Supplement to Deontic Logic

The Paradox of Derived Obligation/Commitment (Prior 1954)

Consider the following statements:

(1a) Bob's promising to meet you commits him to meeting you.
(1b) It is obligatory that Bob meets you if he promises to do so.

It was suggested that these might be represented in either of two ways in SDL:

(1′) pOBm[1]
(1″) OB(pm)[2]

Consider (1′) first. The following are both simply tautologies: ~r → (rOBs) and OBs → (rOBs). So if (1′) reflected a proper analysis of (1a/1b), anything false would commit us to anything whatsoever (e.g., since I am not now standing on my head, it would follow that my standing on my head commits me to giving you all my money) and everything commits us to anything obligatory (e.g., if I'm obligated to call you, then my standing on my head commits me to doing so). What of (1″) then? The following are theorems of SDL: OB~rOB(rs) and OBsOB(rs). So if (1″) reflected an apt analysis of commitment, it would follow from SDL that anything impermissible commits us to everything, and once again, everything commits us to anything obligatory. So, these seem to be troublesome candidates for symbolizing (1a) or (1b) in SDL. The problems are reminiscent of paradoxes about material implication (reading (1′)), and strict implication (reading (1″)), respectively.[3] So the question arose, are there any special problems associated with the interaction of deontic notions and conditionality? The next paradox (Chisholm's), increased the perception that there might very well be. Many consider it to be the most challenging and distinctive puzzle of deontic logic.

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Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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