Carl Schmitt

First published Sat Aug 7, 2010; substantive revision Thu Aug 29, 2019

Carl Schmitt (1888–1985) was a conservative German legal, constitutional, and political theorist. Schmitt is often considered to be one of the most important critics of liberalism, parliamentary democracy, and liberal cosmopolitanism. But the value and significance of Schmitt’s work is subject to controversy, mainly due to his intellectual support for and active involvement with National Socialism.

1. Biographical Sketch

Carl Schmitt’s early career as an academic lawyer falls into the last years of the Wilhelmine Empire. (See for Schmitt’s life and career: Bendersky 1983; Balakrishnan 2000; Mehring 2009.) But Schmitt wrote his most influential works, as a young professor of constitutional law in Bonn and later in Berlin, during the Weimar-period: Political Theology, presenting Schmitt’s theory of sovereignty, appeared in 1922, to be followed in 1923 by The Crisis of Parliamentary Democracy, which attacked the legitimacy of parliamentary government. In 1927, Schmitt published the first version of his most famous work, The Concept of the Political, defending the view that all true politics is based on the distinction between friend and enemy. The culmination of Schmitt’s work in the Weimar period, and arguably his greatest achievement, is the 1928 Constitutional Theory, which systematically applied Schmitt’s political theory to the interpretation of the Weimar constitution. During the political and constitutional crisis of the later Weimar Republic Schmitt published Legality and Legitimacy, a clear-sighted analysis of the breakdown of parliamentary government in Germany, as well as The Guardian of the Constitution, which argued that the president as the head of the executive, and not a constitutional court, ought to be recognized as the guardian of the constitution. In these works from the later Weimar period, Schmitt’s declared aim to defend the Weimar constitution is at times barely distinguishable from a call for constitutional revision towards a more authoritarian political framework (Dyzenhaus 1997, 70–85; Berthold 1999; Kennedy 2004, 154–78; Breuer 2012).

Though Schmitt had not been a supporter of National Socialism before Hitler came to power, he sided with the Nazis after 1933. Schmitt quickly obtained an influential position in the legal profession and came to be perceived as the ‘Crown Jurist’ of National Socialism. (Rüthers 1990; Mehring 2009, 304–436) He devoted himself, with undue enthusiasm, to such tasks as the defence of Hitler’s extra-judicial killings of political opponents (PB 227–32) and the purging of German jurisprudence of Jewish influence (Gross 2007; Mehring 2009, 358–80). But Schmitt was ousted from his position of power within legal academia in 1936, after infighting with academic competitors who viewed Schmitt as a turncoat who had converted to Nazism only to advance his career. There is considerable debate about the causes of Schmitt’s willingness to associate himself with the Nazis. Some authors point to Schmitt’s strong ambition and his opportunistic character but deny ideological affinity (Bendersky 1983, 195–242; Schwab 1989). But a strong case has been made that Schmitt’s anti-liberal jurisprudence, as well as his fervent anti-semitism, disposed him to support the Nazi regime (Dyzenhaus 1997, 85–101; Scheuerman 1999). Throughout the later Nazi period, Schmitt’s work focused on questions of international law. The immediate motivation for this turn seems to have been the aim to justify Nazi-expansionism. But Schmitt was interested in the wider question of the foundations of international law, and he was convinced that the turn towards liberal cosmopolitanism in 20th century international law would undermine the conditions of stable and legitimate international legal order. Schmitt’s theoretical work on the foundations of international law culminated in The Nomos of the Earth, written in the early 1940’s, but not published before 1950. Due to his support for and involvement with the Nazi dictatorship, Schmitt was briefly detained and interrogated at the end of the war as a potential defendant in the Nuremberg trials (ECS; AN), the legitimacy of which he impugned in a legal brief prepared for the defense of the German industrialist Friedrich Flick (IC). The obstinately unrepentant Schmitt was not allowed to return to an academic job after 1945 (Mehring 2009, 438–63). But he nevertheless remained an important figure in West Germany’s conservative intellectual scene to his death in 1985 (van Laak 2002) and enjoyed a considerable degree of clandestine influence elsewhere (Scheuerman 1999, 183–251; Müller 2003).

Unsurprisingly, the significance and value of Schmitt’s works is subject to heated controversy (Caldwell 2005). A group of authors sympathetic to Schmitt argue that Schmitt’s analysis of liberal constitutionalism during the Weimar period is separable from his support for National Socialism and that it constitutes an insightful and important analysis of the political presuppositions of a well-functioning liberal constitutional system (Bendersky 1983; Schwab 1989; Gottfried 1990; Kennedy 2004; Schupmann 2017). From the left, Schmitt’s work is sometimes taken to illustrate the affinities between a purely economic liberalism and political authoritarianism (Mauss 1980; Cristi 1998). The view that the Schmitt of the Weimar period can be read as a defender of liberal order has been questioned by authors who stress the continuity between Schmitt’s conceptions of law, sovereignty, and democracy and fascist ideology (Wolin 1992; Dyzenhaus 1997; Scheuerman 1999). However, engagement with Schmitt is nevertheless considered to be important. It has been argued that Rawlsian political liberalism is vulnerable to Schmitt’s critique of liberalism due to its unwillingness to base itself explicitly on a liberal conception of the good (Dyzenhaus 1997, 218–58) or due to its refusal to recognize the antagonistic nature of politics (Mouffe 1999b). Moreover, Schmitt’s views on sovereignty and emergency powers are often seen as the intellectual basis of contemporary calls for a strong executive power unhampered by constraints of legality (Dyzenhaus 2006, 35–54; Scheuerman 2006; Posner and Vermeule 2010, 3–24). Finally, there are an increasing number of authors who concentrate on particular arguments of Schmitt’s that are seen as worth developing in a systematic context. Two focal points of recent interest are Schmitt’s theory of popular sovereignty (Arato 1995; Lindahl 2007; Kalyvas 2008, 79–186; Loughlin 2010, 209–37; Kahn 2011; Colon-Rios 2012, 79–101; Minkkinen 2013; Vinx 2013a) and his conception of international order (Odysseos and Petito 2007; Slomp 2009; Legg 2011; Benhabib, 2012; Vinx 2013b; Hathaway and Shapiro 2017, chapter 10).

2. Sovereignty and Dictatorship

Modern liberal constitutions do not acknowledge a bearer of sovereign authority, and modern legal and constitutional theory has often tried to dispense with the concept. But Schmitt argues, in Political Theology, that such attempts to get rid of sovereignty cannot be successful. In Schmitt’s view, there can be no functioning legal order without a sovereign authority (PT 5–35; Dyzenhaus 1997, 42–51; McCormick 1997, 121–56; Hofmann 2002, 49–64; Kennedy 2004, 54–91; Kahn 2011, 31–61; Croce and Salvatore 2013, 13–29; Vinx 2015). According to Schmitt, liberal constitutionalists typically hold that all legitimate particular acts of state must apply general legal norms, so that people are subject only to the determinate and predictable demands of the law, not to the potentially arbitrary authority of persons (PT 18–26; see also CT 169–96, CPD 33–50). This view overlooks, Schmitt argues, that general legal norms often fail to provide determinate guidance without considerable interpretation and interstitial legislation (PT 29–35; GU 21–43). In order for the law to become effective, there needs to be an authority that decides how to apply general legal rules to concrete cases and how to deal with problems of contested interpretation or under-determination. However, the material content of the law does not itself determine who is to interpret and to apply it. Hence, a sovereign authority prior to the law is needed to decide how to apply general legal norms to particular cases (PT 29–35).

This argument appears to assume that all legal norms are material norms providing substantive grounds of legal decision. But modern legal systems typically contain norms of competence in addition to material norms. Hence, it seems that the view that all legitimate political authority depends on legal authorization is not as indefensible as Schmitt suggests (Kaufmann 1988, 337–45). The law can determine, for any material legal norm, which person or institution has the competence to interpret and apply it. Subjects of the law may admittedly have to accept that a final decision might turn out to be binding even though wrong. And in this limited sense, Schmitt is right to appeal to Hobbes’s dictum that it is authority and not truth that makes the law. (PT 33–4) But that a legal system, through its norms of competence, provides for the authoritative interpretation of its material legal norms hardly entails that it must contain a sovereign in the traditional understanding of that term. Schmitt’s implicit reply to this objection claims that the applicability of legal norms presupposes a general condition of social normality. Legal norms, Schmitt argues, cannot be applied to a chaos. They require a “homogeneous medium.” (PT 13) No legal norm, in Schmitt’s view, can govern an extreme case of emergency or an absolute state of exception. In a completely abnormal situation, the continued application of the law through the normal administrative and judiciary channels is going to lead to haphazard and unpredictable results, while preventing effective action to end the emergency (PT 13; GU 44–114; Scheuerman 1996; Hofmann 2002, 17–33). If the applicability of material legal norms presupposes a condition of normality, Schmitt assumes, a polity must be entitled to decide whether to suspend the application of its law on the ground that the situation is abnormal. Hence Schmitt’s famous definition of sovereignty, according to which the sovereign is he who decides on the state of exception: If there is some person or institution, in a given polity, capable of bringing about a total suspension of the law and then to use extra-legal force to normalize the situation, then that person or institution is the sovereign in that polity (PT 5). Any legal order, Schmitt bluntly concludes, is based on a sovereign decision and not on a legal norm (PT 10, 12–3).

One might reply to this line of thought that it is perfectly possible to establish legal conditions for the declaration of a state of emergency as well as legal constraints on the permissible means of dealing with an emergency. Schmitt argues, though, that attempts to legalize the exceptional situation are doomed to failure. It is impossible to anticipate the nature of future emergencies and to determine in advance what means might be necessary to deal with them. As a result, the positive law can at best determine who is to decide whether there is an emergency that requires a wholesale suspension of the law. But the sovereign decision cannot be guided by existing material law (PT 11–2). In Schmitt’s view, it is not even necessary for the law to determine who can take a decision on the exception. There can be a sovereign authority, in a jurisprudentially relevant sense, even where such an authority is not recognized by positive constitutional law. All that matters is whether there is a person or institution that possesses the ability, as a matter of fact, to take a decision on the exception. If a sovereign, so understood, exists, its authority to suspend the law does not stand in need of positive legal recognition, since the law’s applicability itself depends on a situation of normality secured by the sovereign (PT 12–3). What about cases, though, where sovereignty is not just unrecognized in positive law but where there is no one, as a matter of fact, who could successfully take a decision to suspend the law altogether? This condition seems to apply in many contemporary western democracies. Perhaps such polities are ill-prepared to deal with radical emergencies. But it would be implausible to conclude that they do not possess a legal order. Schmitt’s full response to this objection will only become clear from his discussion of ‘the political.’ The objection suggests, however, that Schmitt’s claims about sovereignty cannot plausibly be understood as claims about the presuppositions of the mere factual existence of a legal system. Schmitt must be arguing that wherever the situation of normality or homogeneity that makes the results of the application of law determinate and predictable is no longer guaranteed by a sovereign, the positive legal system, consisting of material norms and of positive norms of competence, can no longer be legitimate (Mauss 1980, 81–121; Scheuerman 1999, 15–37; Hofmann 2002).

If the sovereign’s decision on the exception is not subject to any material legal constraint, the power to decide on the state of exception is tantamount to the power to decide what should count as a state of exception (PT 13; Norris 2007). A sovereign’s view on this issue, however, must be responsive to prevailing social attitudes. If it were not, a sovereign could hardly possess the factual capability to suspend the law and to act successfully against the perceived emergency. To do so, his decision will need to be supported by a sufficiently large and powerful constituency. Nevertheless, the need for sovereign decision will be greatest in a society torn by serious ideological or social conflict. And if there is no unanimity among social groups as to what situation to perceive as normal or exceptional, the sovereign decision will inevitably have to side with one group’s conception of normality against that of another. The sovereign creation of a condition of normality, in other words, constitutes a community’s political identity and it is likely to do so through the forcible suppression of those whose conception of normality differs from the sovereign’s (D 132–47). The question of the legitimacy of law thus turns on the question of the legitimacy of an identity-constituting sovereign exercise of foundational violence.

Schmitt admits that the principle of democracy is the only principle of legitimacy that is available as an ideological basis for a contemporary constitution (PT 50–2; CPD 22–32). If Schmitt’s conception of sovereignty is to be defensible, it must therefore be given a democratic interpretation. But it is difficult to see how this could be possible. The only candidate for sovereignty in a democratic polity is the popular sovereign, composed of politically equal citizens. A popular sovereign, it seems, cannot be a Schmittian sovereign, as it will only be able to decide under existing constitutional rules that determine how the people as a collective are to form a unified will. Schmitt prepared the groundwork for a solution to this problem in Dictatorship, his historical study of the development of the institution of dictatorship (McCormick 1997, 121–56; Cristi 1998 108–25; Kalyvas 2008, 88–126; Kelly 2016).

Dictatorial power in its original, Roman form is a formally delegated and time-limited power to defend an already existing republican constitution through the use of extra-legal force (D xlii–xliv, 1–19). A Roman dictator, then, was clearly not a sovereign in Schmitt’s sense of the term. In the course of modern constitutional history, however, the institution of dictatorship, Schmitt claims, fused with sovereignty, and this fusion related sovereignty to democracy. The first step towards this fusion, in Schmitt’s account, was the use of commissarial dictatorship in the early modern absolutist state. The absolutist sovereign did possess the sovereign power to decide on the exception, and was thus capable of authorizing commissars to use dictatorial methods in his name. But the notions of dictatorship and sovereignty were not yet fused. The commissarial dictators of the absolutist sovereign were mere agents of the sovereign and did not themselves possess the power to decide on the exception. The absolutist sovereign, in turn, though he had the power to decide on the exception, was not himself a dictator; first of all since he did not decide under someone else’s but by his own authority, and secondly because he was of course expected to rely on legal governance as his normal mode of operation (D 20–33). But the relation between sovereignty and dictatorship changed in the French revolution. The revolutionary governments relied heavily on dictatorial action to create a new situation of normality that would allow a new constitution to come into force. The revolutionary governments, like the absolutist sovereign, claimed the power to decide on the exception, but they did not claim to be sovereign. Rather, they claimed to exercise the authority to decide on the exception in the name of the French people, even while they were ruling the French people by the use of dictatorial methods (D 132–47). Sovereignty and dictatorship had become fused in the novel institution of sovereign dictatorship: A sovereign dictator is a dictator who does not defend an already existing constitution but attempts to create a new one and who does so not by his own authority but in the name of the people (D 112–31).

Sovereign dictatorship, in Schmitt’s view, is an eminently democratic institution. It can exist only where it has become possible to take a sovereign decision on the exception in the name of the people. Sovereignty, Schmitt concludes, is not just compatible with democracy but central to it, as it is exercised whenever and wherever a democratic constitution is founded (CT 109–10, 265–6; CPD 32). The fact that a democratic constitution cannot endow a particular person with permanent sovereign authority does not entail that the possibility of a genuine sovereign decision on the exception has disappeared. It merely implies that a decision on the exception in the democratic state must take the form of an exercise of the people’s constituent power.

3. The Concept of the Political and the Critique of Liberalism

The sovereign dictator has the power, in taking the decision on the exception, to set aside the positive legal and constitutional order in its entirety and to create a novel positive legal and constitutional order, together with a situation of social normality that fits it. It follows that the sovereign dictator cannot base his claim to be acting in the name of the people on any kind of formal authorization. If the old constitution no longer exists and the new one is not yet in force, there is no formal procedure for generating a public will. And yet, the sovereign dictator claims to exercise the constituent power of the people. What is more, the constitutional order he is to create is to be considered as legitimate since it rests on the people’s right to give itself a constitution (CT 136–9). Schmitt’s view assumes that it is possible to speak of the existence of a people in advance of the creation of any positive constitutional framework. Schmitt therefore has to explain what it means for a people to exist prior to any constitutional framework, and he has to give an account of how the people’s political existence prior to any constitutional framework can ground a sovereign dictatorship.

Schmitt’s The Concept of the Political phrases the answer to this question as an account of the nature of ‘the political.’ (Sartori 1989; Gottfried 1990, 57–82; Meier 1998; Hofmann 2002, 94–116; Mehring 2003; Kennedy 2004, 92–118; Slomp 2009, 21–37; Schupmann 2017, 69–105) Schmitt famously claims that “the specific political distinction … is that between friend and enemy.” (CP 26) The distinction between friend and enemy, Schmitt elaborates, is essentially public and not private. Individuals may have personal enemies, but personal enmity is not a political phenomenon. Politics involves groups that face off as mutual enemies (CP 28–9). Two groups will find themselves in a situation of mutual enmity if and only if there is a possibility of war and mutual killing between them. The distinction between friend and enemy thus refers to the “utmost degree of intensity … of an association or dissociation.” (CP 26, 38) The utmost degree of association is the willingness to fight and die for and together with other members of one’s group, and the ultimate degree of dissociation is the willingness to kill others for the simple reason that they are members of a hostile group (CP 32–3).

Schmitt believes that political enmity can have many different origins. The political differs from other spheres of value in that it is not based on a substantive distinction of its own. The ethical, for example, is based on a distinction between the morally good and the morally bad, the aesthetic on a distinction between the beautiful and the ugly, and the economical on a distinction between the profitable and the unprofitable. The political distinction between friend and enemy is not reducible to these other distinctions or, for that matter, to any particular distinction — be it linguistic, ethnic, cultural, religious, etc. — that may become a marker of collective identity and difference (CP 25–7). It is possible, for instance, to be enemies with members of a hostile group whom one judges to be morally good. And it is equally possible not to be engaged in a relationship of mutual enmity with a group whose individual members one judges to be bad. The same holds, Schmitt thinks, for all other substantive distinctions that may become markers of identity and difference.

This is not to say, however, that one’s conception of moral goodness or badness, for instance, will never play a role in a relationship of political enmity. Any distinction that can serve as a marker of collective identity and difference will acquire political quality if it has the power, in a concrete situation, to sort people into two opposing groups that are willing, if necessary, to fight against each other (CP 37–8). Whether a particular distinction will come to play this role is not determined by its own intrinsic significance but by whether a group of people relies on it to define its own collective identity and comes to think of that identity, as based on that distinction, as something that might have to be defended against other groups by going to war. Since the political is not tied to any particular substantive distinction, Schmitt argues, it is naïve to assume that the political will disappear once conflicts arising from a particular distinction no longer motivate opposing groups to fight. Political identification is likely to latch on to another distinction that will inherit the lethal intensity of political conflict (See ND). But wherever a distinction has political quality, it will be the decisive distinction and the community constituted by it will be the decisive social unit. Since the political community is the social unit that can dispose of people’s lives, it will be able, where it exists, to assert its superiority over all other social groups within its confines and to rule out violent conflict among its members (CP 37–45).

Schmitt claims that one cannot judge, from an external perspective, that a group is morally unjustified in defining its own identity in a certain way and to introduce political enmity, with the attendant possibility of killing, to preserve that identity. Only members of a group are in a position to decide, from the perspective of an existentially affected participant, whether the otherness of another group amounts to a threat to their own form of life and thus potentially requires to be fought (CP 27; See also CT 76–7, 136). Schmitt’s reasoning implicitly relies on a collectivist version of the logic of self-defence. The decision whether someone else’s behaviour constitutes a threat to one’s own life, in some concrete situation, and the decision whether it is necessary to use reactive or even pre-emptive violence to remove or to escape that threat, cannot be delegated to a third person. A group that perceives its own existence to be threatened by some other group, Schmitt argues, finds itself in an analogous position. The possibility of third-party mediation is therefore ruled out in a truly political conflict (CP 45–53).

A political community exists, then, wherever a group of people are willing to engage in political life by distinguishing themselves from outsiders through the drawing of a friend-enemy distinction (CP 38, 43–4). A group’s capability to draw the distinction between friend and enemy does not require, Schmitt holds, that the group already possess a formal organization allowing for rule-governed collective decision-taking. A people, thus, will have an existence prior to all legal form as long as there is a sense of shared identity strong enough to motivate its members to fight and die for the preservation of the group. And as long as a people exists in this way it is capable, through its support, to sustain a sovereign dictatorship exercised in its name (CT 126–35).

Of course, Schmitt’s analogy between the collective and the individual interest in self-preservation papers over an important difference between the two cases. A political community does not enjoy simple biological existence. It might die though all of its individual members continue to live. The drawing of a friend-enemy distinction, therefore, is never a mere reaction to a threat to a form of existence that is already given (but see Mouffe 1999, 49–50). Rather, it actively constitutes the political identity or existence of the people and determines who belongs to the people. To belong one must identify with the substantive characteristic, whatever it may be, that marks the identity of the people, and one must agree that this characteristic defines a form of life for the preservation of which one ought to be willing to sacrifice one’s own life, in the fight against those who don’t belong (CP 46).

Schmitt realizes, of course, that it is possible for people who are not willing to identify in this way to be legally recognized as citizens, and to live law-abidingly, under the norms authorized by some positive constitution. Liberal states, in Schmitt’s view, have a tendency to fail to distinguish properly between friends and enemies, and thus to extend rights of membership to those who do not truly belong to the political nation. In a liberal state, Schmitt fears, the political nation will slowly whither and die as a result of spreading de-politicization, it will succumb to internal strife, or it will be overwhelmed by external enemies who are more politically united (CP 69–79; L 31–77). To avert these dangers, Schmitt suggests, it is necessary to make sure that the boundaries of the political nation and the boundaries of citizenship coincide. This demand explains Schmitt’s claim, in the first sentence of The Concept of the Political, that the concept of the state presupposes the concept of the political (CP 19). The point of this remark is that a state can only be legitimate if its legal boundaries embody a clear friend-enemy distinction.

In order to achieve this aim, Schmitt clearly implies, a sovereign dictator, acting in the interstices between two periods of positive constitutional order, must homogenize the community by appeal to a clear friend-enemy distinction, as well as through the suppression, elimination, or expulsion of internal enemies who do not endorse that distinction (CP 46–8). In so doing, the sovereign dictator expresses the community’s understanding of what is normal or exceptional and of who belongs, and he creates the homogeneous medium that Schmitt considers to be a precondition of the legitimate applicability of law. Schmitt observes that his concept of the political is not belligerent. It does not glorify war, but merely claims that a community that is interested in living politically needs to be willing to go to war if it perceives its political existence to be threatened (CP 32–5). But the intended analogy with self-defence seems to make little moral sense, given that Schmitt’s conception of political existence demands the active elimination of those whom a majority perceives as internal enemies, and even celebrates that elimination as the essential activity of the popular sovereign.

Schmitt’s understanding of the political provides the basis for his critique of liberalism (Holmes 1993, 37–60; McCormick 1997; Dyzenhaus 1997, 58–70; Kahn 2011). On a descriptive level, Schmitt claims that liberalism has a tendency to deny the need for genuine political decision, to suggest that it is neither necessary nor desirable for individuals to form groups that are constituted by the drawing of friend-enemy distinctions. Liberals believe that there are no conflicts among human beings that cannot be solved to everyone’s advantage through an improvement of civilization, technology, and social organization or be settled, after peaceful deliberation, by way of amicable compromise. As a result, liberalism is unable to provide substantive markers of identity that can ground a true political decision. Liberal politics, consequently, boils down to the attempt to domesticate the polity, in the name of the protection of individual freedom, but it is unable to constitute political community in the first place (CP 69–79; CPD 33–50).

If this is a correct account of the character of liberal ideology and of the aims of liberal politics, Schmitt is right to conclude that liberalism has a tendency to undermine a community’s political existence, as he understands it. But in order for this observation to amount to a critique of liberalism, Schmitt needs to explain why a liberal subversion of the political would be undesirable. Schmitt’s political works contain a number of rather different answers to this question. A first line of thought emphasizes, with appeal to Hobbes, that a state can only be legitimate as long as it retains the capacity to offer protection to its members (for Schmitt’s engagement with Hobbes see McCormick 1994; Tralau 2011; and Schmitt’s L; SM; VR). And a state that has suffered a subversion of the political, induced by liberal ideology, Schmitt argues, will be unable to offer protection to its members, because it will fail to protect them from the indirect rule of pluralist interest-groups that have successfully colonized the state (LL 17–36, L 65–77) and, more importantly, because it will lack the power to protect them from external enemies (CP 51–3). If a people is no longer willing to decide between friend and enemy the most likely result will not be eternal peace but anarchy or subjection to another group that is still willing to assume the burdens of the political. This first answer, however, is not Schmitt’s last word on why liberal de-politicization is undesirable. Schmitt seems to admit that a global hegemon might one day be able to enforce a global de-politicization, by depriving all other communities of the capacity to draw their own friend-enemy distinctions, or that liberalism might one day attain global cultural hegemony, such that people will no longer be interested in drawing friend-enemy distinctions (CP 35, 57–8). Schmitt, then, cannot rest his case against liberal de-politicization on the claim that it is an unrealistic goal. He needs to argue that it is undesirable even if it could be achieved (Strauss 2007).

Schmitt replies to this challenge that a life that does not involve the friend-enemy distinction would be shallow, insignificant, and meaningless. A completely de-politicized world would offer human beings no higher purpose than to increase their consumption and to enjoy the frolics of modern entertainment. It would reduce politics to a value-neutral technique for the provision of material amenities. As a result, there would no longer be any project or value that individuals are called upon to serve, whether they want to or not, and that can give their life a meaning that transcends the satisfaction of private desires (CP 35, 57–8; RK 21–7; PR 109–62; WS 85–108). But that a world in which one does not have the opportunity to transcend one’s interest in individual contentment in the service of a higher value would be shallow and meaningless does not suffice to establish that a willingness to kill or to die for a political community will confer meaning on a life, much less that it is the only thing that can do so. When Schmitt claims that the defence of the political is the only goal that could possibly justify the killing of others and the sacrifice of one’s own life (CP 35; 48–9) he assumes without argument that the life of political community, as he understands it, is uniquely and supremely valuable.

Some interpreters have explained Schmitt’s hostility towards liberal de-politicization as being grounded in the view that a willingness to distinguish between friend and enemy is a theological duty (Mehring 1989; Meier 1998; Groh, 1991; Herrero 2015, 143–177; Vatter 2016). Schmitt argues in Political Theology that all key concepts of the modern doctrine of the state are secularized theological concepts, which suggests that a political theory that continues to use these concepts needs a theological foundation (PT 36–52). In The Concept of the Political, Schmitt claims that all true political theorists base their views on a negative anthropology which holds that man is by nature evil and licentious, and thus needs to be kept in check by a strong state capable of drawing a friend-enemy distinction if there is to be social order (CP 58–68). This latter thesis, Schmitt admits, can take a secular form, as in Hobbes or Machiavelli, as the purely descriptive claim that man is inherently dangerous to man. But Schmitt suggests that this secular version of a negative political anthropology is open to be transformed into the view that man, though by nature dangerous, is perfectible or into the view that man’s dangerous behavior is a mere contingent consequence of a mistaken form of social organization (PT 53–66; L 31–9). In order to establish a permanent need for political authority, negative political anthropology must be given a theological reading that portrays the dangerous nature of man as an irrevocable result of original sin. Liberal de-politicization, from this perspective, is to be rejected as a sign of human pride that rebels against God, who alone, but only at the end of history, can deliver humanity from political enmity.

Schmitt himself admits that the theological grounding of politics is based on an anthropological confession of faith (CP 58). And one is tempted to say that Schmitt’s theory turns out to be philosophically irrelevant if this is really the last word. Schmitt would likely have replied that the liberal assumption that man is perfectible, that humanity can overcome political enmity, and that to do so is desirable, is also an article of faith. The theological partisan of the political, in Schmitt’s view, is as justified in practicing his creed as the liberal cosmopolitan and to engage in a deliberate cultivation of political enmity (CPD 65–76). As long as the political theologian can make sure that the friend-enemy distinction survives, liberals will be forced to enter the arena of the political and to go to war against the partisans of the political. And this fight, Schmitt hopes, is going to secure the continuing existence of political enmity and prevent the victory of liberal de-politicization (CP 36–7).

4. Theory of Democracy and Constitutional Theory

Schmitt’s conception of politics tends to radically dissociate democracy from liberalism and, more controversially, from the constituted, rule-bound practices of popular election and parliamentary legislation that characterize the ordinary workings of modern democracy. How, then, did Schmitt apply his radical perspective to the sphere of constituted democratic politics in the Weimar Republic? (Valuable overviews in Dyzenhaus 1997; Kennedy 2004; Neumann 2015, 77–304; Preuss 2016.)

In The Crisis of Parliamentary Democracy, Schmitt understands democracy as the self-rule of the people. In a democratic polity, the decisions taken by the rulers express the will of the people (CPD 25–6). However, the principle of democracy, taken in the abstract, is open to different and competing interpretations. In political practice, the identity of the ruling will with the will of the people is never a simple given. Rather, it is always the result of an act of identification. When political decisions are taken through majority vote, the will of the majority is identified with the will of the people, and every citizen is expected to obey regardless of whether he voted with the majority (CPD 26–30). But what, Schmitt asks, is the basis of this identification? If a majority can overrule a minority, and identify its will with the will of the people, why should it not be possible for the will of a minority to express the will of the people? What if a group of democratic revolutionaries want to establish a democracy in a society where most people are opposed to the principle of democracy? Would they not be justified, from a democratic point of view, to abandon majority rule, to identify their own will with the true will of the people, and to subject their compatriots to a re-educative dictatorship? Schmitt suggests that such a dictatorship would still have to be considered democratic, since it still appeals to the idea that political rule ought to be based on the will of the people (CPD 28–30). Once one accepts this claim, the conclusion that Schmitt aims to establish in The Crisis of Parliamentary Democracy will follow: The electoral institutions that we usually take to be paradigmatically democratic are not, in truth, any more intimately connected with the principle of democracy than a dictatorship in the name of the people. The latter was to be legitimated by plebiscites, initiated by a charismatic leader, in which the people, Schmitt argued, should be allowed to give or withhold approval, but never to initiate the question (CPD 32; VV). But this conclusion must surely be an overstatement. Even democratic dictatorship, however crucial to the establishment of democracy, is exceptional and limited in time. Hence, there must be a characteristically democratic condition of legal normality, and a theory of democracy should tell us what it is. Schmitt’s apparent attempt to dissociate the idea of democracy from any particular method of will-formation fails to explain why the democratic tradition has considered institutional provisions like the election of officials or the extension of the franchise to be characteristically democratic.

Schmitt acknowledges this problem in his Constitutional Theory. The idea that legitimate political rule must make appeal to the will of the people, Schmitt now claims, is grounded in the value of political equality (CT 255–67). Political equality commits us to the denial of natural differences in status among citizens. Per se, no citizen has more of a right than any other citizen else to hold political power. Every citizen, therefore, should participate on equal terms, as far as practically feasible, in the exercise of political rule. What is more, where it is necessary to appoint public officials with special powers not shared by all citizens, these officials must be appointed through periodical elections. The value of political equality, then, explains why certain forms of will formation are considered to be more intimately associated with the idea of democracy than others (CT 280–5). However, Schmitt’s concession to the value of equality comes with a twist. The political equality that constitutes a political community, Schmitt argues, cannot be based on the non-exclusive equality of all human beings as moral persons. Every political community is based on a constitutive distinction between insiders and outsiders or friends and enemies. A democratic political community, as much as any other, must therefore rest on some marker of identity and difference that can ground an exclusive form of political equality which will only apply to insiders (CT 257–64). Schmitt goes on to define democracy as a political system characterized by the identity of ruler and ruled. Ruler and ruled are identical if and only if the rulers and all the ruled share the substantive identity that the community as a whole, in deciding who its enemies are, has chosen to turn into the basis of its political identity (CT 264–7; See also CPD 8–17).

If all those who live together as legally recognized citizens of a constituted democratic state happen to distinguish between friend and enemy in exactly the same way, the equal participation of all citizens in the political process and the electoral appointment of officials would indeed be a requirement of democratic political justice. It would be possible, moreover, to identify the outcomes of the political process with the will of the people, and to consider them democratically legitimate, even if some citizens find themselves in a temporary minority. But the reason why it has become possible to identify the outcomes of democratic procedure with the will of the people is not to be sought in inherent virtues of democratic procedure itself. Rather, the identification is possible only in virtue of the prior identity of all citizens as members of a group constituted by a shared friend-enemy distinction (CPD 10–14; LL 27–28). If, contrary to our initial assumption, those who live together as legally recognized citizens of a constituted democratic state do not share a political identity in Schmitt’s sense, the identity of the rulers with all the ruled will no longer obtain, and the constituted democratic state will no longer be truly democratic. The rule of the majority will degenerate into an illegitimate form of indirect rule of one social faction over another (HV 73–91; LL 17–36; L 65–77). Sovereign dictatorship, then, is still necessary to create the substantive equality that grounds the legitimate operation of constituted, rule-governed democratic politics.

The understanding of democracy so far outlined informs Schmitt’s interpretation of the Weimar constitution (Dyzenhaus 1997, 38–101; Caldwell 1997, 85–119; Scheuerman 1999, 61–84; Hofmann 2002, 117–52; Kennedy 2004, 119–53; Neumann 2015, 77–304; Preuss 2016; Schupmann 2017). A democratic constitution, Schmitt argues in his Constitutional Theory, is the product of an exercise of constituent power on the part of a politically united people (CT 75–77, 125–30, 140–6). The creation of a democratic constitution must not be thought of along the lines of a social contract, since it presupposes the prior existence of a people as a political unity, as explicated in the Concept of the Political (CT 112–3; Böckenförde 1998). If the people did not already exist, Schmitt reasons, it would not be able to give itself a constitution, and a constitution not given by the people itself to itself would not be a democratic constitution. In giving itself a constitution a politically united people determines the concrete form of its political existence, but it does not bring itself into existence. Since a democratic constitution is a unilateral determination, on the part of an already existing people, of the concrete form of its political existence, the people’s constituent power must be inalienable. As long as a people exists it can always decide to give itself a new constitution (CT 140–1). Schmitt’s theory of constituent power has recently received a lot of attention from authors who believe it might help to reinvigorate constituted democracy (Kalyvas 2008, 79–186; Colon-Rios 2012).

Schmitt recognizes that it would be implausible to assume that a written constitution represents a conscious choice of the popular sovereign down to its last detail. The revolution of the German people in 1918 that led to the creation of the Weimar constitution, for example, expressed the German people’s conscious decision for a democratic, republican, and federal state, committed to the principles of the rule of law, and endowed with a parliamentary system of legislation and government (CT 77–8). But in addition to these general principles of political and social order, the Weimar constitution came to contain a large number of specific provisions that do not reflect conscious decisions of the popular sovereign (CT 82–8). Schmitt argues that it would be wrong to treat such particular constitutional norms as possessing the same normative force as the people’s decision for a concrete form of political existence, which is expressed in the basic principles implicit in the constitution. It is wrong, therefore, to regard a constitution as nothing more than the set of all particular constitutional norms, and to assume that all these norms are equally subject to constitutional amendment. Even where, as in Weimar, the positive constitution provides a procedure that seems to allow for the amendment of any particular constitutional norm, it is to be understood, Schmitt argues, that the core constitutional principles chosen by the constituent power are not open to formal abrogation. To claim that they are is to advocate a usurpation of the constituent power of the people by a mere party or faction (CT 77–82, 147–58).

Schmitt thinks that this argument will hold even where an initiative to amend the constitution requires a supermajority. Political decision-taking on the basis of the simple majority rule is legitimate only if citizens share a political identity, in which case they will also agree on a set of constitutional fundamentals. Where they don’t, the identity of ruler and all ruled no longer obtains, and majority rule will consequently become a mere license for the oppression of those who happen to be in the minority. Such oppression, Schmitt argues, does not become any more legitimate where a super-majoritarian requirement is raised and met. That a numerical majority is relatively large and a numerical minority is relatively small does not entail, once there is no longer a shared political identity, that we are any closer to an identity between the ruler and all the ruled than in the case of a simple majority (LL 39–58). Schmitt concludes that it would be absurd to take the view that the formal procedures of amendment provided by a democratic constitution can legitimately be used to overturn its constitutional fundamentals (LL 85–94). Before 1933, Schmitt employed this argument to oppose a Nazi seizure of power (Machtergreifung) in legal form (Bendersky 1983, 107–91). It should also be noted that his claim that there must be limits to constitutional amendment in a democratic constitution based on the principle of popular sovereignty, and that these limits legitimate the notion of a ‘militant democracy’ that is willing to curb individual rights to defend itself, has been very influential in postwar constitutional thought, in Germany and elsewhere (see Ehmke 1953, 33–53; Fox and Nolte 1995, 18–20; Conrad 1999; Colon-Rios 2012, 126–51). However, Schmitt’s constitutional theory did not amount to an unqualified defence of liberal democracy. While Schmitt denies the possibility of changing the fundamental nature of an established constitution from within, and decries the dangers of the tyranny of a mere numerical majority, he nevertheless affirms the possibility of fundamental constitutional change through sovereign dictatorship, and he makes it clear that the German people, in a renewed exercise of their constituent power, might legitimately choose a non-liberal and non-parliamentarian form of democracy (CT 75–7). The exclusionary nature of the friend-enemy distinction that is to be enforced through extra-legal sovereign dictatorship, to provide a basis for the normal functioning of the constitutional order, throws further doubt on the democratic nature of Schmitt’s constitutional theory (see Kraft–Fuchs 1930; Vinx 2013a).

Schmitt’s ambiguous position towards the Weimar system was equally on display in his interpretation of the dictatorial powers of the president of the Weimar Republic under art. 48 of the Weimar constitution (Dyzenhaus 1997, 70–85; Vinx 2016). By partially assimilating the president to a sovereign dictator, Schmitt defended an unusually extensive interpretation of the president’s authority that in effect subjected all constitutional rights to the discretionary interference of the executive headed by the president (See DP). Liberal rights were to be respected, as the German people had chosen to create a liberal constitution, but only on the condition that public order and security had been secured. For Schmitt, individual freedoms, even where constitutionally guaranteed, are to be regarded as concessions of the state to the individual since they are subject, in the last instance, to suspension through a sovereign decision on the exception (CT 80–1, 156–8, 235–52). Schmitt, moreover, vehemently fought against the idea that the protection of the constitution ought to be assigned to a constitutional court. A constitutional court, Schmitt argued, would either have to limit itself to uncontroversial cases in which constitutional law provides determinate guidance or take upon itself the responsibility to determine the political identity of the people. But for a court to assume that responsibility would, in Schmitt’s view, have amounted to an illegitimate usurpation of the constituent power of the people, as much as an attempt to bring about fundamental constitutional change through formal constitutional amendment (HV 12–48; TV 26–41).

Schmitt apparently hoped, throughout the Weimar Republic’s years of relative stability, that presidential dictatorship in defence of the existing constitution might be sufficient to create a condition of normality that would allow the Weimar Republic to function. But this hope was disappointed in the final crisis of the Weimar Republic. Schmitt’s writings during that crisis started to toy with the view that the president should attempt to assume a role much closer to full sovereign dictatorship than even Schmitt’s own interpretation of art. 48 would have permitted and to engineer an authoritarian transformation of the positive constitution (LL 85–94). This project failed when the Nazis managed to take power through the kind of abuse of constitutional procedure that Schmitt had warned against (Kennedy 2004, 154–83). After a very brief period of hesitation Schmitt nevertheless offered his services as a legal advisor to the Nazis. He was careful to emphasize that the Machtergreifung amounted to a true revolution, despite its seemingly legal form, to maintain consistency with his view that a constitution cannot undergo fundamental change through formal amendment (SBV 5–9), but he was quick to translate his identitarian theory of democracy into the racialist idiom preferred by the Nazis (SBV 32–46) and started to advocate an institutionalist theory of law that was supposed to take its bearings from the authentic form of life of the German people (TJT 47–57, 89–95). Schmitt himself presented this shift as a fundamental reorientation of his legal-theoretical approach from a ‘decisionist’ perspective to ‘concrete order thought’. It is doubtful, however, whether the term ‘concrete order’ designates more than the situation of normality that Schmitt had always taken to be the basis of determinate legality. His claim (or hope) was simply that the Nazis have successfully restored normality (but see Croce and Salvatore 2013, 11–76). The national socialist movement, in Schmitt’s view, had managed to orchestrate an exercise of constituent power and to create a new constitution; one that was willing to draw uncompromising distinctions between the German people and its internal and external enemies. Given this description of the Machtergreifung, Schmitt’s political and constitutional theory seems to imply that Hitler’s rule was perfectly legitimate. It therefore seems unnecessary to postulate a radical discontinuity between Schmitt’s views before and after 1933 (Dyzenhaus 1997, 82–101; Mauss 1998; Scheuerman 1999, 113–39; Hofmann 2002, 152–88).

5. Liberal Cosmopolitanism and the Foundations of International Order

Schmitt’s conception of the political grounds a distinctive interpretation of democracy and constitutionalism in the domestic sphere. It led Schmitt to an equally distinctive account of the foundations of international legality that has received increasing scholarly attention in recent years (Scheuerman 1999, 141–73; Scheuerman 2006; Odysseos and Petito 2007; Axtmann 2007; Hooker 2009; Slomp 2009; Legg 2011; Benhabib 2012; Neumann 2015, 419–492; Koskenniemi 2016; Hathaway and Shapiro 2017; Kalyvas 2018). Schmitt is a staunch defender of sovereignty, but he does not embrace a flat rejection of international legality. Rather, Schmitt appears concerned to outline the conditions under which sovereign political communities, with differing political identities, can co-exist in a shared international legal order.

Two important consequences for international theory of Schmitt’s conception of politics are immediately obvious. First, it implies that every true political community must claim a legally unrestricted ius ad bellum. If the distinction between friend and enemy that constitutes a group’s political existence is not drawn by the group itself but by someone else, or if the decision whether to go to war in a concrete situation is no longer taken by the group but by some third party — be it a hegemonic state, an international organization, or an international court — the group no longer exists as an independent political community (CP 45–53). The second key consequence of Schmitt’s conception of politics for international theory follows from the claim that the political existence of a group must be based on a particular identity that serves as the substance of a friend-enemy distinction. Such an identity, of course, must differ from the identity of any other political community for the group in question to achieve a political identity of its own. It would be impossible for there to be a plurality of political communities — and hence, since political community is only possible where a group has enemies, for there to be any political community — if there were only one legitimate form of social organization or communal life (CP 53–8). These two consequences of Schmitt’s conception of politics imply two conditions of the legitimacy of international order, at least if one makes the assumption, with Schmitt, that political communities have an unconditional right to preserve their existence (CP 48–9; CT 75–7). Given this assumption, a legitimate international order must be able to accommodate a plurality of political communities with different, self-determined political identities. What is more, it must recognize as legitimate the ius ad bellum claimed by all groups that have successfully constituted themselves as political communities. A conception of international order that violates any of these two conditions would be incompatible with political existence and therefore illegitimate.

These demands on legitimate international order seem to be a recipe for anarchy. Would it not have been better for Schmitt to admit that his view implies a denial of international legal order? Schmitt’s reply to this objection is twofold. On the one hand, he argues that there is at least one historical instance of a functioning international order that lived up to his criteria of legitimacy. On the other hand, Schmitt claims that the attempt to subject the use of force on the part of political communities to external legal constraint and control, apart from constituting an assault on the possibility of political existence, will only lead to greater disorder and violence than we can expect to experience in a system that recognizes the political.

Schmitt’s first reply is based on an interpretation of the nature of European political order in the period from the establishment of the modern sovereign state to the beginning of WWI. In Schmitt’s account, this period was not a period of mere anarchy. Rather, it was characterized by the existence of a public law governing the relations between European states, the ius publicum Europaeum (NE 140–212). The main pillar of the ius publicum Europaeum, according to Schmitt, was a strict separation between the ius ad bellum and the ius in bello. On the level of ius ad bellum, all independent states were recognized to possess the right to go to war on the basis of their own judgment of justice and necessity. The legal order of ius publicum Europaeum, in effect, did not distinguish between just and unjust war. Rather, both sides in a conflict between sovereign states were by default recognized as legitimate belligerents (NE 140–71). Moreover, since both states in any conflict were held to be legitimate belligerents, states not directly involved in a conflict were taken to possess the right to choose to back either side or to remain neutral (DCW 53–74). This framework, Schmitt argues, allowed European states to bring about a highly effective containment of the negative consequences of war, and thus of the dangers of political existence. The abstraction from the justice of war allowed states to make peace without being hampered by the need to apportion moral blame. The freedom to side with either party in a conflict, or else to remain neutral, allowed states to contain conflicts by balancing or simply by staying out of the fight. Most importantly, however, the mutual recognition of legitimate belligerency allowed for the effective enforcement of stringent constraints on the permissible means of warfare on the level of ius in bello. Inter-statal warfare during the period of the jus publicum Europaeum, according to Schmitt, distinguished carefully between combatants and civilians and abstained from using methods of warfare that might endanger the lives or the property of civilians (NE 142–43, 165–8).

This containment of war, Schmitt claims, was premised on the willingness to bracket the question of justice on the level of ius ad bellum. Once one takes the view that a war can be legitimate on one side, while being illegitimate on the other, one is forced to conclude, Schmitt argues, that it is morally wrong to grant the status of legitimate belligerency to those who are judged to fight without a just cause, and equally wrong to assume that they ought to enjoy the same in bello-rights as those who fight justly (NE 320–2; CP 54–7). Moreover, once one separates between legitimate and illegitimate belligerency, it will no longer be possible to argue that other states have the right to side with either belligerent or to remain neutral. Rather, third parties will be seen to have a duty to side with those who fight justly (DK 26–53). The abandonment of the idea that all participants in a war among states are equally legitimate belligerents, Schmitt concludes, inevitably undercuts the containment of war achieved in ius publicum Europaeum (PB 286–90). Unsurprisingly, Schmitt rejected the project of creating an international legal order based on a ‘discriminating concept of war’ that would subject the use of force on the part of sovereign states to substantive criteria of moral legitimacy and external legal control. He regarded such developments as little more than attempts on the part of the victorious western allies to brand any violent German effort to revise the outcomes of WWI as illegal and thus as unjust, and to give themselves license for the application of means of coercion and for the use of methods of warfare that would have been considered as illegitimate in the context of mutually legitimate belligerency (PB 184–203; NE 259–80). Schmitt argued that international legalization on the model of just war theory would not prevent coming wars. It would merely make them more total, as it would encourage opponents to regard each other as absolute enemies worthy of elimination (NE 309–22; Brown 2007; Slomp 2009, 95–111).

However, Schmitt acknowledged that the era of ius publicum Europaeum had come to an end after WWI, together with the global hegemony of the classical European concert of sovereign states (GO 101–11). Schmitt therefore aimed to assess the chances for the emergence of a new global order analogous in structure to ius publicum Europaeum and he made an attempt, in The Nomos of the Earth, to explicate the presuppositions of the kind of international order exemplified by ius publicum Europaeum. For it to be possible for groups that are related by enmity nevertheless to co-exist in a shared framework which limits the consequences of war mutual enmity must be prevented from reaching the level of absolute enmity. Enmity, even while it may require one to defend one’s own political existence against the enemy, must not require the complete destruction of the enemy’s political and perhaps of his physical existence. Ius publicum Europaeum, in Schmitt’s view, had been capable of preventing absolute enmity through an alignment of friend-enemy distinctions with territorial boundaries (Zarmanian 2006). If the forms of life of two opposed political communities are each tied to and expressed in a particular territory, then the two groups will be able, Schmitt argues, to spatialize the friend-enemy distinction between them (NE 42–9). From the point of view of any one of the two groups, the protection of its political existence will require it to repel any attempt on the part of the other group to dispossess it of its territory. But it will not require the one group to interfere with or to destroy the political existence of the other group if to do so is unnecessary for the protection of its own territory. All political conflicts, under such circumstances, can be reduced to territorial conflicts, and this entails that all conflicts can in principle be contained as long as it is possible to divide territory in a way that will allow both groups to maintain their form of life (NE 143–8).

For political conflicts to be reducible to territorial conflicts, opposing political communities must of course accept the principle of non-intervention in the internal affairs of other political communities. The reduction of political conflict to territorial conflict would be impossible if political allegiances were spread out across borders. If some of those who share the identity that we have made into the basis of our political life live in a territory controlled by another political community we will have to concern ourselves with their fate. If we perceive them to be oppressed by that other community, we may feel compelled to go to war for them, even if the other community has not aggressed against our own territory. To territorialize the friend-enemy distinction, hence, one must ensure that all and only the people who share the same political identity live in the same territory (GO 86–8, 96–101). Some political identities, however, do not lend themselves to a spatialization of the political. A community whose political identity is premised on the promotion of liberal-humanitarian values which it takes to be universal, for instance, must concern itself with the question whether other political communities respect those values and be willing to interfere if they don’t. It cannot accept a reduction of political conflict to territorial conflict, as its political identity purports to be non-exclusive. A global order on the model of ius publicum Europaeum will therefore remain unattainable, and a global civil war characterized by absolute enmity will be unavoidable, Schmitt concludes, as long as the world’s foremost powers are committed to universalist ideologies that imply a rejection of the spatialization of political conflict (GO 90–5; VA 375–85).

As Schmitt would later point out in Theory of the Partisan, the distinction between absolute and contained enmity gives rise to a distinction between absolute, real, and conventional enemies (TP 85–95; see also CP 36–7; Slomp 2009, 112–26). A conventional enemy is an enemy within an established system of containment, whereas a real enemy is an enemy that can be made, though perhaps only after conflict, to settle for a territorial division. Absolute enmity, by contrast, exists wherever there is a conflict that is not amenable to territorial settlement. In Schmitt’s view, it is the powers who, for ideological reasons, refuse to accept a spatialization of conflict that are to blame for absolute enmity and the unbridled violence it entails. Those who are real enemies, but who need not be each other’s absolute enemies, then, have to find a way to recognize each other, to divide the world among themselves, and to hold down political forces that must reject the territorialization of political conflict. Schmitt’s The Nomos of the Earth, accordingly, portrayed the mutually recognized appropriation of the globe by mutually non-intervening, territorially-based political communities as the true foundation of all legitimate international (and thus of national) legal order (NE 42–9, 67–83; GO 77–9; see also Herrero 2015, 21–49). During the Nazi-period, Schmitt applied this view to a justification of Nazi-aggression, by portraying Nazi-Germany as a local hegemon willing to support a global territorial division based on a principle of non-intervention. Schmitt hoped, for a while at least, that America would reveal itself to be Germany’s ‘real enemy’ and that it would be willing to engage in a mutual division of spheres of influence. In this vein, Schmitt interpreted the Monroe-doctrine as the first act of hegemonic appropriation of a sphere of interest that might come to form part of a new global order, if only America were willing let Germany impose its own Monroe-doctrine on continental Europe (GO 83–90). For as long as they were militarily successful, Schmitt celebrated the Nazi wars as the birth pangs of a new ‘nomos of the earth.’ (LS section 20)

Of course, Schmitt’s hopes were disappointed when the war, after catastrophic bloodshed, ended in a stalemate between two hegemonic powers that were both unwilling to repudiate universalist ideology, but nevertheless quite successful in preventing their own conflict from escalating into open war. Schmitt, though, did not question his claim that international order ought to be based on territorial division. It became fashionable in circles around Schmitt to refer to the cold war as a ‘global civil war’ (Müller 2003, 104–15) while Schmitt, in Theory of the Partisan, expressed his admiration of Mao’s and Ho Chi-minh’s partisans for exhibiting a “telluric” character and a “tie to the soil” while rejecting “world revolutionary or technicistic ideology.” (TP 20–2) The new order was still supposed to emerge from a distribution of the globe among internally homogenous peoples tied to a certain land.

It should be obvious that Schmitt’s theory of the presuppositions of international order is closely related to his account of the conditions of well-functioning domestic legality (Vinx 2013b). The spatialization of conflict requires political communities strong enough to enforce internal political homogeneity. But political communities are unlikely to be able to enforce internal homogeneity if they have to live in an international environment that lacks a clear spatial order because it is controlled by powers that are ideologically hostile to the spatialization of conflict. Legitimate domestic order and legitimate international order, for Schmitt, are thus two sides of the same coin. Both require a defense of the political, as Schmitt understands it. (Axtmann 2007) Schmitt’s suggestion, however, that the preservation of the political as he understands it is a necessary condition of legitimate domestic and international legality seems rather hard to swallow in light of the catastrophic experiences of the 20th century. Schmitt was an acute observer and analyst of the weaknesses of liberal constitutionalism and liberal cosmopolitanism. But there can be little doubt that his preferred cure turned out to be infinitely worse than the disease.


Primary Literature

For full bibliographical information on Schmitt’s works see Alain de Benoist, Carl Schmitt. Bibliographie seiner Schriften und Korrespondenzen, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2003. In the list of Schmitt’s works, a date in parentheses after the title refers to the year of first publication in German or (in case of posthumously published material) to the year in which the text in question was written.

Works by Carl Schmitt

[GU] Gesetz und Urteil. Eine Untersuchung zum Problem der Rechtspraxis (1912), München: C.H. Beck, 1969.
[WS] Der Wert des Staates und die Bedeutung des Einzelnen (1914), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 2004.
[PR] Political Romanticism (1919), trans. by Guy Oakes, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1986.
[D] Dictatorship. From the Origin of the Modern Concept of Sovereignty to Proletarian Class Struggle (1921), trans. by M. Hoelzl and G. Ward, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014.
[PT] Political Theology. Four Chapters on the Concept of Sovereignty (1922), trans. by G. Schwab, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
[RK] Römischer Katholizismus und politische Form (1923), Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, 2008.
[CPD] The Crisis of Parliamentary Democracy (1923), trans. by E. Kennedy, Cambridge/MA: MIT Press, 1985.
[DP] “The Dictatorship of the President of the Reich according to Article 48 of the Weimar Constitution” (1924), in C. Schmitt, Dictatorship. From the Origin of the Modern Concept of Sovereignty to Proletarian Class Struggle, trans. by M. Hoelzl and G. Ward, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014, pp. 180–226.
[VV] Volksentscheid und Volksbegehren. Ein Beitrag zur Auslegung der Weimarer Verfassung und zur Lehre von der unmittelbaren Demokratie (1927), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 2014.
[CT] Constitutional Theory (1928), trans. by J. Seitzer, Durham: Duke University Press, 2008.
[ND] “The Age of Neutralizations and Depoliticizations” (1929), in C. Schmitt, The Concept of the Political. Expanded Edition, trans. by G. Schwab, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2007, pp. 80–96.
[HV] Der Hüter der Verfassung (1931), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 1996. [A partial translation of this text is available in The Guardian of the Constitution. Hans Kelsen and Carl Schmitt on the Limits of Constitutional Law , trans. by L. Vinx, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015, pp. 79–173.]
[LL] Legality and Legitimacy (1932), trans. by J. Seitzer, Durham: Duke University Press, 2004.
[CP] The Concept of the Political. Expanded Edition (1932), trans. by G. Schwab, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2007.
[SBV] Staat, Bewegung, Volk. Die Dreigliederung der politischen Einheit (1933), Hamburg: Hanseatische Verlagsanstalt, 1933.
[TJT] On the Three Types of Juristic Thought (1934), trans. by J.W. Bendersky, Westport, CT: Praeger Publishers, 2004.
[SM] “The State as a Mechanism in Hobbes and Descartes” (1936/37), in C. Schmitt,The Leviathan in the State Theory of Thomas Hobbes. Meaning and Failure of a Political Symbol, trans. by G. Schwab and E. Hilfstein, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2008, pp. 91–103.
[L] The Leviathan in the State Theory of Thomas Hobbes. Meaning and Failure of a Political Symbol (1938), trans. by G. Schwab and E. Hilfstein, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2008.
[DCW] The Turn to the Discriminating Concept of War (1938), in C. Schmitt, Writings on War, trans. by T. Nunan, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2011, pp. 30–74.
[PB] Positionen und Begriffe im Kampf mit Weimar — Genf — Versailles 1923–1939 (1940), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 1988.
[GO] The Grossraum Order of International Law with a Ban on Intervention for Spatially Foreign Powers: A Contribution to the Concept of Reich in International Law (1941), in C. Schmitt, Writings on War, trans. by T. Nunan, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2011, pp. 75–124.
[LS] Land and Sea. A World-Historical Meditation (1942), trans. by S.G. Zeitlin, New York: Telos Press, 2015.
[IC] The International Crime of the War of Aggression and the Principle ‘Nullum crimen, nulla poena sine lege’ (1945), in C. Schmitt, Writings on War, trans. by T. Nunan, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2011, pp. 125–97.
[AN] Antworten in Nürnberg (1947), ed. by H. Quaritsch, Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 2000.
[NE] The Nomos of the Earth in the International Law of the Jus Publicum Europaeum (1950), trans. by G.L. Ulmen, New York: Telos Press, 2003.
[ECS] Ex Captivitate Salus. Erfahrungen aus der Zeit 1945/47 (1950), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 2002.
[VA] Verfassungsrechtliche Aufsätze aus den Jahren 1924–1954. Materialien zu einer Verfassungslehre (1958), Berlin: Duncker&Humblot, 1958.
[TV] The Tyranny of Values and Other Texts (1960), trans. by S.G. Zeitlin, New York: Telos Press, 2018.
[TP] Theory of the Partisan. Intermediate Commentary on the Concept of the Political (1963), trans. by G.L. Ulmen, New York: Telos Press, 2007.
[VR] “Die vollendete Reformation. Zu neuen Leviathan-Interpretationen” (1965), Der Staat, 4 (1): 51–69.

Secondary Literature

Anthologies on Schmitt

  • Arvidsson, M., Braennstroem L., and Minkkinen, P. (eds.), 2016, The Contemporary Relevance of Carl Schmitt. Law, Politics, Theology, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Dyzenhaus, D. (ed.), 1998, Law as Politics. Carl Schmitt’s Critique of Liberalism, Durham: Duke University Press.
  • Legg, S. (ed.), 2011, Spatiality, Sovereignty and Carl Schmitt. Geographies of the Nomos, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Mehring, R. (ed.), 2003, Carl Schmitt Der Begriff des Politischen. Ein kooperativer Kommentar, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Meierhenrich, J., and Simons, O. (eds.), 2016, The Oxford Handbook of Carl Schmitt, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mouffe, C. (ed.), 1999a, The Challenge of Carl Schmitt, London: Verso.
  • Odysseos, L., and F. Petito (eds.), 2007, The International Political Thought of Carl Schmitt. Terror, Liberal War and the Crisis of Global Order, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Tralau, J. (ed.), 2011, Thomas Hobbes and Carl Schmitt. The Politics of Order and Myth, Abingdon: Routledge.

Selected Articles and Books on Schmitt

  • Arato, A., 1995, “Forms of Constitution Making and Theories of Democracy,” Cardozo Law Review, 17 (2): 191–231.
  • Axtmann, R., 2007, “Humanity or Enmity? Carl Schmitt on International Politics,” International Politics, 44 (5): 531–51.
  • Balakrishnan, G., 2000, The Enemy. An Intellectual Portrait of Carl Schmitt, London: Verso.
  • Bendersky, J.W., 1983, Carl Schmitt. Theorist for the Reich, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Benhabib, S., 2012, “Carl Schmitt’s Critique of Kant: Sovereignty and International Law,” Political Theory, 40 (6): 688–713.
  • Böckenförde, E.-W., 1998, “The Concept of the Political: A Key to Understanding Carl Schmitt’s Constitutional Theory,” in Law as Politics. Carl Schmitt’s Critique of Liberalism, D. Dyzenhaus (ed.), Durham: Duke University Press, pp. 37–55.
  • Breuer, S., 2012, Carl Schmitt im Kontext. Intellektuellenpolitik in der Weimarer Republik, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Brown, C., 2007, “From Humanized War to Humanitarian Intervention: Carl Schmitt’s Critique of the Just War Tradition,” in The International Political Thought of Carl Schmitt. Terror, Liberal War and the Crisis of Global Order, L. Odysseos and F. Petito (eds.), Abingdon: Routledge, pp. 56–69.
  • Caldwell, P.C., 1997, Popular Sovereignty and the Crisis of German Constitutional Law. The Theory and Practice of Weimar Constitutionalism, Durham: Duke University Press.
  • –––, 2005, “Controversies over Carl Schmitt: A Review of Recent Literature,” The Journal of Modern History, 77 (2): 357–87.
  • Colon-Rios, J., 2012, Weak Constitutionalism. Democratic Legitimacy and the Question of Constituent Power, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Conrad, D., 1999, “Limitation of Amendment Procedures and the Constituent Power,” in D. Conrad, Zwischen den Traditionen. Probleme des Verfassungsrechts und der Rechtskultur in Indien und Pakistan, ed. by J. Lütt and M.P. Singh, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, pp. 47–85.
  • Cristi, R., 1998, Carl Schmitt and Authoritarian Liberalism. Strong State, Free Economy, Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
  • Croce, M. and Salvatore, A., 2013, The Legal Theory of Carl Schmitt, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Dyzenhaus, D., 1997, Legality and Legitimacy. Carl Schmitt, Hans Kelsen and Hermann Heller in Weimar, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2006, The Constitution of Law. Legality in a Time of Emergency, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ehmke, H., 1953, Grenzen der Verfassungsänderung, Berlin: Duncker & Humblot.
  • Fox, G.H. and Nolte, G., 1995, “Intolerant Democracies,” Harvard International Law Journal, 36 (1): 1–70.
  • Gottfried, P.E., 1990, Carl Schmitt. Politics and Theory, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
  • Groh, R., 1998, Arbeit an der Heillosigkeit der Welt. Zur politisch-theologischen Mythologie und Anthropologie Carl Schmitts, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Gross, R., 2007, Carl Schmitt and the Jews: The “Jewish Question,” the Holocaust, and German Legal Theory, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Hathaway, O. and Shapiro, S., 2017, The Internationalists. How a Radical Plan to Outlaw War Remade the World, New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Herrero, M., 2015, The Political Discourse of Carl Schmitt. A Mystic of Order, Lanham, Md: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Hofmann, H., 2002, Legitimität gegen Legalität. Der Weg der politischen Philosophie Carl Schmitts, Berlin: Duncker & Humblot.
  • Holmes, S., 1993, The Anatomy of Antiliberalism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hooker, W., 2009, Carl Schmitt’s International Thought. Order and Orientation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kahn, P.W., 2011, Political Theology. Four New Chapters on the Concept of Sovereignty, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Kalyvas, A., 2008, Democracy and the Politics of the Extraordinary. Max Weber, Carl Schmitt, and Hannah Arendt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018, “Carl Schmitt’s Postcolonial Imagination,” Constellations, 25 (1): 35–53.
  • Kaufmann, M., 1988, Recht ohne Regel? Die philosophischen Prinzipien in Carl Schmitt’s Staats- und Rechtslehre, Freiburg: Karl Alber.
  • Kelly, D., 2016, “Carl Schmitt’s Political Theory of Dictatorship”, in The Oxford Handbook of Carl Schmitt, J. Meierhenrich and O. Simons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 217–244.
  • Kennedy, E., 2004, Constitutional Failure. Carl Schmitt in Weimar, Durham: Duke University Press.
  • Kervégan, J.-F., 1992, Hegel, Carl Schmitt. Le politique entre spéculation et positivité, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Kraft-Fuchs, M., 1930, “Prinzipielle Bemerkungen zu Carl Schmitt’s Verfassungslehre,” Zeitschrift für öffentliches Recht, 9: 510–41.
  • Lindahl, H., 2007, “Constituent Power and Reflexive Identity: Towards an Ontology of Collective Selfhood,” in The Paradox of Constitutionalism. Constituent Power and Constitutional Form, M. Loughlin and N. Walker (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 9–24.
  • Löwith, K., 1995, “The Occasional Decisionism of Carl Schmitt,” in K. Löwith, Martin Heidegger and European Nihilism, R. Wolin (ed.) and G. Steiner (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, pp. 37–69.
  • Loughlin, M., 2012, Foundations of Public Law, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mauss, I., 1980, Bürgerliche Rechtstheorie und Faschismus. Zur sozialen Funktion und aktuellen Wirkung der Theorie Carl Schmitts, München: Wilhelm Fink.
  • –––, 1998, “The 1933 Break in Carl Schmitt’s Theory,” in Law as Politics. Carl Schmitt’s Critique of Liberalism, D. Dyzenhaus (ed.), Durham: Duke University Press, pp. 198–216.
  • McCormick, J.P., 1994, “Fear, Technology, and the State: Carl Schmitt, Leo Strauss, and the Revival of Hobbes in Weimar and National Socialist Germany,” Political Theory, 22 (4): 619–52.
  • –––, 1997, Carl Schmitt’s Critique of Liberalism. Against Politics as Technology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mehring, R., 1989, Pathetisches Denken. Carl Schmitts Denkweg am Leitfaden Hegels: Katholische Grundstellung und antimarxistische Hegelstrategie, Berlin: Duncker&Humblot.
  • –––, 2009, Carl Schmitt: Aufstieg und Fall. Eine Biographie, München: C.H. Beck.
  • Meier, H., 1998, The Lesson of Carl Schmitt. Four Chapters on the Distinction between Political Theology and Political Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2006, Carl Schmitt and Leo Strauss: The Hidden Dialogue, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Minkkinen, P., 2013, “Political Constitutionalism versus Political Constitutional Theory: Law, Power and Politics,” International Journal of Constitutional Law, 11 (3): 585–610.
  • Mouffe, C., 1999b, “Carl Schmitt and the Paradox of Liberal Democracy,” in The Challenge of Carl Schmitt, C. Mouffe (ed.), London: Verso.
  • Müller, J.-W., 2003, A Dangerous Mind. Carl Schmitt in Post-War European Thought, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Neumann, V., 2015, Carl Schmitt als Jurist, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck.
  • Norris, A., 2007, “Sovereignty, Exception, and Norm,” Journal of Law and Society, 34 (1): 31–45.
  • Posner, E. and Vermeule, A., 2010, The Executive Unbound. After the Madisonian Republic, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Preuss, U.K., 2016, “Carl Schmitt and the Weimar Constitution”, in The Oxford Handbook of Carl Schmitt, J. Meierhenrich and O. Simons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press pp. 471–489.
  • Rüthers, B., 1990, Carl Schmitt im Dritten Reich: Wissenschaft als Zeitgeistverstärkung?, München: C.H. Beck.
  • Sartori, G., 1989, “The Essence of the Political in Carl Schmitt,” Journal of Theoretical Politics, 1 (1): 63–75.
  • Scheuerman, W.E, 1996, “Legal Indeterminacy and the Origins of Nazi Legal Thought: The Case of Carl Schmitt,” History of Political Thought, 17 (4): 571–590.
  • –––, 1999, Carl Schmitt. The End of Law, Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • –––, 2006, “Carl Schmitt and the Road to Abu Ghraib,” Constellations, 13 (1): 108–24.
  • Schupmann, B.A., 2017, Carl Schmitt’s State and Constitutional Theory. A Critical Analysis, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schwab, G., 1989, The Challenge of the Exception. An Introduction to the Political Ideas of Carl Schmitt between 1921 and 1936, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
  • Slomp, G., 2009, Carl Schmitt and the Politics of Hostility, Violence, and Terror, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Strauss, L., 2007, “Notes on Carl Schmitt, The Concept of the Political,” trans. H.J. Lomax, in C. Schmitt, The Concept of the Political. Expanded Edition, trans. George Schwab, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 97–122.
  • Van Laak, D., 2002, Gespräche in der Sicherheit des Schweigens. Carl Schmitt in der politischen Geistesgeschichte der frühen Bundesrepublik, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Vatter, M., 2016, “The Political Theology of Carl Schmitt”, in The Oxford Handbook of Carl Schmitt, J. Meierhenrich and O. Simons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 245–268.
  • Vinx, L., 2013a, “The Incoherence of Strong Popular Sovereignty,” International Journal of Constitutional Law, 11 (1): 101–24.
  • –––, 2013b, “Carl Schmitt and the Analogy between Constitutional and International Law: Are Constitutional and International Law Inherently Political?,” Global Constitutionalism, 2 (1): 91–124.
  • –––, 2015, “Carl Schmitt’s Defence of Sovereignty”, in Law, Liberty, and State. Oakeshott, Hayek and Schmitt on the Rule of Law, D. Dyzenhaus and T. Poole (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 96–121.
  • –––, 2016, “Carl Schmitt and the Problem of Constitutional Guardianship”, in The Contemporary Relevance of Carl Schmitt, M. Arvidsson, L. Brännström, and P. Minkkinen (eds.), Abington: Routledge, pp. 34–49.
  • Wolin, R., 1992, “The Conservative Revolutionary Habitus and the Aesthetics of Horror,” Political Theory, 20 (3): 424–47.
  • Zarmanian, T., 2006, “Carl Schmitt and the Problem of Legal Order: From Domestic to International,” Leiden Journal of International Law, 19 (1): 41–67.

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