The Biological Notion of Self and Non-self

First published Tue May 21, 2002; substantive revision Thu May 21, 2015

Fundamental to biology are (1) defining the characteristics of identity, which distinguish individual organisms from those of similar kind, and (2) describing the mechanisms that defend organisms from their predators. Immunology is the science devoted to these problems. A progeny of late 19th-century microbiology and the clinical discipline of infectious diseases, immunology did not attain a formal theoretical construction until after World War II, when “the self” was introduced as the conceptual foundation of a new theory of immunity. In the original formulation, self-reactive immunity was eliminated in utero, leaving active immune mechanisms to destroy “the other”— pathogens, foreign substances, altered host elements. By the late 1970s, the self model assumed paradigmatic standing, and immunology dubbed itself the science of “self/non-self discrimination.” But this thesis has been challenged, for the immune self is polymorphous and ill-defined. Contemporary transplantation biology and autoimmunity have demonstrated phenomena that fail to allow strict adherence to the self/non-self dichotomy, and placing tolerant immune mechanisms within a broad ecological context has highlighted the balance of co-operative and competitive relationships in which immunity functions. As new models are emerging, “the self” has been regarded as both (1) a powerful idiom tying together divergent phenomena and research traditions, and (2) a fecund metaphor, whose grounding—philosophically and scientifically—is unsteady. In sum, “the self” has operational and heuristic utility, but the basis of self/non-self discrimination remains elusive as the putative nexus of immunology's doctrines.

1. Introduction

Because of immunology’s eclectic contributions to pathology, clinical medicine, and basic biology, it cannot unite under a single, unifying experimental banner. Rather, it is (and from its inception has been) characterized by multiple, even competing research agendas, each requiring a different methodological apparatus to order its experimental program. Yet the discipline is organized by an underlying concept of an identified and protected self. In whichever domain immunity is studied – from basic science to clinical syndromes – “the immune self” is either implicitly or explicitly invoked. So whether regarded as a theoretical construction or fecund metaphor, the self has served as immunology’s central motif, and its derivative concept of self/non-self discrimination has become the science’s cardinal theme. The self thus has effectively integrated this diverse discipline, but (1) how selfhood functions in theory and practice, and (2) with what epistemological standing it serves immunology have presented a beguiling set of problems.

Undoubtedly, the ‘self’ possesses operational utility and attends to diverse functions. These may best be appreciated when we survey different communities of scientists and observe how they are accustomed to working with an understanding of agency that may differ from others. The topography of the self’s employment then becomes a map of the field that has been fractured into communities barely conversant with each other. Simply stated, the way one comprehends the notion of selfhood in immunology determines how immunity is understood. That is to say, immunology is a theory-heavy science, and theory directs not only the mode of discourse, but also the ways in which investigative findings are interpreted. By examining the history of the self concept and surveying its use and failings, a window opens into the inner workings of immune theory (Tauber 1994). That exercise then provides insight into the science’s evolution – past and likely future. And from the perspective of philosophy, the epistemological standing of agency, individual, and the self as presented in contemporary immunology suggests important ways in which the discussions swirling around their ontological status might be reconsidered.

Two general theoretical outlooks have dominated immunology’s theory: The more dominant one asserts that the immune system protects a self. In its placement at the nexus of infectious diseases, the ‘immune self’ was originally conceived as an independent entity, a host requiring protection. By addressing the conceptual basis of host defense, namely, maintaining the integrity of the organism, immune theory incorporates cardinal features: a ‘self’ exists; that this subject has certain identifying characteristics, of which immune tolerance (or non-reactivity) distinguishes that which is ‘self’ from ‘the other’ (or non-self); and that identity arises as a developmental process, which may be modulated throughout life but essentially represents a protected ‘space’ of immune silence (non-reactivity). Notwithstanding the utility and heuristic power of this conception, such an account based on a self-other demarcation derives from an anthropocentric extrapolation, one that may be directly traced to the original clinical orientation in which immunology emerged: Infectious disease afflicts the patient – a threatened self – and immunity is thus construed as protective of that agent.

This scenario has been challenged by a formulation that works by an altogether different theoretical construction, one that displaces immunology as the science of self-defense for one in which organismal identity emerges in dialogue with the organism’s internal and external environments. On this so-called ‘ecological’ view, focus on the fundamental character of information processing displaces discernment of the secondary effector (defensive) phenomena. In other words, immune reactivity (rejection or tolerance) is a second-order response to the cognitive functions of the immune system. This orientation reflects an expanded ‘sensibility’ to the environment, where flexible borders of the organism and changing parameters of individuality dispense with any characterizing essences – genetic, molecular, or immune. Such an understanding commits immunology to holistic models and a research agenda that includes a contextual (as opposed to insular) notion of immunity. A wider ecological consideration places the organism in the world of complex inter-relationships. Emphasizing the individuality of the independent organism limits the functions of immunity, which when regarded solely in terms of defense omits the other half of the ledger, i.e., the organism's co-operative intercourse with the environment. By showing how those constructions operate, immune theory is illustrated in novel ways.

On this view, a balance between defense and ecological exchange must guide the ways in which immune-determined identity is understood. Indeed, tolerance serves as the functional complement to immune destruction, inasmuch as each modality plays an essential role in mediating the organism’s relationship to its world. This relational understanding has gained interest as immunology is increasingly welcomed as an important member of the ecological sciences, and concomitant with that integration, the immune self has undergone metamorphosis from its original autonomous incarnation. In light of this inflection from an emphasis of immunity-as-defense to immunity-as-interface-of-exchange, immunology’s conceptual character is shifting.

As “eco-immunology” grows in sophistication, the complexity of such economies reveals that the underlying notions of individuality that have assumed a certain authority under the older regime, has weakened. Both a variety of philosophical arguments, on the one hand, and scientific evidence, on the other hand, confers new meanings on the immune self. These are based on accommodating various notions of immunity, which include cooperative ecological exchange mediated by both active and passive immune tolerance. (“Tolerance” refers to the immune system's “silence” to potential targets of destruction, thus allowing host constituents and some foreign elements an adopted co-equal status within the organism.) Some constituents remain stable as new evolutionary constructs, i.e., symbiotic relationships, while others are transitory in response to the day-to-day life of the organism’s nutritive and general homeostatic requirements. The challenges posed by the ‘ecological imperative’ highlight the science’s evolution and the complexity of the language that refracts those developments. Here we have a compelling case example of ‘language-at-work,’ where we can trace how certain intuitions about agency have been articulated in the self idiom, which in turn has served as a platform from which more sophisticated models have evolved and theories developed.

2. Philosophical and linguistic considerations: The cognitive metaphor

Defining the self philosophically, and even linguistically, has a complex history and a vast literature (see e.g., Taylor 1989; Seigel 2005; Martin and Barresi 2006). Arguably, the ‘self’ in English has no equivalent in other languages (Balibar 2014a), which highlights the cultural baggage of the term. This semantic idiosyncrasy then suggests that the meanings of self found in the immunological literature may be obscured by factors not easily recognized by native speakers or their foreign correspondents. Beyond the cultural dependence of the term, analytically too often the epistemological, psychological, and moral categories have been conflated (Howes 1998; Tauber 1999; Hoffman 2012). And in addition, epistemological ambiguities reside in the very notion of ‘agent’ or ‘agency’ in consideration of the imprecise understanding of personal identity or notions of self-consciousness underlying such constructions: (1) what exactly is acting and (2) is any given action done by an agent or to an agent?

In English, ‘self’ occurs as a reflexive pronoun as early as the tenth century in old English, but its use in philosophy to refer to “that which in a person is really and intrinsically he (in contradistinction to what is adventitious); the ego (often identified with the soul or mind as opposed to the body); a permanent subject of successive and varying states of consciousness” (Oxford English Dictionary, vol. S, p. 410; emphasis in original) appeared only in the late seventeenth century – most closely identified with John Locke’s writings (Balibar 2013). And concomitantly, ‘agency’ appeared in English only in the seventeenth century and introduced into philosophy a century later to designate action (in the physical sense), or what modifies action (in contrast to being the object of action), or what modifies the agent (Schneewind 1998). We might well ask, who or what is the subject beyond a placeholder for describing various kinds of action? In other words, the subject cannot be separated from the deed (Pippin 2010, p. 78). The “myth of the verb” grammatically sets a (presumed) ‘thing’ doing an action, yet when critically examined, we do not know whether a particular action is functioning as cause or effect (Austin 1979; Davidson 1971; Balibar 2014b).

“Self” permeates English almost unnoticeably as an integrated suffix or prefix of other words (as, for example, “itself,” “myself,” “self-sacrificing,” and the like) and it also serves as a synonym for the “human individual;” its immunological usage connects its divalent meanings of emphatic reference (reference is to the person or thing mentioned, and not, or not merely, to some other) and circumscribed individuality. In disentangling the two senses we appreciate that the emergence of self within immunological thinking does not have a singular point of origin nor singular meaning. Immunologists have assumed a grammatical analogy with ‘self’ and, implicitly, ‘agency,’ to characterize immune phenomena. Initially, the semantic parallel designated a noun, an entity or ‘thing’ that demarcated boundaries between a host organism and its ‘other.’ However, as the assumptions of various cognitive modalities were attached to the personification of immune selfhood, powerful semantic appendages fastened themselves to the interpretation of experimental findings. As ‘recognition,’ ‘tolerance,’ ‘learning,’ and ‘memory,’ and the like became key terms in immunology’s lexicon, the central organizing construct of an agent in action penetrated the language of the laboratory with profound effects on how immunity is conceived: (1) the identification of the foreign implicitly requires that something is doing the recognizing; and (2) recognizing is a perceptive event and must rely on a cognitive apparatus, at least in typical descriptions of such phenomena.

If the insular self rests upon a scaffold upon which to hang experimental data and an implicit presence to direct immunity’s modeling, then protection of an agent, ‘the self,’ putatively requires a cognitive capacity by which host and the foreign are perceived and thereby discriminated. From such information, discernment of the environment is achieved and activation of pathways leading to an immune response may be initiated. This so-called cognitive paradigm embeds psychological functions in immune processes, but the conceptual character of such ‘mental’ categories has meanings that vary with the particular perception theory adopted. When different models of cognition are considered, immunology’s conceptual foundation shifts (Tauber 2013).

Extensions of conventional psychological understanding of representational cognition based on a subject-object dichotomy support notions of immune agency conceived as an entity. Accordingly, the language of perception used in immunology describes immune functions as a quasi-nervous system of information processing with accompanying notions of memory and decision-making. On that view, the immune system is the “mobile brain” (Fridman 1991), which mimics the implicit (mental) agent, who peers at the world as a separate being. Adopting this view of cognitive operations of a self, support the language of agency in a circular logic that re-enforces the operations of the self as an organizing principle. But adaptive problem solving, signaling, and communication in the context of functional collective behavior need no reliance on agency at all. Drawing an analogy from colony behaviors of insects (Bonabeau 2001; Gordon 2001) and bacteria (Ben-Jacob, Becker, Shapira, and Levine 2004), the immune system meets challenges without centralized control or directives by simply following its rules of regulation (Shanks and Pyles 2013).

The immune system understood as a “distributed information processing system” is of particular interest in terms of this discussion (Orosz 2001). From this perspective two cardinal characteristics become prominent: (1) there is no central immunological processor (as found in a computer’s CPU), and (2) the dynamical patterns of interactions among the diverse parts of the immune system describes an immunoecology, which, in a cognitive model, understands immunity as arising within a system that recognizes and reacts to stimuli in a process termed immunoinformatics (Orosz 2001, p. 126; see also Forrest and Hofmeyr 2001). So an alternative formulation beckons: Perception that dispenses with representations and attendant notions of agency reconfigure the predicate epistemology dominating current immune theory. Although the scientific observer regards the immune system functioning as an agent, the system in fact processes information without the perspective of some (artificial) knowing entity surveying the world. Such direct perception dispenses with the recursive, self-reflective persona, who sits in a Cartesian Theater to observe the world (Dennett 1991). That construction originates in the attempt to understand consciousness, but immune functions require no such self-awareness. There is no subject-object divide; the system simply is. So if a predicate modality of cognition is replaced with a non-predicate structure (one in which immunity is regarded strictly in terms of its own processes in the absence of a humuncular witness), individualized agency is deconstructed as an organizing principle of the discipline.

In sum, these different understandings of perception – representational and non-representational, e.g., ecological, enactivist, and autopoietic perspectives (Shapiro 2011) reflect different notions of agency, which, in turn, provide competing philosophical understandings of immunology’s conceptual foundations. Simply stated, the manner in which cognition is modeled pushes immune theory down one road or another. And more generally, these models reflect parallel controversies dominating current debates in philosophy of mind and attendant discussions about personal identity. This case example of how language, and more particularly the place of agency in that language, organizes the ways we think of scientific phenomena is interesting in its own right, but more deeply this analysis illustrates the shoals of thinking about mental functions in the Cartesian mold in which the same kinds of subject-object models lead to philosophical controversies about how humans perceive the world and think about it.

3. Concerning individuality and selfhood

The understanding of immune selfhood has direct relevance to current debates about individuality in philosophy of biology (e.g., Sarkar 1998, 2005; J. Wilson 1999; R. Wilson 2005; Dupré and O’Malley 2009; Clarke 2010; Goodnight 2013; Clarke and Okasha 2013; Bouchard and Huneman 2013; Godfrey-Smith 2014). The discussions swirling around ‘species,’ ‘organism,’ and ‘individual’ are interlocked, each suffering from vague and multiple criteria and thus forbidding the development of precise and inclusive definitions (Clarke and Okasha 2013). Individuality itself is subject to (1) philosophical dispute as to what such a class is; (2) the evolution of such things as individuals; and 3) the disciplinary boundaries that study them, which in turn determines the responses to the philosophical and evolutionary questions. Within those debates, agency, and more specifically the immune self, assume particular meanings. Prominent debates about individuality are considered in immunology under the category of selfhood, and in many ways, the standing of the ‘immune self’ amplifies, and, perhaps, helps elucidate the complexities of designating what, indeed, is an individual or an organism.

Although different conceptions of individuality have long been acknowledged as reflecting different modes of organization (Huxley 1926) and exhibiting “individual differentials” (conferring distinctive, unique features) that distinguish one organism from another (Loeb 1937), commonly an individual is regarded as possessing anatomic borders, harmonious balance characterized by communication between its parts, division of labor for the benefit of the whole, and a system of hierarchical dominance and control. And such an individual reproduces as a unit to replicate itself. Symbiosis challenges this well-entrenched definition of the individual organism, not only because physiological autonomy has been sacrificed, but anatomic borders have lost clear definition and development becomes intertwined among several phylogenetically defined entities.

Indeed, while the “biological individual” has served as a crucial category to studies of genetics, immunology, evolution, development, anatomy, and physiology, each of these sub-disciplines has a specific conception of individuality, which has historically provided conceptual contexts for integrating newly acquired data. During the past decade, nucleic acid analysis, especially genomic sequencing and high-throughput RNA techniques, has challenged each of these disciplinary definitions by finding significant interactions of animals and plants with symbiotic microorganisms that disrupt the boundaries which heretofore had characterized the biological individual (Gilbert, Sapp and Tauber 2012). Animals cannot be considered individuals by anatomical, or physiological criteria, because a diversity of symbionts is both present and functional in completing metabolic pathways and serving other physiological functions. Similarly, these new studies have shown that animal development is incomplete without symbionts, which also constitute a second mode of genetic inheritance, providing selectable genetic variation for natural selection. Most pertinent to our discussion, the immune system also develops, in part, in dialogue with symbionts, and thereby functions as a mechanism for integrating microbes into the animal-cell community, and conversely some invaders use the host immune system as developmental clues (McFall-Ngai et al. 2013; Viney and Riley 2014). Indeed, the extraordinary diversity and richness of symbiotic functions has led to a growing understanding of how the host’s internal ecology confers an ever-evolving identity. So while the defensive role of immunity is clearly prominent in the medical and agricultural contexts, that point of view must be balanced with how the internal milieu of the individual organism integrates ‘foreign’ elements. From this ecological vantage, the body’s economy is regulated by a mixture of host and ‘unrelated’ genomes and thus the notion of a circumscribed, self-defined entity ― designated ‘the self’ ― requires qualification.

Recognizing the “holobiont”— the multicellular eukaryote plus its colonies of persistent symbionts — as a critically important unit of investigation opens up new investigative avenues and challenges the ways in which the biological sub-disciplines have heretofore characterized living entities. So, instead of extending Western social notions of human identity into biology, we now appreciate that complexes of organisms in fact constitute presumed individuals and thus defy any singular definition of organismal identity as independent agents. The implications of this general orientation for immunology hardly can be over-emphasized.

While the self and individual are generally used interchangeably in immunology, such conflation obscures important philosophical distinctions. In this regard, the recent discussion offered by Thomas Pradeu is most relevant. He considers immune differentiation a crucial criterion for individuality by arguing that the immune system establishes boundaries and thus, through the principle of inclusion, defines a basis for establishing individuation (Pradeu 2010; 2012; 2013). Robert Wilson, among others, also endorses this criterion of individual agency (R. Wilson 2005). Although Pradeu discards ‘the immune self’ as a useful designation, he maintains that organisms are “biological individuals that are cohesively organized through an immune system” (Pradeu 2013, p. 89). He tracks this immunity criterion phylogenetically from the very earliest prokaryotic unicellulars (through an RNA interference mechanism) to the aggregates of superorganisms (e.g., social insects), where defensive mechanisms have been described at both the single insect and colony-level (Pradeu 2013, pp. 90–1). Thus for him, the immune system defines the organism and the term ‘individuality’ serves simply to identify discernible elements that may be counted (e.g., mitochondria, cells, an organism).

However, the criteria of boundaries hardly suffice for defining an organism, which itself has been recognized as fraught with ambiguity (for reasons that differ from the problem of designating the immune self). In the case of immune identity, the temporal seesaw of autoimmunity and tolerance preclude static functional borders; substances breathed or eaten from the environment are ignored; pregnancy as a archtypical chimera defies easy parameters of individualization (A. Martin 2007); the fallibility of anatomic and even genetic criteria of selfness are well known. Add the symbiotic relationships so prevalent in multi-cellular organisms, which require immune blindness to remain stable, the entire question of what is included as belonging to the organism and what is not leaves the “principle of inclusion” problematic.

Accordingly, immunology must balance its dominant concern with insular individuality against a science that includes the cooperative assemblies of organisms. Indeed, if symbiosis is seen as the rule, not the exception of organization, immunity shifts from exclusive concerns with competitive struggle to one that includes mechanisms to account for the intimate cooperation between species as a fundamental feature of evolution. Thus a strong case can be made for Pradeu’s suggestion that “immunity is the most important mechanism to explain the evolution of the multicellular organism’s individuality” (2013, p. 86; a view also held by Müller 2003), if individuality is broadly understood. In other words, when regarded from the predatory perspective, defensive immune functions are dominant in the emergence and perpetuation of individuals, i.e., individuals are in large measure individuals because of immunity. And when considered from the symbiotic (cooperative) vantage the ontological equivocality of organism and individuality pose a different set of issues about the standing of individuals. Thus, although selfhood and individuality are pragmatically useful and possess powerful heuristic appeal, they remain imprecise categories. These characterizations are more fully described below, where the ambiguous standing of immune selfhood results from its dual complementary functions of defense and tolerance.

4. The immune self

As mentioned, contemporary immunology has established its fundamental theory as a biological expression of personal identity, wherein the ‘immune self’ is defended by the immune system. We can trace this theme to those discoveries that led to the elucidation of the bacterial etiology of infectious diseases and the resultant twin birth of two disciplines, microbiology (the study of the offenders) and immunology (the examination of host defense) (Linton 2005; Silverstein 2009). This is the historical account of immunology as a clinical science, a tool of medicine, and as such it focuses almost exclusively on the role of immunity as a defender of the invaded host. And note, the paradigmatic host is the patient, a “self” trespassed, which bestows a particularly effective power to this view, whether infected by a microorganism or assaulted by a malignancy (Löwy 1996). To erect such a conceptual edifice is to explain the development of the field by assuming a major presupposition, namely that there is a definable self that might be defended. This matter, however, does not explicitly appear until the 1940s.

The original incarnation of the immune self arose from what appeared to be a dichotomy: During World War II, studies of skin transplantation of severely burned patients revealed an immunological barrier based on a simple self/non-self distinction: autologous or twin transplants escaped immune destruction. On this basis, Macfarlane Burnet hypothesized a model of immune regulation that would eventually define immunology. He argued that during embryonic development, immunocytes recognize ‘self’ elements and once recognized, the ‘self-recognizers’ are purged from the immune library. The expunged thus leaves a ‘hole’ in the reactive profile of the immune system corresponding to host constituents (Burnet and Fenner 1949). This ‘hole’ (or ‘negative space’) is the ‘immune self.’ For Burnet, the hostile meeting between self and non-self – with its attendant imagery of combat, invasion, aggression, or counter-attack – is the archetypical description of immunity, not because it represents the norm, but because its attendant events are the most arresting and consequential (a view contested by later feminist critics, e.g. Weasel 2001; Napier 2003; 2012; Howes 2008, 2012; Scheper-Hughes 2012.)

The self/non-self distinction has justly been acknowledged as immunology’s governing paradigm (e.g., Golub and Green 1991) and consistently defended by those committed to the self/non-self discrimination as the basis of immune function (e.g. Cohn 2015). (Note, the ‘self/non-self model’ is not a model in the usual sense, but rather serves as a guiding paradigm or a basic presupposition of the science that begins with this differentiation of identity. For a topology and analysis of different kinds of immunity models developed and used in the more common sense see Baetu 2014.) However, because the immune self carries many meanings and functions in diverse ways, a precise definition of immune identity has not been attained. The underlying reason for this ‘failure’ resides within a larger framework in which a conceptual ambiguity reflects a deeper issue: immunity itself has contested meanings. The traditional notion of defense reflects immunology’s original clinical orientation, but much of what has been called ‘autoimmunity’ in fact includes tolerant sentinel functions both of host tissue and tolerance of substances at the interface of host and its external environment. These ‘resting’ functions comprise normal physiological ‘immunity.’ On this view, the activated response is a special case of immunity and hardly qualifies to characterize normal immune physiology, nor reflect the basic organization and regulation of the immune system in its unstressed state (Tauber 2015).

Drawing from these different orientations that would conceptualize immunity, at least four notions of selfhood have played an active role in immunology’s history:

  1. An implicit self presumes that a self exists and must be defended. Within the immunochemical tradition the emergence of that identity is not a subject of immunology. Paul Ehrlich and his colleagues embraced this understanding and to the extent molecular biologists study immune factors and their genetics, the issue of selfhood simply evaporates as a concern – theoretical or practical. On this view, the evoked immune response assumes the self/non-self distinction, which in turn builds on Claude Bernard’s conception of a homeostatic, balanced interior that depends on the insularity of the organism: any insult to such stability results in processes to restore the original steady state as in any physiological system. Immunity fits into this orientation inasmuch as it was originally conceived as a means of dealing with a disruptive state, infection (E. Cohen 2001). The early immunochemists accepted this platform and then proceeded with their own concerns.

  2. A given self exists, but only as a result of immune processes that define self and differentiate non-self. Once such selfhood is established, the distinctions of self and the other organize immunity. This is Burnet’s model and upon it he presented the mechanism by which those lymphocytes that respond to antigen challenge are selected (the initiating event) and then expand to mount an immune response to insult. This clonal selection theory (CST) is the dominant model of contemporary immunology and in its Burnetian expression stands as the prototype of immune selfhood (Podolsky and Tauber 1997). In some sense, CST envelops the implicit self (discussed above) by offering an explanation of how the self is born and retains its identity throughout life.

  3. In the 1880s, Elie Metchnikoff championed cellular-mediated immunity against a prevailing reductionist immunochemical approach that promoted humoral factors (i.e., antibody) as the key elements of immunity (Metchnikoff 1901; Tauber and Chernyak 1991). His “phagocytosis theory” proposed that nutritive cells in hydra and sponges continued to eat in higher organisms, but now in service to host defense and various scavenger and repair services. In other words, Metchnikoff’s theory conceived immunity as a subset of inflammatory responses to internal and external threats to the host organism and thus was an attempt to account for how organismic identity is established (Tauber 2003). On this view, a stable, established self does not exist; rather, immune activity confers identity by its ever-vigilant sentinel baseline functions, which include repair of tissue damage, processing senile cells, and eliminating malignancies. (For example, the human erythrocyte circulates in the blood for 120 days and then is digested in the spleen, as a result of macrophages recognizing altered aged red cell surface moieties). Individuality then becomes a product of immune surveillance in an ongoing, evolving process. According to this latter view, useful as the self idiom has proven, one cannot point to ‘the self,’ an entity, and say, “the immune system defends the self.” Instead, according to Metchnikoff, the immune system fundamentally establishes identity and secondarily secures its integrity.

    So instead of placing “the immune self” at the center of immune theory, Metchnikoff would make identity of the emergent self the key problem that would orient the fledgling science of immunology. As observers, immunologists attribute identity (and thereby designate selfness) to that which is ignored – an apparent lacuna (or silence) of an on-going active, dynamic process. Accordingly, instead of defending such an entity, Metchnikoff maintained that immunity is the process in which identity is established. Note, no end point is achieved. Because organismal identity is not a given, nor attained in anything approaching some final form, the emergent self was posed as a life-long developmental process. (See Leo Buss’s re-statement of Metchnikoff’s thesis in terms of current evolutionary biology theory [1987].)

  4. From this last position only a short step brings forth a fourth version of immune selfhood, where the entire idea of the self is omitted from immune theory. Just as CST achieved dominance, Niels Jerne presented a model of immunity that moved past the identity issue altogether (Jerne 1974; 1984). He conceived the immune system as closed, consisting only of interlocking units, which, when perturbed by antigen, manifested immune responses. No longer in service to a ‘self,’ on his view the immune system functions by perceiving only what it might know – itself. Indeed, self/non-self has no meaning in this construction, because the truly foreign is not recognized at all. Activation occurs only by disruption of the network’s steady state. Thus patterns and context become organizing principles, so that self/non-self is eclipsed by context: the meaning of an antigen is determined by the setting of its presentation, not by any intrinsic property. Jerne’s network theory thereby shifted the understanding of immune cognition, displacing the perspective of an agent processing information (an inherent property of the immune self construction) to another understanding of perception without agency or, what we will call, the absent self. Note, the emergent self adheres to the identification of the self, albeit with indistinct characteristics or borders; the absent self, however, abdicates the identity question altogether by substituting a notion of embedded perception for a knowing agent surveying the world. Thus in Jerne’s scheme, the subject-object structure of knowing has been replaced with an understanding of cognition occurring directly within the system itself. He thereby removed the homunculus at the core of modern epistemology (Tauber 2013).

    A similar construct has found its most recent articulation in the “continuity theory” proposed by Pradeu and Edgardo Carosella, in which the immune response results from major modification of recognized antigenic patterns (Pradeu and Carosella 2006a; 2006b; Pradeu 2010, 2012). On this view, immunity is depicted in a multi-dimensional framework in which both temporal and ‘spatial’ patterns of antigens determine immunogenicity (Pradeu, Jaeger, and Vivier 2013). The model then predicts that degrees of activation result from varying degrees of disturbance, which in turn is determined by the degree to which the antigen patterns differ from normal. Note, self/non-self discrimination as such has no role in this model.

These various characterizations – the implicit self (Ehrlich); the given self (Burnet); the emergent self (Metchnikoff), and the absent self (Jerne) – must be understood as constituting competing conceptual grounds upon which immunology, both its theory and practice, developed and will continue to evolve. Indeed, competing designs of immune identity have infused the field with a rich meanings, idiomatic uses, and theoretical musings.

5. Immune agency contested

By the mid-1990s, the simple division of self and other was challenged by new laboratory findings about autoimmunity (discussed below). Some critics argued that the self, having served a useful metaphorical function, had irretrievably weakened under the weight of experimental and critical review. One aspect concerns the difficulty of defining the immune self, which has several general meanings: (1) the “organismal self” – the epistemological functional category immunologists typically employ; (2) the “immunological self” – an ontological construction which draws from molecular definitions and builds upon Burnet’s theory of tolerance; and (3) the “immune self” – a metaphysical formulation of the system-as-a-whole (Ulvestad 2007 pp. 88 ff.). And beyond these categorical differences, there are at least half a dozen different conceptions of what constitutes the immune self: (1) everything encoded by the genome; (2) everything under the skin including/excluding immune “privileged” sites; (3) the set of peptides complexed with T-lymphocyte antigen-presenting complexes of which various sub-sets vie for inclusion; (4) cell surface and soluble molecules of B-lymphocytes; (5) a set of bodily proteins that exist above a certain concentration; (6) the immune network itself, variously conceived (Matzinger 1994, p. 993). While these versions may be situated along a continuum between a severe genetic reductionism and complex organismal constructions, each shares an unsettled relationship to a dichotomous model of self and other.

The controversy over the epistemological status of the immune self gained its major momentum as a result of the “danger theory” presented by Polly Matzinger and Ephraim Fuchs in 1994 (Matzinger 1994; Anderson and Matzinger 2000a, 200b; reviewed in Podolsky and Tauber 1997, pp. 361–8; Langman 2000; Pradeu 2012, pp. 205–18). Matzinger and Fuchs had proposed that the immune response was not based on a reaction to the pathogen per se, but rather immunity was initiated by inflammatory signals detected from injured tissue. Thus an infection or injury changed the context of tissue anatomy and physiology, an alteration that immunocytes detected. Support soon followed (Forsthuber, Yip, and Lehmann 1996; Ridge, Fuchs, and Matzinger 1996; Sarzotti, Robbins, and Hoffman 1996), but enthusiasm for a palace revolt has quieted, albeit hardly settled (Howes 2011; Pradeu 2012).

Twenty years later, we might reasonably conclude that while the use of “the self” terminology remains ensconced in immunology’s literature, the centrality of what might be construed as a metaphysical construct suggests that the self might be better regarded as only a metaphor for a “figure” outlined by the immune system's silence, i.e., its non-reactivity. That figure is inconstant and modified upon certain conditions. Chimeric transplants are an example of active tolerance mechanisms (Starzl and Demetris 1995; 1998) and pregnancy is a good example of natural chimerism, which has been appropriately referred to as an unexplained paradox (Hunt 1996; Howes 2007; 2008; 2011; A. Martin 2010; 2011). Long after delivery is completed, fetal cells are found in maternal bodies, a phenomenon referred to as “micro-chimerism ” (Bianchi et al. 1996; Nelson 2001; Kaiser 2005; Lo 2009), a condition mimicked by successful artificial transplantation (Starzl and Demetris 1995; 1998). Pregnancy thus exhibits an ‘internal ecology,’ where an immune sanctuary defies the self-other distinction. Here the “danger theory” finds its conceptual traction, inasmuch as immune tolerance becomes the default state in the absence of inflammatory co-stimulatory factors (Bonney and Matzinger 1997). While much evidence supports this theoretical interpretation, whether the fetus simply fails to generate an inflammatory response or mechanisms are in place to neutralize activation is not clear. Whatever the precise tolerance mechanisms might be, we must still ask, what constitutes the threshold or borderline of activity that differentiates the ‘other’ as the object of immunity?

The implicit acceptance of agency in the guise of the immune self supports the current predicate structure of immunology’s epistemology, which in turn requires self/non-self differentiation. Is such a demarcation artificial, inasmuch as so much of immune activity is on-going background ‘noise’ of immune surveillance, lymphocyte turnover, and basic physiological processing? Since the immune response is, by and large, defined by studies of the activated state, we have little insight about baseline immune activity. Indeed, the gradations of the immune responses ranging from rest to various conditions of primed or pre-activated conditions to full blown responses offer different characterizations of the immune system in which the self is enfolded in obscurity. Given the highly contextualized nature of immunity dependent on a dynamic system, the borders of the self and the identity of the other are increasingly appreciated as inconstant, and often elusive. Indeed, the antigenicity of any given substance is determined by the context in which the immune system ‘sees’ any potential target (Borel, 1986, pp. 23–24; Cohen 1994, 2004; Tauber 1997). Charles Goodnight makes the critical point that ‘context’ sets certain boundary conditions and identifies the object of study. Thus the observer constructs the reality in which immunity is studied, where some phenomena assume importance and others do not. On the more specific question of antigenicity, how that construction is built determines what constitutes an immune response. In contemporary research the dominance of full activation frames the reaction profile of immune functions and more subtle activities are thereby obscured. In short, where does immune selfhood begin and the non-self commence? That question assumes its full significance when autoimmunity is considered.

6. Autoimmunity

Given the historical antecedents to the immune self question, when the centrality of such discrimination has been contested, much controversy has ensued (Langman 2000). Some detractors generously call for a pluralistic approach; others regarded the crisis over the self as overblown; most agree that immune selfhood is increasingly a polymorphous and ill-defined construct, but immunology has made good heuristic use of it (e.g., Howes 2011; Hoffman 2012). Yet the criteria for establishing the immune self have not been established, and, furthermore, the self/non-self dichotomy cannot account for various immune functions. Aside from incomplete understanding of immune tolerance, discrepancies arising from a continuum of ‘autoimmune’ reactions – ranging from normal physiological and inflammatory processes to uncontrolled disease – have destabilized the self/non-self dichotomy. Indeed, immune reactivity against the organism’s own constituents is an ordinary finding intrinsic to the behavior of the surveillance functions of the immune system and thus an important component of normal physiology.

Because the entire orientation of the science regarded immunity as a mediator of host defense, so-called autoimmune reactions were originally viewed as pathological. Indeed, Burnet argued that autoimmunity arose from “forbidden clones [which] in all essential respects…is equivalent to a clone of malignant cells” (Burnet 1972, p. 9). Such aberancy putatively arose from stochastic events associated with aging, where normal mechanisms that exercise control over somatic mutation and censorship mechanisms were deranged (ibid.). However, autoimmunity is now recognized as a normal aspect of immune function, inasmuch as healthy individuals have high frequencies of autoreactive B cells and T cells (Dietrich and Kazatchkine 1994). “Natural autoantibodies” have been characterized and quantified in both normal (Avrameas 1991; Coutinho, Kazatchkine and Avrameas 1995) and disease states (Notkins 2007), which may reflect the requirement of autoreactivity for natural self-tolerance and a role in maintaining homeostasis (Coutinho and Kazatchkine 1994).

Naturally occurring, auto-reactive B cells have been found to undergo several distinct fates in vivo: they can be physically eliminated, functionally inactivated, or they can persist unchanged or become activated (Goodnow 1992). And while auto-reactivity decreases with each step of B‑cell development, it is not eliminated. Although natural autoantibodies constitute a significant portion of serum immunoglobulins, most naturally occurring, auto-reactive‑expressing B cells do not secrete their auto-antibodies and seem to harmoniously coexist with their auto-antigen. The biological significance of this apparent inconsistency to the clonal tolerance theory remains enigmatic, but it now is clear that self‑reactivity is physiologic concinnity and should be distinguished from pathological autoimmunity (Pasquali and Martin 2012). The English noun “concinnity” and the adjective, “concinnous” are employed to designate the unremarkable physiology of the immune system doing its maintenance functions, and “autoimmunity” should then be limited to describe and refer to autoimmune diseases, i.e., those pathological conditions of immune attack on the animal’s own tissues (Tauber 2015). Accordingly, the current common use of ‘autoimmunity’ does not reflect the line demarcating autoimmunity as a normal function of the animal’s economy and a disease state (Vaz and Carvalho 2014).

Serving a key role in normal immunological physiology, immune-sensing mediates the body's normal processing of senile cells, repair of damaged tissues, and immune destruction of malignancies (Huetz et al. 1988; Poletaev and Osipenko 2003). These on-going household duties of immune surveillance possibly offer insight into what the immune system does on a routine basis. Self-surveillance may well be the original function of the immune system, in which the primordial role of the immune system was to serve perceptive and communicative functions of the body's own physiology to establish and then maintain host identity (Stewart 1992, 1994a, 1994b; Ramos, Vaz, and Saalfeld 2006). Given the striking correlations with the nervous system of shared receptors and mediators, intimate anatomic relationships, and ontogenetic origins, immune functions might have descended from a common neuro-endocrine communicative function (Ader 2006). Accordingly, under pathogenic pressure, the immune system developed specialized capacities as a defensive system, which largely explains the evolutionary forces that have molded the immune system in higher vertebrates (Janeway 1992; Medzhitov and Janeway 2002).

If the spectrum of immunity is enlarged, differentiating low reactive concinnous immune reactions from fully activated responses against the ‘other’ is only a matter of degree. Indeed, low level autoimmunity must now be regarded as normal, so if the immune system's basic function (and ultimately its organization and regulation) is to be elucidated, these normal activities must be further characterized. One might argue that concinnous reactions still reflect the self/non-self distinction, because ‘abnormal’ cells have lost their standing as legitimate members of the host. However, the line differentiating normal from abnormal remains fuzzy, and in some cases indeterminate. T-lymphocytes are eliminated during selection and maturation in the thymus if their affinity for self antigen is either too high (negative selection) or too low (positive selection) (Kisielow et al. 1988); B-cells also have tolerance checkpoints (Meffre and Wardemann 2008). Note, the remaining repertoire in fact is not based on self/non-self discrimination, but rather the degree of self-recognition. However, autoreactive T cells persist after thymic selection, so other mechanisms must operate to maintain peripheral tolerance (Coutinho and Bandeira 1989; Coutinho 2005). So, the functional difference that determines recognition of the foreign may result from some quantitative affinity difference, the context in which the antigen is seen, or the degree of interruption in network dynamics induced by such an antigen. Accordingly, the overall function of the immune system may be defined as maintenance of molecular (antigenic) homeostasis (Poletaev, Stepanyuk and Gershwin 2008) and thus a collective basis for reactivity – not the discriminatory power of individual lymphocytes – determines identity and immune specificity (Daëron 2014). On this broadened view, autoimmunity becomes a normal, integrated active process, and selfness entails a spectrum of immune activity that ranges from the absence of immune recognition to various degrees of concinnous immunity (Schwartz and Cohen 2000; Horn et al. 2001; Coutinho 2005).

7. The ecological imperative

Because immune theory was forged with the specific target of defining immune responses to pathogenic threats, the wider issues of how immunity participates in the construction of the animal’s ecology was, from the very inception of the discipline, subordinated to the medical challenges. After all, public health concerns have always dominated the life sciences and consequently immunology’s interface with ecology emerged as secondary to the clinical sciences. So immunity framed by the animal’s larger ecological setting, which include the entire complex of inter-organismal exchanges – both benign and transgressive – historically has been subordinated to the study of predator-host relationships.

Notwithstanding that “independence” is a political term and cannot fairly represent the dialectical relationships of the organism and its environment (Levins and Lewontin 1985), nor the evolutionary peculiarities of individuality itself, the insular immune self formulation remained largely unchallenged until the development of a science of the environment that would account not only for individual organisms, but also for their interactions. The ecological perspective, while subordinate to the agent-based understanding of immune theory, has been patiently waiting for its full acknowledgement. That latent theme is now emerging as the ecological imperative has impacted the commitment of Burnetian immunology organized around the protection of an autonomous self.

Only within the past two decades have serious attempts been made to integrate immunology and ecology (Gewin 2011; Martin, Hawley and Ardia 2011; Demas and Nelson 2011). This new inter-disciplinary field – eco-immunology – seeks to explain natural variation in immune functions, and to do so, several agendas are at play: (1) an adaptationist approach to investigate the costs and benefits of investment in immune activity; (2) the potential role of pathogens in shaping life history variation; (3) the relevance of cultural and ecological factors to the development and function of the immune system; (4) the genetics and evolutionary mechanisms that operate to establish genomes determined by environmental factors; and (5) the direct contributions of nutritional, pathogenic, reproductive and psychosocial factors to human immune functions (Lochmiller and Deerenberg 2000; McDade 2005; Schulenburg et al, 2009; Pedersen and Babayan 2011). Once such factors are incorporated into the study of immunity, we appreciate that the current precepts of immune theory relying on the immune self, placed within more narrow considerations, must be re-conceptualized. In short, immunology conceived as an ecological science dramatically widens conceptions of immunity from an insular model to one integrated within the organism's greater environment. However, the challenge of revising an individualistic notion of immune selfhood is not just in response to fully placing the organism within its environment, because well before the task of integrating immunology and ecology became an explicit research program, as described above, immunologists faced a growing uncertainty about their investment in the ‘immune self’ to model immunity.

The normal exchange of benign substances requires active immune tolerance and it is this dimension that brings immunology more fully into focus as an ecological science. Discerning the inter-relationships of organisms with their organic and inorganic environment re-directs immunology from a science of autonomous individuals to one that examines cooperative and competitive exchanges. In that re-orientation, the singular self is re-configured, both in terms of its placement in the world, but also in terms of its own constitution. In this regard, the full environmental context of immune recognition commands consideration (French, Moore, and Demas 2009). This conceptual shift joins other life sciences’ move towards an ecological or systems-wide consideration of complex function. So while reductionism prevails, a growing consensus has emerged that in order to decipher the structure and regulation of complex systems, a more comprehensive integrative approach is required.

When an ecological orientation is included, integration and coordination serve as organizing principles. In other words, balance assumes a regulative principle. This is hardly a novel concept. Early investigators recognized an ecological perspective by showing balanced host/parasite states resulting from mutual adaptions, which produce an equilibrated balance of pathogen virulence and host resistance to allow asymptomatic carrier conditions (Swiatczak 2013). When balance was disrupted, disease was considered to result either from the direct effects of the pathogen or the untoward effects of the immune response (e.g., studies of Texas cattle fever by Theobald Smith; Felix d’Herelle’s discovery of bacteriophage dynamics; Burnet’s explanation of the epidemiology of Q fever and psittacosis [ibid.]). Since those early observations, the imbalanced state between host and pathogen as the cause of deleterious conditions has gained currency in contemporary thinking (Virgin et 2009; Garrett et al. 2010; Willing et al. 2011): “evolutionary equilibrium favors mutualistic rather than parasitic or unilaterally destructive interactions” (Lederberg 1993, p. 8). Such an expansive view begins to build a more comprehensive picture of immunity as mediating both competitive and cooperative relationships, which are not captured in the laboratory setting where standard conditions frame experiments that only barely reflect the complexity of the environmental setting (Viney and Riley 2014, p. 16).

The dynamic character of the organism’s development and changing life experiences continuously modulates its immune history and, in turn, its identity. The notion of a “liquid” character highlights various immune response mechanisms within a construct, which accounts for the organism’s various ecosystems – both internal and external (Grignolio et al 2014). By employing temporal, geographical/evolutionary, and environmental dimensions, a model of immunity shifts from a more static understanding of immune selfhood to one that accounts for biological changes occurring with age and differing organismal contexts related to nutrition and geography. Such temporal and geographical dimensions continuously reshape the antigenicity of physical entities (molecules, cells, bacteria, viruses), create new targets of oral tolerance or rejection, and challenge the status of unexpected self epitopes produced by proteasome splicing (ibid.) Indeed, a recent examination of twins has shown that the vast predominance of immune variation results from non-heritable influences, and thus the immune profile of healthy individuals is largely the product of particular responses to environmental challenges (Brodin et al. 2015). When variation plays such a dominant role in constructing immune identity, what then is such an entity as the immune self? Accordingly, instead of a science of immunity based on a strict self-other configuration (where the self is established in embryo and maintained throughout life), the conception of an “immunological biography” and contextual setting more comprehensively accounts for the organism’s interactive ecology and dialectic character. So while the ‘immune self’ governs the practice and theoretical orientation of most practicing immunologists, the neat boundaries of ‘self’ and ‘other’ may more profitably be regarded as broken and replaced by a spectrum of functions based on a gradation of immune responses that do not neatly fit a dichotomous division.

According to this expansive purview, the relevance of the ‘ecological orientation’ to immunology requires a re-commitment to examining systems (Wodarz 2014). The application of systems biology falls into three frameworks: (1) the processing of data based on an orthodox clonal selection model that examines portions of the system excited by antigen stimulation; (2) an autonomous modality of immune “internal activity” that portrays the on-going normal physiology of immune processing in the body’s economy; and 3) and an ecological presentation that emphasizes the open information flow that the immune system processes and responds to. This last modality, the interface of organism and environment, places the immune system firmly within the organism’s larger interactive context. Here, we see the full potential of systems biology.

Systems biology attempts to model complexity by supplementing an older reductionist analysis of biological phenomena with an integrative strategy that would combine the various elements into a coherent, dynamic whole (Lilienfeld 1978; Kitano 2001). To do so, “immunocomputing” of artificial immune systems has drawn on recent developments in computer science, cybernetics, information processing, pattern recognition, language representation and knowledge-based reasoning (e.g. de Castro and Timmis 2002; Tarakanov et al. 2003; Cohen 2007; Cohen and Harel 2007). This medley of approaches reflects the character of systems biology more generally, and while it is premature to suggest which application will be most noteworthy for immune modeling, the first textbook devoted to immunological bioinformatics announced the goal of establishing “an in silico immune system” (Lund et al. 2005: ix), which has been followed by a surge of interest and speculation (e.g., Bersini and Carneiro 2006; Flower and Timmis 2007). Understanding how immune cells and their mediators interact with each other, the surrounding tissue and the microbiome requires comprehensive multi-dimensional modeling to examine global crosstalk between molecular pathways and cell populations. Such relationships are now emerging as a result of applying high-throughput profiling technologies (Kidd et al. 2014). Analysis of genome-wide transcriptions exhibits the changes that correlate with different states of the immune system such as the molecular signatures associated with autoimmunity, post-vaccination states, and various phases of infection. Population studies designed to determine the links between genotype and phenotype have uncovered numerous genetic variations that influence function of the immune system. DNA sequencing technologies have been applied to monitor responses of vaccines, evolution of viral variants to escape immune detection, diagnostics for leukemia, and profiling of T cell and antibody repertoires. With the integration of peptide and protein data from different cell types or tissue sources, combined with cytometric studies and metabolics, an unprecedented number of parameters may now be integrated. As one enthusiast opined: “…after a 100 years of empirical research, immunology is hovering on the brink of reinventing itself as a quantitative, genome-based science….whether or not the multitude of practitioners of immunology wish to acknowledge it” (Flower 2007, p. 2).

Whether the recent surge of interest in systems biology will effectively address this revised agenda for discerning immune regulation remains to be seen, but, clearly, the linear assembly of connected discrete elements currently portraying the immune system is an inadequate model. Although applications of a systems approach to the immune system are in their infancy, it is already clear that the results of those efforts depends in large measure on the underlying concepts that characterize the immune system itself. Although no singular method has yet emerged for immunologists to mix the various elements comprising systems biology, suffice it to note that as a cognitive system, immune reactivity requires a theory of information that escapes the predicate epistemological structure dominating current models. As discussed above, immunology already has a theoretical infrastructure that supports such a cognitive structure, and various research developments suggest that this ecological orientation, which embraces a contextual understanding of perception is taking hold. If sustained, immunology is in the midst of a major transition.

In conclusion, to adequately address the larger dynamics that must account for the co-existence of interacting species, a systems approach must account for the behaviors of the immune system – both of individuals as classically understood and that of the population’s collective immunity. Such a study presents the language of a dialogue between organisms and their environments in response to the challenges received from diverse encounters. Thus the ecological orientation commits immunologists to examine not only the internal systems of immunity as traditionally conceived, but also to address the challenge of defining the immune system in the full context of its environment and the commune of individuals comprising the species. To remain restricted within an analysis that already assumes only a defensive posture, limits understanding how animals live in exchange with others. Accordingly, by describing that inter-active economy, immunology becomes an important member of the ecological sciences. This theoretical current is carrying immunology’s research program into new waters, which in turn portends a shift in immunology’s basic paradigm.

So if we look at the “big picture,” immunology is adjusting to the twin demands of increasing molecular elucidation, on the one hand, and addressing the ecology of immunity, on the other hand. In both contexts, the “self” has been threatened with loss of its theoretical authority. From the molecularists' perspective, atomic delineations have outstripped explanations of immune regulation so that no molecular signature of selfhood suffices to explain the complex interactions of immunocytes, their regulatory products, and the targets of their actions. Reactivity thus becomes the functional definition of immune identity. And from the ecological perspective, self/non-self discrimination recedes as a governing principle when immunity is appreciated as consisting of an array of responses, whether directed at the deleterious or the beneficial. Accordingly, immune activities comprise a continuum, where the character of the immune object is determined by the context in which it appears, not necessarily by its character as “foreign” per se. More simplistic models have too often obscured this cardinal lesson. The core of this re-orientation requires the re-conceptualization of selfhood in a contextualized schema, which breaks the formal alterity of ‘the other’ and thus denies a rigid subject-object dichotomy. This view is hardly radical. Immunologists have long-appreciated that the original theories outlining self/non-self discrimination limit the comprehension of variable immune-mediated interchanges. Eco-immunology expands the expanse of immune behaviors and places immuno-biology fully within the organism's environment. Such an approach presumably will push immunology towards a larger ecological conceptualization for understanding immune regulation and thus expand contemporary immunological theory well beyond its current borders, where defense of singular selves is replaced with models describing the interactions of individuals in a community of others.

8. Conclusion: Immunology contextualized

To account for the role of selfhood in immunology we must consider two historical forces: The first begins with the adoption of ‘self’ as an organizing motif of immunity, which brought a demand to define agency in that context. In its earliest formal use, ‘the immune self’ designated a most general differentiation process, in which sameness or self-identification served as the basis of immune discernment. That early use adopted a commonplace understanding of personal identity. However, despite its utility for organizing immune functions, the immune self cannot be defined in any singular fashion. Having served an important heuristic function as a powerful rhetorical idiom, the self lacks firm epistemological standing and thus functions as a fragile scientific construct. Some definitions of immune selfhood suffice within a certain investigative tradition, while others vie for consideration when immune regulation is considered in a different context. When various points of view are considered, it is increasingly evident that immune theory based on ‘selfhood’ carries the conceptual burdens assigned to it with difficulty, and while many commentators still support the immune self paradigm (e.g. Howes 2010; Hoffman 2012; Cohn 2015), others have been highly critical (e.g. Matzinger 1994; Tauber 2000; Pradeu 2012). The self’s epistemological ambiguity and its polysemy in large measure account for the term’s powerful heuristic value, but that function is derived not from a definition of immune identity, but rather because selfhood effectively functions as an idiom with many uses and meanings to organize immune phenomena (Crist and Tauber 1999). Idiom and metaphor are not theory, so when the immune self as originally conceived is replaced with a more relaxed notion of individuality, a new understanding of immune identity emerges.

The second trajectory concerns the general tides of a growing ecological sensibility in the life sciences. Immunology has been caught up in that wave. Such an orientation alters the basic postulates of current immune theory and reflects the present state of theorizing that already has the conceptual infrastructure to assume a fuller ecological orientation. So instead of a theory based on self/non-self distinctions, our understanding of the immune system might be built on a schema that fully captures the dynamic and dialectical relationships characterizing an organism engaged in the complex internal and external environments constituted by friend and foe.

While the dominant, and certainly the clearest explanation for the immune self’s transfiguration must be accounted for by the incomplete scientific model upon which it was based, an expansion of ideas from other sciences broke open the confines of mid-twentieth-century immunology: cognitive science challenged agent-centered predicate cognition for Gibsonian embedded perception; the various life sciences studying symbiosis broke traditional definitions of host anatomy, physiology, development, and, more broadly, evolution; systems biology adapted from other scientific disciplines provided opportunities to model immune phenomena in expanded dimensions of function. These are best characterized as ‘internal’ to immunology’s scientific venture.

The ‘external’ position, or ‘constructivist’ argument, asserts that immunology’s models of identity are derived not just with the assembly of epistemic facts, but include the entire cognitive and organizing principles of a widely held conception of personhood as the scaffold for their interpretation. So, from this perspective, the Cartesian atomistic conception of agency assumed by the self/non-self dichotomy brings an entire array of embedded ideas about cognition and individuality, which have pervasive and profound effects on conceiving immune organization and regulation. Accordingly, these conceptual influences unobtrusively guide the development of the science along lines set by the underlying prevailing philosophical understandings of agency (Tauber 1994).

Commentators have boldly assigned cultural values to immune theory by noting how social differences between men and women, workers and managers, or citizens and foreigners were written into immunology. These may be regarded as paradigmatic for the modern notions of identity, where social boundaries are contested and the body becomes the localized site of battle between self and other (Haraway 1989a, E. Martin 1990; 1994). Following this line of criticism, underlying notions of race guiding the elaboration of immune theory have been suggested, where immunity was the culturally transformed activity of the atavistic animal (Rossiianov 2008). This orientation has been promoted by David Napier (2003), who argues that just as Social Darwinians a century ago saw in “the survival of the fittest” the key for understanding society, Napier sees “immune reaction” as capturing the social essence of life in America today. The warfare metaphors — “attack,” “defense,” “invaders” — so prevalent in immunology's lexicon, dramatically illustrate this construction, both in terms of the self/other dichotomy, as well as the privileged regard of individuality over community. Thus current immune models have been regarded as supporting an ideological orientation of social barriers, wherein the self never truly engages or changes its fundamental essence. Accordingly, immunology provides a political metaphor for American culture marked by atomistic individuality. Such extrapolations originate with the self conceived within a Western moral construct: Existentially and politically most Westerners understand themselves as individual selves constituted by a subjective commitment to personalized self-fulfillment, on the one hand, and personal responsibility, on the other hand.

Some feminists have offered an alternate configuration. The key precept in line with this train of thought holds that the foreign, the other, is not necessarily threatening or dangerous. And, correspondingly, the power relations of supremacy of ‘self’ over ‘other’ implicitly underlies the definition and identity of selfhood as instantiated by certain masculine ideals of autonomy and dominance. Accordingly, feminist critics have assailed the self/non-self distinction as a particularly vivid example of the dominance of masculine power-authority that is linked to deeper commitments of the self/other distinction as a cognitive form of objectivity (Keller 1982; Harding 1986; 1991). Noteworthy in this regard is Matzinger’s danger theory, which dispenses with the self/non-self division and, according to a feminist interpretation, discards the demonization of the other for a more inclusive structure for immune theory (Weasel 2001). Note, this line of argument includes the suggestion that women themselves, because of their feminine socialization, possess a different epistemological perspective, which differentiates them from their male colleagues (Keller 1983; 1985; Weasel 2001, pp. 36–9).

Whether or not immunologists have appropriated such descriptions of personal identity for their models of immunity, certainly one can appreciate that immune theory makes easy transit to descriptions of Western societies. For instance, the character of the immune state appeared to have a strong influence on how Americans regarded themselves during the height of the AIDS epidemic (E. Martin 1994). And social critics have appropriated immunity – centered on extrapolated notions of ‘immunization’ and ‘autoimmunity’ – to characterize post-capitalist societies. Some would even maintain “immunological ideas now provide the primary conceptual framework in which human relations take place in the contemporary world” (Napier 2003, p. 3). Irrespective of the validity of such extrapolations, the immune system has functioned as an anthropological tool available for the interpretation of various cultural patterns (Western and non-Western), inasmuch as it seemingly illustrates the ambivalent and reciprocal status of the Same and the Other (Moulin 2001; Moulin and Cambrosio 2001). To the extent that we can identify such attendant cultural meanings, we might better appreciate the bi-directionality of conceptual exchanges between social meanings of selfhood and corresponding conceptions evident in the science.

If we broaden the scope in which the contested definition or meaning of selfhood includes critiques from anthropology, philosophy, psychology, and feminism, an extraordinary expanse of ideas still require placement into the general question of how implicit notions of personal identity have found expression in immune theory and vice versa. So while it is too early to judge the extent immune concepts have influenced cultural conceptions of the individual in the social sciences and self-identification in Western cultures more broadly, clearly a larger role is emerging. And conversely, the movement from the immune self as an autonomous construction to formulations based on contextualized identity mirrors attacks on the Cartesian ego launched from diverse directions among social critics and philosophers.

Once the moral agency conceived in the Enlightenment is discarded and the agent-based epistemological models born in the same era are displaced (and the deconstruction of the self/non-self distinction in immune theory becomes important support for that move), substituting non-Western or postmodern notions of agency may be invoked. A postmodern conception of immune selfhood has, indeed, been proposed (Weasel 2001; Code 2006), a view that has kindred support in ecology (e.g., Drengson and Inoue 1995) and cognitive science (e.g., Shapiro 2011), where Cartesian conceptions of individual autonomy are being replaced with contextualized accounts. Accordingly, there is no self “essence” or permanent “self,” but rather the organism must be conceived from various perspectives, each with temporary overlapping aspects. Such a dynamic object, fully embracing process (Whitehead 1929) and indeterminacy (Stollar 2012), becomes an impermanent collective of functions and interactions fully integrated within the environment. The self then becomes a convenient label for an aggregate of processes that are characteristically fleeting. This general orientation has growing influence in contemporary philosophies of mind (e.g., embodied-mind models [Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 1991] and the “phenomenal self-model” [Metzinger 2003]). Although different sets of arguments are asserted, a general proposition maintains that the self as such does not exist, but rather a phenomenal self – a process, not an entity – appears in conscious experience. How such a conception will impact immunology remains to be seen, but if we look for analogies to contemporary philosophical discussions, the dynamic, dialogical character of the organism closely corresponds with these latter philosophical critiques of mind and postmodern portrayals of personal identity.

Such speculations are not ideal armchair ruminations. The immune self – with its accompanying claims to epistemological veracity – has entered the ideological fray of commentary about post-capitalist societies. If immunology cannot define such a thing as ‘the self,’ how then do we characterize personal identity in an age that increasingly relies on science to provide answers to various philosophical quandaries about human agency? These range from the evolutionary origins of morality to the conceptions of gender and sexuality; from the character of altruism to the very notion of ‘human nature’ (e.g. Wright 1995; Ridley 1998; Buss 2003; Wade 2014). The purported cascade from the gene to animal behavior to ethics abounds, despite the credibility gap of such extensions. Perhaps the primary lesson learned from the immune case is that such identifications are preliminary at best, and more critically, how immune identity is formulated supports certain ideological positions over others. In other words, immunology may be viewed under certain circumstances as a political science, with all of the attendant dangers associated with such fellow travelers.

And if we step back from the particularities of the metaphor discussion, we see that the ‘self’ has completed a cycle, originally having been borrowed from social and political discourse it has now re-entered culture criticism with new conceptual meanings in order to assist in building a political theory, which itself is composed of analogues and metaphors from the very science that has carried those metaphors from that culture (from folk psychology and philosophy) for its own purposes (e.g. Esposito 2011; reviewed by Anderson and Mackay 2014). Simply, ‘the self’ functions in a rich circularity between the laboratory and its supporting culture. And no wonder. This movement from one discourse to the other exhibits the easy slide of the epistemological knowing agent into its moral counterpart and then back again. Indeed, the boundary separating science from its enveloping culture and philosophy cannot easily be drawn (Gieryn 1995).


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