Actualism

First published Sat Jun 17, 2000; substantive revision Mon Dec 8, 2008

Actualism is a widely-held view in the metaphysics of modality. To understand the thesis of actualism, consider the following example. Imagine a race of beings — call them ‘Aliens’ — that is very different from any life-form that exists anywhere in the universe; different enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly. Now, even though there are no Aliens, it seems intuitively the case that there could have been such things. After all, life might have evolved very differently than the way it did in fact. For example, if the fundamental physical constants or the laws of evolution had been slightly different, very different kinds of things might have existed. So in virtue of what is it true that there could have been Aliens when in fact there are none, and when, moreover, nothing that exists in fact could have been an Alien?

To answer this question, a philosopher should try to identify the special features of the world that are responsible for the truth of claims about what could have been the case. One group of philosophers, the possibilists, offers the following answer: ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is true because there are in fact individuals that could have been Aliens. At first blush, this might appear directly to contradict the premise that no existing thing could possibly have been an Alien. The possibilist's thesis, however, is that existence, or actuality, encompasses only a subset of the things that, in the broadest sense, are. Rather, in addition to things like us that actually exist, there are merely possible things — possible Aliens, for example — that could have existed, but, as it happens, do not. So there are such things, but they just happen to exhibit a rather less robust but nonetheless fully-fledged type of being than we do. For the possibilist, then, ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is true simply in virtue of the fact that there are possible-but-nonactual Aliens, i.e., things that could have existed (but do not) and that would have been Aliens if they had.

Actualists reject this answer; they deny that there are any nonactual individuals. Actualism is the philosophical position that everything there is — everything that can in any sense be said to be — exists, or is actual. Put another way, actualism denies that there is any kind of being beyond actual existence; to be is to exist, and to exist is to be actual. Actualism therefore stands in stark contrast to possibilism, which, as we've seen, takes the things there are to include possible but non-actual objects.

Of course, actualists will agree that there could have been Aliens. An actualist theory, therefore, will be a metaphysical theory that attempts to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to any nonactual objects whatsoever. What makes actualism so philosophically interesting, is that there is no obviously correct way to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to possible but nonactual objects. In this article, we will clarify the “possibilist challenge” to actualism in some detail and lay out the various attempts to meet the challenge and assess their effectiveness.


1. The Possibilist Challenge to Actualism

The fundamental thesis of actualism is:

A:   Everything there is exists, or is actual.[1]

Or, equivalently:

A:   There is nothing that is not actual.

Possibilism denies thesis A. More specifically, according to the possibilist, there are things that do not, in fact, exist but which could have existed — things like possible Aliens (in the sense above), possible people that were never born, and so on. Note that this is not merely to say that there could have been Aliens, or that there could have been people other than those who actually exist. Nearly everyone believes that. Rather, it is to say that there really are, quite literally, things that do not actually exist but which could have. (An important but significantly different notion of possibilism to which many of the issues in this article do not apply was developed by the philosopher David Lewis, and is discussed in the supplemental document Classical Possibilism and Lewisian Possibilism.)

As will be discussed in detail below, possibilism provides an elegantly simple, general account of the truth conditions of our modal discourse. The possibilist challenge to actualism is to give an analysis of our ordinary modal beliefs that is consistent with thesis A and, hence, which doesn't appeal to possible but nonactual objects. There are two central aspects to the possibilist challenge: the challenge of possible worlds, and the challenge of possible objects. The latter will be the central focus of this article, but, for the sake of completeness, we begin with a brief discussion of the former.

1.1 Worlds

Claims such as ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ and ‘It is necessary that human beings are mortal’ are known as modal claims, because the sentential prefixes ‘it is possible that’ and ‘it is necessary that’ indicate a ‘mode’ in which the statements they precede are true. Modal claims of these (and many other) forms are ubiquitous in our thought and discourse. Many of our reflective and creative thoughts seem to be about possibilities (consider, for example, the possibility that there are clean, fuel-efficient automobiles that cause no harm to the environment) and much of our logical reasoning involves drawing conclusions which, in some sense, necessarily follow from premises that we already believe. Modal logic is the logic of possibility and necessity and the study of modal logic, as a discipline, has flourished in the latter half of the twentieth century. This was due in no small part to the introduction of the concept of possible worlds to investigate the truth conditions of modal claims. A large part of the logic of possibility and necessity seems to be captured by treating the modal operators ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is possible that’ as quantifiers over possible worlds. That is, the following semantic analyses seem to capture a large part of the logic of modality:

  1. The statement It is necessary that p (p) is true just in case p is true in all possible worlds.
  2. The statement It is possible that p (p) is true just in case p is true in some possible world.

Notice that it is a consequence of analysis (b) that true claims asserting a possibility imply the existence of possible worlds.

On the face of it, then, the possible worlds analysis of the truth conditions of basic modal statements just sketched appears to entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, and hence appears directly to contradict thesis A. Consequently, actualists either have to try to develop a semantics — a theory of meaning — for modal statements in terms that do not entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, or at least to provide an account of possible worlds on which this consequence is rendered metaphysically innocuous.

The power of the possible worlds semantics — and the distinct lack of any persuasive alternatives — is very attractive to many actualists, and they are loathe to give it up (so long, of course, as they do not have to abandon actualism). Consequently, actualists typically grasp the second horn of the above dilemma and adopt some sort of actualistically acceptable, “sanitized” version of this theory on which possible worlds are conceived as theoretical abstract objects which actually exist. Many such theories of abstractly-conceived worlds have been developed, some with better success than others (see, for example, Plantinga [1974] and [1976], Adams [1974], Fine [1977], Chisholm [1981], van Inwagen [1986], or Zalta [1983] and [1993]). Some take worlds to be maximal possible states of affairs, others take them to be maximal possible properties or propositions, still others treat them as maximal consistent sets of some sort, and yet others treat them as part of a more general theory of abstract objects. For purposes here, it will serve well enough just to assume some generic version of this view on which such abstractly conceived worlds can perform their theoretical tasks in virtue of certain actualistically unobjectionable modal properties. (A fairly detailed example of such an account, and some of its philosophical ramifications, can be found in the supplementary document An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds.)

1.2 Mere Possibilia

The second step in the actualist analysis of modality is to find a way to do without possible but nonactual individuals — also known as mere possibilia or contingently nonactual individuals. The central reason for introducing such entities, at least in modern discussions, is this: Possible but nonactual individuals enable us to provide compelling semantic analyses of modal claims involving the quantifier ‘there is’. To see this, consider, first, a non-modal claim involving such a quantifier: ‘There are philosophers’. Such a claim would typically be regimented in first-order logic as ‘There is an x such that x is a philosopher’ or, using more formal notation (in which ‘Px’ abbreviates the predicate ‘x is a philosopher’): ∃xPx. On the usual “Tarskian” semantics[2] for classical, first-order logic, given the intended meaning of ‘Px’, the truth condition for this claim is — unsurprisingly — that there is an individual x that is a philosopher. And because there is in fact such an individual — the philosopher Plato, say — the claim is true. According to Tarskian semantics, then, the truth value of a general statement is determined ultimately by simple facts about whether or not specific individuals exhibit certain properties.

Now consider the modal claim ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’. It is natural to regiment this claim as ‘It is possible that there is an x such that x is an Alien’, which is typically formalized as follows:

(1)   ◊∃xAx.

Now, how are we to understand the truth condition for (1)? Because nothing that actually exists could be an Alien, the truth of (1) does not appear to depend upon any simpler facts about individuals. (1), if true, must simply be a brute fact. And this seems puzzling: How can that simply be the end of the matter? How can a rather complex truth about what there could be just be true without being grounded in simpler truths about individuals? And thus the possibilist: By introducing possible worlds and (contingently nonactual) possibilia into our ontology, we can define a truth condition for (1) in terms of simpler facts about individuals in other possible worlds. Specifically, according to possible world semantics, sentence (1) is true if and only if:

(2)   There is a possible world w and there is an individual x such that x is an Alien at w.

But, it is a fact about the logic of the quantifier ‘there is’ that such quantifiers commute with one another. In other words, (2) implies (3):

(3)   There is an individual x and there is a possible world w such that x is an Alien at w.

So the truth conditions of (1) imply (3). But if (3) is true, then so is the ordinary modal claim ‘Something is possibly an Alien’, i.e.,

(4)   xAx

for which (3) provides the truth conditions. Thus, given the simplest logic concerning modal and quantifier claims, (1) implies (4). In other words, the simplest quantified modal logic tells us that (5) implies (6):

(5)   It is possible that there is an x such that x is an Alien.
(6)   There is an x such that it is possible that x is an Alien.

The problem for the second step of the actualist treatment of modality may now be stated more precisely, namely, A is inconsistent with (6). A asserts that everything there is actually exists. But then (6) to asserts the existence of a possible Alien. By hypothesis, however, there are no possible Aliens among the actually existing individuals.[3] Thus, according to the simplest quantified modal logic, our ordinary modal beliefs have logical consequences that seem to be inconsistent with actualism.[4]

1.2.1 The Problem of Iterated Modalities

The problem described in the previous paragraph resurfaces for the actualist in an apparently more troublesome way when we consider sentences involving quantification into nested, or ‘iterated’, modal contexts. (This problem was first raised in a forceful way by McMichael [1983b].) Consider, for example, the following sentence:

(7)   Joseph Ratzinger (i.e., the Pope at the time of this writing, August 2008) could have had a son who could have become a priest.

(7) is represented in a standard modal language as follows:

(8)   ◊∃x(Sxp ∧ ◊Px)

To see the problem, note that an actualist might successfully develop a semantics that explains the truth of general modal existentials like (1) in a way that avoids the implication from (1) to (4) and hence avoids appealing to possibilia — indeed, the supplemental document An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds seems to provide just such an account. However, (8), while still general — like (1), it is not, on its face, “about” any particular individual — its truth conditions seem nonetheless to require a merely possible individual in a way that (1) does not. Like (1), it asserts the general possibility of an individual having a certain property, viz., being a son of Ratzinger — so far so good. But it continues on to assert (via an occurrence of the initial, existentially quantified variable ‘x’ within the iterated modal context ‘◊Px’) a further possibility regarding that very individual: it says that Ratzinger could have had a son a and that, possibly — i.e., in some possible world — he is a priest. Unlike (1), then, it appears that (8) requires us to understand the general possibility that there be an individual with a certain property P in terms of a specific mere possibile (as no actually existing thing could be Ratzinger's son) so that we can track that individual from one possible world to another to understand the nested possibility that it have another property Q. So the iterated modal operator in (8) appears to force a commitment to possibilia upon us in a way that (1) does not. We will return to the problem of iterated modal operators at several points below.

1.3 Where We Go From Here

As the reader who works through the remainder of this essay will discover, the simplest quantified modal logic has numerous consequences that seem incompatible in some way or another with actualism. In the next section, we will discover still other such consequences. Though we have succeeded in describing the issues surrounding actualism in more precise terms, we have only scratched the surface of the debate. Much of the debate turns on the precise characteristics of the modal logic being proposed as a logic for actualism. This debate can only be understood if one can contrast the characteristics of these proposed alternative logics with the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Thus, we will spend the next section of this essay describing the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Only then will we be in a position to evaluate the more complicated alternatives developed by actualists in the attempt to avoid commitment to nonactual possibles. For example, it is important to see just how Kripke's modal logic (Kripke [1963]) employs a variety of special techniques that yield a logic consistent with thesis A (these will be documented below).

The remaining sections of this essay, therefore, contain the following material. In Section 2, we describe, in a precise way, both the characteristics of the simplest quantified modal logic and its controversial theorems. (As we acquire more sophisticated logical tools, we will revisit some of the examples already discussed; the redescription of these examples in more sophisticated logical terms may prove to be instructive.) We also show why each of the controversial theorems is objectionable from the standpoint of actualism. In Section 3, we outline a modal system developed by Saul Kripke that appears to be consistent with thesis A. However, in Section 3.3, we will discover that Kripke's system introduces special problems of its own. Finally, in Section 4, we discuss the various attempts actualists have made to solve these problems and to find a quantified modal logic and corresponding metaphysics of necessity and possibility that are consistent with thesis A.

2. The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML)

Roughly (and rather abstractly) speaking, a logic is a collection of formal languages together with a model theory, that is, a formally rigorous semantics for those languages that, in particular, yields a precise account of what it means for a formula, or sentence, of a given language to be true under a given interpretation, or model, of the language. A formula of a language L is logically true, or valid, if it is true under any interpretation of L, and a set of formulas entails a given formula if the latter is true under any interpretation of L that makes the members of the former true. Ideally, validity and entailment for L can be precisely captured in a system of axioms and rules of inference, in the sense that, for any given formula φ of L, (i) φ is valid if and only if it is a theorem of the system, and (ii) for any set Γ of formulas of L, Γ entails φ if and only if φ can be derived from Γ in the system. Validity and entailment as defined in the Tarskian semantics of classical first-order logic can be precisely captured in this sense.

The languages of first-order modal logic (with identity) are defined just like those of classical first-order logic, but with the following additional clause in the definition of the notion of a formula for a given language L:

  • Whenever φ is a formula of L, so is □φ.

More specifically, first-order modal languages will have variables, individual constants, n-place predicates, atomic formulas such as ‘Pacb’ and ‘x=y’, and the usual boolean, quantified, and modal formulas involving the familiar logical constants ‘~’ (negation), ‘→’ (material conditional), ‘∀’ (the universal quantifier), and ‘□’ (the necessity operator). The other common boolean connectives ‘∧’ (conjunction), ‘∨’ (disjunction), and ‘↔’ (material equivalence), the ‘existential’ quantifier ‘∃’, and the possibility operator ◊ are all defined in the usual way. Notably, the formula ◊φ is defined as ~□~φ, reflecting the modal intuition that to say that φ is possibly true is to say that φ is not necessarily false. For convenience, a complete specification is provided in Section 1 of the supplementary document The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic. It would serve well to spend a moment or two examining these definitions to making sure that you understand the kinds of statements that are expressible in this language.

The simplest semantics for first-order modal languages defines, for a given modal language L, a class of interpretations having two distinguishing features: (1) each interpretation I in the class has two mutually exclusive domains — a nonempty domain w of possible worlds (which includes a distinguished “actual world” w0) and a nonempty domain D of individuals; and (2) given any individuals a1,…,an in D and given any possible world w in w, each interpretation I specifies, for each n-place predicate π, whether π applies to a1,…,an (respectively) at w or not. Given that specification, the semantics then defines truth conditions for every formula of the language. The definition of truth even accommodates “open” formulas (i.e., formulas with free variables) by appealing to assignment functions f which assign to each variable α some object f(α) in D. (For purposes below, for an assignment function f, let f[α,a] be f if f(α) = a, and otherwise let it be the assignment that is exactly like f except that it assigns a to α instead of f(α).) Given an assignment function f, a denotation function d is determined for the terms (constants and variables) of the language generally. Specifically, if a term τ is a constant, dI,f(τ) is the individual in D that I assigns to τ. If τ is a variable, then dI,f(τ) is f(τ).

Given an interpretation I for L and an assignment f, the notion of truth at a world (under I and f) for formulas φ of L is then defined recursively for all of the formulas of the language. The three most important parts of this definition are the clauses for atomic, quantified, and modal formulas. Here are examples of each that will be especially useful for purposes here; let w be a world of I:

  1. The open, atomic formula ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case I specifies that ‘P’ applies to dI,f(‘x’) at w.
    Less formally: under the interpretation I and assignment f, ‘Px’ is true at world w just in case ‘P’ applies to the object assigned (by f) to the variable ‘x’.
  2. The quantified formula ‘∀xPx’ (‘∃xPx’) is trueI,f at w just in case, for every (some) individual a in the domain D of I, ‘Px’ is trueI,f[‘x’,a] at w.
    Less formally, and by the previous clause: under the interpretation I and assignment f, ‘∀xPx’ (‘∃xPx’) is true at world w just in case, for every (some) individual a in D, ‘Px’ is true at world w under the assignment f[x,a]. By the clause above, this means that, according to I, for every (some) individual a in D, the predicate ‘P’ applies to the object assigned (by f[x,a]) to ‘x’ at w. Note that, because, by definition, f[x,a] assigns a to ‘x’, this can be restated as: under the interpretation I and assignment f, ‘∀xPx’ (‘∃xPx’) is true at world w just in case, for every (some) individual a in D, the predicate ‘P’ applies to a at w.
  3. The open, modal formula ‘□Px’ (‘◊Px’) is trueI,f at w just in case for every (some) possible world w′, ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w′.
    Less formally: under the interpretation I and assignment f, ‘□Px’ (‘◊Px’) is true at world w just in case, for every (some) world w′, ‘Px’ is true at w′, that is, by clause (1) above, ‘P’ applies to the object assigned by f to the variable ‘x’ at w′. Thus, less formally still, under I and f, ‘□Px’ (‘◊Px’) is true at a possible world w iff the object a assigned to ‘x’ has the property expressed by ‘P’ in every (some) possible world.

A formula φ (in which the variable x might occur free) is then defined to be trueI just in case φ is trueI,f at the actual world w0, under every assignment f. (Effectively then, in the definition of truth, formulas free variables are treated as if those variables were all universally quantified.) Validity and entailment are defined as indicated above. For convenience, one may consult the precise definition in Section 2 of the supplementary document The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic. It would serve the reader well to study these definitions if they are unfamiliar.

We now have a logic in the sense noted above — a collection of formal languages together with a method of interpreting them — which we will call the Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML). It is a well known fact that validity and entailment in the semantics for SQML can be captured in a complete system of axioms and rules of inference (a.k.a. a proof theory), which we will refer to as as SQML. (There is no serious danger if one were to forget that ‘SQML’ refers to the logic and ‘SQML’ refers to the proof theory, for given the completeness of SQML, in most contexts it doesn't much matter whether we are referring to the entire logic or its proof theory.) SQML combines classical propositional logic, classical quantification theory, and the logic with identity — a.k.a. classical first-order logic with identity (FOL=) — with S5 propositional modal logic (a.k.a. KT5). For convenience, we reproduce the axioms and rules of inference of these systems in Section 3 of the supplementary document The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic. We presuppose familiarity with FOL= here. The addition of S5 strengthens FOL= with three axiom schemas — the K schema, the T schema, and the 5 schema (see below) — and the Rule of Necessitation (RN), which permits one to infer □φ from any given theorem φ. Each of the axioms of the resulting logic SQML is true in every interpretation in the class described in the previous paragraph. Moreover, the rules of inference ‘preserve truth’ (and preserve logical truth). That is, the rules of inference permit one to infer only (logical) truths from any set of premises consisting solely of (logical) truths. Notice (importantly) that open formulas are assertible as axioms and provable as theorems in SQML. Familiarity with this logic will be presupposed in what follows.

The problem that SQML poses for actualist philosophers is that, while all of its logical axioms appear to be true, some of the logical consequences of these axioms appear to be false. Consider first the fact that the new modal axioms added by SQML to FOL=, i.e., all instances of the K, T, and 5 schemas, all seem true. The K schema asserts that if a conditional is necessary, then if the antecedent is necessary, so is the consequent:

K:  □(φ→ψ) → (□φ→□ψ)

It is easy to see that this is true in every interpretation of the class of simplest interpretations: if a conditional is true in every possible world and the antecedent of the conditional is true in every world, then the consequent of the conditional is true in every world.

The T schema asserts that a formula true in every possible world is simply true:

T:  □φ → φ

Clearly, this is true in all interpretations — if a sentence is true in every possible world, it is true in the distinguished actual world.

The 5 schema asserts that if a formula φ is possible, then it is necessarily the case that it is possible:

5:  ◊φ → □◊φ

It is not hard to see that this is logically true. If a formula is true in some possible world, then from the point of view of every possible world, the formula is true in some possible world. That is, if a formula is true at some possible world, then at every possible world, there is some possible world where the formula is true. (The formal validity of the 5 schema is proved in the supplementary document The 5 Axiom Schema is Logically True.)

2.1 Controversial Consequences of SQML

However, the controversies surrounding actualism and modal logic center on the following theorems, (the instances of) which are all logically true and provable from the axioms and rules of SQML. The first of these is the so-called Barcan Formula (more correctly, the Barcan schema), after Ruth Barcan Marcus, who was the first logician to study the principle explicitly (Barcan [1946]):

BF:   x□φ → □∀xφ

or, in the equivalent form (by the definitions of ‘∃’ and ‘◊’) found most often in the literature:

BF:   ◊∃xφ → ∃x◊φ.

That all instances of BF are logically true is proved rigorously in the supplementary document The Barcan Formula is Logically True. That all instances of BF are derivable from the system of axioms and rules of SQML follows immediately from the semantic completeness of that system relative to the semantics of SQML. (A system of axioms of rules is semantically complete relative to a corresponding semantics if every logical truth of the semantics is derivable in the system.) However, the proof of this fact (discovered by Prior [1956]) is of independent interest and will be relevant to the discussion below, so we display it explicitly in the supplementary document Proof of the Barcan Formula in SQML.

Two further controversial principles we shall discuss are Necessary Existence and the Converse Barcan Formula:

NE:   x□∃y(y=x)
CBF:   □∀xφ → ∀x□φ

Demonstrating that NE and all instances of CBF are logically true in the semantics for SQML is left as an exercise for the reader. As above, however, it is useful to see their derivations from the axioms and rules of SQML. These can be found in the supplementary documents Proof of NE in SQML and Proof of CBF in SQML.

2.2 Why Actualists Find SQML Unacceptable

With the logic SQML laid out before us, it is instructive to consider why its consequences BF, NE, and CBF offend the actualist's philosophical sensibilities.

2.2.1  BF and Possibilia

Consider first the Barcan Formula. Our Alien example has already provided us with an example of BF in action: where φ is ‘Ax’, BF asserts that proposition (1) of Section 1.2 implies (4), or, in terms of their ordinary language counterparts, that (5) implies (6) — from the mere possibility of Aliens BF entails that there are, in fact, possible Aliens. Since, by assumption, no actually existing thing could be an Alien, (4) and (6) are true only if there are mere possibilia, hence, only if the actualist's central principle A is false.

2.2.2  NE and Contingency

To facilitate discussion of NE, let us introduce a unary predicate ‘E!’ to express actual existence. For the actualist, recall, there is no distinction to be drawn between being and existence, between the things that are and the things that exist. Hence, given an explicit predicate to express existence, the actualist principle A can be expressed formally as follows:

A*:   xE!x.

But we can say more. For the actualist position isn't that it's just an accident that there are no mere possibilia; that there just don't, as a matter of fact, happen to be any. Rather, for the actualist, principle A is a necessary truth; it is not even possible that there be mere possibilia. Thus, we can strengthen A to:

NA:   Necessarily, everything there is is actual,

which we can express more formally in terms of our new predicate as:

NA*:   □∀xE!x.

Now, turning our attention to NE proper, the actualist's problem with NE revolves around the notion of contingency. Possibilists and actualists alike can agree that a contingent being is one for whom both existence and nonexistence are, from a metaphysical standpoint, equally possible. That is:

x is contingent =dfE!x ∧ ◊~E!x

For an actualist, of course, the first conjunct is superfluous, since everything actually exists and hence, obviously, everything possibly exists. But possibilists will want to count nonactual possibilia — possible children of Joseph Ratzinger, for example — as contingent as well in virtue of the fact that they only accidentally fail to exist; metaphysically, like actually existing beings that could have failed to exist, their existence and their nonexistence are equally possible. (We therefore adopt the more inclusive definition in the interest of metaphysical neutrality.) Actualists and possibilists alike, then, generally agree that there are contingent beings in the sense above:

CB:   x(◊E!x ∧ ◊~E!x)

Now for the crux of the matter. For the actualist, we noted, there is no distinction to be drawn between being and existence. Another way to express this — perhaps stronger, but common among actualists — is to say that there is no difference in meaning between ‘x exists’ and ‘there is such a thing as x’. Notably, this is the influential view of Quine [1948] (p. 23):

We have all been prone to say, in our common-sense usage of ‘exist’, that Pegasus does not exist, meaning simply that there is no such entity at all.

Hence, actualists often simply define the existence predicate ‘E!’ in terms of the existential quantifier thus:

E!Def:   E!x  =df   ∃y(y=x).

Two significant consequences follow. First, under E!Def, thesis A, in its formal guise A*, now falls out as a logical truth of SQML. For it is a simple theorem of the first-order logic on which SQML is built that everything is identical to something: ∀xy(y = x). Given E!Def, this theorem is exactly A*. NA* then follows in the proof theory of SQML by an application of the Rule of Necessitation. Second, under E!Def, NE — ∀x□∃y(y = x) — is logically equivalent to:

NE!:   xE!x.

Hence, under the actualist's understanding of existence, NE says that everything exists necessarily and hence (by the definitions of ‘∃’ and ‘◊’) that nothing can possibly fail to exist — ~∃x◊~E!x — from which it immediately follows, contrary to CB, that there are no contingent beings, beings (like us) for whom existence and nonexistence are equally possible. Thus Arthur Prior's remark in [1957] (p. 48) that classical quantified modal logic (effectively, SQML) is “haunted by the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily.”

Indeed, from an actualist perspective, matters are even worse, as SQML entails an even stronger result. By applying the Rule of Necessitation to NE, one obtains:

NNE:   □∀x□∃y(y=x).

Hence, under E!Def, NNE can be rewritten as:

NNE!:   □∀xE!x.

That is, for an actualist, it is a theorem of SQML that it is necessary that everything necessarily exists, that anything that there could have been already exists necessarily. It follows that it is not even possible for there to be contingent beings, contrary to very strong, ordinary modal intuitions.

It is worth noting briefly why the possibilist finds NE and NNE unproblematic.[5] Since the possibilist denies principle A and holds that there are in fact things that do not actually exist, he will reject the actualist's definition DefE! of the existence predicate ‘E!’; for metaphysical applications of SQML, it will simply be introduced as a primitive 1-place predicate. The possibilist can then embrace both CB — that there are contingent beings — and NE/NNE. For to say that an object is contingent is to say that it either could exist but in fact does not, or that it does exist but in fact might not. As noted already, for the possibilist, there are of course many examples of both the former and the latter. CB is thus satisfied. But, in accord with NE, every contingent being a is nonetheless necessary, in the sense that, regardless of whether or not a exists in fact, there would still have been such an object as a. With the rejection of DefE!, NE! no longer follows — from the fact that, necessarily, there is such a thing as a it does not follow that a necessarily exists, that a is necessarily actual.

So for the possibilist, NE and NNE are unproblematically true and can be rendered consistent with our modal intuitions by distinguishing being from actual existence. For actualists, however, who categorically reject any such distinction, NE can mean only that all actually existing things are necessarily actual and NNE that anything that could have existed already does. NE and NNE thus provide the actualist with additional reasons to abandon SQML.

2.2.3 CBF and Serious Actualism

Finally, there is CBF. For the actualist, the most immediate problem with CBF is simply that the instance

CBFE!:   □∀xE!x → ∀xE!x

together with the actualist thesis NA* entails NE! directly. For purposes below, however, it will be useful to point out a further, related, problem. Say that a property P or relation R is existence entailing just in case it is not possible that anything have P, or bear R to anything, without existing. Otherwise put, if an object exemplifies P, or bears R to anything, at a world, it exists at that world. The thesis commonly known as serious actualism is that, necessarily, all properties and relations are existence-entailing. (See Plantinga [1983] and [1985], Fine [1985], Pollock [1985], Menzel [1991], and Deutsch [1994] for further discussion of serious actualism.) In semantic terms, this amounts to the constraint that an object in the extension of a property at a world must fall under the range of the quantifier at that world. More formally, serious actualism can be expressed schematically as follows:

□SA:   □(∃y1…∃ynφ → E!x), where φ is atomic and contains at least the variables x, y1, …, yn.

Depending on the system, □SA is often derivable by successive applications of the laws of Generalization, some basic quantificational logic, and Necessitation from a simpler schema that it will also be useful to name explicitly:

SA:   φ → E!x, where φ is atomic and contains x.

SA and □SA are obviously quite consistent with, if not entailed by, the actualist point of view.[6] But given that some property necessarily holds of everything, □SA and CBF entail NE!. (See An Informal Derivation of NE! from □SA and CBF.)

3. Kripke's System

Given the controversial consequences of SQML, one can understand why actualists would seek a reformulation of first-order modal logic that both: (1) defines interpretations so that BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true, and (2) weakens the proof theory of SQML so that BF, NE, and CBF are not derivable as theorems of the logic. Kripke's logic appealed to actualists and serious actualists for these very reasons. The system of Kripke [1963] invalidates BF, NE, and CBF both model-theoretically and proof-theoretically.

It is illuminating both to see exactly how Kripke was able to construct interpretations on which BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true and to see exactly how Kripke modified the logic of SQML so that these these schemata and sentences are no longer theorems. These techniques will be the subject of the next two subsections.

3.1 Kripke Models

The key insight in Kripke's (first-order) quantified modal logic is the replacement of the single domain D of individuals in the interpretation of a first-order modal language with a function dom that assigns to each world w of the interpretation its own distinct domain of individuals dom(w). No restrictions are placed on the domain of a world; any set of individuals, including the empty set, will do. Thus, instead of a single domain common to all worlds, domains are permitted to vary from world to world. Intuitively, of course, dom(w) represents the objects that exist in w. In particular, the domain of the actual world represents — of course — the things that are actual, the things that exist simpliciter. Interpretations like this for first-order modal languages in which each world has its own domain are known as Kripke models.

The central semantic difference between Kripke models and interpretations for SQML is that, in a Kripke model, when a quantified formula ∀xφ is evaluated at a world w, the quantifier ranges only over the objects that exist in the domain of w. Thus, in particular, the sample clause in the definition of truth for quantification above must be revised for Kripke models M as follows, where, again, f is an assignment function and w a world of M:

The quantified formula ‘∀xPx’ is trueM,f at w just in case, for all individuals a in dom(w), ‘Px’ is trueM,f[‘x’,a] at w, where f[‘x’,a] is f if f(‘x’) = a, and otherwise is just like f except that it assigns a to ‘x’ instead of f(‘x’).

Again, a little less formally, under the Kripke model M and assignment f, ‘∀xPx’ is true at w just in case, for all individuals a that exist in w, the predicate ‘P’ applies to a at w.

Kripke's changes to the semantics of first-order modal languages are relatively simple. Nonetheless, unlike the semantics for SQML, Kripke's semantics yields a set of logical truths that is fully compatible with actualism. In particular, all three of the principles with which the actualist takes issue — BF, NE, and CBF — turn out to be invalid in Kripke's semantics. Consider first BF in the form

◊∃xφ → ∃x◊φ.

For definiteness, let φ be the formula ‘Ax’ expressing that x is an Alien (in the sense of ‘Alien’ introduced above). As we noted, even though there are no Aliens in the actual world w0, there could have been; that is, there is a possible world w in which there are Aliens. Thus, on Kripke's way of evaluating quantified formulas, the antecedent to BF — ‘◊∃xAx’ — comes out true at the actual world: ‘◊∃xAx’ is true at w0 if and only if there is some world u at which ‘∃xAx’ is true, and that, in turn, is true at such a u just in case some entity that exists in u is an Alien there. Assuming, as we are, that there is such a world, then, ‘◊∃xAx’ is indeed true, i.e., true at the actual world. However, as we also noted, no actually existing thing is an Alien. Thus, there is nothing in the domain of the actual world such that ‘◊Ax’ is true of it, that is, nothing a in the actual world and no world u are such that ‘A’ is true of a at u. So, in the case in question, the antecedent of BF is true, but the consequent is false. So BF is not valid, that is, there are models in which some of its instances are false.

It should be obvious why NE is also invalid in Kripke's semantics: domains of worlds can be empty. Thus, let M1 be a Kripke model containing at least one actual individual (i.e., at least one object adom(w0)) and a world w that has an empty domain. Then, obviously, a does not exist in w, and hence ‘∃y(y=x)’ is false at w when a is assigned to ‘x’. Thus, ‘□∃y(y=x)’ is false at w0 when a is assigned to ‘x’, and so, because a is in the domain of the actual world w0, NE is false in M1.

Although Kripke's semantics does not presuppose serious actualism, it is consistent with it, so it is still important that CBF turn out invalid in the semantics to avoid the argument to NE noted above when serious actualism is assumed. To see that CBF is indeed invalid, first, let M2 be a Kripke model in which NE is false. (We just proved the existence of such a model in the previous paragraph, of course.) Next, let the predicate ‘P’ express a property in M2 that is necessarily both existence-entailing and universal, that is, a property which is exemplified at each world w by everything that exists at w and by nothing else. The property existence, of course, is the simplest example of such a property. We can represent the universal, existence-entailing character of this property formally in M2 simply by stipulating that the extension of ‘P’ at any world w of M2 is dom(w), so that all and only the things that exist at each world are in the extension of ‘P’ at that world. Now, note that, under these conditions, it is true in M2 (i.e., true at the actual world w0 of M2) that □∀xPx: intuitively, everything that exists in every possible world has the property P (i.e., the property that the predicate ‘P’ denotes) in that world. Let a be any object in the actual world w0 that fails to exist in some world w. (Since, by hypothesis, NE fails in M2, there must be such an object in dom(w0).) Because P is existence-entailing, a is not in the extension of ‘P’ at w. So there is something in the actual world w0 that does not have the property P in every possible world, i.e., ‘∀xPx’ is false in M2. Hence, the instance ‘□∀xPx→∀xPx’ of CBF is false in M2.

Note that the invalidity of CBF reopens the door to serious actualism SA in Kripke's semantics, as it was the combination of SA with CBF that led to trouble (i.e., trouble for the actualist) in SQML. And it is easy to see formally that this is the case by constructing a Kripke model in which SA is true. Note first that the thesis of serious actualism can be expressed as the thesis that all properties are existence-entailing; there is no possible world in which something has a property but fails to exist in that world. In first-order languages, properties are represented by predicates, and having a property is represented semantically by being in the extension of a predicate. Thus, to represent a property as existence-entailing in a Kripke model, one simply ensures that, at every possible world w, the extension of the predicate representing that property consist only of things that exist in w. Hence, to represent all properties as existence entailing, and hence, to make SA true, one ensures that this is so for all the predicates of one's language. Formally, then, let M3 be any Kripke model satisfying the condition that, for every n-place predicate F and world w, F is interpreted so that, at w, F applies only to things that exist in w; more formally, for individuals a1,…,an of M3, F applies to a1,…,an at w only if a1,…,andom(w). This condition ensures that SA (indeed □SA) is true in M3.

The compatibility of SA with Kripke's semantics is yet further evidence of its suitability as a formal semantics for the actualist. A question that remains is: What sort of logic does this semantics yield?

3.2 Kripke's Quantified Modal Logic

A logic formulated in a given language L* is said to be sound with respect to a semantics for L* if and only if every formula of L* that is a theorem of the logic is valid (logically true) relative to that semantics (i.e., is true in every interpretation or model of the semantics). A logic is said to be complete with respect to a semantics for L* if and only if every formula of L* that is valid relative to that semantics is a theorem of the logic. A sound and complete logic for a semantics is a good thing, of course, as it provides a purely syntactic, proof-theoretic mechanism for demonstrating the semantic validity of formulas in the language.[7]

SQML is sound and complete relative to the semantics given above for its language L. Since, as we saw in the previous section, BF, NE, and CBF are invalid in Kripke's semantics, SQML is obviously not sound with respect to that semantics. Hence, Kripke must modify SQML to block their derivation without blocking the derivation of any valid formulas.

There are two elements to Kripke's solution to this problem. Note first that a typical proof of NE will involve open formulas (i.e., formulas containing free variables) to which the Rule of Necessitation is subsequently applied. Notably the proof in the supplementary document Proof of NE in SQML makes use of the following logical axioms (see lines 1 and 2):

  • x=x
  • y(yx) → xx.

By contraposition and the definition of the existential quantifier, the latter axiom is equivalent to ‘x=x → ∃y(y=x)’. Thus, given ‘x=x’, we have ‘∃y(y=x)’. The crucial step now is the application of Necessitation in line 6 to this formula — containing, we note, a free occurrence of ‘x’ — to yield ‘□∃y(y=x)’, which in turn yields NE, by the Rule of Generalization.

To repair this “flaw” in SQML, Kripke adopts the generality interpretation of theorems containing free variables, that is: a formula φ containing free variables α1,…,αn, when asserted as a theorem (and hence, in particular, as an axiom), is taken to be an abbreviation for its universal closure ∀α1…∀αnφ. Thus, under this proposal, the proof of NE noted above fails. For the axioms used in the proof, because they involve free variables, cannot stand as they are. Rather, they must be taken to be abbreviations of

  • x(x=x)
  • x(∀y(yx) → xx)

respectively. From the second axiom displayed above we can derive ‘∀x(x=x → ∃y(y=x))’ and, from this ‘∀x(x=x) → ∀xy(y=x)’ (by the quantifier distribution axiom). So using the first axiom displayed above, we can now derive ‘∀xy(y=x)’ by Modus Ponens, and, finally, by Necessitation we can derive only ‘□∀xy(y=x)’. This latter proposition, for Kripke, is uproblematically and uncontroversially true — in every possible world, every individual existing in that world is identical to something (viz., itself). To derive NE from this, however, we need CBF — in particular, the instance ‘□∀xy(y=x) → ∀x□∃y(y=x)’. But, as Kripke points out, the usual SQML proof of CBF also depends essentially on an application of Necessitation to an open formula derived by universal instantiation — the same “flaw” that infects the proof of NE. (See the inference from line 1 to line 2 in the supplementary document Proof of the Converse Barcan Formula in S5.) Hence, it, too, fails under the generality interpretation of free variables. The proof of BF found in Proof of the Barcan Formula in S5 fails for the same reason. Hence, the usual SQML proofs of all three actualistically unacceptable principles fail in Kripke's system.

However, the generality interpretation of theorems containing free variables is not quite enough to purge quantified modal logic of NE and its ilk. For valid proofs of NE, BF, and CBF can still be generated in SQML from the proofs noted by simply replacing free occurrences of the variable ‘x’ with occurrences of a constant ‘c’. The second element of Kripke's solution, therefore, is to banish constants from the language of quantified modal logic; that is, to specify the language of quantified modal logic in such a way that variables are the only terms.

Note that, because theorems involve neither constants nor free variables in Kripke's system, the Rule of Generalization has no purchase; any quantifier prefixed to a theorem in virtue of the rule would be vacuous (and hence could be inferred from the easily provable theorem φ → ∀αφ, for α not occurring free in φ). However, there remain validities of Kripke's system that, in SQML, can only be proved by applications of Generalization to theorems containing free variables, e.g., ‘∀x(PxPx)’. Moreover, the inability to assert theorems containing free variables makes it impossible to prove any de re modal validities. For the logical form of all such propositions involves a modal operator within the scope of a quantifier, and hence, the proof of any such proposition would appear to require the application of Necessitation to a formula in which a variable occurs free — ‘∀x□(PxPx)’, for example, in SQML, requires the application of the Rule of Necessitation to ‘PxPx’ followed, once again, by an application of Generalization.

Kripke's solution cleverly involves jettisoning both Generalization and Necessitation as rules of inference and incorporating just enough of them as needed into the statement of his logical axioms — slightly revised from their SQML guises. In particular, Kripke's system declares the result of prefixing universal quantifiers and modal operators, in any order, to propositional tautologies (whether or not they contain free variables) to be axioms. Thus, in particular, both ‘∀x(PxPx)’ and ‘∀x□(PxPx)’ count as axioms in Kripke's system.

Kripke's system is presented in detail in the supplementary document Kripke's Quantified Modal Logic. With his modifications in place — broadly, the generality interpretation of free variables, the removal of individual constants, and the relocation of Generalization and Necessitation into the logical axioms themselves — Kripke is able to demonstrate that his system is sound and complete relative to his semantics. Soundness, in particular, tells us that no invalid formula is provable in the system. Hence, since NE, CBF, and BF are all invalid in Kripke's semantics, soundness guarantees that they are all unprovable in his system.

3.3 Is Kripke's System Actualist?

On the face of it, Kripke's logic provides the actualist with a powerful alternative to SQML. However, although BF, NE, and CBF are neither valid nor provable in Kripke's system, the system is open to several serious objections.

First, Kripke regards the loss of free variables from assertible sentences as a mere inconvenience. But this seems much too facile; a great deal of mathematical reasoning is carried out in terms of formulas with free variables, especially when reasoning about "arbitrary" objects from which one intends to draw general conclusions. One should at least wonder why such reasoning cannot be carried out in a modal logic. Far more serious, however, is the loss of individual constants. It is surely a sad irony that a system whose motivation is to capture our modal intuitions — most notably, intuitions about contingency — cannot so much as permit us to talk about specific contingent individuals and say of those individuals that they are contingent.

Alarming as this problem might be, however, it is in fact more a formal rather than a philosophical objection to Kripke's system. Although Kripke himself might not be particularly pleased at the prospect, it seems that the proper response to these problems is simply to alter those features of classical quantification theory and/or classical propositional modal logic that give rise to invalid inferences such as the above. (Arguably, Kripke has already made a similar move in adopting the generality interpretation of free variables.) Obvious suspects here are universal instantiation and necessitation. After all, there is nothing sacrosanct about either classical quantification theory or classical modal logic. If they are inconsistent with strong modal intuitions, then their revision is required and fully warranted.

So its current inability to name contingent beings does not of itself constitute much of an objection to Kripke's system. It is likely that it could be patched up so as to allow it this expressive capacity. Far more serious is the fact that, despite the invalidity and unprovability of the actualistically objectionable principles BF, NE, and CBF, Kripke's system does not appear to have escaped ontological commitment to possibilia. A semantics for a language provides, in particular, an account of how the truth value of a given sentence of the language is determined in a model by the meanings of its semantically significant component parts, notably, the meanings of its names, predicates, and quantifiers. Now, truth-in-a-model is not the same as truth simpliciter. However, truth simpliciter is usually understood simply to be truth in an intended model, a model consisting of the very things that the language is intuitively understood to be “about”. So if we are to take Kripke models seriously as an account of truth for modal languages, then we must identify the intended models of those languages. And for this there seems little option but to take Kripke's talk of possible worlds literally: the set W in an intended Kripke model is the set of all possible worlds. If so, however, it appears that Kripke is committed to possibilia. For suppose that the modal operators, properly interpreted, are literally quantifiers over possible worlds. And suppose it is possible that there be objects — Aliens, for example — that are distinct from all actually existing objects. Letting ‘A’ express the property of being an Alien, we can represent this proposition by means of the sentence ‘◊∃yAy ∧ ~∃xAx’, i.e., while there could be Aliens (◊∃yAy), no actually existing thing could be an Alien (~∃xAx). On Kripke's semantics, the first conjunct of this sentence can be true only if there is a possible world w and an object a such that a is an Alien at w. But given the second conjunct, any such object a is distinct from all actually existing things. Hence, using Kripke's semantics to provide us with an account of truth, we find ourselves quantifying directly over possible worlds and mere possibilia (see Williamson [2000], 206-7). That BF, NE, and CBF are unprovable in Kripke's system, it seems, is metaphysically irrelevant. For it appears that, nonetheless, the semantics itself is wholly committed to possibilism.

An option for the actualist here, perhaps, is simply to deny that Kripke models have any genuine metaphysical bite. The real prize is the logic, which describes the modal facts of the matter directly. Kripke's semantics is simply a formal instrument that enables us to prove that the logic possesses certain desirable metatheoretic features, notably consistency. But this position is unsatisfying at best. Consider ordinary Tarskian semantics for nonmodal first-order logic. Intuitively, this semantics is more than just a formal artifact. Rather, when one constructs an intended model for a given language, it shows clearly how the semantic values of the relevant parts of a sentence of first-order logic — the objects, properties, relations, etc. in the world those parts signify — contribute to the actual truth value of the sentence. The semantics provides insight into the “word-world” connection that explains how it is that sentences can express truth and falsity, how they can carry good and bad information. The embarrassing question for the actualist who would adopt the proposed instrumentalist view of Kripke semantics is: what distinguishes Kripkean semantics from Tarskian? Why does the latter yield insight into the word-world connection and not the former? Distaste for the metaphysical consequences of Kripke semantics at best provides a motivation for finding an answer to these questions, but it is not itself an answer. The actualist owes us either an explanation of how Kripke's semantics for modal languages does not commit us to possibilism, or else he owes us a semantical alternative.

4. Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge

We now turn to the work of actualists who have tried to address the possibilist challenge. The relevant literature is quite extensive, but actualist responses to the challenge seem largely to fall into two broad categories, which we will call trace and no-trace, or strict, actualism. The difference comes down to this. Actualists and possibilists alike agree that there are (in at least some sense or other) contingent beings, beings that actually exist but which (in at least some sense or other) might have failed to be. Trace actualists believe alongside possibilists that, necessarily, for any contingent being x, even if x had failed to be (in the relevant sense), there would still have been some sort of metaphysical vestige, or trace, of x, either the object x itself in some ontologically attenuated state or a surrogate, or proxy, thereof (Bennett [2006]).[8] Consequently, for the trace actualist, as for the possibilist, there would still have been information about x, i.e., true or false propositions definitely and specifically about x, notably, the proposition [x does not exist]. Structurally, then, the semantical universe of the trace actualist looks quite a lot like the possibilist's universe — for every merely possible object on the possibilist's account, one finds instead an actualistically acceptable vestige of that object. Hence, the trace actualist is able to reconstruct quantified modal logic along the lines of one of their possibilist counterparts, SQML or Kripke's logic. Strict actualists, by contrast, categorically reject the idea that there are, or could have been, traces of nonexistent objects and consequently often find themselves forced to accept rather more awkward quantified modal logics that are more suited to their metaphysical commitments.

There are any number of representatives of, and variations on, these two categories of actualist. For brevity, I will focus only on a few salient accounts.

4.1 Trace Actualism

4.1.1 Possibilia Reconceptualized: New Actualism

We begin with a form of trace actualism that offers a way to preserve the formal, theoretical benefits of SQML in its entirety simply by reinterpreting its intended semantics so as to eliminate its apparent commitment to possibilia. On this form of actualism, the truth condition for the modal claim “There might have been Aliens” is just what it appears to be on the semantics of SQML, namely, that in some possible world, there is an object that is an Alien at that world. However, this truth condition does not commit us to mere possibilia, to entities that fail to be actual. Instead, the new form of actualism is based on the idea that this truth condition is committed to the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects, i.e., actually existing objects that are, in fact, nonconcrete, but which could have been Aliens (hence could have been concrete). This theory has been recently put forward by Linsky and Zalta ([1994], [1996]) and Williamson ([1998], [1999], [2012]) (though Williamson eschews the word ‘actual’ (as well as ‘being’) in his formulation of the theory and speaks only in terms of ‘existence’ and its cognates). These philosophers claim that a nonconcrete object of the sort in question is not an Alien, but instead has the modal property of possibly being an Alien. In other words, modal claims such as “There might have been Aliens” (formalized, once again, as (1)) can be interpreted to be true in virtue of the actual existence of objects that are nonconcrete (and hence which are not Aliens) at our world, but which are Aliens (and hence concrete) at some other possible world. Thus, unlike possibilia, the nonconcrete objects involved in the truth conditions of such modal claims actually exist. To say this is to use ‘exist’ and ‘actual’ similar to they way Platonists use them when they claim that mathematical objects exist or are actual. However, unlike mathematical objects, which are necessarily nonconcrete, the objects required for the truth of modal claims are only contingently nonconcrete — they are nonconcrete at our world but concrete at other possible worlds. Similarly, ordinary concrete objects (like the tables, animals, planets, etc., of our world) are assumed to be contingently concrete — they are concrete at some worlds (including ours) and not at other worlds.

With this basic idea in hand, the “new actualists” (to give them a simple label) point out that our ordinary modal claims can be given a straightforward analysis by: (1) regimenting ordinary modal discourse in the simplest possible way using SQML and (2) semantically interpreting SQML by appealing to contingently concrete objects and contingently nonconcrete objects (both of which are assumed to actually exist). This interpretation, the new actualist argues, allows him to accept principle A and its formal expression A* — taking the existence predicate ‘E!’ to be defined as in DefE! — and reveals that the controversial consequences of SQML — BF, CBF, and NE/NE* — do not contradict our modal intuitions, once those intuitions are understood in terms of a more subtle conception of the abstract/concrete distinction.

To see why, reconsider the definition and discussion of SQML and reexamine BF. For an actualist, from the fact that there might have been aliens (◊∃xAx), BF entails that there exists something that could have been an Alien (∃xAx). But, it was asked, doesn't this contradict the intuition (described at the very outset) that no actually existing thing could have been an Alien? Here, the new actualist argues that this intuition is legitimate only when it is properly understood as the intuition that no concrete thing could have been an Alien. Recall that our thought experiment asked us to “imagine a race of beings that is very different from any life-form that actually exists anywhere in the universe; different enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly.” According to the new actualist, the relevant intuition here — that nothing could have been an Alien — is grounded in the fact that when we look around us and examine all the concrete objects there are, we note that none of them could have been an Alien (just as no gorilla could have been a fruitfly). However, this leaves room to claim that there exist (contingently) nonconcrete objects which could have been Aliens. According to the new actualist, these contingently nonconcrete objects have been overlooked because (1) no one has correctly drawn the proper distinction between contingently nonconcrete and necessarily nonconcrete objects, and (2) everyone has assumed that concreteness was an essential property of concrete objects (see below).

Thus, according to the new actualist, whenever there is a true claim of the form “There could have been something which is F”, BF doesn't imply anything that is incompatible with our modal intuitions. For the conclusion that it entails, namely, that “There exists something that could have been an F”, does not require us to suppose that there is some concrete object that could have been F. Rather, BF requires only the existence of a something that could have been F, and that thing might well be contingently nonconcrete.

NE and CBF are equally harmless according to the new actualist. For, while it is true that Socrates exists necessarily on the new actualist's account, he is not a “necessary being”. For a necessary being is one whose ontological status does not change from world to world — it is either concrete in every possible world or nonconcrete in every possible world. Socrates, by contrast, is concrete in some worlds and nonconcrete in others. There is thus still a robust sense in which Socrates is a contingent being — he might have failed to be concrete, failed to exist in space and time. And that, the new actualist argues, is the actual foundation of our belief that Socrates is a contingent being. Similar to the possibilist, then, since the existential quantifier ranges over absolutely all the things there could be — necessarily/contingently concrete and necessarily/contingently nonconcrete alike — the new actualist, too, will not accept the original definition of contingency above. Rather, she will introduce an additional predicate C! to express the property of being concrete and define contingency accordingly:

x is contingent =dfC!x ∧ ◊~C!x

That is, a contingent being is one for whom both concreteness and noncreteness are equally possible. Since, therefore, NE is an actualistically acceptable consequence of SQML, the Converse Barcan Formula (CBF) is rendered acceptable as well, for the fact that it, together with thesis A or serious actualism (SA), implies NE!, is of no consequence for the new actualist.

Once it is seen that BF, NE, and CBF require only contingently nonconcrete objects and not possibilia, it is natural to reconceive the nature of concrete objects. According to new actualism, ordinary concrete beings are concrete at some worlds and not at others. This, as just noted above, is the sense in which they are contingent. Traditional actualists have described worlds where these objects are not concrete as worlds where these objects have no sort of being whatever. By contrast, the new actualist just rests with their nonconcreteness at the world in question, and argues that that should suffice to account for our intuition that such objects “are not to be found” in such a world. Moreover, new actualists reconceive the idea of an “essential” property of a concrete object. Instead of saying that Socrates is essentially a person because he is a person in every possible world where he exists, new actualists say that he is essentially a person because he is a person in every world where he is concrete.

So by recognizing the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects and by reconceptualizing both the contingency of concrete objects and the notion of an essential property in what seem to be harmless ways, there appears to be a way to interpret SQML so that it is consistent with actualism. Specifically, in the “intended” new actualist model of SQML, everything in the one domain D both is and is actual. To account for the validity of BF, NE, and CBF, D is understood to include: (1) contingently concrete objects, (2) contingently nonconcrete objects, and, if there are such (3) necessarily concrete objects and (4) necessarily nonconcrete objects. All of these objects in D, according to the new actualist, actually exist.

By reconceptualizing possibilia, then, new actualism appears to offer a very simple and elegant solution to the possibilist challenge that involves no theoretical alteration to the language, semantics, or proof theory of SQML. In particular, the new actualist is able to preserve simple and straightforward truth conditions for our paradigmatic modal claim (1) as well as more complicated propositions like (7) and (8) that involve nested modalities. (Further details are provided in the supplementary document New Actualism and Iterated Modalities for the interested reader.) Thus, the new actualists can argue that their view shows why a single formalism, SQML, suffices as a regimentation for the modal claims of natural language no matter whether one is an actualist or a possibilist. Both possibilists and actualists can employ SQML to represent our modal beliefs, though each will interpret the formalism in different ways to suit their own purposes. New actualism thus appears to show, somewhat surprisingly, that SQML is metaphysically neutral.

Problems with this Account

Objections to new actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

4.1.2 Haecceitism

One of the best known responses to the possibilist challenge was developed by Alvin Plantinga [1974]. First, Plantinga analyzes possible worlds on the approach described at the end of Section 1.1 above and in the supplementary document An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds. To summarize: he defines world to be a state of affairs of a certain sort. A state of affairs for Plantinga is a proposition-like entity that either obtains — [Socrates' having been a philosopher], say — or does not — [There being Aliens], say. One state of affairs s includes another s′ if it is not possible that s obtain without s′ obtaining. A state of affairs is a possible world, then, just in case it is possible that it includes all and only the states of affairs that obtain. Since, for Plantinga, worlds are states of affairs and states of affairs are all actually existing abstract entities, his account addresses the challenge that possible worlds pose for actualists.

Second, the heart of Plantinga's answer to the challenge of possible objects is the notion of an individual essence. Plantinga's precise definition of this notion is a bit complex, but the idea itself is quite simple. Consider first the venerable distinction between essential and accidental properties. Intuitively, the essential properties of an object are those properties that make the object “what it is”. More exactly, they are the properties that the object couldn't possibly have lacked. Its accidental properties, by contrast, are those that it just happens to have but might well have lacked. Thus, the property [being a horse] is intuitively not a property that the champion racehorse Secretariat could have lacked; he couldn't have been a rabbit, say, or a stone. The property [being a horse] is thus essential to the 1973 Triple Crown winner Secretariat. By contrast, Secretariat could easily have lacked the property [being a racehorse]. Under different circumstances — if, say, he'd injured a leg as a colt — he might have spent his days frolicking in the fields. That property is therefore accidental to Secretariat. So the first part of the definition of an individual essence — the “essence” part — is that an individual essence is an essential property of anything that has it. And the “individual” part of the definition is simply that if something has a given individual essence, then nothing else could possibly have that same individual essence. (We provide the definition Plantinga actually uses in the document Plantinga's Definition of an Individual Essence.)

Examples of individual essences are a little harder to come by than examples of essential properties. There are fairly strong intuitive grounds for the thesis that having arisen from the exact sperm and egg that one has is an individual essence of every human person, or at least of every human body. A different sperm and the same egg, say, would have resulted in a perhaps similar but numerically distinct person. Less controversial from a purely logical standpoint are what Plantinga calls haecceities, i.e., “purely nonqualitative” properties like [being Plantinga], or perhaps, [being identical with Plantinga], that do no more than directly characterize the object per se as that very thing, and nothing more. Pretty clearly, Plantinga has the property [being Plantinga] essentially — he could not exist and lack it; any world in which he exists is, ex hypothesi, a world in which he is Plantinga, and hence a world in which he exhibits the property in question. Moreover, nothing but the individual Plantinga could have had that property; necessarily, anything that has it is identical to Plantinga. Hence, [being Plantinga] is an individual essence. Importantly, Plantinga takes individual essences, like all properties, to exist necessarily, even if they are not exemplified. (Interested readers may wish to read the supplementary document Background Assumptions for Plantinga's Account.)

Briefly put, Plantinga's solution to the possibilist challenge is to replace the possibilia of Kripke's semantics with individual essences, in particular, with haecceities. We follow the development of this solution found in Jager [1982] (which Plantinga [1979, n. 8] endorses). As in Kripke's semantics, this semantics is designed for a first-order modal language L* with no individual constants. An interpretation I of L* consists again of two mutually disjoint nonempty sets: the set of possible worlds and the set of haecceities. And, as with Kripke, there is a function dom that assigns to each possible world w its own distinct domain dom(w). However, instead of the possible individuals that exist in w, this domain consists of those haecceities that are exemplified in w, or more exactly, that would have been exemplified if w had been actual. To highlight this important metaphysical difference with Kripke's semantics, Plantinga refers to these essences collectively as the essential domain of w.

But how, exactly, does I assign values to predicates? After all, it is not haecceities to which predicates apply at worlds, it is the things that exemplify them; [being an Alien], if it were exemplified, would not be a property of essences, but of individuals. Plantinga's trick is to talk, not about exemplification, but coexemplification. Properties P and Q are coexemplified just in case some individual exemplifies both P and Q. So, for example, given that there are men who are philosophers, the properties [being a man] and [being a philosopher] are coexemplified in the actual world. For any world w, we say that P and Q are coexemplified in w just in case w includes [P and Q's being coexemplified]. Thus, given that it is possible that there be, say, purple Aliens, the properties [being purple] and [being an Alien] are coexemplified in some possible world w. More generally, a relation R is coexemplified with properties P1,…,Pn (in that order) just in case (i) there exist individuals i1,…,in that exemplify P1,…,Pn, respectively, and (ii) i1,…,in (respectively) stand in the relation R. And for any world w, R is coexemplified with properties P1,…,Pn (respectively) in w just in case w includes [R's being coexemplified with P1,…,Pn].

In Plantinga's system, then, a 1-place predicate P applies to a given haecceity e at a world w just in case the property expressed by P is coexemplified with the e at w. And an n-place predicate R applies to haecceities e1,…,en at w just in case the relation expressed by R is coexemplified with e1,…,en at w. For any haecceities e1,…,en and possible world w in our interpretation I, then, I specifies, for each n-place predicate R, whether or not R applies to e1,…,en at w. Note that, because Plantinga is a committed serious actualist, the assignment of haecceities to predicates by I is so constrained that a predicate can be applied to haecceities e1,…,en at w only if e1,…,en are in the essential domain of w.

The denotation function f for I works fundamentally just as in SQML and Kripke's logic, only now, of course, it assigns haecceities to variables instead of possibilia. There is, however, an important difference in the assignment of truth values to sentences. Specifically, unlike Kripke, Plantinga assigns uses a de re interpretation of negation and necessity in assigning truth values to sentences. That is, for Plantinga, sentences of the form ~φ and □φ that contain a free variable, ‘x’, say, are thought of as predicating properties (negative or modal, as the case may be) to the individual whose haecceity is assigned to ‘x’. To illustrate, suppose ‘x’ is taken to denote Socrates' haecceity hs and the ‘P’ expresses the property of being a philosopher. Then, under the denotation assignment in question, ‘~Px’ is true at a world w just in case Socrates's haecceity hs is coexemplified with the property of failing to be a philosopher at w. But since Plantinga is a serious actualist, Socrates must exist at w in order for this to be so. Hence, for Plantinga, ‘~Px’ is true at w just in case (i) Socrates' haecceity hs is in the essential domain of w and (ii) it is not the case that hs is coexemplified with [being a philosopher] at w. By the same token, for Plantinga, ‘□Px’ is true at w just in case Socrates has the property of being a philosopher essentially at w. Hence, for Plantinga, ‘□Px’ is true at w just in case (i) Socrates' haecceity hs is in the essential domain of w and (ii) hs is coexemplified with [being a philosopher] at every possible world w* in which it is exemplified (i.e., in which Socrates exists).

We illustrate the most important clauses of Plantinga's formal haecceitist semantic theory with some simple cases:

  1. The open, atomic formula ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case I specifies that ‘P’ applies to dI,f(‘x’) at w.
  2. The negated formula ‘~Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case I specifies (i) that f(‘x’) ∈ dom(w) and (ii) that ‘P’ does not apply to dI,f(‘x’) at w.
  3. The quantified formula ‘∀xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all haecceities e in dom(w), ‘Px’ is trueI,f[‘x’,e] at w, where f[‘x’,e] is f if f(‘x’) = e, and otherwise is just like f except that it assigns e to ‘x’ instead of f(x). (A little less formally, ‘∀xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all haecceities e, the predicate ‘P’ applies to e at w.)
  4. The open, modal formula ‘□Px’ (‘◊Px’) is trueI,f at w just in case for every (some) possible world w, ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w.

Referring back to our Alien example, then, the proposition that it is possible that there are Aliens, ◊∃xAx, is true on this account if and only if there is a possible world w and a haecceity e such that ‘A’ applies to e at w, i.e., if and only if the property [being an Alien] and e are coexemplified in w. However, since no such haecceity is exemplified in the actual world, i.e., since there is no such haecceity in its essential domain, nothing (i.e., nothing actual) is a possible Alien, that is, ∃xAx is false. Hence, as in Kripke's semantics, the Barcan Formula is invalid on Plantinga's semantics.

Notice also that Plantinga's account can also provide truth conditions for iterated modalities. The problem, recall, was that sentences like

(8) ◊∃x(Sxp ∧ ◊Px)

appear to require mere possibilia to serve as the values of the quantifier, since no actually existing thing could be a son of the current pope. For Plantinga, the solution is simply that quantifiers range over haecceities, and that, in particular, (8) is true in virtue of there being an unexemplified haecceity h such that (i) in some possible world, the [son of] relation is coexemplified with h and Ratzinger's haecceity hr and (ii) in another world, that very same haecceity is coexemplified with [being a priest].

In sum, then, in Plantinga's account there is a haecceity for every possibile in Kripke's. And for every property that every possibile enjoys at any given world w in Kripke's account, there is an individual essence that is coexemplified with that property in (the Plantingian counterpart of) w. Plantinga's semantics would thus appear to generate precisely the same truth values for the sentences of a modal language as Kripke's. Hence, it would appear that Plantinga has indeed successfully developed a semantics for modal languages that comports with actualist scruples.

Problems with this Account

Jager (1982) has also provided a complete axiomatic system for the above formalization of Plantinga's semantics. To avoid the derivation of NE, BF, and CBF, Jager, like Kripke, adopts both the generality interpretation of theorems containing free variables and thus defines his system without the Rule of Generalization. Rather, all variables in all theorems are universally quantified. Additionally, as noted above, and for the same reason, Jager works in a language L* that banishes individual constants so as to avoid the reconstruction of the undesired proofs in their terms and hence suffers from the same expressive shortcomings noted already in regard to Kripke's axiomatic system above.

Further, more philosophical objections to Plantinga's account of actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

4.2 Strict Actualism

Many propositions are singular in form. That is, as opposed to general propositions like [All men are animals] and [There are Aliens], some propositions are, in the words of Arthur Prior, “directly about” specific individuals — for example, the proposition [Winston Churchill was a German citizen]. Such propositions — often referred to as Russellian propositions — are typically expressed by means of sentences involving names, pronouns, indexicals, or other devices of direct reference. As we've seen, possibilists believe that there are singular possibilities (i.e., singular propositions that are possibly true) about things that don't actually exist, viz., possibilities involving mere possibilia. Similarly, haecceitists also believe there are singular possibilities that are in a certain clear sense directly about things that don't exist, viz., possibilities that, were they actual, would entail the exemplification of haecceities that are, in the actual world, unexemplified. Say that a strict actualist is an actualist who rejects the idea that there are, or could be, singular possibilities that are directly about things that do not exist. Since it is necessary that there are no such possibilities, it follows that, had some actually existing individual a failed to exist, there have been no singular propositions about that individual; or, as Prior often puts it, there would have been no facts about a, not even the fact that a fails to exist (see, e.g., Prior [1957], pp. 48-49). A strict actualist, then, as we might put it, believes that, necessarily, all possibilities are either wholly general or, at most, are directly about actually existing individuals only.

4.2.1 Priorean Actualism

Arthur Prior was the first philosopher to attempt to revise modal logic to comport with strict actualism. It was Prior [1956] who first proved that BF is a theorem of the proof theory of SQML and he clearly saw that the theoremhood of NE required the proponent of SQML to accept either possibilism or “the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily” ([1968], p. 48). Prior's goal, therefore, was to address the possibilist challenge by developing a system of quantified modal logic consistent with both actualism and the existence of contingent beings.

Prior's solution — his system Q (Prior [1957] Chs. IV and V) — has two prongs: rejecting the interdefinability of the modal operators □ and ◊; and restricting the Rule of Necessitation. The central notion that underlies Prior's system is the notion of necessary statability. Say first that [φ] is the proposition expressed by a sentence φ, and that φ is true in a world only if the proposition [φ] it expresses is. Prior's idea is that a sentence φ that expresses a singular proposition [φ] about a contingent individual a is not even statable — hence neither true nor false — in worlds in which a doesn't exist. Thus, a sentence φ is necessarily statable only if all of the individuals referred to in the sentence (hence all of the individuals the proposition [φ] that it expresses is about) are necessary beings. Prior indicates necessary statability by means of a new operator ‘S’: the formula ‘Sφ’ means that φ is necessarily statable.

Given this spadework, Prior argues against the interdefinability of □ and ◊ as follows. Suppose φ expresses a singular proposition [φ] about a contingent individual a. If there is no possible world in which φ is false, then, of course, as on any possible world semantics, it is not possible that φ itself be false, i.e., ~◊~φ is true. However, it does not follow that φ is necessarily true, i.e., that □φ is true. For in order for that to be the case, φ would have to be necessarily statable. And for that to be the case, a would have to exist necessarily. But by hypothesis a is contingent. Hence, even though we have ~◊~φ, we cannot infer □φ. Accordingly, instead of the usual interdefinability of □ and ◊, in Prior's Q we have that a proposition is necessarily true iff it is both necessarily statable and not possibly false:

Q□◊:   □φ ↔ (Sφ ∧ ~◊~φ)

A notable consequence of Prior's view is that many logical truths are not necessary. For example, for any object a, there is obviously no world in which the proposition [PaPa], hence the sentence ‘PaPa’, is false. Thus, if φ is a logical truth, it follows that ~◊~φ is also true (indeed, logically true). However, if a is a contingent being, this sentence is unstatable at worlds where a fails to exist, and hence is neither true nor false in those worlds. Hence, it is, in particular, not true in those worlds. So it is not necessarily true.

For Prior, then, we can always infer that a logical truth is not possible false, that is, he accepts the following rule of inference, which we might call the Rule of Weak Necessitation:

RWN:  If ⊢φ, then ⊢~◊~φ
Thus, from ⊢(PaPa) we have that ⊢~◊~(PaPa). Full necessitation, however, requires necessary statability. Given (Q□◊), this can be expressed in the following derived rule:
Revised RN: If ⊢φ, then ⊢(Sφ → □φ)

Thus, although we have ⊢PaPa, ⊢□(PaPa) does not follow without ⊢S(PaPa), which is never the case in Q.

As noted, Prior's chief goal was a quantified modal logic consistent with the existence of contingent beings and that means, first and foremost, blocking the derivation of NE. As in standard predicate logic, in Q we have ⊢∃y y=x, i.e., following DefE! (which, in a first-order context, Prior would accept), ⊢E!x.

By RWN, then, we have ⊢~◊~E!x and, hence, by universal generalization (a valid rule in Q),

⊢∀x~◊~E!x.
That is, it is a logical theorem of Q that, for any object a, it is not possible that a fail to exist — not a happy feature of a purported logic for contingent beings. Properly understood, however, Prior argues, the theorem only reflects the fact that no proposition about a is statable — even the proposition that a doesn't exist — in a world if a itself does not. The theorem in question would be problematic only we could infer □φ straightaway, which is precisely what is prevented by the modifications to SQML noted above that are found in Q. Rather, we get only the weaker, indeed trivial, theorem (SE!a → □E!a) that E!a is necessary if it is necessarily statable, i.e., in effect, if a exists necessarily. Prior therefore claims that our intuitions about possible nonexistence can be salvaged by defining φ to be weakly possible just in case it is not necessary, i.e., just in case ~□φ is true. Thus, the nonexistence of a contingent being a, while not strictly possible, is nonetheless weakly possible; more exactly, despite the theoremhood of ‘~◊~E!a’ in Q, ‘~□E!a’ can be consistently asserted in Q. NE is thus not a theorem of Q. (Specifically, Revised RN will not warrant the inference on line 6 of the derivation of NE in SQML.)

More generally, it is easy to see that, not only NE, but BF and CBF are not theorems of Prior's logic. The proof of BF relied both on the interdefinability of possibility and necessity as well as on the unrevised Rule of Necessitation. (Specifically, the interdefinability of possibility and necessity plays a crucial role behind the scenes in line 3 of the proof of Lemma 1 in the derivation of BF in SQML, and the Rule of Necessitation was used in the proof of DR1 in line 2 of the proof of the main Theorem, which is equivalent to BF proper.) Likewise, the proof of CBF cannot proceed in the usual way using Revised RN. (Specifically, we cannot appeal to Revised RN on line 2 of the derivation of CBF in SQML.)

Problems with this Account

Objections to Prior's Q and its philosophical underpinnings are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

4.2.2 World Stories

A notable gap in the foundations of Prior's Q is that it has no clear semantics. Presumably, modal operators are to be interpreted as quantifiers over worlds, but Prior himself never explicitly provides an account of possible worlds nor a formal semantics to provide any insight into what the truth conditions for sentences of Q are supposed to be. This is understandable. Kripke models are still the norm for modal semantics. But, as already seen, they appear only to mask commitment to possibilia by invalidating NE, BF, and CBF. It is therefore not immediately clear what semantical options remain for the strict actualist.

Building on Prior's metaphysical intuitions, Adams [1981] sketches an alternative, strict actualist semantics for modal discourse and a corresponding logic. As this is arguably the most important and influential defense and development of strict actualism to his point, I will take particular pains to clarify Adams' arguments and extract and, where necessary, develop the underlying logic of his account.

Adams' approach centers around his notion of a “world story”. The intuitive idea is that a world story is a complete “description” of things as they could be. Somewhat more rigorously, say that a set s of propositions is maximal if, for any pair p, q of mutually inconsistent propositions, s contains either p or q, and that s is consistent if it is possible that all the members of s be true together. The idea, then, is that a world story is simply a maximal consistent set of propositions. Given this, a proposition p is true in a world story w just in case p is a member of w. And the actual world story is simply the one such that a proposition p is true in it if and only if p is, in fact, true. In particular, then, the truth conditions for our paradigmatic modal statement (1), ‘Possibly, there are Aliens’ (formally, ◊∃xAx), are straightforward and, on the face of it, innocuous from a strictly actualist perspective: (1) is true if and only if the proposition expressed by ‘There are Aliens’ is true in some possible world.

However, Adams finds that this simple intuitive idea needs modification in order for it properly to reflect strict actualism. Because there are, in fact, no Aliens and since, by hypothesis, no actually existing thing could have been an Alien, it of course follows for the strict actualist that there are, in fact, no singular propositions that are in any sense about merely possible Aliens or “vestiges” of some ilk that play their role. For Adams, world stories generally ought to reflect this fact about the actual world story. That is, as with Prior, a singular proposition p about some (actually existing) individual a should be true in a world story w only if the proposition [a exists] is also true in w — or, as Prior would put it, only if ‘a exists’ is statable in w. Thus, just as there are in the actual world story no singular propositions about individuals that could have existed but do not, likewise, in no other world story w are there any singular propositions about individuals that would not have existed had w been actual, i.e., if all the propositions in w been true. In general, then, world stories are not fully maximal in the sense above. Rather, a world story is maximal only with respect to the propositions that would exist if it were actual.

4.2.2.1 Truth-in, Truth-at, and the Logic of Strict Actualism

At first sight, Adams' view seems almost exactly Prior's with the addition of world stories and a rather more metaphysically robust conception of propositions. And indeed, as far as the metaphysics goes, this is so. But there are critical differences in the logic that Adams derives from the metaphysics. Adams' justification for the view (recounted in the previous paragraph) that no world w contains singular propositions about individuals a that do not exist in w is very similar to the reasoning Prior used to justify his view that no such proposition p — notably, the proposition [~E!a] that a does not exist — is true with respect to w. This was essentially how Prior justified the logical truth of ‘~◊~E!a’ and, hence, its theoremhood in his logic Q.

However, Adams does not follow Prior here. Instead, Adams goes on to identify two notions of truth relative to a world story, both of which comport with strict actualism but which yield different sets of logical truths. Notably, the two notions differ on ‘~◊~E!a’. Specifically, some propositions can be considered true relative to a world story w in virtue of being included in w. Intuitively, these are propositions that would have had the property of being true (and hence, by serious actualism, would have existed) if w had been actual. Say that these propositions are true in w. However, certain singular propositions that are not true in w can clearly be considered true with respect to w in another, broader sense. For suppose w is a world story that includes no propositions about Adams. Then, even though [Adams does not exist] is not true in w — there would have been no such proposition, after all, had w been actual — we can see, from our perspective “outside” w looking in, so to speak, that w nonetheless represents an Adams-less world; that, in a clear sense, despite its exclusion from w, [Adams does not exist] correctly describes, or characterizes, w:

A world story that includes no singular proposition about me … represents my possible non-existence, not by including the proposition that I do not exist but simply by omitting me. That I would not exist if all the propositions it includes, and no other actual propositions, were true is not a fact internal to the world that it describes, but an observation that we make from our vantage point in the actual world, about the relation of that world story to an individual of the actual world.

When a proposition correctly characterizes a world story w, whether or not it is included in w, Adams says that the proposition is true at w. Every proposition that is true in w is therefore true at it as well; for if [a exists] is not true in w, then [a does not exist], and everything it entails, is true at w.

In light of this distinction, Prior's Q can be seen to be based upon truth in a world while Adams bases his logic upon truth at a world. The difference this makes is quite profound. Most notably, since propositions of the form [a does not exist] can be true at a world without being true in it, sentences of the form ‘~◊~E!a’ do not turn out to be logical truths for Adams. Consequently, Adams is able to restore the equivalence of ‘□’ and ‘◊’:

□◊:   □φ ↔ ~◊~φ

‘~◊~E!a’, in particular, is once again logically equivalent to ‘□E!a’.

This is not to say that the system suggested by Adams' approach is without complications of its own. Adams only provides a series of logical principles concerning truth at a world and only gestures toward the corresponding axioms. Nonetheless, it is possible to extract a fairly comprehensive logic from those principles (see Menzel [1991]). Adams begins by asserting, in effect, the validity of classical propositional logic. Hence, Adams can be understood to be adopting some complete axiomatization of classical, truth-functional propositional logic. Adams then broadens his observations about propositions of the form [a does not exist] to singular propositions generally. He expresses this in terms of propositional functions, which for purposes here can be thought of as atomic formulas:

  • If [a exists] is not true at w, then, for atomic φ containing x, y1, …, yn, [~∃y1…∃ynφ(a)] is true at w.

Note that this principle is essentially serious actualism, and corresponds directly to the schema □SA above. Given universal generalization and Adams' slightly weakened version of necessitation (see below), the only axiom he needs is the SA schema:

SA:   φ → E!x, where φ is atomic and contains x.

The truth of such propositions as [Adams does not exist] at some world story complicates the logic of quantification for Adams. For, while [Adams does not exist] ([~E!a]) might be true at some world story w, it is surely not the case that [Something does not exist] ([∃x ~E!x]) is true at w as well. More generally, where φα/τ is the result of replacing all free occurrences of α in φ with occurrences of an arbitrary term τ that is substitutable for α in φ,[9] the necessitation of the law of existential generalization:

□EG:    □(φα/τ → ∃αφ)

is not logically valid on Adams' approach.

□EG is obviously derived in SQML by applying the rule of Necessitation to the law of existential generalization. Adams' solution is therefore to restrict Necessitation to the so-called “free” quantificational fragment of his system. More specifically, where τ is again substitutable for α in φ, the usual universal instantiation schema is:

UI:    ∀αφ → φα/τ

To avoid the untoward inference above, Adams adopts the schema:

FUI:    ∀αφ → (E!τ → φα/τ)

or, expressed in terms of its existential counterpart:

FEG:   φα/τ → (E!τ → ∃αφ)

Thus, applying Necessitation to FEG, then, yields only:

□FEG:   □[φα/τ → (E!τ → ∃αφ)]

Thus, instead of the problematic inference above, from the truth of [~E!a] at w, by □FEG, it follows by only that [E!a → ∃x~E!x] is true at w. So, where a is Adams, from the truth of [Adams does not exist] at w it only follows — trivially, due to its false antecedent — that [If Adams exists, then something does not exist] is true at w.

Full classical quantification theory (in non-modal contexts) can be reintroduced into Adams' system (as he desires) simply by adding a schema expressing that all names and free variables denote existing things:

E!:   E!τ, for all terms τ

Necessitation is then restricted to the free quantification fragment simply by allowing its application only in proofs not involving any instance of E!:

Nec:   □φ follows from φ, so long as φ is provable without any instance of E!.

The restriction on Nec here prevents the SQML derivation of BF, CBF, and NE. The proof of BF in particular requires the necessitation of the formula ∀x□φ → □φ (see line 2 in the proof of the main Theorem). But this formula is only derivable in Adams' system from the instance ∀xφ → (E!x → □φ) of FUI together with the instance E!x of E!. Hence, the SQML proof of BF cannot be replicated. The SQML proofs of CBF and NE fail in Adams' system for similar reasons.

Importantly, serious actualism together with a certain interpretation of modal statements leads Adams [1982, pp. 28ff] to abandon several principles of basic modal propositional logic. This interpretation is captured in the following general principle:

  • If [a exists] is not true at w, then, for any formula φ containing x, y1, …, yn free (n ≥ 0) [~∃y1…∃yn◊φ(a)] and [~∃y1…∃yn□φ(a)] are true at w.

As a special case (where n=0) we have:

  • If [a exists] is not true at w, then, for any formula φ containing x free, [~◊φ(a)] and [~□φ(a)] are true at w.

We can express these principles axiomatically as follows. Say that a formula φ is modal if it is of the form □ψ, ~□ψ, ◊ψ or ~◊ψ, and that, for a term τ, it is de re with respect to τ if it is modal and contains a (free, if τ is a variable) occurrence of τ; then we have:

MSA:   y1…∃ynφ → E!x, where φ is de re with respect to x.

Note that the effect of MSA is that a modal statement (or existential quantification of such) containing a name expresses a modal property de re of the individual denoted by the name and hence should be treated semantically, in effect, as an atomic statement, i.e., as a predication — hence the evident formal similarity to the serious actualism principle SA. Thus, for Adams, ‘Necessarily, Adams is not an Alien’, say, expresses, in effect, that Adams has the property of being such that, necessarily, he is not an Alien; again, ‘Possibly, Socrates does not exist’ expresses, in effect, that Socrates has the property of possibly not existing. And given this interpretation of modal statements of the sort in question this is just what we should expect. For if they are in effect atomic sentences, i.e., predications of modal properties to objects, it follows that all statements of the sort in question are false at worlds in which a does not exist. For by serious actualism, an object a can have a property at a world only if it exists there. The principles are thus fully justified on the grounds of serious actualism:

In accepting [these principles] one opts for a modal logic that reflects the idea that what modal facts there are (or would be) depends on what individuals there are (or would be). Inasmuch as there would be different individuals in different possible worlds, the modal facts de re differ from world to world. (Ibid., p. 29.)

The logical implications of Adams' understanding of the truth conditions for proposition expressed by de re sentences are dramatic. For if the proposition [Necessarily, Adams is not an Alien] is identical or, at least, logically equivalent to the atomic proposition [Adams is necessarily-not-an-Alien], then, while [Necessarily, Adams is not an Alien] is in fact true — for at every world, Adams-less or not, [Adams is an Alien] is false — it is not the case that [Adams is necessarily-not-an-Alien] is true at worlds in which Adams does not exist, since, by serious actualism, Adams has no properties at such worlds. Hence, [Necessarily, Adams is necessarily-not-an-Alien] is false simpliciter. Since [Adams is necessarily-not-an-Alien] is at least logically equivalent to [Necessarily, Adams is not an Alien], their necessitations are logically equivalent as well. Hence, [Necessarily, necessarily, Adams is not an Alien], too, is false. Thus, we have ‘□~Aa’ and ‘~□□~Aa’, i.e., ‘~(□~Aa → □□~Aa)’, i.e., the characteristic principle

4:  □φ → □□φ

of the modal propositional logic S4 is, in general, invalid.

By the same token we lose the characteristic principle of the logic S5. For the proposition [Possibly, Socrates exists] is obviously true. However, according to the Adams, this is at least logically equivalent to the atomic proposition [Socrates possibly-exists]. So by serious actualism again, it is not true in worlds where Socrates does not exist. Hence, [Necessarily, Socrates possibly-exists] is false simpliciter. But [Socrates possibly-exists] is, at least, logically equivalent to the proposition [Possibly, Socrates exists], so their necessitations are equivalent as well. Hence, [Necessarily, possibly, Socrates exists] is false. Thus, we have ◊E!s and ~□◊E!s, i.e., ~(◊E!s → □◊E!s), i.e., the characteristic principle

5:  ◊φ → □◊φ

of S5 is also, in general, invalid.

As a consequence, Adams follows Prior in rejecting the usual logical equivalence of necessity and possibility albeit, for Adams, only in modal contexts rather than across the board. For in denying that Adams is necessarily not an Alien at an Adams-less world u, i.e., in affirming the truth of [~□~Aa], at u, it does not follow that he is possibly an Alien, i.e., it does not follow for Adams that [◊Aa] is true at u. Indeed, on Adams' semantics for modal propositions at worlds once again, its negation [~◊Aa] is true at u. In place of the modal schema 4, therefore, Adams proposes a weaker principle that, in modal contexts, reflects the notion of weak necessity reflected in Prior's principle RWN above; specifically:

W4:  □φ → □~◊~φ

Similarly, in denying that Socrates' existence is possible at a world w in which he doesn't exist, i.e., in affirming the truth of [~◊E!s] at w, it does not follow that his non-existence is necessary at w, i.e., it does not follow that [□~E!s] is true at w. Indeed, as just noted, on Adams' semantics for modal propositions at worlds, it is false outright at w since [□~E!s] is true there if and only if, at w, Socrates has the property of necessarily-not-existing. Thus, [~□~E!s] is true at w. In place of the 5 schema, therefore, Adams proposes the following weaker principle that, in modal contexts, reflects Prior's notion of weak possibility:

W5:  ◊φ → □~□~φ

Weakening 4 and 5 to W4 and W5, respectively, forces a final repair. Specifically, if □◊ is considered a logical axiom, then 4 and 5 are immediately derivable from W4 and W5 by Nec. But the solution is straightforward and requires a weakening of □◊ along Priorean lines, albeit one that, unlike Q□◊, preserves the logical truth of □◊. Consider the following definition:

    E!φ   =df   E!τ1 & … & E!τn, where τ1, ... τn are all of the individual constants and free variables occurring in φ.

Then □◊ simply needs to be weakened to

A□◊:   E!φ → (□φ ↔ ~◊~φ).

Unlike Q□◊, A□◊ does not require that the individual constituents of the proposition [φ] themselves exist necessarily in order for the necessity of [φ] to follow from the impossibility of [~φ]. Rather, it requires only that, for any given world w, those constituents exist simpliciter, so that [φ] can be evaluated, from the perspective of w, with respect to any world u, regardless of whether or not its constituents exist in u. Given the restriction on Nec, it is not possible to derive the necessitation of □◊ from A□◊ and that prevents the derivation of 4 and 5 from W4 and W5. Given E!, however, □◊ still falls out as a theorem.

Problems with this Account

Objections to Adams' world story semantics are discussed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

4.2.3 Role Semantics

McMichael [1983a] has proposed an actualist semantics that avoids certain objections to haecceities as well as certain objections to world stories. Like Plantinga, McMichael introduces a class of properties, which he calls roles, that serve as surrogates of a sort for possibilia. Importantly, however, unlike haecceities, roles are all purely qualitative, except perhaps insofar as they involve actually existing individuals, and are not in general assumed to be essential, or essentially unique to, any given individual. As such, they cannot play the vestigial role that either unexemplified haecceities play in Plantinga's actualism or that possibly concrete nonconcretia play in new actualism.

McMichael's account builds on a very rich and elaborate theory of n-place relations, and it is necessary to lay out at least some of its basic concepts in order to understand the account. First, some terminology. In general, the arity of a relation is the number of places it has, that is, the number of arguments it takes to form a proposition. Thus, [being happy] is a 1-place relation and therefore has arity 1, while [being between] has arity 3. Note that, for McMichael, the term ‘relation’ encompasses both properties and propositions: properties are 1-place, or unary, relations and propositions are 0-place relations.

Instead of necessity and possibility, McMichael's primitive modal notion is inclusion, a 2-place relation that can hold between relations of the same or different arity. Because it is McMichael's only modal primitive, inclusion cannot be defined, but, intuitively, in the case of properties, the idea is that one property P includes another Q just in case, necessarily, anything that has P has Q. Thus, the property [being red] includes the property [being colored]. Again, intutively once again, one binary relation R includes another R′ just in case, necessarily, for any objects x and y, if x bears R to y, then x bears R′ to y. So, for example, the conjunctive relation [being both a child and an heir of] includes the relation [being a child of].

Inclusion can also hold between an n+1-place relation and an n-place relation, relative to one of the argument places of the former.[10] Thus, in particular, a 2-place relation Q can include a property P, relative to one of its two argument places: intuitively, Q includes P, relative to its first argument place, if and only if, necessarily, whenever two things a and b stand in the relation Q, a exemplifies P. And if the inclusion were with respect to the second argument place, of course, it would be b that exemplifies P. So, for example, the relation [brother of], relative to its first argument place, includes the property [being male]; whenever any object a bears the [brother-of] relation to some object b, a has the property [being male]. Again, [brother-of], relative to its second argument place, includes the property [being a sibling].

A (unary) role is just a “purely qualitative” property of a certain sort, where (as described in more detail in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences) a purely qualitative property is a property that “involves” no particular individuals. Thus, such properties as [being a philosopher] and [being someone's mother or maternal aunt] are purely qualitative, while [being a student of Quine] and [being Johnson's mother or a friend of Boswell] are not. Given this, McMichael defines a property P to be a unary role if (i) it is exemplifiable, (ii) it is purely qualitative, and (iii) for any purely qualitative property Q, either P includes Q or P includes the complement ~Q of Q. A role is thus a complete (nonmodal) “characterization” of the way something could be, qualitatively. Intuitively, then, the role @(a) of a given object a is a “conjunction” of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive properties that a exemplifies. Thus, for example, Socrates' role @(Socrates) includes the properties [being a philosopher], [being snub-nosed], [being the most famous teacher of a famous philosopher], [being condemned to death] and so on.[11] The notion of role generalizes in a natural way to all n-place relations, including, notably, propositions (i.e., 0-place relations) and binary (i.e., 2-place) relations. A 0-place role is simply McMichael's version of a possible world. Similar to Adams' world stories, a 0-place role is a conjunction of purely qualitative propositions that is both maximal (with regard to purely qualitative propositions) and possible: possible world w is a conjunction of purely qualitative propositions such that, for any qualitative proposition P, w includes either P or its complement, but not both. Thus, the actual world in particular is the conjunction of all true qualitative propositions. Similarly, the binary role @(Boswell,Johnson) that Boswell bears to Johnson is, intuitively, a conjunction of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive binary relations that Boswell bears to Johnson.[12] As one might suspect, it can be shown on McMichael's theory that a binary role includes a unique unary role with respect to each of its argument places. In particular, the binary role @(Boswell,Johnson) includes @(Boswell) relative to its first argument place and @(Johnson) relative to its second.

Importantly, McMichael also introduces a notion of accessibility between roles to capture intuitions about possibility, notably, de re possibility. To see how this notion works into McMichael's account, note that Adams [1979] has argued persuasively that no purely qualitative property, no matter how complex, can serve as an individual essence for a contingent being. (This point is also discussed in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences.) Hence, in general, roles — being purely qualitative — are not individual essences. Rather, they are general properties that are (in general) exemplifiable by different things (though not necessarily things in the same possible world). Because of this, none of the objections to Plantinga's haecceities is relevant to roles, as the fact that haecceities are individual essences lies at the heart of those objections. At the same time, McMichael is able to provide a semantics for (8) — ◊∃x(Sxp ∧ ◊Px) — that does not run afoul of the iterated modalities objection. The basic trick is to “alter the criterion for deciding what an individual might have done” [Ibid., 73]:

Instead of saying that what an individual might have done is what he does in some possible world, let us say that what an individual might have done is what any such individual does in some possible world…. To determine what Socrates might have done, we don't look for worlds in which he appears, but instead we look for roles in possible worlds which are accessible to Socrates' actual role. If one of these roles includes a certain property, then that property is one Socrates could have had; otherwise, it is not. [Ibid., 73]

Thus, a little more formally, where F is the property [being foolish], and s is Socrates, a simple modal sentence such as

(9) Possibly, Socrates is foolish (◊Fs)

is true just in case some unary role accessible to the actual role of Socrates includes the property of being foolish. Naturally enough, McMichael takes accessibility to be transitive — intuitively, if Socrates could have played a role R1 other than his actual role @(Socrates) and, had he played that role, he could have played another role R2, then R2 is in fact a role he could have played, i.e., R2 should be considered accessible to @(Socrates).

Similar to Plantinga's semantics, then, quantifiers do not range over individuals, but over roles. This enables McMichael to avoid the iterated modalities objection and, in particular, to provide a compositional semantics for our iterative paradigm (8). Specifically, (8) is true if and only if

(10) Some role R accessible to Ratzinger's actual role Rr includes the property [being a parent of someone] (i.e., the property [λyxCxy] expressed by the open formula ‘∃xCxy’).

(10) captures the idea that an individual such as Ratzinger could have been a parent. Adams, of course, got this far in his account of (8). But, unlike Adams, with roles at his disposal, McMichael can continue his analysis of (8) and unpack the existentially quantified formula ‘∃xCxy’. Specifically, (10) holds if and only if

(11) Some binary role s that includes the [child of] relation (i.e., the relation [λxy Cxy] expressed by the atomic formula ‘Cxy’) also includes, relative to its second argument place, the role R (a role accessible to Ratzinger's actual role Rr).

That is, in accordance with McMichael's recursive definition of truth, (11) unpacks the quantified formula ‘∃xCxy’ in terms of the [child of] relation that is expressed by the embedded atomic formula ‘Cxy’. Specifically, the truth of (8) consists in the existence of a binary role s that includes the [child of] relation and, relative to its second argument place, a role accessible to Ratzinger's role Rr. Note that, being a binary role, s also includes a unique role relative to its first argument place. And because it includes the [child of] relation and, relative to its second argument place, a role R accessible to Ratzinger's role Rr, s will include, relative to its first argument place, a role R′ that can only be exemplified by a child of whatever exemplifies R, i.e., a child of such an object as Ratzinger.

To capture the intuition that no such child could be identical to any actually existing thing, then, McMichael can simply deny that the role R′ that would be exemplified by such a child is accessible to the role of any actually existing thing.

Importantly, accessibility between roles is also the mechanism McMichael uses to account for possible nonexistence. Specifically, if a unary role R1 is accessible to a binary role R2 then McMichael takes this intuitively (and ensures it formally) to mean that, if @(a,b) = R2, then it is possible that a exist and exemplify R1 without b existing.[13] Similarly, to say simply that it is possible that a given individual — Socrates say — fail to exist is, on McMichael's semantics, to say that some possible world (i.e., some 0-place role) is accessible to @(Socrates). As McMichael [Ibid., p. 78] puts it:

Socrates' nonexistence is possible not because there is a role accessible to his actual role that includes, in [possibilist] fashion, nonexistence, but because there is a [0-place] role accessible to his actual role that is not really a role for him at all. It is not a role for him, because there is no sense in which Socrates could fill a role of zero arguments.
Logical Consequences

All of the controversial consequences of SQML are invalid in McMichael's role semantics. BF, in particular, fails because the semantics allows for interpretations in which the domain of actual individuals is empty but the domains of other worlds are not. In such interpretations, ◊∃xE!x is true but ∃◊xE!x is not. (Obviously, NE fails in such interpretations as well.)

Unlike Adams' account, the characteristic S4 schema is valid due to the transitivity of the accessibility relation among roles. However, the Brouwerian schema,

B:  φ → □◊φ

and hence also the 5 schema (which follows from the system S4 + B) are not valid. The technical details of this are complex, but the intuitive reason why B fails in McMichael's semantics is similar to Adams' reasons for the failure of the 5 schema. As with Adams, in McMichael's account, for Socrates' existence to be possible at a world is for him to have the property of possibly not existing. Hence, in worlds in which Socrates does not exist (i.e., worlds accessible from his actual role @(Socrates)), there is no such thing as Socrates to exemplify any properties, in particular the property of possibly existing. Hence, by serious actualism, in worlds in which he doesn't exist, Socrates does not have the property of possibly existing. Hence, as with Adams, it is true, but not necessary, that Socrates' existence is possible, i.e., we have ◊E!s but not □◊E!s.

For similar reasons, τ=τ is not logically necessary for McMichael for terms τ generally. For identity is a relation and hence, by serious actualism, in worlds in which Socrates, say, does not exist, Socrates stands in no relations to anything, himself in particular. Thus, when s is Socrates, □s=s is not true.

Problems with this Account

Objections to McMichael's role theory are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

4.2.4 Model-Theoretic Actualism

A rather different strict actualist approach to the possibilist challenge is broached by Menzel [1990] and is clarified and refined by Ray [1995]. A very similar approach is elaborated in great formal and philosophical detail by Chihara [1998]. For ease of reference, call this approach “model-theoretic actualism”.

All non-skeptical approaches to modality agree that Kripke models provide key insights into the meaning of our modal discourse and the nature of modal reality. However, as we have seen, the naive “intended” model of Kripke semantics leads to possibilism. As seen above, the standard sort actualist response — what David Lewis calls “ersatzism” — has been to define actualistically acceptable notions of possible worlds or possible individuals to serve as replacements for the elements of w and D in the naive intended model, thereby (or so it is argued) preserving the semantical and metaphysical benefits of Kripke models while avoiding ontological commitment to possibilia. As just seen above, however, ersatzism is still problematic. By contrast, the model-theoretic account does not attempt to identify worlds and possibilia as acceptable abstract entities of some sort. Rather, these notions are abandoned altogether.

To get at the idea, note first that the notion of an intended Tarski model makes perfectly good sense for a formalization of nonmodal discourse about the actual world. To illustrate, suppose we have a given a piece of nonmodal discourse about a certain event, a baseball game, say. Suppose now we formalize that discourse in a nonmodal language L′; that is, for each referring expression in the disourse (e.g., ‘Mark McGwire’, ‘second inning’, etc.), there is a unique constant of L′, and for every simple verb phrase in the discourse (‘is a home run’, ‘is out’, ‘relieves’, etc.) there is a unique predicate of L′. Then we can form a Tarski model ML for L′ whose domain consists of the actual objects that the speakers are talking about in the discourse (fans, players, equipment, etc.) and which interprets the predicates of L′ so that they are true of exactly those (n-tuples of objects in the domain that are in the extension of the corresponding verb phrases of the discourse. In this way we form the intended model of L′, the piece of the world that it is intended to be about.

According to proponents of model-theoretic actualism, the fallacy of both ersatzism and possibilism is the inference that things must work in largely the same way with regard to Kripke models. A Kripke model is basically an indexed collection of Tarski models. Just as there is an intended Tarski model for a nonmodal language L′ constructed from the actual world, the accounts above infer that, for a given formalization L of modal discourse, there must be an intended Kripke model constructed from all possible worlds. And, depending on one's tolerance for possibilia, this leads either to possibilism or one of its ersatz variations.

For model-theoretic actualists, the modal upshot of a Kripke model, what it tells us about modal reality, is found in its structure rather than its specific content. The elements of a Kripke model are therefore irrelevant; it is easiest just to take them all to be pure sets, or ordinal numbers, or some other type of familiar mathematical object. Consequently, there can be no notion of a single intended model, because, for every model, there are infinitely many others that are structurally isomorphic to it and, as noted, structure is all that matters on the model-theoretic account. In place of intended models, the model-theoretic account offers the notion of an intended* model. To get at the idea, suppose one has an intended Tarski model M of the actual world, a model that actually contains entities in the world and assigns extensions to predicates that reflect the actual meanings of the adjectives and verb phrases those predicates formalize. Now replace the objects in that model with abstract objects of some ilk to obtain a new model M′ that is structurally isomorphic to M. Then M′ also models the world under a mapping, or embedding, that takes each element e′ of M′ to the element e that it replaced in M. We can thus justifiably think of M′ as a sort of intended model because, even though it doesn't necessary contain anything but pure sets (or some other type of mathematical object), under an appropriate embedding it models the actual world no less than M. To distinguish models like M′ that require a nontrivial embedding into the world from models like M, model-theoretic actualists call the former intended* models.

According to model-theoretic actualism, the notion of an intended* Tarski model is all that is needed for modeling the modal facts. From these, a notion of an intended* Kripke model can be defined. Assume that L is a model language that formalizes some range of modal discourse about the world. Roughly, then, an intended* Kripke model M is simply a Kripke model such that (i) the Tarski model indexed by the distinguished index w0 is an intended* Tarski model of the actual world, (ii) every Tarski model M in M could have been an intended* model of the world, that is, the world could have been as M represents it, and (iii) necessarily, some Tarski model in M is an intended* model of the world, i.e., no matter how the world had been, there would have been an intended* Tarski model of it in M.[14]

Truth in a model on the model-theoretic account is defined as usual as truth at the distinguish index w0 of the model, hence, a sentence φ is true simpliciter if and only if it is true at the distinguished index of some (hence, any) intended* Kripke model. Given the definition of an intended* model, it follows that a modal formula ‘◊φ’ is true if and only if, for some intended* Kripke-model M, φ is true in some Tarski-model M in M, that is, in some Tarski-model M in M that could have been an intended* model of the world. Thus, in particular, (1) is true if and only if

(20)   For some intended* Kripke model M, there is a Tarski model M in M in which ‘∃xAx’ is true,

that is, given the definition of an intended* Kripke model, if and only if there is a Tarski model M that could have been an intended* Tarski model and such that, if it had been, there would have been aliens.

According to model-theoretic actualism, then, intended* Kripke models adequately represent the modal structure of the world simply by virtue of their own modal properties. And because the only Kripke models that are needed for providing a semantics for modal languages are constructed entirely out of existing objects, Kripke's semantics conforms with the thesis of actualism, but does so without the elaborate metaphysical apparatus of the ersatzist accounts.

That said, certain refinements to Kripke models are introduced by model-theoretic actualists to deliver a more appealing quantified modal logic than Kripke's. First, to comport with serious actualism (and to validate SA as a logical truth) the extension of a predicate at a world is restricted to the domain of the world. As in Kripke models, the domain of a “world” can be empty, with the exception of the actual world, and quantified sentences are evaluated at a world relative to the domain of that world. Obviously, at any such world w, ∀x~E!x (as well as any other universally quantified sentence) will be vacuously true. Equally obviously, ~E!a will be true, no matter the value of ‘a’. Thus, the principle of universal instantiation UI is not necessary. It is therefore important for the model-theoretic actualist to use the “free“ quantification axiom FUI of Adams' logic. Also, as in both Prior's Q and Adams' logic, it is assumed that all terms denote actually existing things; this is reflected model theoretically in the condition that terms are assigned denotations in the domain of the actual world. Hence the principle E! is valid as well. Given this, the model-theoretic actualists adopt the free quantification theory of Adams' logic, which, as noted, in the presence of E! yields a classical quantification theory in nonmodal contexts. Both E! and UI is therefore logically valid but contingent for the model-theoretic actualist. To avoid their derivation, as in Adams' logic, the rule of necessitation is restricted to theorems that are provable without any instance of E!.

Model-theoretic actualists differ dramatically with Adams on the underlying propositional base of modal logic. However, this is not the result of any philosophical or theoretical differences between these two types of actualism. As noted above, Adams takes any modal statement containing a name as, in effect, an atomic statement that predicates a modal property of the referent of the name. This leads him to reject the characteristic axiom schemas of both S4 and S5. For model-theoretic actualists — those on which the present account is based, at any rate — this is a move that Adams did not have to make. Specifically, model-theoretic actualists reject the principle MSA that treats de re sentences as, in effect, predications. Rather, a consistent application of the intuition underlying the truth-in/truth-at distinction suggests that the truth conditions for modal propositions at other worlds — their “modal facts” — are determined from the perspective of the actual world. More carefully put in terms of model-theoretic actualism, the truth value of a de re sentence at a Tarski model within an intended* Kripke model M is evaluated from the perspective of the “actual” world @ of M. Notably, suppose M is a Tarski model in M representing things as they might have been if Socrates hadn't existed. For the model-theoretic actualist, the statement that it is possible that Socrates exists, ◊E!s, is evaluated straightaway as true at M just in case there is a Tarski model M in M at which E!s is true — the “actual” model M@ indexed by @, for instance. Thus, informally speaking once again, it is from “our” perspective in the actual world that we see that Socrates exists and hence deem it as possible with respect to any other world, Socrates-less or not. Hence, ◊E!s → □◊E!s — and indeed, by similar reasoning, any instance of the S4 and S5 schemas — is valid for the model-theoretic actualist.

By removing MSA and restoring S5 to the reconstruction of Adams' above, the model-theoretic actualist arrives at a much more standard first-order modal logic without, it would appear, any commitment to possibilia or possible worlds. The resulting logic is proved complete in Menzel [1991].

Problems with this Account

Objections to model-theoretic actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

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