#### Supplement to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

## Bayesian Formalisations of the *Information-Dependence Template*

Bayesian epistemologists have attempted to formalise extant
explanations of transmissivity and non-transmissivity of
justification; they have concentrated on the *information-dependence
template*. Many epistemologists would claim that an acceptable
Bayesian formalisation of this template would illuminate its rational
structure and, in some sense, validate the explanation of
non-transmissivity resting on it. In this section we present models
put forward by Okasha (2004), Chandler (2010) and Moretti
(2012). (Chandler 2013 also provides a belief revision AGM-style model
that we will not survey in this entry.)

The Bayesian assumes that rational belief comes in degrees and that
degrees of rational belief or credences obey the probability
calculus. Consider any proposition *x*. The expression Pr
(*x*)—called the *unconditional probability*
of *x*—is interpreted by the Bayesian as supplying the
degree of credence of a rational subject *s* in *x*. In
probability theory the expression Pr(*x*|*y*)—called
the *conditional probability* of *x* given a
proposition *y*—is customarily defined as Pr
(*x*&*y*) / Pr(*y*) provided that Pr(*y*)
> 0. (Hereafter whenever we use an expression with form Pr
(…|*y*) we will always assume that Pr(*y*) > 0.)
Pr(*x*|*y*) is interpreted by the Bayesian as supplying the
degree of credence that *s* would have in *x* if the truth
of *y* were given to her. The Bayesian says that *y*
(incrementally) *confirms* *x* if and only if Pr
(*x*|*y*) > Pr(*x*). Furthermore the Bayesian says
that *y* (incrementally) confirms *x* *conditional
on* a proposition *z* if and only if Pr
(*x*|*y*&*z*) > Pr(*x*|*z*). All
Bayesian models for transmissivity and non-transmissivity that we
consider here assume that there exists a very close relation between
degrees of epistemic justification and degrees of rational belief, so
that the latter can faithfully represent the former.

Okasha’s (2004) framework rests on two further modelling assumptions:

(A1) the claim that

s’slearningywould provideswith some degree of justification forxand the claim thatyconfirmsxtranslate into one another.(A2) the claim that

s’s learningywould provideswith some degree of justification forxgiven background informationzand the claim thatyconfirmsxconditional onztranslate into one another.

Okasha essentially proposes to translate the *information-dependence
template* into the following triad:

(I) Pr( p|e&q) > Pr(p|q).( econfirmspconditional onq.)(II) Pr( p|e) ≤ Pr(p).( edoes not confirmpotherwise.)(III) p⊢q.( pentailsq.)

On the axioms of probability and the definition of conditional probability, (I)–(III) jointly entail:

(IV) Pr( q|e) ≤ Pr(q).( edoes not confirmq.)

When the overall formalism is interpreted as detailed above, the
entailment of (IV) from (I)–(III) is meant to explain why no
justification based on *e* can transmit from *p* to *q*
whenever the *information-dependence template* is
instantiated. More precisely, this framework seems to be meant to
account for non-transmissivity of first-time and quantitatively
strengthening justification. Suppose in fact
the *information-dependence template *is satisfied so that
(I)–(III) are true. Then (IV) is true too. Hence *e* can
provide no degree of justification for *q*. Thus – one
might infer – *q* cannot receive via
transmission from *p* any first-time or quantitatively
strengthening justification based on *e*.

In spite of appearance, Okasha’s formalism has been found
problematic in different respects. To begin with, (I)–(III)
appear unable to explain *non-trivial* cases of transmission
failure that the *information-dependence template* is deemed to
be able to explain. These are cases in which *e* does
supply *s* with justification for *p* conditional
on *q* because *q* is in background information,
but *e* supplies *s* with no first-time or quantitatively
strengthening justification for *q*. Note that since *q* is
in background information, in these cases *e* supplies *s*
with no first-time or quantitatively strengthening justification
for *q* *given background information* *q*.

The problem for Okasha’s formalism is this: given (A2),
Okasha is committed to translating the claim
that *s*’s learning *y* would provide *s*
with no degree of justification for *x* *given background
information* *z* as Pr(*x*|*y*
& *z*) ≤ Pr(*x*|*z*). Thus Okasha should
construe formally the proposition that *s*’s
learning *e* would supply *s* with no justification
for *q* *given background information* *q* as:

(V) Pr(q|e&q) ≤ Pr(q|q).

Namely, *e* does not confirm *q* *conditional*
on *q* (cf. Moretti 2012). If (V) were a part of Okasha’s
framework, the latter could perhaps account for the non-trivial cases
of transmission failure mentioned before. But (V) is no part of
Okasha’s framework. Note furthermore that the truth of (I)-(III)
appears *explanatorily irrelevant* for the truth of (V). This is
so because for every *q* and *e* such that Pr(*e*
& *q*) > 0, Pr(*q*|*e* & *q*) = Pr
(*q*|*q*) = 1 so that, *trivially*, Pr
(*q*|*e* & *q*) ≤ Pr(*q*|*q*).

Okasha’s framework appears affected by a more general difficulty. Although this model doesn’t specify any Bayesian principle of transmissivity of justification, the principle implicitly assumed by Okasha is presumably this:

() If Pr(O-Transp|e) > Pr(p) andp⊢q, then Pr(q|e) > Pr(q).

*O-Trans* says that if *e* confirms *p*, and *p*
entails *q*, then *e* confirms *q*. If justification is
represented as confirmation, a deductive argument with
premise *p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e*
for *p* is *transmissive* (of some degree of justification)
if and only if *O-Trans* is *non-vacuously* true. It’s
been known for a long time that *O-Trans* is not true in general;
but that doesn’t exclude its being true in some particular
cases, which is what we’re supposed to understand the question
of transmission failure coming to, on Okasha’s proposal.

Once *O-Trans* is assumed, it is natural to think that
the *non-transmissivity* of an argument of the same type will
formally be certified by the
argument’s *falsifying* *O-Trans*. Yet note
that *O-Trans* is, not false, but *vacuously true* when
(I)-(IV) are satisfied. For *O-Trans*’ antecedent embeds
the logical negation of (II) (cf. Chandler 2010). It is thus unclear
whether Okasha’s model actually supplies a formal account of
non-transmissivity. (For further criticism see Chandler 2010
and Moretti 2012.)

Let us turn to Chandler’s (2010) formalisation. This model
intends to be as faithful as possible to the informal notion of
justification that the epistemologists who analyse transmission and
transmission failure typically presuppose. A proposition is justified,
on this notion, just in case it is *rationally believable*
or *acceptable*. Accordingly, Chandler’s framework is
based on the following modelling assumption:

s’s learningywould justifyxif and only ifs’s learningywould raise her credence inxand would do so over a relevant probability thresholdt∈ [0, 1) sufficient for rational belief or acceptance, i.e. if and only if Pr(x|y) > Pr (x) and Pr(x|y) >t.

The basic version of the principle of transmissivity of justification embedded is this model is the following:

(C-Trans) If Pr(p|e) > Pr(p), Pr(p|e) >tandp⊢q, then Pr(q|e) > Pr(q).

*C-Trans* states that if *e* confirms *p* such
that *p*’s conditional probability given *e*
exceeds *t*, and *p* entails *q*, then *e*
confirms *q*. According to this model, a deductive argument with
premise *p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e*
is *transmissive* of justification if and only if *C-Trans*
is non-vacuously true. Note that Pr(*p*|*e*)
> *t* and *p* ⊢ *q* jointly entail Pr
(*q*|*e*) > *t*. Thus if *C-Trans* is
non-vacuously true, *e* confirms *q* such
that *q*’s conditional probability given *e*
exceeds *t*. A deductive argument with premise *p*,
conclusion *q* and evidence *e* is *non-transmissive*
of justification if and only if *C-Trans* is false.

*C-Trans* seems to be meant to account formally for
transmissivity of first-time and quantitatively strengthening
justification, in the senses that any deductive argument with
premise *p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e* is
transmissive of justification of either type if and only if it
satisfies *C-Trans*. We have transmissivity of first-time
justification only if Pr(*q*) ≤ *t*. We have
transmissivity of quantitatively strengthening justification only if
Pr(*q*) > *t*. Note that *C-Trans* can be false for
some *e*, *p* and *q* because there are probability
distributions that verify its antecedent while falsifying its
consequent for any chosen *t* ∈ [0, 1). Thus *C-Trans*
makes room for non-transmissivity of justification.

In Chandler’s model, the condition that the justification
from *e* for *p* depends on *q* being in background
information is interpreted as the condition that the justification
from *e* for *p* depends on *q* being antecedently
justified, which is translated into the following material
conditional:

(C) If Pr(p|e) >tthen Pr(q) >t.

The *information-dependence template* is formalised by conjoining
the antecedent of *C-Trans* and the above conditional. The
resulting proposition is equivalent to the following:

(C-Fail) The antecedent ofC-Transis true and Pr(q) >t.

*C-Trans* and *C-Fail* actually capture some feature of
Wright’s informal framework (cf. Chandler 2010, 338). However,
while the satisfaction of the information-dependence template is meant
to *suffice* for non-transmissivity, the fulfilment
of *C-Fail* is only *necessary* for non-transmissivity
but *not* sufficient for it. For it can be shown that,
necessarily, *C-Fail* is true if *C-Trans* is false, but
there are probability distributions that make *C-Fail*
and *C-Trans* true at the same time for any chosen *t*
∈ [0, 1).

With the purpose to improve on Chandler’s model, Moretti (2012)
suggests turning *C-Trans* into this principle:

(M-Trans) If Pr(p) ≤t, Pr(p|e) >tandp⊢q, then Pr(q) ≤t.

Accepting *M-Trans* involves turning *C-Fail* into this
condition:

(M-Fail) The antecedent ofM-Transis true and Pr(q) >t.

*M-Trans* says that if *p*’s unconditional probability
does not exceed t while the conditional probability of *p*
given *e* does, and *p* entails *q*,
then *q*’s unconditional probability does not
exceed *t*. *M-Trans* accounts formally for transmissivity
of first-time justification in the sense that any deductive argument
with premise *p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e*
is *transmissive of first-time justification* if and only
if *M-Trans* is non-vacuously true. (Note again that Pr
(*p*|*e*) > *t* and *p* ⊢ *q* entail Pr
(*q*|*e*) > *t*.) Since *M-Fail* is just the
condition of falsehood of *M-Trans*, *M-Fail* provides a
formal condition *sufficient* for non-transmissivity of
first-time justification.

As we have seen in Sect 3.2, the satisfaction of
the *information-dependence template* might turn out to be a
sufficient condition for non-transmissivity of both first-time and
quantitatively strengthening justification. Yet note that
if *M-Fail* were sufficient for non-transmissivity of
quantitatively strengthening justification, *M-Fail* would
prevent *any* deductive argument whatsoever concluding
in *q* from being transmissive of quantitatively strengthening
justification. For the clause in *M-Fail* according to which Pr
(*q*) > *t* is intuitively a *necessary* condition
for transmission of quantitatively strengthening justification
to *q*. This would be an unpalatable result because (as we have
seen in Sect. 2) some deductive arguments appear capable of
transmitting quantitatively strengthening justification (cf. Moretti
2012).

Moretti tentatively proposes a new Bayesian formalisation including a
condition alternative to *M-Fail* that appears sufficient for
non-transmissivity of both first-time and quantitatively strengthening
justification. See Moretti (2012) for details.