Supplement to Neo-Daoism

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji

Technically, the Seven Worthies were of the same generation as Wang Bi, except Shan Tao who was older and closer to He Yan in age. As such, they do not represent a “second generation” of Xuanxue scholars. However, they faced a vastly different political landscape, which sparked new concerns. A series of bloody but futile revolts against the Sima family followed the coup of 249, and political turbulence continued even after the founding of the Jin. In the words of a later historian, this was a time when few intellectuals of note were spared a violent end (Jin shu 49).

Ji Kang—or Xi Kang (Hsi Kang, in Wade-Giles romanization), as the surname Ji was pronounced Xi in classical Chinese—cuts a striking figure in the history of Chinese philosophy. A brilliant musician and poet, a master of Pure Conversation, an iconoclast, a model of integrity, and a handsome man by all accounts, Ji Kang was the undisputed leader of the Seven Worthies and one of the most influential intellectuals of his age. Ji was related to the Wei imperial house by marriage. Not once did he bow to the dictates of the Sima government. Likened to a “sleeping dragon” of great potential threat to the regime, he was eventually imprisoned and sentenced to death. Several thousand students of the imperial academy reportedly petitioned for his release. Before the execution, as traditional sources further relate, Ji remained calm and perfectly composed; as the final hour approached, he asked for a qin (string instrument, commonly translated as zither or lute) and gave a final performance, lamenting only that the tune he played would now die with him (e.g., see Jin shu 49). Later scholars throughout Chinese history who saw themselves as victims of injustice would often draw inspiration from Ji Kang's courage and integrity.

Ji Kang's extant writings include a collection of sixty poems, an influential “Rhapsody on the Zither” (Qin fu), and fourteen other essays. These last provide a good introduction to Ji Kang's Neo-Daoist philosophy. It is worth noting that Ji did not leave behind any commentary on the “Three Treatises on the Profound” and other classics, although he openly acknowledged Laozi and Zhuangzi as his “teachers.” As Xuanxue developed, as mentioned earlier, discursive essays, criticisms, and replies to criticisms began to gain favor as a more direct medium of philosophical discourse. Ji's corpus also includes a “biographical” work, or rather an anthology of legends, entitled Shengxian gaoshi zhuan (Biographies of Sages and High-minded Men), which survives in a Qing dynasty reconstructed edition. Though this work is of greater historical than philosophical interest, it should not be overlooked for it bears indirectly on Ji's famous discourse on “nourishing life.”

The key to Ji Kang's version of Neo-Daoism lies in the concept of ziran. In agreement with He Yan and Wang Bi, Ji sees an inherent order in the universe. The origin of the Daoist world is to be understood in terms of the transformation of qi. The “original qi,” brimming with creative energy but completely undifferentiated, gave rise to yin and yang, from which heaven and earth, the five dynamic elemental forces (wuxing), and the myriad beings in turn ensued. Boundless but not reducible to any shape or form, the Dao can be described as wu, but in this interpretation, the nothingness of Dao gains meaning from the original oneness of qi. In this respect, Ji Kang seems closer to He Yan than Wang Bi in drawing from the yin-yang cosmological theory, though there is perhaps a stronger religious sensibility that distinguishes Ji's approach to the profound mystery of Dao.

On the premise that the order of nature issues from the transformation of qi, Ji Kang recognizes that individuals are allotted a qi endowment of varying abundance and purity, which defines their nature and capacity. This explains why some people are blessed with long life or exceptional talents, while others must endure certain natural disadvantages. The fact that one may be gifted in some ways but deficient in others testifies to the presence of different configurations of vital powers informing each person. In an essay titled “On Intelligence and Courage” (Mingdan lun), Ji Kang thus disputed the assertion that those who possess intelligence or brilliant understanding are sure to have courage. Arising from different determination of qi, Ji says, the two “cannot produce each other.”

While most people are born with a mix of strengths and weaknesses, the logic of ziran allows the possibility of perfect endowment. It follows that sages must be regarded as extraordinary beings animated by the finest qi-essence. For the same reason, Ji Kang defended the existence of “immortals” (xian), a popular ideal in religious Daoism, on the understanding that they are similarly informed by the purest form of qi, which precludes any defilement that causes the body and spirit to decay. Nevertheless, while perfect “destiny” (ming) cannot be ruled out, it is not the handiwork of an omnipotent divine being. Rather, the order of nature should be understood as encompassing the world of spirits and immortals. Put another way, the distinction between “natural” and “supernatural” collapses in the realm of the Dao, for both the sacred and the mundane spring from the transformation of ziran.

So defined, neither sagehood nor immortality can be attained through learning or effort. However, the doctrine of ziran does not necessarily entail a strong determinism or “fatalism” that dismisses all human effort. Immortality may be beyond reach, but as Ji Kang explains in his essay “On Nourishing Life” (Yangsheng lun), self-cultivation can enhance one's physical and spiritual well-being substantially. Specifically, breathing exercises, special diets and the use of drugs can help maximize the limits of one's natural endowment, and bring about rejuvenation and long life. Drug use, incidentally, was widespread among the literati in early medieval China. He Yan, for example, is known to have championed a certain drug for its ability to “lift one's spirit,” and Ji Kang is also reputed to have been a connoisseur in this field. In any case, knowledge of Dao and practice in the art of nourishing life can make a significant difference, even though they may fall short in transforming the person into an immortal.

This same insight underlies Ji Kang's debate with his friend Ruan Kan on whether good or bad fortune is associated with one's place of residence. The debate arose when Ji objected to Ruan's thesis that fortune or misfortune has nothing to do with one's dwelling (zhai wu jixiong). A total of four exchanges (probably out of six) between the two are preserved in Ji's collected writings. Ji Kang did not set out to defend geomancy. The debate is not about whether houses can be built in certain ways to attract good fortune or ward off harmful influences. In rejecting any link between fortune (i.e., destiny conceived as a function of qi endowment) and one's residence (i.e., environmental factors), Ruan Kan was in effect saying that destiny is entirely predetermined. In contrast, reflecting a more dynamic view of ziran, Ji argues first of all that since the world is constituted by qi, naturally some places would be better endowed than others, e.g., in terms of air or water quality, which would create a favorable environment for the residents. Moreover, environmental conditions can be made more conducive to personal and social development. At least, effort is required to ensure that they do not deteriorate, e.g., due to pollution or exploitation of natural resources. In this way, Ji Kang sought to articulate an ethics of ziran that leaves room for appropriate human intervention.

It is important to note, however, that effort directed at nourishing life should always accord with ziran and must not be confused with action that violates the principles of nature. This brings into view Ji Kang's critique of Confucian norms and rituals, which he considered artificial and restrictive. Ji devoted an essay to refuting the widely held view that people “naturally take to learning” (ziran haoxue). Learning in the Confucian sense presupposes discipline and does not come naturally to people, whose need to preserve energy predisposes them toward repose. From this essay, it also becomes clear that the concept of ziran is closely tied to a Daoist philosophy of history, which envisions a process of decline from a pristine beginning of simplicity and wholesome goodness. Echoing the Laozi (Chapter 18), Ji Kang asserts that it is only when the “great Dao” fell into disuse—that is, when selfishness and strife rendered natural, prereflective kindness out of the ordinary—that benevolence and righteousness came to be treasured as acquired, remedial virtues. In this sense, Confucian learning reflects but the loss of naturalness in a world dominated by self-interest. In another essay, “On Dispelling Self-interest” (Shisi lun), Ji brings out further the ethical implications of ziran.

Without self-interest means, at the very least, that one is completely open about one's feelings and intentions. This does not guarantee moral purity, of course—truthfulness may be accompanied by arrogance, for example—but it reflects a heart-mind no longer burdened by praise or blame, approval or censure, and other self-regarding concerns. Conversely, veiled motives and hidden feelings invariably involve calculations of cost and benefit that corrupt the heart-mind, even if they are invested in moral ventures. Ideally, in the case of a sage endowed with perfect nature, complete openness and purity coincide. For the majority, however, self-interest poses an obstacle to realizing ziran. From this perspective, nourishing life thus takes on a deeper ethical meaning. Although breathing exercises and the use of qi-enhancing drugs may be useful, ultimately all such effort must be directed at dispelling self-interest. To dispel self-interest and in this sense attain utmost “emptiness,” it is necessary to confront the root problem of desire.

Desires are harmful to both body and mind, as Ji Kang emphasizes in “On Nourishing Life.” Purity of being, in contrast, entails the absence of desire or any form of emotional disturbance. Are all desires, then, unnatural? The essay drew a sharp response from Xiang Xiu, for whom desire arises naturally from the heart-mind. As such, it cannot be eradicated but only regulated by rules of propriety and ritual action. In reply, Ji Kang points out that although pleasure and anger, and the desire for fame and beauty may stem from the self, like a tumor they only serve to deplete one's qi-energy. Basic needs are of course not to be denied, but desires are shaped by objects and reflect cognitive distortions that consume the self. To quench one's thirst, one does not desire to drink the whole river. This is fundamentally different from the desire for power and wealth, which knows no rest. Further, the suppression of desire by artificial means may remove certain symptoms, but it does not cure the disease. It is only by recognizing the harmful influences of desire that one begins to seek calmness and emptiness of mind. Ultimately, nourishing life is not just about health and longevity but sets its sight on a higher, and to Ji Kang, more authentic, mode of being characterized by dispassion.

In this connection, Ji Kang's famous thesis that emotions are foreign to music—or literally, that “sounds do not have [in them] sorrow or joy” (sheng wu ai le)—becomes readily understandable. If desire and the emotions that flow from it are not intrinsic to nature, and since sounds are naturally produced by the vibration of qi-energies, it cannot be the case that music embodies sorrow or joy, as classical Confucian musical theory generally assumes. Subjective and cognitive reactions, including the possibility of emotional contagion, in other words, should be distinguished from what is natural and objective; otherwise, Ji argues, one can hardly account for the fact that the same piece of music may invoke different responses in different audiences. Certain sounds, perhaps together with other factors like temperature or lighting, may tend to produce certain responses, e.g., making the listener irritable, but it cannot be said that such sounds are “ill-tempered” in themselves. On the aesthetic front, this has the effect of opening up the field of aesthetic judgment—for example, music condemned by classical Confucianism as inherently “licentious” could now be reappraised in terms of its musical quality. At the ethical and spiritual level, music can be a powerful aid to nourishing life. This is because music can articulate harmony that would render conditions more favorable for the heart-mind to dispel self-interest. Ji Kang's work on nourishing life and the nature of music wielded considerable influence among Xuanxue scholars. Together with the debate on the relationship between “words and meaning,” which will be discussed in Section 5 below, they ranked as three of the most important topics in Neo-Daoist philosophy (see Shishuo xinyu 4.21).

Ji Kang is often depicted as a radical iconoclast, who openly challenged the authority of classical models of moral attainment, including Confucius. Compared with He Yan and Wang Bi, he certainly seems less inclined to accommodate Confucian learning and ritual practice in his vision of ziran. It is also true that he was politically frustrated and marginalized. Yet, the emphasis on nourishing life need not imply abandoning the sociopolitical world for a life of reclusive exile. Like Wang Bi, Ji recognizes that the order of ziran encompasses basic social institutions like the family and the state. In his “Family Admonitions” (Jiajie), he instructed his children to uphold integrity in both private and public life. In an essay devoted to the teachings of government (Taishi zhen), Ji affirmed that rulership has a basis in the principles of nature. Respect for elders and kindness are not contrary to ziran, so long as they do not become deliberate acts with a view to self-gain. Ji Kang might have preferred a life of “carefree wandering,” to borrow a phrase from the Zhuangzi, and historical sources also report that he sought the company of recluses, but this does not mean that he was unconcerned about the politics of his day.

In another essay (Guan Cai lun), Ji attempted to rehabilitate the two nobles of the Zhou dynasty—Lords Guan and Cai—who had been condemned by later historians for their opposition to the Duke of Zhou. Commentators generally agree that the historical discussion serves as a pretext and the real criticism is directed at the Sima regime. This is not the work of a man who rejected politics as a matter of principle, but points instead to an engaged intellectual who would stop at nothing to make known the truth as he saw it. In the end, if the order of ziran were allowed to flourish, if desire and self-interest were pacified, and if careful nourishing were applied to remove interference especially of the Confucian and Legalist variety, society would attain peace and harmony of its own accord. Despite the tragic circumstances of his life, Ji Kang proves rather sanguine in his faith in the power of ziran.

Together with Ji Kang, Ruan Ji (Juan Chi) came to represent the Xuanxue movement after the coup of 249. An outstanding poet and musician, he is also remembered for his daring defiance of the Confucian orthodoxy, at a time when deviation from the norms of tradition could easily be deemed seditious. To his admirers, Ruan Ji was a tragic hero. Well versed in both Confucian and Daoist learning, he was evidently a man of principle who took seriously the calling of an intellectual to bring peace and harmony to the state. Hailing from a distinguished family, he was in a strong position to make a difference in public affairs. The unforgiving realities of third-century Chinese politics, however, soon took its toll on Ruan, who found himself trapped in a world of violence and duplicity. Ruan was commissioned under the Sima government; in fact, he was cherished at the highest level for his talent and influence among the educated elite. Unlike Ji Kang, whose refusal to submit to the new government cost him his life, Ruan reluctantly took his place along the corridors of power and avoided a violent end. This is not to say that he had betrayed his ideals out of fear, or that survival did not come with a price. Proud and uncompromising, never a consenting partner in the intercourse of power, Ruan had to endure repeated slander and escaped censure only by finding refuge in an almost constant intoxicated stupor.

Drinking was an important aspect of literati culture. Wine made from a variety of fruits and grains was widely consumed. In Ruan's case, wine became a means to self-expression as well as a lifeline to preserving his integrity. According to his biography, he avoided a marriage proposal from the Sima house itself by staying drunk for sixty days (Jin shu 49). Whether this actually happened, or whether he was an alcoholic is not the issue; what emerges from this and other reports is a portrait of a frustrated but sensitive and ardent thinker, whose outrage at an immoral world finds precise expression in “outrageous” opinions and behavior challenging the legitimacy of established practice. Even at his mother's funeral, Ruan did not stop drinking, an act that patently disregarded the requirement of ritual and resulted in a call for his banishment from the realm. The full significance of the story comes to light when the reader realizes that Ruan was in fact famous for his filial piety. When his mother died, his grief was so intense that he “coughed up blood” and “wasted away” for a long time.

Although Ruan was unable to escape from the world of power, he took every opportunity to assert his free and indomitable spirit. Rituals and convention were not meant for him, as he announced boldly in response to a charge that he had contravened the rules of propriety in seeing his sister-in-law off on a journey. So disgusted with and disdainful of the shallow men of high society, Ruan would literally “eye” his visitors in different ways—gleaming with adoration and pleasure when they were to his taste, or rolling his eyes superciliously when the company was deemed foul. This did not earn him too many friends at court, but it certainly enhanced his reputation as a leader of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove. Despite his unyielding distaste for hypocrisy, Ruan never allowed himself to criticize individuals openly by name, an aloofness that no doubt saved his neck and earned the admiration of Ji Kang, whose more fiery temperament proved less amenable to the wise counsel of silence.

Ruan Ji left behind a large number of poems and several essays. An early work is entitled “Disquisition on Music” (Yue lun), in which he discusses along Confucian lines the function of music in bringing about harmony. Like most Neo-Daoist intellectuals, Ruan believed that the teaching of Confucius had been distorted by later scholars who under the banner of Confucianism sought merely to further their own gain. Confucius was only concerned with the Dao. The writings of Confucius and other sages sought to bring to light but one Daoist truth. In particular, as discussed previously, the Yijing, Laozi, and Zhuangzi were seen to have comprehended fully the profound mystery of Dao, and Ruan devoted an essay to each of them. While the essay on the Yijing (Tong Yi lun) dates probably to his youth, and that on the Laozi (Tong Lao lun) survives only in fragments, the Da Zhuang lun (On the Full Meaning of the Zhuangzi) reflects Ruan's mature thinking. Equally important is his famous poetic essay, the “Biography of Master Great Man” (Daren xiansheng zhuan), in which he takes aim at the corrupt ways of the world and evokes an image of Daoist transcendence, a biting contrast that is rendered all the more powerful in the light of his own predicament.

Like Ji Kang, Ruan Ji focuses on the concept of ziran, naturalness, in his reformulation of Daoist philosophy. Commenting on the Laozi, Ruan makes clear that the concept of Dao should be understood as the “self-so” source of the processes of change and transformation. Whereas the Laozi calls it Dao, the Yijing describes it as the “Great Ultimate” (taiji), and the Spring and Autumn Annals, the “Origin” (yuan). Or, as Ruan writes in his essay on the Zhuangzi, “heaven and earth are born of ziran, and the myriad beings are born of heaven and earth.” There is “nothing outside” (wuwai) the world of ziran, Ruan adds, which is to say that the Dao should not be mistaken for any metaphysical agent or entity. Rather, the theory of naturalness suggests that heaven and earth and everything within it originate from one vital qi-energy. All phenomena are constituted by qi; as such, according to Ruan, Zhuangzi is surely right when he declares that “the myriad beings are but one body” (Zhuangzi, Chapter 5).

The plenitude of nature reflects the inexhaustible resourcefulness of the Dao. Moreover, phenomena conform to constant principles and function in harmony. In his Zhuangzi essay, Ruan details in traditional cosmological terms how the original qi differentiates into yin and yang, the two basic forms of vital energy that not only shape but continue to govern the phenomenal world. Male and female, the hot and the cold, light and darkness, and other yin-yang correlates underpin the structural order of the Daoist universe. The movement of the sun and the moon, the regularity of the seasons, the operation of wind and rain, and other natural processes disclose further a dynamic regime of self-regulating change and renewal. In this way, an inherent order is shown to lie at the heart of ziran. As in Ji Kang's analysis, this forms the basis of an ethics of naturalness.

The ideal sage, of course, embodies naturalness in his entire being. This presupposes a profound understanding of what the Zhuangzi calls the “equality of things,” now explained by Ruan Ji in terms of the oneness of qi. Life and death, fortune and misfortune, and other seemingly unbridgeable divides form but moments in the same continuum of natural transformation. The sage, accordingly, regards them as one. Distinctions, in the sense of value discrimination, can thus no longer be maintained. Whether this entails a mystical union with nature remains a question. Ruan's poetic eloquence, especially in the “Biography of Master Great Man,” often appears to rise to mystical heights. Nevertheless, the more important point seems to be that the sage recognizes the centrality of emptiness and quiescence in a life of ziran.

Devoid of self-interest, unmoved by riches and power, completely at ease with his own nature and the natural order of things at large, the sage attains freedom and in this sense, “transcendence.” In contrast, as “Master Great Man” denounces, the learned “gentlemen” of polite society are no better than the lice that dwell in one's pants. Hiding deep in the recesses of tradition, they dare not move against ritual and dread any threat to the status quo. When hungry, they feast parasitically on the people. There is ample evidence that Ruan Ji regarded the teachings of the Confucian tradition at that time to be deficient and detrimental to the project of naturalness.

More precisely, Ruan's theory of ziran envisages an inner spirituality that must be protected from the corrupting influence of power and desire. There is a wholesome sincerity and innocence to natural affective expressions. When desire for gain is allowed to dominate, however, what is spontaneous mutates into hidden designs and false appearances. For this reason, complete openness ranks high on Ruan's ethical agenda. In a world dominated by small-minded “gentlemen,” where sincerity of feeling is judged a threat to the establishment, an ethics of naturalness inevitably finds itself engaged in a struggle for freedom.

Later Xuanxue scholars took great pleasure in recounting how despite venomous opposition, Ruan Ji had persisted in his unorthodox ways. For example, we are told that he frequented a neighbor's place for wine and the company of the latter's beautiful wife. When he got drunk, he would fall asleep next to her. Understandably suspicious at first, the husband nonetheless found Ruan completely innocent, honorable and above reproach in both intention and act. In this, we see how moral character is traced to naturalness. Another neighbor had a talented and beautiful daughter who unfortunately died young. Although Ruan did not know the family, he went all the same to her funeral and cried with total abandon. Whether in these or other accounts, the point is always that whereas rituals and taboos stifle and corrupt the self, naturalness promises liberation and a return to authenticity.

Does not the open display of emotions contradict the emphasis on “emptiness”? He Yan, for example, had argued that sages do not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. However, as this view entails that sages must be regarded as ontologically distinct from ordinary human beings and that sagehood is beyond the reach of self-cultivation, not all Xuanxue scholars would be amenable to it. As we have seen, Wang Bi had countered that “emptiness” need not suggest the absence of emotion, but rather an enlightened mode of being marked by a heart-mind that is not bound by emotional or other attachments. These arguments would have been known to Ruan Ji. Given Ruan's emphasis on authenticity, he would be concerned to show that genuine affective responses flowing from a pure heart empty of selfish desire belong integrally to the ideal ethical life.

In the Da Zhuang lun, Ruan Ji describes the sage as a “person of ultimate attainment” (zhiren), whose profound understanding of the “equality” of things in the order of ziran naturally expresses itself in a simple yet fulfilled life. On a larger scale, this should translate into a peaceful and harmonious society. If nature had yielded an originally pristine order, how did it come to be infested with an army of “lice”? Ruan Ji provides a startling response in his “Biography of Master Great Man.”

At the “beginning,” when yin and yang naturally took their course, when domination and deceit were yet unknown, all under heaven indeed lived in perfect harmony. There were neither rulers nor ministers, and yet order prevailed of its own accord. When rulership was established, Ruan goes on to say, domination arose; when ministers were appointed, conflict and deceit also came into the world. It is not entirely clear why or how kingship came to be established, but judging from Ruan's essay on the Zhuangzi, much of the blame lies with subjective discrimination. When natural distinctions (e.g., differences in size) became value markers (e.g., that big is “better” than small), desire and domination already began to cloud the true picture.

In elevating naturalness above all manmade institutions, Ruan Ji thus found a place for anarchism, which is rarely entertained in the whole of Chinese philosophy. During the fourth century, perhaps reflecting the political turbulence of the period, another thinker by the name of Bao Jingyan did take up the same theme in an essay entitled “On Not Having Rulers” (Wu jun lun). Although the work has not survived, it was criticized by Ge Hong (ca. 283–363) in his Baopuzi (The Master Who Embraces Simplicity). According to Ge Hong, Bao was an avid reader of the Laozi and the Zhuangzi and was adept in the art of disputation. The main thesis of his work is that rulership is but a form of domination that violates naturalness. Nevertheless, anarchism did not find strong support in Neo-Daoism. In fact, the majority of Xuanxue scholars may be said to have espoused fairly “conservative” political ideals. He Yan and Wang Bi, for example, had little difficulty justifying absolute monarchical rule, provided that it coincides with ziran and “nonaction.”

While the critique of government is clear, Ruan Ji was certainly not plotting to overthrow it. Such scheming would an inimical to the goal of naturalness. Does it entail renunciation, a complete severing from the political world? Ruan Ji is commonly depicted as a frustrated intellectual yearning for a life free of deception and untainted by power relations. Indeed, one suggestion is that whereas Ruan in his early writings had accorded a positive place to ritual and music as the work of the ancient sages to maintain harmony in the world, in his later years he became totally disillusioned and turned to escapism. This view is unhelpful, because it undermines the possibility of renewal in the philosophy of ziran. The ethics of naturalness is not about renunciation. The sages of old were all concerned with diminishing the power of desire, so as to enable the people to live well and prosper. From this perspective, the Daoist recluse furnishes a powerful symbol because he abides by ziran and not because he refuses to have anything to do with the world. Similarly, the “Great Man” does not aspire to a life of freedom to realize his own ambition, but rather to initiate a process of healing that would revitalize the rule of the Dao, envisioned as a kind of wholesome cooperative community. If naturalness has any restorative power at all, escapism should have little role to play in Neo-Daoist ethics.

Copyright © 2014 by
Alan Chan <>

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