Supplement to The Consistent Histories Approach to Quantum Mechanics

Further Reading

This supplement contains recommendations for further reading on a number of topics in various sections of the main text.

Section 2: Quantum Properties. The basic definition of a quantum property as the term is used here was set forth in Section III.5 of von Neumann (1932). Ch. 4 of Griffiths (2002a) provides a fairly elementary introduction, while Section 4.6 provides an elementary example of the quantum logic scheme of Birkhoff and von Neumann (1936). A detailed discussion of the alternative logic associated with consistent histories will be found in Griffiths (2014).

Section 3: Quantum Probabilities. Chapter 5 of Griffiths (2002a) introduces quantum probabilities and sample spaces in a way that shows their relationship to their classical counterparts.

Section 4.1: Quantum Time Development: Kinematics. History families in which the choice of events to discuss at a given time depends on particular events in the past or in the future are discussed in Section 14.4 of Griffiths (2002a).

Section 4.2: Quantum Time Development: Dynamics. Several very simple examples (toy models) of quantum time development, including radioactive decay, measurements, and interferometers will be found in Chapters 12 and 13 of Griffiths (2002a).

Section 5.2: Counterfactual Reasoning. See the extended discussion in Chapter 19 of Griffiths (2002a) and an application to Hardy's paradox in Chapter 25. The exchange between Stapp and the author in Stapp (2012) and Griffiths (2012) may also be of interest.

Section 6: Classical Physics. For a lengthier discussion of how classical emerges from quantum physics see Chapter 26 of Griffiths (2002a), which is based on ideas in Gell-Mann and Hartle (1993, 2007) and Hartle (2011). These are broadly consistent with the approach of Omnès (1988).

Section 7: Measurement and Preparation. Measurements are discussed at considerable length in Chapters 17 and 18 of Griffiths (2002a), and as applied to Bell’s problem in Griffiths (2011b). For preparation of quantum states, see Section 3.5 of Griffiths (2014).

Section 7.4: Generalized and Weak Measurements. See Griffiths (2017a) for a detailed discussion of both of these topics from the histories perspective.

Section 8: Locality and Special Relativity. Detailed discussions will be found in Chapters 23 and 24 of Griffiths (2002a) and in Griffiths (2002b, 2011a, 2011b).

Section 8.2: Bell inequalities and Einstein locality. Discussion of these topics from the histories perspective will be found in Chapters 23 and 24 of Griffiths (2002a), whereas Griffiths (2011b) provides a more readable, and Griffiths (2011a) a more detailed analysis.

Section 9: Quantum Information. A brief introduction to the histories perspective on quantum information will be found in Griffiths (2017b), whereas Griffiths (2013) has an extended and more technical discussion.

Section 10.3: Incompatibility paradoxes Details of the histories approach will be found in Ch. 22 of Griffiths (2002a). In addition see Sec. V E of Griffiths (2017a) for remarks on the widely discussed but often ill-defined notion of quantum “contextuality”.

Section 10.4: Counterfactual paradoxes. In addition to the material indicated above for Section 5.2, see the discussion of Wheeler's delayed choice in Section II B of Griffiths (2017a).

Section 11.4: Unicity is one of the main topics in Griffiths (2014); see in particular the discussion in Section 4.

Copyright © 2019 by
Robert B. Griffiths <>

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