Supplement to Socrates

The Reception of Socrates

There are many instances of Socrates’s influence in arts and letters outside academic philosophy, of which the following is the merest sample. Wilson 2007 is light in tone and covers the millennia; Monoson 2011 is a scholarly account of the post-WWII period in North America, especially during the heyday of McCarthyism. Both include scores of examples, and both point to other sources that are likewise full of examples.


  • 1942, John Steinbeck, The Moon is Down, New York: Collier
  • 1956, Mary Renault, The Last of the Wine, New York: Pantheon
  • 1990, Muriel Spark, Symposium, Boston: Houghton Mifflin

Plays, Radio, Television, and Film

  • 1939, Corrado D’Errico, Processo e Morte di Socrate, Italian film
  • 1942, Eric Linklater, Socrates Asks Why, BBC Radio Drama
  • 1948, The Death of Socrates, CBS Radio
  • 1951, Maxwell Anderson, Barefoot in Athens, New York: Sloan
  • 1952, Lister Sinclair, Socrates, Montreal: Jupiter Theatre
  • 1953, Arnold Manoff, "The Death of Socrates," You Are There, season 1, episode 14, CBS
  • 1965, Leo Aylen & Jonathan Miller, The Drinking Party, BBC Television: Sunday Night Play
  • 1966, Leo Aylen & Jonathan Miller, The Death of Socrates, BBC Television: Sunday Night Play
  • 1971, Roberto Rossellini, Socrate, in Italian, TV movie distributed with subtitles by New Yorker Films
  • 1978, Steve Allen, Meeting of Minds, season 2, episodes 11–12, PBS
  • 2003, Walter Cronkite interview, All Things Considered, NPR, explains the 1953 broadcast in relation to Hollywood black-listing of writers.

Songs and Musical Compositions

  • 1919, Erik Satie, Socrate, Suite for Voices and Small Orchestra, Paris: Éditions Max Eschig
  • 1949, Bertholt Brecht, "How Fortunate the Man with None" from Mother Courage, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp
  • 1956, Leonard Bernstein, Serenade after Plato’s Symposium, U.S.: Jalni Publications
  • 2015, Michael Levy (on replica tortoise-shell lyre), The Death of Socrates

Books for Children and Youths

  • 2006, Pamela Dell, Socrates: Ancient Greek in Search of Truth, Minneapolis: Compass Point
  • 2006, Paul Levinson, The Plot to Save Socrates, New York: Tor/Macmillan
  • 2011, David M. Johnson, Socrates and Athens, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press

Copyright © 2018 by
Debra Nails <>

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