Supplement to Self-Consciousness

The Scope of Immunity to Error Through Misidentification

Since its early discussion in the work of Wittgenstein (1958), Shoemaker (1968), and Evans (1982), the topic of immunity to error through misidentification (IEM) has received a great deal of attention (see, for example, Prosser & Recanati 2012). The standard view is that some but not all first-person thoughts are IEM. For example, the thought “I am happy”, when based on introspection, is typically regarded as IEM. It is intuitive to suppose that introspection is necessarily an awareness of one’s own mental features; one cannot introspect another’s mind. It is, therefore, difficult to see how one might know, via introspection, that \(a\) has a headache if \(a\) is not oneself. Given this, one will not be able to misidentify an introspectively presented subject as oneself. On the other hand, the thought “I am happy”, based on an overheard conversation between two therapists, is not plausibly IEM, since it is possible that one has misidentified the person spoken about as oneself.

There is a question about which sources of information, aside from introspection (see entry on introspection), ground IEM judgements. Candidate sources that have generated significant debate include episodic memory (Shoemaker 1970; Evans 1982: §7.5; Hamilton 2009, 2013; Bermúdez 2012, 2013; Fernandez 2014; entry on memory), bodily awareness (Evans 1982: §7.3; Cassam 1997: §2.7; Bermúdez 1998: ch. 6; O’Brien 2007: ch. 11; Chen 2011; de Vignemont 2012, entry on bodily awareness), action awareness (O’Brien 2007: ch. 11, and 2012; Peacocke 2008: ch. 7), and “self-locating” perceptual experience (Evans 1982: §7.3; Cassam 1997: §2.7). In each of these cases, we would normally suppose that errors of misidentification do not occur. If I know, through an episodic memory of eating breakfast, that \(a\) had toast for breakfast, I thereby know that I had toast for breakfast; if I know, through bodily awareness (including proprioception and kinaesthesia), that \(a\) has crossed legs, I thereby know that I have crossed legs; if I know, through action awareness, that \(a\) is typing, I thereby know that I am typing; if I know, via the “self-locating” egocentric structure of perceptual experience, that \(a\) is facing a wall, I thereby know that I am facing a wall. In each case, it might be thought, since the information source in question is dedicated to a single object, oneself, it cannot ground the de re thought \(a\) is \(F\) unless \(a\) is oneself. It will follow from this that self-ascriptions grounded in these forms of awareness cannot be based on a false identification of some object as oneself.

In each of these cases, however, including that of introspection, counter-examples have been offered (for discussion, see the works cited in the previous paragraph). These take one of two forms: either thought experiments or actual, typically pathological, cases. Fantasy cases typically involve a deviant causal chain leading from another person’s memory, bodily state, action, etc. to oneself. Thus, taking the example of bodily awareness, we can imagine that I am hooked up in such a way that my proprioceptive system receives input from the state of your body. This “quasi-proprioception”, it might be claimed, is sufficient to ground the thought that \(a\) is \(F\) and, if I am unaware of my unusual situation, I am liable to think that I am \(F\). That judgement, then, must rely on the implicit identification of myself with \(a\) (O’Brien 2007: ch.11). If this is right, then whilst we might say that proprioceptively grounded self-ascriptions do not typically involve misidentification, this is at best a contingent truth. Such self-ascriptions are, in Shoemaker’s term, only de facto IEM (Shoemaker 1970: 46, where he also introduces the notion of quasi-memory). This conclusion depends on the claim that such deviant causal chains are sufficient to ground the de re thoughts in question. But that this is so cannot simply be assumed. As such, the status of the various information sources as grounding IEM thoughts depends at least in part on the conditions of de re, or singular, thought (cf. Evans 1982: ch.4; Recanati 1993; Daly 2007; Jeshion 2010; Michael 2010).

Actual cases vary, but it has sometimes been suggested that the phenomena of thought insertion (Stephens & Graham 2000; Mullins & Spence 2003), alien limb (Moro, Zampini, & Aglioti 2004), anarchic hand (Marchetti & Della Sala 1998), “anonymous memory” (Klein & Nichols 2012), and “anonymous vision” (Zahn, Talazko, & Ebert 2008), are counterexamples to the claims that thoughts based, respectively, on introspection, bodily awareness, action-awareness, episodic memory, and perceptual experience, are IEM (Campbell 1999b; Marcel 2003; Lane & Liang 2011; Gallagher 2012: ch.7). In each of these cases, subjects seem to be aware of some state of theirs—a thought, memory, visual experience, etc.—without it seeming to be their own state (also see Langland-Hassan 2015). For example, whilst it is true that the subject of thought-insertion is thinking that P, they do not take that thought to be their own and so do not form the judgement “I think that P”. It seems, then, that these forms of awareness do not suffice to ground the relevant self-ascription, so thoughts grounded in these various modalities are not IEM (for critical discussion, see Gallagher 2000; Coliva 2002; Peacocke 2003; de Vignemont 2012; Seeger 2015).

These actual cases differ from the fantasy cases in an important respect. Whilst they arguably involve errors of misidentification, they seem not to be errors of misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun, since none involve the first-person concept. In none of the cases do subjects judge themselves to be some way or other; quite the opposite. The subject of thought insertion is aware of what is, in fact, their own thought, but attributes it to someone else, failing to make the appropriate first-person judgement. It is helpful here to distinguish between errors of self-misidentification, in which the subject mistakenly takes a distinct thing or person to be themselves and so mistakenly judges “I am \(F\)”, and errors of other-misidentification, in which the subject mistakenly takes what is in fact themselves to be some thing, or someone, else and so mistakenly judges “\(a\) is \(F\)”. The cases that are typically discussed in this context usually involve mistakenly taking oneself to be someone else (or, in some cases, simply failing to form any relevant belief as to who is \(F\)), and so are not cases of self-misidentification, but rather of other-misidentification (cf. de Vignemont 2012). But IEM, as typically understood, concerns an immunity to self-misidentification. Thus, since none of these cases seem to involve errors grounded in the false identity judgement “\(\textrm{I} = a\)”, whatever it is that they do show, none obviously challenge the claim that when these various information sources do ground self-ascriptions, those first-personal thoughts are IEM.

Copyright © 2017 by
Joel Smith <joel.smith@manchester.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free