Supplement to Deontic Logic

Challenges in Defining Deontic Logic

Defining a discipline or area within one is often difficult. Deontic logic is no exception. Standard characterizations of deontic logic are arguably either too narrow or too wide. Deontic logic is often glossed as the logic of obligation, permission, and prohibition, but this is too narrow. For example, it would exclude a logic of supererogation as well as any non-reductive logic for legal notions like claims, liberties, powers, and immunities from falling within deontic logic. On the other hand, we might say that deontic logic is that branch of symbolic logic concerned with the logic of normative expressions: a systematic study of the contribution these expressions make to what follows from what. This is better in that it does not appear to be too exclusive, but it is arguably too broad, since deontic logic is not traditionally concerned with the contribution of every sort of normative expression. For example, “credible” and “dubious” are normative expressions, as are “rational” and “prudent” but these two pairs are not normally construed as within the purview of deontic logic (as opposed to say epistemic logic, and rational choice theory, respectively). Nor would it be enough to simply say that the normative notions of deontic logic are always practical, since the operator “it ought to be the case that,” perhaps the most studied operator in deontic logic, appears to have no greater intrinsic link to practicality than does “credible” or “dubious.” The following seem to be without practical import: “It ought to be the case that early humans did not exterminate Neanderthals.”[1] Perhaps a more refined link to practicality is what separates deontic logic from epistemic logic, but this doesn't help distinguish it from rational choice theory, the former being concerned with collective practical issues as well as individual ones. Perhaps there is no non-ad hoc or principled division between deontic logic and distinct formal disciplines focused on the logic of other normative expressions, such as epistemic logic and rational choice theory. These are interesting and largely unstudied meta-philosophical issues that we cannot settle here. Instead we have defined deontic logic contextually and provisionally.

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Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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