford lectures on “The Varieties of Religious Experience” in Edinburgh (published in 1902).
  • 1904–5 Publishes “Does ‘Consciousness’ Exist?,” “A World of Pure Experience,” “How Two Minds Can Know the Same Thing,” “Is Radical Empiricism Solipsistic?” and “The Place of Affectional Facts in a World of Pure Experience” in Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. All were reprinted in Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912).
  • 1907. Resigns Harvard professorship. Publishes Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking with Longmans, Green & Co., based on lectures given in Boston and at Columbia.
  • 1909. Publishes A Pluralistic Universe with Longmans, Green & Co., based on Hibbert Lectures delivered in England and at Harvard the previous year.
  • 1910. Publishes “A Pluralistic Mystic” in Hibbert Journal. Abandons attempt to complete a “system” of philosophy. (His partially completed manuscript published posthumously as Some Problems of Philosophy). Dies of heart failure at summer home in Chocorua, New Hampshire.

2. Early Writings

“Remarks on Spencer’s Definition of Mind as Correspondence” (1878)

Although he was officially a professor of psychology when he published it, James’s discussion of Herbert Spencer broaches characteristic themes of his philosophy: the importance of religion and the passions, the variety of human responses to life, and the idea that we help to “create” the truths that we “register” (E 21). Taking up Spencer’s view that the adjustment of the organism to the environment is the basic feature of mental evolution, James charges that Spencer projects his own vision of what ought to be onto the phenomena he claims to describe. Survival, James asserts, is merely one of many interests human beings have: “The social affections, all the various forms of play, the thrilling intimations of art, the delights of philosophic contemplation, the rest of religious emotion, the joy of moral self-approbation, the charm of fancy and of wit—some or all of these are absolutely required to make the notion of mere existence tolerable;…” (E 13). We are all teleological creatures at base, James holds, each with a set of a priori values and categories. Spencer “merely takes sides with the telos he happens to prefer” (E 18).

James’s characteristic empiricism appears in his claim that values and categories fight it out in the course of human experience, and that their conflicts “can only be solved ambulando, and not by any a priori definition.” The “formula which proves to have the most massive destiny,” he concludes, “will be the true one” (E 17). Yet James wishes to defend his sense that any such formulation will be determined as much by a freely-acting human mind as by the world, a position he later (in Pragmatism) calls “humanism”: “there belongs to mind, from its birth upward, a spontaneity, a vote. It is in the game, and not a mere looker-on; and its judgments of the should-be, its ideals, cannot be peeled off from the body of the cogitandum as if they were excrescences…” (E 21).

“The Sentiment of Rationality” (1879, 1882)

The substance of this essay was first published in Mind in 1879 and in the Princeton Review in 1882, and then republished in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy in 1897. Although he never quite says that rationality is a sentiment, James holds that a sentiment—really a set of sentiments—is a “mark” of rationality. The philosopher, James writes, will recognize the rationality of a conception “as he recognizes everything else, by certain subjective marks with which it affects him. When he gets the marks, he may know that he has got the rationality.” These marks include a “strong feeling of ease, peace, rest” (WB 57), and a “feeling of the sufficiency of the present moment, of its absoluteness” (WB 58). There is also a “passion for parsimony” (WB 58) that is felt in grasping theoretical unifications, as well as a passion for distinguishing, a “loyalty to clearness and integrity of perception, dislike of blurred outlines, of vague identifications” (WB 59). The ideal philosopher, James holds, blends these two passions of rationality, and even some great philosophers go too far in one direction or another: Spinoza’s unity of all things in one substance is “barren,” as is Hume’s “‘looseness and separateness’ of everything…” (WB 60).

Sentiments of rationality operate not just in logic or science, but in ordinary life. When we first move into a room, for example, “we do not know what draughts may blow in upon our back, what doors may open, what forms may enter, what interesting objects may be found in cupboards and corners.” These minor uncertainties act as “mental irritant[s],” which disappear when we come to know our way around the room, to “feel at home” there (WB 67–8).

James begins the second part of his essay by considering the case when “two conceptions [are] equally fit to satisfy the logical demand” for fluency or unification. At this point, he holds, one must consider a “practical” component of rationality. The conception that “awakens the active impulses, or satisfies other aesthetic demands better than the other, will be accounted the more rational conception, and will deservedly prevail” (WB 66). James puts the point both as one of psychology—a prediction of what will occur—and as one of judgment, for he holds that it will prevail “deservedly.”

As in his essay on Spencer, James explores the relations between temperaments and philosophical theorizing. Idealism, he holds, “will be chosen by a man of one emotional constitution, materialism by another.” Idealism offers a sense of intimacy with the universe, the feeling that ultimately I “am all.” But materialists find in idealism “a narrow, close, sick-room air,” and prefer to conceive of an uncertain, dangerous and wild universe that has “no respect for our ego.” Let “the tides flow,” the materialist thinks, “even though they flow over us” (WB 76). James is sympathetic both to the idea that the universe is something we can be intimate with and to the idea that it is wild and unpredictable. If he criticizes idealism for its “sick-room air,” he criticizes reductive forms of materialism for denying to “our most intimate powers…all relevancy in universal affairs” (WB 71). The intimacy and the wildness portrayed in these contrasting philosophies answer to propensities, passions, and powers in human beings, and the “strife” of these two forms of “mental temper,” James predicts, will always be seen in philosophy (WB 76). Certainly it is always seen in the philosophy of William James.

3. The Principles of Psychology

In 1878, James agreed to write a psychology textbook for the American publisher Henry Holt, but it took him twelve years to produce the manuscript, and when he did he described it to Holt as “a loathsome, distended, tumefied, bloated, dropsical mass, testifying to nothing but two facts: 1st, that there is no such thing as a science of psychology, and 2nd, that W. J. is an incapable” (The Letters of William James, ed. Henry James. (Boston: Little, Brown, 1926, pp. 393–4). Nevertheless, this thousand page volume of psychology, physiology and philosophy has proved to be James’s masterwork, containing early statements of his main philosophical ideas in extraordinarily rich chapters on “The Stream of Thought,” “The Consciousness of Self,” “Emotion,” “Will,” and many other topics.

James tells us that he will follow the psychological method of introspection in The Principles, which he defines as “the looking into our own minds and reporting what we there discover” (PP 185). In fact he takes a number of methodological approaches in the book. Early on, he includes chapters on “The Functions of the Brain” and “On Some General Conditions of Brain Activity” that reflect his years as a lecturer in anatomy and physiology at Harvard, and he argues for the reductive and materialist thesis that habit is “at bottom a physical principle” (PP 110). As the book moves along, he involves himself in discussions with philosophers—for example with Hume and Kant in his hundred-page chapter on the self, and he finds himself making metaphysical claims that anticipate his later pragmatism, as when he writes: “There is no property ABSOLUTELY essential to any one thing. The same property which figures as the essence of a thing on one occasion becomes a very inessential feature on the other” (PP 959).

Even “introspection” covers a range of reports. James discusses the experiments that his contemporaries Wundt, Stumpf and Fechner were performing in their laboratories, which led them to results such as that “sounds are less delicately discriminated in intensity than lights” (PP 513). But many of James’s most important and memorable introspective observations come from his own life. For example:

The rhythm of a lost word may be there without a sound to clothe it…. Everyone must know the tantalizing effect of the blank rhythm of some forgotten verse, restlessly dancing in one’s mind, striving to be filled out with words (PP 244).

Our father and mother, our wife and babes, are bone of our bone and flesh of our flesh. When they die, a part of our very selves is gone. If they do anything wrong, it is our shame. If they are insulted, our anger flashes forth as readily as if we stood in their place. (PP 280).

There is an excitement during the crying fit which is not without a certain pungent pleasure of its own; but it would take a genius for felicity to discover any dash of redeeming quality in the feeling of dry and shrunken sorrow (PP 1061).

Will you or won’t you have it so?” is the most probing question we are ever asked; we are asked it every hour of the day, and about the largest as well as the smallest, the most theoretical as well as the most practical, things. We answer by consents or non-consents and not by words. What wonder that these dumb responses should seem our deepest organs of communication with the nature of things! (PP, p. 1182).

In this last quotation, James tackles a philosophical problem from a psychological perspective. Although he refrains from answering the question of whether these “responses” are in fact deep organs of communication with the nature of things—reporting only that they seem to us to be so—in his later writings, such as Varieties of Religious Experience and A Pluralistic Universe, he confesses, and to some degree defends, his belief that the question should be answered affirmatively.

In the deservedly famous chapter on “The Stream of Thought” James takes himself to be offering a richer account of experience than those of traditional empiricists such as Hume. He believes relations, vague fringes, and tendencies are experienced directly (a view he would later defend as part of his “radical empiricism.”) James finds consciousness to be a stream rather than a succession of “ideas.” Its waters blend, and our individual consciousness—or, as he prefers to call it sometimes, our “sciousness”—is “steeped and dyed” in the waters of sciousness or thought that surround it. Our psychic life has rhythm: it is a series of transitions and resting-places, of “flights and perchings” (PP 236). We rest when we remember the name we have been searching for; and we are off again when we hear a noise that might be the baby waking from her nap.

Interest—and its close relative, attention—is a major component not only of James’s psychology, but of the epistemology and metaphysics that seep into his discussion. A thing, James states in “The Stream of Thought,” is a group of qualities “which happen practically or aesthetically to interest us, to which we therefore give substantive names…”. (PP 274). And reality “means simply relation to our emotional and active life…whatever excites and stimulates our interest is real” (PP 924). Our capacity for attention to one thing rather than another is for James the sign of an “active element in all consciousness,…a spiritual something…which seems to go out to meet these qualities and contents, whilst they seem to come in to be received by it.” (PP 285). Faced with the tension between scientific determinism and our belief in our own freedom or autonomy, James—speaking not as a psychologist but as the philosopher he had become—argues that science “must be constantly reminded that her purposes are not the only purposes, and that the order of uniform causation which she has use for, and is therefore right in postulating, may be enveloped in a wider order, on which she has no claims at all” (PP 1179).

In his discussions of consciousness James appears at various times to be a reductive materialist, a dualist, a proto-phenomenologist, and a neutral psychologist who wouldn’t dare to consider philosophical questions. One of the most original layers of The Principles lies in James’s pursuit of a “pure” description of the stream of thought that does not presuppose it to be either mental or material, a pursuit that anticipates not only his own later “radical empiricism,” but Husserl’s phenomenology. In his chapter on “Sensation,” for example, James is at pains to deny that sensations are “in the mind” and then “by a special act on our part ‘extradited’ or ‘projected’ so as to appear located in an outer world” (PP 678). He argues that our original experiences are objective, that “only as reflection becomes developed do we become aware of an inner world at all” (PP 679). However, the objective world originally experienced is not the world of spatial relations that we think:

Certainly a child newly born in Boston, who gets a sensation from the candle-flame which lights the bedroom, or from his diaper-pin [who] does not feel either of these objects to be situated in longitude 71 W. and latitude 42 N.….The flame fills its own place, the pain fills its own place; but as yet these places are neither identified with, nor discriminated from, any other places. That comes later. For the places thus first sensibly known are elements of the child’s space-world which remain with him all his life. (PP 681–2)

James’s chapter on “Habit,” early in the book, begins with habit as a physical matter but ends by considering its ethical implications. James argues that the laws of nature are themselves habits, “nothing but the immutable habits which the different elementary sorts of matter follow in their actions and reactions upon each other” (PP 109). In our brains, habits are paths of nervous energy, as rivers and streams are the paths of water’s flow. At skin level, even a scar is a kind of habit, “more likely to be abraded, inflamed, to suffer pain and cold, than are the neighboring parts” (PP 111). On the psychological level as well, “any sequence of mental action which has been frequently repeated, tends to perpetuate itself ...” (PP 116). Habits are useful in diminishing the attention that we have to devote to our actions, thereby allowing us to develop “our higher powers of mind” (PP 126). On the social level, habit is “the enormous fly-wheel of society, its most precious conservative agent. It alone is what keeps us all within the bounds of ordinance, and saves the children of fortune from the envious uprisings of the poor” (PP 125). The “ethical implications of the law of habit,” (PP 124) as James sees them, concern which habits we choose to develop, and when. Many habits must begin early in life: “Hardly ever is a language learned after twenty spoken without a foreign accent” (PP 126). We should strive to make our “nervous system our ally instead of our enemy” by forming as many good habits as we can, as early in life as we can. Even later in life, we are to keep our capacity for resolution in shape by every day or two doing “something for no other reason than that you would rather not do it” (PP 130).

Two noteworthy chapters late in The Principles are “The Emotions” and “Will.” The first sets out the theory—also enunciated by the Danish physiologist Carl Lange—that emotion follows, rather than causes, its bodily expression: “Common-sense says, we lose our fortune, are sorry and weep; we meet a bear, are frightened and run; we are insulted by a rival, are angry and strike. The hypothesis here to be defended says that this order of sequence is incorrect…that we feel sorry because we cry, angry because we strike, afraid because we tremble…” (PP 1065–6). The significance of this view, according to James, is that our emotions are tied in with our bodily expressions. What, he asks, would grief be “without its tears, its sobs, its suffocation of the heart, its pang in the breast-bone?” Not an emotion, James answers, for a “purely disembodied human emotion is a nonentity” (PP 1068).

In his chapter on “Will” James opposes the theory of his contemporary Wilhelm Wundt that there is one special feeling—a “feeling of innervation”—present in all intentional action. In his survey of a range of cases, James finds that some actions involve an act of resolve or of outgoing nervous energy, but others do not. For example:

I sit at table after dinner and find myself from time to time taking nuts or raisins out of the dish and eating them. My dinner properly is over, and in the heat of the conversation I am hardly aware of what I do; but the perception of the fruit, and the fleeting notion that I may eat it, seem fatally to bring the act about. There is certainly no express fiat here;… (PP 1131).

The chapter on “Will” also contains striking passages that anticipate the concerns of The Varieties of Religious Experience: about moods, “changes of heart,” and “awakenings of conscience.” These, James observes, may affect the “whole scale of values of our motives and impulses” (PP 1140).

4. Essays in Popular Philosophy

James’s popular and influential, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, published in 1897, collects previously published essays from the previous nineteen years, including “The Sentiment of Rationality” (discussed above), “The Dilemma of Determinism,” “Great Men and Their Environment” and “The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life.” The title essay—published just two years earlier—proved to be controversial for seeming to recommend irresponsible or irrationally held beliefs. James later wrote that he should have called the essay “the right to believe,” to indicate his intent to justify holding certain beliefs in certain circumstances, not to claim that we can (or should) believe things simply by an act of will.

In science, James notes, we can afford to await the outcome of investigation before coming to a belief, but in other cases we are “forced,” in that we must come to some belief even if all the relevant evidence is not in. If I am on an isolated mountain trail, faced with an icy ledge to cross, and do not know whether I can make it, I may be forced to consider the question whether I can or should believe that I can cross the ledge. This question is not only forced, it is “momentous”: if I am wrong I may fall to my death, and if I believe rightly that I can cross the ledge, my holding of the belief may itself contribute to my success. In such a case, James asserts, I have the “right to believe”—precisely because such a belief may help bring about the fact believed in. This is a case “where a fact cannot come at all unless a preliminary faith exists in its coming” (WB, 25).

James applies his analysis to religious belief, particularly to the possible case in which one’s salvation depends on believing in God in advance of any proof that God exists. In such a case the belief may be justified by the outcome to which having the belief leads. He extends his analysis beyond the religious domain, however, to a wide range of secular human life:

A social organism of any sort is what it is because each member proceeds to his own duty with a trust that the other members will simultaneously do theirs…. A government, an army, a commercial system, a ship, a college, an athletic team, all exist on this condition, without which not only is nothing achieved, but nothing is even attempted (WB 24).

Moral questions too are both momentous and unlikely to be sustained by “sensible proof.” They are not matters of science but of “what Pascal calls our heart” (WB 22). James defends our right to believe in certain answers to these questions anyway.

Another essay in the collection, “Reflex Action and Theism,” attempts a reconciliation of science and religion. James’s expression “reflex action” alludes to the biological picture of the organism as responding to sensations with a series of actions. In the higher animals a theoretical or thinking stage intervenes between sensation and action, and this is where, in human beings, the thought of God arises. James maintains that this thought is a natural human response to the universe, independent of any proof that God exists, and he predicts that God will be the “centre of gravity of all attempts to solve the riddle of life” (WB, 116). He ends the essay by advocating a “theism” that posits “an ultimate opacity in things, a dimension of being which escapes our theoretic control” (WB 143).

The Will to Believe also contains James’s most developed account of morality, “The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life.” Morality for James rests on sentience—without it there are no moral claims and no moral obligations. But once sentience exists, a claim is made, and morality gets “a foothold in the universe” (WB 198). Although James insists that there is no common essence to morality, he does find a guiding principle for ethical philosophy in the principle that we “satisfy at all times as many demands as we can” (WB 205). This satisfaction is to be achieved by working towards a “richer universe…the good which seems most organizable, most fit to enter into complex combinations, most apt to be a member of a more inclusive whole” (WB 210). This work proceeds by a series of experiments, by means of which we have learned to live (for the most part) without “polygamy and slavery, private warfare and liberty to kill, judicial torture and arbitrary royal power.” (WB 205) . However, James holds that there is “nothing final in any actually given equilibrium of human ideals, [so that] as our present laws and customs have fought and conquered other past ones, so they will in their turn be overthrown by any newly discovered order which will hush up the complaints that they still give rise to, without producing others louder still” (WB 206).

James’s essay “On a Certain Blindness in Human Beings,” published in his Talks to Teachers on Psychology and to Students on Some of Life’s Ideals in 1899, illustrates another important element of James’s moral outlook. The blindness to which James draws attention is that of one human being to another, a blindness he illustrates with a story from his own life. Riding in the mountains of North Carolina he comes upon a devastated landscape, with no trees, scars in the earth, here and there a patch of corn growing in the sunlight. But after talking to the settlers who had cleared the forest to make room for their farm, James comes to see it their way (at least temporarily): not as devastation but as a manifestation of “duty, struggle, and success.” James concludes: “I had been as blind to the peculiar ideality of their conditions as they certainly would also have been to the ideality of mine, had they had a peep at my strange indoor academic ways of life at Cambridge” (TT 233–4). James portrays a plurality of outlooks in the essay to which he attaches both a metaphysical/epistemological and an ethical import. This plurality, he writes:

commands us to tolerate, respect, and indulge those whom we see harmlessly interested and happy in their own ways, however unintelligible these may be to us. Hands off: neither the whole of truth nor the whole of good is revealed to any single observer, although each observer gains a partial superiority of insight from the peculiar position in which he stands. Even prisons and sick-rooms have their special revelations (TT 264).

Although “On a Certain Blindness” is about toleration and the appreciation of different points of view, James sets out his own romantic point of view in his choice of heroes in the essay: Wordsworth and Shelley, Emerson, and W. H. Hudson, all of whom are said to have a sense of the “limitless significance in natural things” (TT 244). Even in the city, there is “unfathomable significance and importance” (TT 254) in the daily events of the streets, the river, and the crowds of people. James praises Walt Whitman, “a hoary loafer,” for knowing how to profit by life’s common opportunities: after a morning of writing and a bath, Whitman rides the omnibus down Broadway from 23rd street to Bowling Green and back, just for the pleasure and the spectacle of it. “[W]ho knows the more of truth,” James asks, “Whitman on his omnibus-top, full of the inner joy with which the spectacle inspires him, or you, full of the disdain which the futility of his occupation excites?” (TT 252). James’s interest in the inner lives of others, and in writers like Tolstoy who share his understanding of their “mysterious ebbs and flows” (TT 255), leads him to the prolonged study of human religious experience that he presented as the Gifford Lectures in 1901–2, published as The Varieties of Religious Experience in 1902.

5. The Varieties of Religious Experience

Like The Principles of Psychology, Varieties is “A Study in Human Nature,” as its subtitle says. But at some five hundred pages it is only half the length of The Principles of Psychology, befitting its more restricted, if still large, scope. For James studies that part of human nature that is, or is related to, religious experience. His interest is not in religious institutions, ritual, or, even for the most part, religious ideas, but in “the feelings, acts, and experiences of individual men in their solitude, so far as they apprehend themselves to stand in relation to whatever they may consider the divine” (V 31).

James sets out a central distinction of the book in early chapters on “The Religion of Healthy-Mindedness” and “The Sick Soul.” The healthy-minded religious person—Walt Whitman is one of James’s main examples—has a deep sense of “the goodness of life,” (V 79) and a soul of “sky-blue tint” (V 80). Healthy-mindedness can be involuntary, just natural to someone, but often comes in more willful forms. Liberal Christianity, for example, represents the triumph of a resolute devotion to healthy-mindedness over a morbid “old hell-fire theology” (V 91). James also cites the “mind-cure movement” of Mary Baker Eddy, for whom “evil is simply a lie, and any one who mentions it is a liar” (V 107). For “The Sick Soul,” in contrast, “radical evil gets its innings” (V 163). No matter how secure one may feel, the sick soul finds that “[u]nsuspectedly from the bottom of every fountain of pleasure, as the old poet said, something bitter rises up: a touch of nausea, a falling dead of the delight, a whiff of melancholy….” These states are not simply unpleasant sensations, for they bring “a feeling of coming from a deeper region and often have an appalling convincingness” (V 136). James’s main examples are Leo Tolstoy’s “My Confession,” John Bunyan’s autobiography, and a report of terrifying “dread”—allegedly from a French correspondent but actually from James himself. Some sick souls never get well, while others recover or even triumph: these are the “twice-born.” In chapters on “The Divided Self, and the Process of Its Unification” and on “Conversion,” James discusses St. Augustine, Henry Alline, Bunyan, Tolstoy, and a range of popular evangelists, focusing on what he calls “the state of assurance” (V 247) they achieve. Central to this state is “the loss of all the worry, the sense that all is ultimately well with one, the peace, the harmony, the willingness to be, even though the outer conditions should remain the same” (V 248).

Varieties’ classic chapter on “Mysticism” offers “four marks which, when an experience has them, may justify us in calling it mystical…” (V 380). The first is ineffability: “it defies expression…its quality must be directly experienced; it cannot be imparted or transferred to others.” Second is a “noetic quality”: mystical states present themselves as states of knowledge. Thirdly, mystical states are transient; and, fourth, subjects are passive with respect to them: they cannot control their coming and going. Are these states, James ends the chapter by asking, “windows through which the mind looks out upon a more extensive and inclusive world[?]” (V 428).

In chapters entitled “Philosophy”—devoted in large part to pragmatism—and “Conclusions,” James finds that religious experience is on the whole useful, even “amongst the most important biological functions of mankind,” but he concedes that this does not make it true. Nevertheless, James articulates his own belief—which he does not claim to prove—that religious experiences connect us with a greater, or further, reality not accessible in our normal cognitive relations to the world: “The further limits of our being plunge, it seems to me, into an altogether other dimension of existence from the sensible and merely ‘understandable’ world” (V 515).

6. Late Writings

Pragmatism (1907)

James first announced his commitment to pragmatism in a lecture at Berkeley in 1898, entitled “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results.” Later sources for Pragmatism were lectures at Wellesley College in 1905, and at the Lowell Institute and Columbia University in 1906 and 1907. Pragmatism emerges in James’s book as six things: a philosophical temperament, a theory of truth, a theory of meaning, a holistic account of knowledge, a metaphysical view, and a method of resolving philosophical disputes.

The pragmatic temperament appears in the book’s opening chapter, where (following a method he first set out in “Remarks on Spencer’s Definition of Mind as Correspondence”) James classifies philosophers according to their temperaments: in this case “tough-minded” or “tender-minded.” The pragmatist is the mediator between these extremes, someone, like James himself, with “scientific loyalty to facts,” but also “the old confidence in human values and the resultant spontaneity, whether of the religious or romantic type” (P 17). The method of resolving disputes and the theory of meaning are on display in James’s discussion of an argument about whether a man chasing a squirrel around a tree goes around the squirrel too. Taking meaning as the “conceivable effects of a practical kind the object may involve,” the pragmatist philosopher finds that two “practical” meanings of “go around” are in play: either the man goes North, East, South, and West of the squirrel, or he faces first the squirrel’s head, then one of his sides, then his tail, then his other side. “Make the distinction,” James writes, “and there is no occasion for any further dispute.”

The pragmatic theory of truth is the subject of the book’s sixth (and to some degree its second) chapter. Truth, James holds, is “a species of the good,” like health. Truths are goods because we can “ride” on them into the future without being unpleasantly surprised. They “lead us into useful verbal and conceptual quarters as well as directly up to useful sensible termini. They lead to consistency, stability and flowing human intercourse. They lead away from excentricity and isolation, from foiled and barren thinking” (103). Although James holds that truths are “made” (104) in the course of human experience, and that for the most part they live “on a credit system” in that they are not currently being verified, he also holds the empiricistic view that “beliefs verified concretely by somebody are the posts of the whole superstructure” (P 100).

James’s chapter on “Pragmatism and Humanism” sets out his voluntaristic epistemology. “We carve out everything,” James states, “just as we carve out constellations, to serve our human purposes” (P 100). Nevertheless, he recognizes “resisting factors in every experience of truth-making” (P 117), including not only our present sensations or experiences but the whole body of our prior beliefs. James holds neither that we create our truths out of nothing, nor that truth is entirely independent of humanity. He embraces “the humanistic principle: you can’t weed out the human contribution” (P 122). He also embraces a metaphysics of process in the claim that “for pragmatism [reality] is still in the making,” whereas for “rationalism reality is ready-made and complete from all eternity” (P 123). Pragmatism’s final chapter on “Pragmatism and Religion” follows James’s line in Varieties in attacking “transcendental absolutism” for its unverifiable account of God, and in defending a “pluralistic and moralistic religion” (144) based on human experience. “On pragmatistic principles,” James writes, “if the hypothesis of God works satisfactorily in the widest sense of the word, it is true” (143).

A Pluralistic Universe (1909)

Originally delivered in Oxford as a set of lectures “On the Present Situation in Philosophy,” James begins his book, as he had begun Pragmatism, with a discussion of the temperamental determination of philosophical theories, which, James states, “are just so many visions, modes of feeling the whole push … forced on one by one’s total character and experience, and on the whole preferred—there is no other truthful word—as one’s best working attitude” (PU 15). Maintaining that a philosopher’s “vision” is “the important thing” about him (PU 3), James condemns the “over-technicality and consequent dreariness of the younger disciples at our American universities…” (PU 13).

James passes from critical discussions of Josiah Royce’s idealism and the “vicious intellectualism” of Hegel to philosophers whose visions he admires: Gustav Fechner and Henri Bergson. He praises Fechner for holding that “the whole universe in its different spans and wave-lengths, exclusions and developments, is everywhere alive and conscious” (PU, 70), and he seeks to refine and justify Fechner’s idea that separate human, animal and vegetable consciousnesses meet or merge in a “consciousness of still wider scope” (PU 72). James employs Henri Bergson’s critique of “intellectualism” to argue that the “concrete pulses of experience appear pent in by no such definite limits as our conceptual substitutes are confined by. They run into one another continuously and seem to interpenetrate” (PU 127). James concludes by embracing a position that he had more tentatively set forth in The Varieties of Religious Experience: that religious experiences “point with reasonable probability to the continuity of our consciousness with a wider spiritual environment from which the ordinary prudential man (who is the only man that scientific psychology, so called, takes cognizance of) is shut off” (PU 135). Whereas in Pragmatism James subsumes the religious within the pragmatic (as yet another way of successfully making one’s way through the world), in A Pluralistic Universe he suggests that the religious offers a superior relation to the universe.

Essays in Radical Empiricism (1912)

This posthumous collection includes James’s groundbreaking essays on “pure experience,” originally published in 1904–5. James’s fundamental idea is that mind and matter are both aspects of, or structures formed from, a more fundamental stuff—pure experience—that (despite being called “experience”) is neither mental nor physical. Pure experience, James explains, is “the immediate flux of life which furnishes the material to our later reflection with its conceptual categories… a that which is not yet any definite what, tho’ ready to be all sorts of whats…” (ERE 46). That “whats” pure experience may be are minds and bodies, people and material objects, but this depends not on a fundamental ontological difference among these “pure experiences,” but on the relations into which they enter. Certain sequences of pure experiences constitute physical objects, and others constitute persons; but one pure experience (say the perception of a chair) may be part both of the sequence constituting the chair and of the sequence constituting a person. Indeed, one pure experience might be part of two distinct minds, as James explains in a chapter entitled “How Two Minds Can Know One Thing.”

James’s “radical empiricism” is distinct from his “pure experience” metaphysics. It is never precisely defined in the Essays, and is best explicated by a passage from The Meaning of Truth where James states that radical empiricism consists of a postulate, a statement of fact, and a conclusion. The postulate is that “the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience,” the fact is that relations are just as directly experienced as the things they relate, and the conclusion is that “the parts of experience hold together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience” (MT, 6–7).

James was still working on objections to his “pure experience” doctrine, replying to critics of Pragmatism, and writing an introduction to philosophical problems when he died in 1910. His legacy extends into psychology and the study of religion, and in philosophy not only throughout the pragmatist tradition that he founded (along with Charles Peirce), but into phenomenology and analytic philosophy. Edmund Husserl incorporated James’s notions of the “fringe” and “halo” into his phenomenology (Moran, pp. 276–80), Bertrand Russell’s The Analysis of Mind is indebted to James’s doctrine of “pure experience,” (Russell, 1921, pp. 22–6), Ludwig Wittgenstein learned about “the absence of the will act” from James’s Psychology (Goodman, Wittgenstein and William James, p. 81), and the versions of “neopragmatism” set out by Nelson Goodman, Richard Rorty and Hilary Putnam are saturated with James’s ideas. In physics, James’s humanistic pragmatism, and his suggestion that “new being come[s] in local spots and patches” (P 138; Fuchs 2017, p. 33) have inspired the version of quantum theory known as QBism (see Healey). James is one of the most attractive and endearing of philosophers: for his vision of a “wild,” “open” universe that is nevertheless shaped by our human powers and answers to some of our deepest needs, but also, as Russell observed in his obituary, because of the “large tolerance and … humanity” with which he sets that vision out. (The Nation (3 September 1910: 793–4).


Primary Literature: Works by William James

The works that correspond to the abbreviations [PP], [WB], [TT], [V], [P], [PU], [MT], and [E] are referenced below -- the abbreviation is indicated occurs at the end of relevant reference.

  • The Works of William James, Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 17 vol., 1975–.
  • William James: Writings 1878–1899. New York: Library of America, 1992.
  • William James: Writings 1902–1910. New York: Library of America, 1987
  • “Remarks on Spencer’s Definition of Mind as Correspondence,” first published in The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 1878. Contained in Essays in Philosophy, pp. 7–22.
  • The Principles of Psychology, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981. Originally published in 1890 [PP].
  • The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 1979; first published in 1897 [WB].
  • “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results,” 1898. Contained in Pragmatism, in The Works of William James, pp. 255–70.
  • Talks to Teachers on Psychology and to Students on Some of Life’s Ideals. New York: Henry Holt, 1899 [TT].
  • The Varieties of Religious Experience, New York: Longmans, Green, 1916. Originally published in 1902 [V].
  • Pragmatism. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1979. Originally published in 1907 [P].
  • A Pluralistic Universe. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977. Originally published in 1909 [PU].
  • The Meaning of Truth, Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 1979 [MT]. Originally published in 1909.
  • Essays in Philosophy. Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 1978 [E].
  • Some Problems of Philosophy. Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, 1979. Originally published in 1911.
  • The Letters of William James, ed. Henry James, Boston: Little Brown, 1926.
  • The Correspondence of William James, ed. Ignas K. Skrupskelis and Elizabeth M. Berkeley, 12 volumes. Charlottesville and London, University Press of Virginia, 1992–.
  • Selected Letters of William and Henry James, Charlottesville and London, University Press of Virginia, 1997.

Secondary Literature

  • Baghramian, Maria and Sarin Marchetti (eds.), 2017, Pragmatism and the European Traditions: Encounters with Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology Before the Great Divide, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Barzun, Jacques, 1983, A Stroll with William James New York: Harper and Row.
  • Benoist, Jocelyn, 2005, “A Phenomenology or Pragmatism?” in Pragmatism, Critical Concepts in Philosophy, vol. 2, Russell B. Goodman (ed.), London and New York: Routledge, pp. 89–112.
  • Bernstein, Richard, 2010, The Pragmatic Turn, Cambridge, U.K. and Malden, MA: Polity Press.
  • Bird, Graham, 1986, William James (The Arguments of the Philosophers), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Campbell, James, 2017, Experiencing William James: Belief in a Pluralistic World, Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press.
  • Carrette, Jeremy, 2013, William James’s Hidden Religious Imagination: A Universe of Relations, New York: Routledge.
  • Edie, James, 1987, William James and Phenomenology, Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • Feinstein, Howard M., 1984, Becoming William James, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Friedl, Herwig, 2019, Thinking in Search of a Language: Essays on American Intellect and Intuition, New York and London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Fuchs, Christopher A., 2017, “Notwithstanding Bohr: The Reasons for QBism,” Mind and Matter, 15(2): 245–300; page reference is to the preprint of Fuchs 2017 available online].
  • Gale, Richard M., 1999, The Divided Self of William James, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2004, The Philosophy of William James: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Girel, Mathias, 2004, “Les Angles de l’acte. Usages d’Emerson dans la Philosophie de William James,” Cahier Charles V, XXXVII (October): 207–245.
  • Goodman, Russell B., 1990, American Philosophy and the Romantic Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Chapter 3.
  • –––, 2002, Wittgenstein and William James, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2004, “James on the Nonconceptual,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, XXVIII: 137–148.
  • –––, 2008, “Emerson, Romanticism, and Classical American Pragmatism,” in The Oxford Handbook of American Philosophy, ed. Cheryl Misak, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 19–37.
  • –––, 2010, “William James’s Pluralisms,” Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 2: 155–76.
  • –––, 2016, “Thinking about Animals: James, Wittgenstein, Hearne”, in Nordic Wittgenstein Review, 5(1): 9–29.
  • Healey, Richard, 2017, “Quantum-Bayesian and Pragmatist Views of Quantum Theory,” in The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2017 edition), Edward Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Jackman, Henry, 2008, “William James,” in The Oxford Handbook of American Philosophy, Cheryl Misak (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 60–86.
  • –––, 2017, “William James on Conceptions and Private Language,” Belgrade Philosophical Annual, 30: 175–193.
  • Klein, Alexander, 2009, “On Hume on Space: Green’s Attack, James’s Empirical Response,” in Journal of the History of Philosophy, 47(3): 415–49.
  • ––– (ed.), 2018, The Oxford Handbook of William James, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Levinson, Henry S., 1981, The Religious Investigations of William James, Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press.
  • Madelrieux, Stéphane, 2008, William James, l’attitude empiriste, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Marchetti, Sarin, 2015, Ethics and Philosophical Critique in William James, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • –––, forthcoming, The Jamesean Mind, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Matthiessen, F. O., 1947, The James Family, New York: Knopf.
  • McDermott, John, 1986, Streams of Experience: Reflections on the History and Philosophy of American Culture, Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Misak, Cheryl, 2013, The American Pragmatists, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Moore, G. E., 1922, “William James’ ‘Pragmatism’,” in Philosophical Studies, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, pp. 97–146.
  • Moran, Dermot, 2017, “Phenomenology and Pragmatism: Two Interactions. From Horizontal Intentionality to Practical Coping,” in Baghramian and Marchetti 2017, pp. 272–93.
  • Myers, Gerald, 1986, William James: His Life and Thought, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Pawelski, James O., 2007, The Dynamic Individualism of William James, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Perry, Ralph Barton, 1935, The Thought and Character of William James, Boston: Little, Brown, 2 vols.
  • Pihlström, Sami, 2008, The Trail of the Human Serpent is over Everything: Jamesian Perspectives on Mind, World, and Religion, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Poirier, Richard, 1992, Poetry and Pragmatism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Proudfoot, Wayne, ed., 2004, William James and a Science of Religions, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary, 1987, The Many Faces of Realism, La Salle, IL: Open Court.
  • ––– (with Ruth Anna Putnam), 1990, “William James’s Ideas,” in Putnam, Hilary, Realism with a Human Face (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 217–231.
  • Putnam, Ruth Anna, 1997, The Cambridge Companion to William James, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Richardson, Robert D., 2006, William James: In the Maelstrom of American Modernism, Boston: Houghton Mifflin.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1921, The Analysis of Mind, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • –––, 1986, The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell (Volume 6), London: George Allen and Unwin, pp. 257–306.
  • Simon, Linda, 1998, Genuine Reality: a life of William James, New York: Harcourt Brace.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, 1990, William James’s Radical Reconstruction of Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Skillen, Anthony, 1996, “William James, ‘A Certain Blindness’ and an Uncertain Pluralism,” in Philosophy and Pluralism, ed. David Archard. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 33–45.
  • Slater, Michael R., 2009, William James on Ethics and Faith, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Pragmatism and the Philosophy of Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sprigge, T. L. S., 1993, James and Bradley: American Truth and British Reality, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Suckiel, Ellen Kappy, 1982, The Pragmatic Philosophy of William James, Notre Dame, IN and London: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • –––, 1996, Heaven’s Champion, Notre Dame, IN and London: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Tarver, Erin C. and Shannon Sullivan (eds.), 2015, Feminist Interpretations of William James, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Taylor, Eugene, 1996, William James on Consciousness Beyond the Fringe, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Wahl, Jean, 1925, Pluralist Philosophies of England and America, trans. Fred Rothwell , London: Open Court.
  • Wilshire, Bruce, 1979, William James and Phenomenology: A Study of “The Principles of Psychology”, New York: AMS Press, 1979.

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