Francis Herbert Bradley's Moral and Political Philosophy
F. H. Bradley's only book on moral philosophy was Ethical Studies, published in 1876. Organized around the concept of self-realization, it presents a metaphysical ethics in the sense that it is largely concerned with understanding the moral agent. This begins with an analysis of the structure of volitional choice. In this respect, Bradley offers a theory of practical reasoning. Yet, he holds it equally important to learn how a child develops from a creature with appetites and needs into a mature, reflective moral agent capable of complex deliberations and choices. Answering this question requires a psychological theory of moral development which explains why individuals pursue the specific goals they do. In this respect Ethical Studies offers a naturalized ethics. Since moral theories positing self-realization as the end of morality are perfectionist theories it is no surprise that Bradley thinks the main objective of moral action is to become as morally good as we can and making the world morally better in the process. Usually perfectionism is explicated in terms of the moral virtues and their contribution to the good life. However, Bradley approaches the perfectionist theme differently: he never discusses the various moral virtues, instead defending his thesis on the ground that the realization of the self is a necessary feature of the logical structure of intentionally willed moral actions. The basic data for analysis of moral action come from observing the practical judgments ordinary people make and their understanding and use of normative concepts. The role of the philosopher is to explain this moral world rather than to generate principles dictating how people should act. In this respect, Bradley offers a descriptive rather than a prescriptive ethical theory.
Bradley claims that proving that the ultimate end of action is self-realization would require establishing the nature of the self, of reality and the process of realization, which would amount to having a developed system of metaphysics, and that, lacking this, the best he can do is to explain the thesis and try to make it plausible (Ethical Studies, p. 65). The reader should not be fooled by this. Metaphysics was always Bradley's primary philosophical interest and his moral theory is shaped by his metaphysical views, which are evident throughout Ethical Studies. The lament that he does not have a fully developed view, which is common in his writings, merely reflects his feeling that there is always more to be said.
- 1. The Structure of Volitional Choice
- 2. The Perfect, Ideal Self
- 3. The Content of Volitional Choices
- 4. The Psychology of Moral Development
- 5. The End of Morality
- 6. Bradley's Political Philosophy
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Bradley begins his study of morality and the moral agent with an analysis of the ordinary person's understanding of moral responsibility. The reason for this starting-place is revealed much later, when he argues that children are not moral creatures until they have developed a measure of self-consciousness. This, he says, makes possible “imputation and responsibility, and here begins the proper moral life of the self” (Ethical Studies, p. 299). If an action has any moral significance whatsoever then the person responsible (in the causal sense) can be held accountable (responsible in the normative sense). One could feel accountable to other people, to God or to one's own conscience, and with this goes a sense of liability to censure or punishment. Actually being guilty and thereby deserving of censure or punishment requires the satisfaction of three conditions: the person held accountable must be the same person as the one who did the act, the act must have been that person's, and he or she must have had some understanding of the moral quality of the act. While not in a position to provide a philosophical opinion on questions concerning personal identity or what constitutes an action, the ordinary person nevertheless recognizes cases in which an accused person was “not himself” or “did not mean to do it” or acted under duress, and sees these as mitigating circumstances. In sum, the ordinary person's view, as Bradley presents it, is Aristotelian: for the purposes of determining moral responsibility an act has to be the agent's in that its origin (arche) lies with or in the agent in some sense—and the agent must not be acting under coercion or in a state of non-culpable ignorance. These last conditions reflect the common view that one cannot, in justice, hold someone accountable unless she had a measure of control over the situation and thereby could be viewed as acting of her own free will.
If we turn to the theories of philosophers we find differing opinions about whether we enjoy this sort of freedom from external influences, and Bradley is interested in how the theories of Determinism and Indeterminism differ from the views of the ordinary people; not because he thinks the ordinary people will always be correct about such matters—indeed, they likely have not thought much about such things—but because examining what the ordinary people say about moral matters reveals the deep structures of a society's moral thinking as that is embedded in its language and social institutions. This is also important, as we will see later, because Bradley believes morality is relative to a communal setting, and sees a child's moral development as dependent on membership in a community.
In the matter of the free will debate the ordinary people believe neither side. Against Determinism they hold that they can and often do initiate actions—and on this point Bradley portrays the ordinary person as accepting the thesis now called “agent causality.” What is omitted by the Determinists are explanations of behavior which appeal to the reasons of the agent, thereby ignoring Aristotle's notion of final causality, or purposely reducing it to efficient causality. The Indeterminist presents herself as the friend of freedom but when she claims that people are so free that they could choose any act at any time the ordinary people object. They think it often possible to predict what someone will do, because she has a formed moral character and can be counted on to act a certain way when faced with moral questions. Moreover, the ordinary person thinks character is developed by the choices people make and the kind of life they have led. Bradley notes, however, that character is malleable to a degree and it is often difficult to determine the extent to which someone's character is more or less fixed and resistant to change. Those matters aside, the key result of the discussion of moral responsibility is the portrayal of moral agents as not only acting in the world in ways that shape that world—especially the social world—but also in ways that shape the agent's moral character. From the perspective of morality both the act and the doing of it are equally important.
But Bradley does not stop at character formation, claiming that human nature itself is evolving. He rejects the traditional view that one's essential human nature remains unchanged even though there will be some differences in people that are only historical accidents. The contrary position is a metaphysical doctrine, often called historicity, which claims that human beings are self-making within the limits of their natural and social contexts. There is a dialectical relationship between these aspects of the human condition: we are not only constrained by natural and social contexts but can often alter natural conditions and social arrangements, thereby influencing how they impact on our choices. For example, my ability to think certain things possible will be a function of my conception of the social institutions of my society. If marriages are defined as being between a male and a female, I may not even contemplate the possibility of being in a same-sex marriage leave alone feel free to act on the idea. Yet, change is possible because human beings have the ability to represent states of affairs that do not exist. In its most familiar form this happens when you plan tomorrow's dinner.
The task, now, is to elaborate the logical structure of this self-making process, for Bradley's moral thesis is not merely that the aim of moral action is to generate a better, superior self, and ultimately a perfect self, but that this is to be achieved by the agent herself, for it is a process of ‘self-realization.’ Eventually this theory must supply an account of how anything we might recognize as moral content gets included in the picture, but the first task is to articulate the formal structure of “volitional choice” (Ethical Studies, p.71). Bradley begins this task by noting the different aims we have in pursuing theoretical knowledge versus our aims in practical reasoning:
What we want in theory is to understand the object; we want neither to remove nor alter the world of sensuous fact, but we want to get at the truth of it. The whole of science takes it for granted that the ‘not-ourself’ is really intelligible; it stands and falls with this assumption. So long as our theory strikes on the mind as strange and alien, so long do we say we have not found truth; we feel the impulse to go beyond, we alter and alter our views, till we see them as a consistent whole. There we rest, because then we have found the nature of our own mind and the truth of the facts in one. And in practice again, with a difference, we have the same want. Here our aim is not, leaving the given as it is, to find the truth of it; but here we want to force the sensuous fact to correspond to the truth of ourselves. (Ethical Studies, p.73)
This presents two very different kinds of intentional mental states. In the case of empirical knowledge we have a subject in the psychological state of believing that something is true of the world; his belief has a propositional object as its content as Bradley would call it. Since the goal is to correctly understand the world, the subject is committed to altering his belief set until it accurately represents the external physical world. By contrast, when I wish or desire to become a better person I must first have represented the self or person I wish to be under some description. This sort of mental state also has a propositional object; e.g., in the statement, “I wish that I were a more patient person” the italicized proposition following the “that” is the object of the mental state we call wishing. What we have here, in Bradley's terminology is an ideal object which is the content of the wish. This is ideal because it is a mental representation of a state of affairs that does not exist at the point the wish is made.
An ideal object can represent a possible different state of the person contemplating it, which presupposes, in addition to the ability to represent possible future states, a degree of self-awareness. An example of this sort of self-consciousness is found in the addict who may be very aware of how his desires are ruining his life. Once this sort of self-reflective awareness is achieved it is then possible to think of changing things. In Bradley's language this addict has pictured a better self that he might be, and if he comes to identify his satisfaction with realizing this better self there is a possibility of change. This situation sets up a conflict between the actual person the addict now is and the represented better person he wishes to be and this generates disharmony or what Bradley often calls a “felt contradiction”. The pain of this conflict moves the individual toward resolving it. It is important to note that the addict cannot move forward without having a determinate ideal object, a definite conception of the ideal self being represented. Without this, identifying his satisfaction with realizing that state would be impossible.
This gives us a way to see what Bradley means when he says, in a later article, that “volition is ‘the self-realization of an idea with which the self is identified’” (Collected Essays, p. 476). In Ethical Studies the claim made is that the only thing we can aim at in acting is to realize ourselves—or, better, the structure of practical reasoning and the facts of moral psychology make it impossible that we could aim at anything other than self-realization. If volitional choice has a possible state of oneself as its object, and if one has identified one's satisfaction with achieving this, then acting so as to realize the superior self that has been pictured is an advancing of oneself or realizing oneself. In fact, this would also be true of a case in which the intentional object represents a state of affairs not directly involving a change in oneself, for having identified one's satisfaction with a possible state of affairs would mean that its coming to be would be also a case of advancing oneself, for in this case the agent has forced the world to conform to us. What is crucial is that the represented state be taken as the agent's end. As Bradley notes, “all my thoughts are not my ends” and if self-realization meant no more than having an idea of a future event in our mind which later happens, “then I should realize myself practically when I see that the engine is going to run off the line, and it does so” (Ethical Studies, p. 67).
Volitional choice therefore has a built-in normative feature in the form of an idea of a better state or self. But self-realization means more than this for ethical theory, for it purportedly represents the over-arching, ultimate goal of moral action, which entails some idea of a perfect, ideal self that is being aimed at. This raises an epistemic problem. With individual cases, such as the addict contemplating his situation, it may be that he gets an idea of how he might change by observing other people or considering how he used to be before becoming an addict. But how can anyone know what the ideal self is, the superior self that is not merely better, but best? Answering this is crucial if Bradley's ethical theory is not to fall victim to a criticism he made of Mill's thesis about the qualities of pleasures (Utilitarianism, Chapter 2). Bradley leveled a barrage of criticisms against any theory, Utilitarian or otherwise, that proposed the maximization of pleasure as the ultimate moral goal. The central objection was that since pleasures are a “perishing series,” with each one passing away once it has been experienced, it is not possible to accumulate a sum of pleasures, and since there are always more pleasures available than anyone has experienced, Mill's moral goal of maximizing pleasant states was meaningless. But introducing the idea of qualitatively different kinds of pleasures that can be ranked suggests that perhaps the hedonist can, after all, successfully articulate the self we should be aiming at. Perhaps the best self—the ideal moral self—is the one that pursues the highest type of pleasure.
In evaluating this Bradley stresses the relative, comparative nature of terms such as ‘higher’ and ‘lower’. Contrast terms such as ‘superior’ and ‘inferior’ invite us to ask, “in respect of what is A higher than, or superior to, B?” Bradley insists that if I say Sally is superior to Joan I must first be comparing them in terms of some characteristic they share—for example, both are beautiful—and, second, I am positioning them on a scale, which is conceived in terms of two determinate termini. We can perhaps see the point here by imagining what happens when, having said Sally is superior to Joan, we are next asked to rank Mary. If Mary is judged superior (in beauty) to both, then she is being placed between Sally and someone who is right at the top of the scale. Mill's account of superior pleasures fails because he never explains what the scale is that is being used and so never explains what the ‘highest’ kind of pleasure is. Whether this criticism survives scrutiny does not matter all that much as far as the fate of hedonism is concerned, for Bradley's attack on qualitative hedonism is nothing short of thorough and he thinks there is no convincing case Mill can make in support of it. For example, Mill's competent judges cannot say that this ranking just “feels” right, for that is to confess that the talk of ranking is meaningless since one could have just as well “ranked” them differently. And the ranking cannot be made in terms of Mary's beauty, because that is the quality that makes Mary a candidate for placement on the scale in the first place; which leads Bradley to hold, as did most of Mill's critics, that unless the whole business really is nonsense, there must some criterion other than pleasure being used and so Mill has given up hedonism. These, and some other arguments are independent of the issue about knowing the upper limit end of the scale of pleasures That issue is important, however, because it marks a problem Bradley's theory of self-realization should also have to face: namely, that talk of a ‘superior’ or ‘better’ or ‘more perfect’ moral person would require an explication of the upper limit of the scale these evaluations are employing. This seems a reasonable demand, for even apart from the question of whether judging something to be better than something else entails knowing what is best, Bradley's thesis is not just that we try to become better with each choice and action, but that we want to be the best possible, to be perfect moral agents.
Fortunately, Bradley has an answer. In the passage from Ethical Studies quoted above Bradley said that in our theoretical attempts at understanding the world we want to make our set of empirical beliefs coherent, and since we assume as a working hypothesis that the external world is systematic, a contradiction in our beliefs would indicate we have not yet arrived at the coherence and consistency that is demanded. In addition, our empirical belief set has to include all the facts, has to be comprehensive. Bradley claims a similar objective applies to intentional agents. We look to produce a self that is an organic whole in which all is related so as to render it a system rather than a mere collection of random acts and characteristics. Yet it must also seek to be all it can become rather than living “the life of an oyster.” These two aspects he calls ‘homogeneity’ and ‘specificity’ respectively (Ethical Studies, p.74), and they appear to parallel “coherent” and “comprehensive” as applied to a set of beliefs.
To show that we aim at being a whole, Bradley first offers some empirical evidence.
To the extent that people consider the consequences of their actions they demonstrate that they do not see their actions as disconnected from other things they have done and might do, and they subordinate some ends to wider goals. That is, ordinary people not only display a degree of prudence in making choices but also recognize that the value of some actions is that they are means to more important goals. In fact, he claims that most people act with some “ideal of life,” or some idea of what would make them perfectly happy, however vaguely expressed, and this orders their lives, governing their choices and actions. In a word, normal lives of mature adults are at least relatively systematic. Moreover, if a person has become habituated to act in certain ways, has developed a disposition to act thus and so, then her actions will tend to be relatively consistent. This sort of person has what Bradley calls a “standing will” and it explains why those who know someone well can predict what this person will do with a considerable degree of certainty and why that person feels pleased that others know she can be counted on to act appropriately. There is, in other words, a structure to her actions suggesting her inner life—her desires, dispositions, values and so on—is unified. She is like an organism in that all these features work together as one unite, (= a “whole”).
Moving beyond empirical evidence, Bradley claims that in volitional action “the self as a whole is, in the end, the content of our wills” (Ethical Studies, p. 71). In other words, in self-realization the ideal object with which the self will identify its ultimate satisfaction is a whole. There are two articulations of this notion of a “whole self.” First, Bradley notes that we find it natural to speak of someone willing this or that, and we often speak of someone's will, as in “her will to live.” This reveals two aspects of the will, of the individual person deliberating and choosing a course of action. First, when Sally wills something there is a particular process that occurs in which Sally deliberates, experiences certain desires or leanings toward one thing or another, eventually terminating in her doing such and such. Bradley calls this the particular aspect of the will to indicate that volitional choice is geared toward specific actions in the world. Even if Sally cannot carry out her plans, say because she is paralyzed, her willing still targets doing something specific. On the other hand, when we say Sally has a will we are conceiving of her as persisting beyond any single specific choice, and seeing her as the owner and author of what she wills. Bradley calls this the universal aspect of the will. The “volition as a whole É is the unity of both these factors, and the projection or carrying of it out into external existence; the realization both of the particular side, the this or that to be done, and the realization of the inner side of the self in the doing of it” (Ethical Studies, p.72). The moral thesis of self-realization reflects the importance of both, for creating our moral character through our choices and actions entails both particular acts of will and a subsisting will that is developed through these choices.
In his later articles on the will a volition is defined as “the self-realization of an idea with which the self is identified.” Again, this pictures a self that can identify with an ideal object and can through action realize (bring about) the state of affairs represented by the ideal object. When this occurs the self is also realized because of its identification with this object. The full analysis reveals five necessary components:
There is (1) existence, (2) the idea of a change, and (3) the actual change of the existence by the idea to (4) the idea's content. And (5) in this change the self feels itself realized. (Collected Essays, p. 477)
The self that entertains the ideal object (the intentional object) and identifies its satisfaction with that object and that feels satisfaction when that object has become real in the world, must all be the same self. This is the main point of saying that the will has a universal aspect.
The thesis that we aim at being a whole is further illuminated by considering volitional choice from the inner perspective of the individual moral agent. This agent is aware of being the same person throughout specific acts of choosing—an awareness of being the “I” that wills to do this or that. But at the same time there is—or should be—some uncertainty about who or what this “I” is, for there is a dualism built right into the logical structure of volitional choice in that it requires awareness of both the existing state of the self and a superior state represented as a possible future state. Since both are felt to represent this person a tension arises along with a desire to resolve the tension; so there is, right at the heart the matter a kind of movement toward restoring the unity of the self by overcoming the dualism that necessarily exists in any volition. Later this sort of conflict gets introduced in Bradley's moral theory in terms of the development of, and the conflict between, the good self and the bad self.
Bradley next says that what we really desire is not merely to be a whole, but an infinite whole. This introduces a particular, and perhaps to some minds a peculiar, metaphysical doctrine: that if A is dependent on B then A is not real in and of itself—because it is defined by, or can only function through, its relationship to B. The real is independent; it is what it is in terms of its own features and functions. . (On this view ‘real’ is a normative term.) Something which has no external relations that impinge on what it is and can do is infinite. By contrast, a finite entity has something that limits it. This relates to the analysis of the self of moral action because, given this conception of what it means to be ‘real’—as requiring total independence from anything else and thereby being free of all relations—it would be analytic that the goal of self-realization can be attained only if one could become an infinite whole in Bradley's this technical sense of ‘infinite’. Of course, it is unlikely that the everyday moral agent has thought of her situation in these terms. But that is not necessary because each has a felt impulse which points her in the right direction. Explaining this introduces yet another metaphysical doctrine, Bradley's theory of immediate experience.
The best way to appreciate this theory is to consider the nature of the most primitive stage of sensory experience. Some philosophers have held that in our initial sensory states we have a subject or self confronting and receiving information from an object—which might be either a physical object or a sense-datum. The mistake here, in Bradley's view, lies with the dualism this picture endorses, with the idea that the initial experiences are ones in which the experiencing self's consciousness is focused on an object. In other words, these views see the initial stage of experience as cognitive (meaning there is an object before one's conscious awareness); in other words they are intentional mental states. Bradley rejects this, arguing that there is level of a non-cognitive experience at the foundation of all cognitive experiences. At this logically prior level conscious experiences have no objects. Being in pain is often offered as an example of this sort of mental state. Bradley calls this level of experience “feeling” to remind us that we are dealing with a non-cognitive mental state below the level of thought; and it is also called “immediate experience” because it is as yet unmediated by any mental operations such as attention and abstraction. The reason Bradley advances this view of immediate experience lies with his analysis of the structure of thought. Put roughly, he claims that in judging that “The wolf is eating the lamb,” for example, we separate various aspects of what is immediately given and assert a relationship between them, which involves mental operations such as attention and abstracting. Operations of this sort must be working on experience that is a non-relational unity. (In a sense then, the argument for immediate experience is transcendental, in the Strawsonian sense that it can be shown to be a necessary condition of the mental operations we can and do perform.) Finally, at some point the subject-object or experience-experienced dichotomy has to arise.
The details of Bradley's doctrine of immediacy need not detain us here, but one point is of central importance: when we move to the higher level of consciousness that entails intentional mental states there supposedly remains a residual “feel” of the unity of immediate experience, and some residual sense of the “contents” of immediate experience. This is relevant to the question of why there is an impulse to become an infinite whole: it is because we carry a residual feel that all reality is a systematic non-relational unity. In other words, there is a residual trace of the primitive level of immediacy or feeling that moves us toward wholeness in the sense that we feel at odds, incomplete, when we conceive of ourselves as defined by our relations to ‘things’ and ‘other selves’. And when we consider this along with the theory of the nature of thought, we recognize that these experiences as they are expressed in statements actually leave out other aspects of the given and so are incomplete. In this way judgments are never completely accurate and only partly true. (This is Bradley's theory of the degrees of truth.) The consequence of this line of thinking for moral theory is that we have a test by which to determine whether we have realized ourselves in a particular case: namely, have we arrived at a greater unity, which means fewer felt contradictions or explicit contradictions in our desires, our dispositions and the like? The ideal moral self is achieved when we arrive at a point at which it has no limiting relations, which is to say, when we are an infinite whole, a systematic organic unity. That we can be part way along in this progress toward the ideal moral self, and in our understanding of what the ideal moral self demands, reflects what will later become his theory of degrees of reality. In the case of morality, one step on the road to perfection occurs when we stop thinking of other people in our community as forces or wills pitted against us—that is, when we stop seeing our relations to them as external—and begin to see others as internally related to us. Being internally related to others in our community means that our relations to others are essential to us, in the sense of defining who and what we are. By contrast, external relations make no difference to their terms. For example, my being in front of the Eiffel Tower is usually said to be an external relation I bear to that object—it does not make me a different person. Put roughly, the difference between a mere collection of people—such as those who went to the parade yesterday—and a community or social unit such as a family—lies in whether the relationships each person bears to the others in the group makes a difference to who and what they are. This internal bond is observed whenever a member of the community talks of what “we” believe, value, and so on. Here is the appearance of what has been called “we-intentionality.”
The next task is to show what provides the moral content for practical deliberations and choices about how to act. Most importantly, we want to know what specific types of actions or goals will allow us to realize ourselves. Here Bradley turns to historical ethical theories to determine whether they can supply what is wanted. Bradley examines teleological hedonism and deontological theories and finds both unacceptable. Deontological theories fail because they place no constraints on what can be willed by a moral agent and so no specific end is indicated and none barred. Deontology is one-sided and abstract: it has focused on the universal aspect of the will and disregarded the other, equally important particular element. What is in fact missing is any adequate psychological account of desire which explains how we are motivated to do specific things, to make specific choices. By contrast, ethical hedonism makes the opposite mistake of focusing on the particular to the detriment of the universal side. Classical Utilitarianism, for example, sees particular pleasant states as the goal of action but cannot present any of these as having any intrinsic value, for they are only means to the maximization of pleasure and could be replaced by any other means that were more, or equally, effective. Moreover—and this is an objection raised by all the British Idealists against hedonism—since pleasant states perish there is no sense in which a number of them can be enjoyed together as felt states rather than merely remembered. So, a sum of pleasures or a maximum of pleasures cannot be the end moral agents are to aim for.
There is another reason the British Idealists believed that pleasure could not be the end of moral action. Henry Sidgwick correctly expressed this objection: “It is said … by Mr. Green that ‘pleasure as feeling, in distinction from its conditions which are not feelings, cannot be conceived’; and, therefore, of course, cannot be taken as an end of rational action” (Hedonism and the Ultimate Good, p.36). The debate Green is weighing in on concerns what can and cannot be the intentional objects of desires. Sidgwick claims that Green's argument trades on an ambiguous use of ‘conceive’. We might not be able to “form the notion of an angle without the notion of the sides containing it,” says Sidgwick, but we can see that an angle is greater than or equal to another “without any comparison of the containing sides” (loc. cit.). This misses the point. It is not that I have to compare sides in order to ascertain the size of an angle, but rather that our conception of an angle entails the notion of a space contained, as it were, between two lines that meet at a point and we cannot ‘think’ of a ‘mere angle’ in the sense of an unbounded spatial quantity. Applied to pleasures, the issue is whether there are naked pleasures, as it were, and whether one can attach any meaning to the idea of a pleasure detached from the activity or whatever it is that is the pleasant experience. Bradley made a similar point in Ethical Studies: pleasure and pain are feelings which “are as they are felt to be, but they tell us nothing. In a word they have no content: they are states of us, but they have nothing for us (Ethical Studies, p. 94). If we cannot characterize pleasures—because they have no meaning or content in and of themselves—then we cannot identify with them and so they could not be the objects aimed at in rational choice, as Green had said.
Mill had in effect rejected this view by accepting that pleasures display qualitative differences. Bradley recognizes that we talk as though they do, using expressions which appear to entail that pleasures and pains have immediately given felt qualities but he offers an explanation of why this is. He starts with the observation that while it is uncertain whether all sensations are ”coloured by pain and pleasure“ it is certain that ”without sensation we never have pleasure or pain“ (Collected Essays, p. 244). Just as sensations never occur apart from some psychic context, which may make a significant difference to the sensation, neither do pleasures and pains ”exist apart from sensation“ (Collected Essays, p. 245). He goes on to assert that ”pains and pleasures have no qualities of their own,“ it being ”the quality of the sensations, or arrangements of sensations, which we place to their credit. The kinds of pains which have been urged in disproof of the above, the feelings that shoot or that burn or gnaw, are each due to the special sort of sensations, together with the rhythm of intensity in the pain“ (loc cit). If this is true, it offers a reason why we might mistake a quantitative for a qualitative difference, namely, that we mistake variations in sensory intensities and intensity-patterns over time, with which pleasure is attached or attendant, for qualitative differences in the pleasures themselves. Given that further features of the overall experience are said to be attributable to the powers of the sensations, these—rather than the pains and pleasures—appear to be the causal agents. If this interpretation is correct, pains and pleasures are epiphenomena. For present purposes the importance of this is that it bolsters the Idealists' argument that pleasure cannot be the end of rational action, leave alone the ultimate end of moral action. It also explains the so-called Paradox of Hedonism.
Both of these views—hedonism and deontology—approach morality from the perspective of the individual person. This individual is treated as a fully formed moral agent independent of any social relations. Each is able to decide what is morally required by consulting a formal principle in their mind (e.g., the Kantian categorical imperative) or their own feeling states. In responding to individualism, which he thinks ultimately rests on a false theory of human nature, Bradley's worry as far as morality is concerned is that it reflects a kind of egoistic antagonism to other people that makes morality impossible: if the self we are ”to realize is an atom, a unit which repels other units, and can have nothing in itself but what is exclusively its, its feelings, its pleasure and pain—then it is certain that it can stand to others, with their pleasures and pains, only in external relation; and since it is the end, the others must be the means, and nothing but the means. On such a basis morality is impossible É“ (Ethical Studies, p, 115). It is impossible because, since morality requires being an organic whole, social relations that are external defeat that goal. The sort of confrontational individualism in which each asserts his or her will against the wills of others generates the intolerable situation that contract theories take to be the motivation for creating the social contract, which in its turn becomes another form of external constraint on individuals that prevents the community from becoming anything other than a mere collection of egoistic, atomic individuals.
In opposition to individualism Bradley endorses the thesis of holism. Debates pitting individualism and holism against each other usually focus either on questions about explanations or on questions about the essential nature of social creatures such as human beings. Methodological individualism takes a position on the first of these, claiming that the explanation of the behavior of collective or corporate entities requires reduction to the beliefs, aims, and desires of individuals making up that collective. There has recently been some interesting literature on this debate, expressed in terms of whether corporations and other groups can be said to have a perspective (a set of beliefs and values) such that it would be appropriate to say that the collective itself has beliefs, desires, and so on, thereby exhibiting a form of collective intentionality (we-intentionality) that is not reducible to the intentional mental states of its members (e.g., French and Wettstein's Shared Intentions and Collective Responsibility). Bradley at times talks of society and the state in ways which suggest he would accept the position of the proponents of collective intentionality, and perhaps he must commit to it if the argument for metaphysical holism, which is his main concern, goes through.
The metaphysical thesis claims that individuals are what they are because of their social relations. To the extent that Bradley offers anything in the way of argument for this position he tends to lean rather heavily on empirical evidence which shows us that people born at different times and places, and born into this or that cultural or religious or ethnic group, will tend to inherit the practices and attitudes of those by whom they are raised. He does think of children as born with certain natural needs and desires and with certain aptitudes and latent possibilities; but these need nurturing and some of these tendencies need to be ”civilized“, the effect being: ”These ‘civilized tendencies’, if we may use the phrase, are part of the essence of the child: he would only partly (if at all) be himself without them; he owes them to his ancestors, and his ancestors owe them to society“ (Ethical Studies, p. 170). Against the individualist who objects that there was, nevertheless, a point at which there were no societies but only individuals, he elicits the aid of Darwin in support of the view that humans have always been social, having evolved from social animals. But Bradley has a more interesting argument for holism which enters on language. The language a community speaks has to be truly public, with understood and accepted meanings for its central terms, on pain of ending with nobody ever understanding what anyone else is talking about. The language also has, embedded in it as it were, the values and beliefs of the community that speaks it. In passing on its language to the children a society is passing on its values, its understanding of its institutions and so on. As Bradley says, for each child, learning to speak the language ”carries into his mind the ideas and sentiments of the race É and stamps them in indelibly“ This child also observes and comes to participate in the practices of the society: he ”grows up in an atmosphere of example and general custom“ (Ethical Studies, p. 172).
Holism has ramifications for the theory of self-realization, because if one's social relations are constitutive of what one is then the self is only realized when it recognizes and endorses the duties it has as a member of a community—a family, a state, and so on. At this point the self's perspective shifts from the subjective feelings and goals of the individual to the idea of moral obligations that are objective, in that they hold for all in the community, and also objective in that one has them no matter what personal desires one might have. Of course, with the recognition that one is a member of the community the situation will not be construed as ”them“ forcing ”me’ to behave a certain way; but will give rise to genuine collective intentionality, to viewing things in terms of what we believe and value.
One key thing that happens at this stage is that the idea of realizing the self is now given specific content. Earlier we saw the moral agent, the moral self, in terms of the formal structure of volitional action, but here we see a self that has specific content attached to its realization or perfecting of itself, for the communal morality indicates what is expected of someone if they wish to be regarded as a virtuous member of that moral community. Moreover, society offers the homogeneity and specificity that moral development demands: social life not only provides a greater degree of homogeneity, in that it removes the dualism of oneself and others, but it provides an expansion of the self through the greater diversity (specificity) found in living with others, since that communal life expands one's experience beyond what is available to her as a mere, isolated, individual. Again, we have movement in the direction of being an infinite whole because relations previously thought to be external to the individual—and thereby limiting factors—are now seen as internal to the self.
In passing, it is interesting to consider why Bradley approves of following the feelings of the phronimos—the person of practical wisdom—when he has no faith in the judgments of Mill's competent judges who are said to be able to rank pleasures and no confidence in Mill's Moral Almanac (Utilitarianism, Chapter 2). The difference is that Mill's experts are simply reporting their own personal feelings—which are not authoritative, for anyone else could disagree and there is no test available to determine who is right—and the Moral Almanac is merely a collection of these sorts of experiences; while, by contrast, the phronimos has, through long experience within his society, come to identify with the values of that society and so his judgments and choices reflect these values. The social norms have become such a part of who he is that he need not think about what to do but has an intuitive “feel” for what morality demands (Ethical Studies, p. 196). If this is correct, it seems then that the phronimos no longer feels any conflict between the particular self he is and the self he ought to be as a member of society. Bradley noted Goethe's directive to “Be a whole or join a whole,” which he amended to, “You can not be a whole, unless you join a whole” (Ethical Studies, p.79). This is what the phronimos has done, thereby transforming his external relations to others in society into the internal relations characteristic of parts of an organic unity. (Whether this means that the phronimos is therefore not able to be an inspiration or a spur to initiating social change, or is unable himself to rise to the level of Ideal Morality, is a question Bradley does not address. But it should be the case, for the phronimos no longer retains the degree of residual individuality which is required by the next level of morality, Ideal Morality.)
Bradley has two reservations about the morality of the community. First, there are some ways of realizing or perfecting oneself that appear to have nothing to do with morality proper or with society, which raises a question about the limits of morality, about whether the demands of self-realization go beyond the moral obligation to perfect oneself as a member of society. Does the artist have an obligation to perfect her talents? If so, is this a moral obligation? Bradley notes that it seems reasonable to say that we will not realize ourselves if we fail to develop our talents and abilities and he even feels some temptation to call this a moral obligation—or at least an obligation of some sort—while at the same time admitting that there are spheres of activity that are or should be free of obligation, where we are left to our own devices. In saying this he is admitting that individualism is not totally wrong, for even members of a community remain individuals pursuing their own separate plans and projects, albeit within the framework of the community's social and political institutions and its normative understandings and commitments. The second reservation is that the reflective individual may come to feel that her society is wrong in some respect or is in what Bradley calls a “rotten” condition. While it may not be clear what ‘rotten’ would mean or how one would determine whether a society was in this condition or not, it is clear that change can be urged if we discover a contradiction in the moral views of our society. For example, if the constitution claimed all are equal before the law yet specific laws denied benefits or access to the institutions of the state to some group, then we would have a contradiction. Denying same sex partners the opportunity to marry and enjoy whatever rights and social benefits that go along with that status may be relevant contemporary example. Given this possibility, there has to be some scope for revising social rules and political institutions, which means one would be opposing society's moral values and in doing this, more or less opposing oneself in that one's moral perspective has been inherited from members of that society, from the ancestors. In this case the opposition between the subjective self and the superior moral self identified with the community breaks out again, which then becomes the impetus to a change in moral values.
This illuminates Bradley's remark that social morality is both absolute and relative. The morality of one's society has a prima facie claim on individual members and so is absolute in the sense that no one is free simply to go her own way; yet the social morality may change for the same reasons the perspective of an individual might change—for example, because of the discovery of new facts or with the revelation of a contradiction which forces a re-thinking of present values—and so they are only relative. Thus, while the individual has a prima facie obligation to be as good as his society he also has the obligation to be reflective about social morality and to determine whether it requires modification.
What remains to be explained is how the moral consciousness arises, and Bradley's account, not surprisingly, depends on the fact that children are raised in a social environment and will learn by experience. At an early stage of mental life the child will experience pleasure from some object—say an apple—and transfers the pleasant sensation to the object, so that it becomes part of the content of the apple, a part of what that object means to the child, or, better, a part of what the child sees in that object. The child generates an appetite for objects of this sort and in the presence of an apple the child will have a mixed reaction: a pleasant feeling because the object is seen as pleasant, but a painful feeling because she is not in possession of, or enjoying, the apple. This produces a felt tension—“felt” because it is occurring at a pre-cognitive level, before the child has beliefs about the object is or able to make inferences about the object based on past experience. This felt tension is desire and it moves the child to action, to try to take physical possession of it. Bradley's psychological account differs from the hedonist's in that whereas hedonism holds that a particular pleasure is willed, Bradley claims that the ideal object willed is a particular thing which has had a pleasant quality transferred to it and thereby attributed to the thing itself. Moreover, on Bradley's account the will—once we get to the stage of having a fully developed self capable of having a will—is actually seeking the object willed because it represents the satisfaction of the self following the process of identification. However, at this stage we have at best a very primitive precursor of the self and it can only be said to affirm itself. That is, it lacks the developed consciousness necessary to representing ideal objects. Moreover, the child at this stage lacks the higher-order consciousness needed to see itself as realizing itself by attaining an ideal object with which it has identified its satisfaction. It only “affirms” itself in that it puts its will into the world as its appetites and desires respond to sensible objects and in this its unarticulated objective is to possess the thing it desires. At this early stage the child desires the object only when it is present; at a later stage the child will gain a sense of these things as independent external objects that persist, ceteris paribus, and so can be desired in their absence.
The child also experiences other people and is eventually going to recognize them as individuals with independent wills—i.e., as others who have their own plans and projects and as selves attempting to realize themselves through their actions, and who, because of these facts, may oppose or confirm its own desires, oppose its will. Since initially these others are going to be family members or care-givers there will be a pre-conscious bond of affection between them and the child. When the child acts in accord with the will of another, pleasure results from the affirmation from that other person, while opposition is experienced as painful because it negates the bond of affection. This produces the felt tension similar to that which occurs in the case of an inaccessible desired object: a tension between the pleasure associated with the presence of the care-giver and the pain of being without the approval of that person. The main point here is that the child will tend to be good (i.e., fit in with the norms and expectations of the caregivers) solely because not doing so is painful, not because the child has, at this stage, any goal it is trying to achieve by being good, nor even the ability to articulate why it acts as it does. As Bradley says, “The child is taught to will a content which is universal and good, and he learns to identify his will with it, so that he feels pleasure when he feels himself in accord with it, uneasiness or pain when his will is contrary thereto, and he feels that it is contrary. This is the beginning of personal morality” (Ethical Studies, p. 178).
As the child develops it learns the language of morality and thereby the moral perspective embedded in it. In this process the child learns the meaning of normative concepts and in doing so learns what they mean to others in the shared linguistic community. In this way the social community imparts a moral perspective. In fact, the community introduces the child to two levels of moral reflection: it imparts specific moral values and norms through its institutions and practices, and; it provides the moral concepts that are necessary to the task of conceiving of ways to improve society, in this way making possible the move to the more comprehensive level of Ideal Morality.
The above rehearsal glosses over several identifiable stages of moral development set out in Bradley's moral psychology. These details can be ignored here, for the important point to note is that Bradley attempts to supple a psychological account of moral development that fills in the final part of his exposition of the theory of self-realization by explaining how one comes to identify one's satisfaction with the achieving or realizing of particular moral ends. It is also important to note the roles he assigns to pleasure and pain. That these have a place in his moral theory indicates that the ethical hedonists were not totally wrong about their importance, their mistake being to think that promoting pleasure and diminishing pain marks the ultimate goal of moral activity. By contrast, Bradley argues that in acting morally we choose and will and act in terms of the idea of a state of affairs which represents a superior self to be realized. We feel pleasure at the thought of that self with which we have identified because we feel affirmed by the thought of its realization. We feel pain at the felt contradiction between this and our actual self and pain at the thought of not being the superior self we desire.
Bradley's excursion into moral psychology represents an effort to explain the process whereby one identifies one's satisfaction with a particular ideal object, which is an essential element in the structure of volitional action. He traces the transitions from a very primitive state of mental life through to the sort of consciousness exhibited by a mature moral agent. From primitive appetites which involve a precursor self that affirms itself through its desires we arrive at a variety of types of actions and of objects of volition and different relations between the self and the objects. Children move from the simple desire to possess the object to the pleasure taken in the approval of others, to self-conscious moral action and its pleasures. These stages also reveal the development of feelings and emotions and an increasing range of types of object that one might take pleasure in. In other words, there is an extension of the individual's range of interests and these move out beyond desired objects to an interest in other people and future events and so on. In this process the self is developing its conception of itself and once it recognizes that its fate is tied to that of society we have a social self that does not see itself as being indifferent to the interests of others.
An important feature of this developmental process is gaining knowledge of good and bad and the capacity to will both. The need for this arises, first, at the formal level of the structure of volitional action, which entails the dualism of inferior and superior selves (or conceptions of these). To get beyond formal necessary conditions to an account of specific actions this formal structure has to be filled in with some determinate content which explains what the nature of these two selves is. At the level of social morality this may involve no more than knowledge of what society demands of me—which I will identify as the superior, good self I should be—alongside my tendencies to go my own way which marks the bad self that opposes the social norms. But there must be more than mere knowledge, for it is also necessary, psychologically, that we actually feel the tension produced by the conflicting tendencies to be both good and bad. It is not simply that one fails to comprehend fully the nature of moral action without this, but that we also cannot feel the contradictions that will move us to action, and without action there is no morality. Hence, the common notion that moral agents are often viewed as having to expend a great deal of effort on the internal struggle between the desire to be good and a propensity to do things known to be bad is correct. In Bradley's theory the ultimate moral end of self-realization presents two pictures of the self, labels one of these “superior” and sets the moral task as realizing that superior self in the face of the actual, inferior self. In this way moral conflicts are always internal struggles. In acting morally I aim at realizing my good self, which I see as my true self. Yet I cannot in good faith say that my bad self is not myself, with the result that, as Bradley rather picturesquely puts it, “when I enter the lists against it, it is at my own breast that I lay my lance in rest” (Ethical Studies, p. 277).
Unfortunately, this also marks the final tension that renders morality a self-contradiction. To the extent that people have both a good and a bad self, they are a “self-contradiction,” and if these are necessary to morality as Bradley's suggests they are then the ultimate moral end of action—self-realization as an infinite whole—cannot be achieved. As he puts it, “we are a self-contradiction: we never are what we feel we really are; we really are what we know we are not; and if we became what we are, we should scarcely be ourselves” (Ethical Studies, p. 234). Morality really seeks its own demise for were the ideal self realized there would be nothing that remains to be actualized, at which point morality is at an end. “Morality aims at the cessation of that which makes it possible” (loc. cit.) This parallels Bradley's metaphysical position: if thought actually were to capture the supra-relational unity that is Reality, thought would have to have passed beyond itself, committing what Bradley calls “thought's happy suicide.” Because thought by its very nature analyzes and abstracts it cannot ever express the unity that Reality is and which is only dimly felt in immediate experience. Similarly for morality: “it is the effort after non-morality, and it presses forward beyond itself to a super-moral sphere where it ceases to exist as such” (loc. cit.). Indeed, some writers think we can pass beyond morality into the sphere of religion. One advantage of this is that we might find an ideal moral type—say the Jesus of Christianity - which provides an example of the ideal self we should be aiming at. In fact it could be claimed that in religion the self that is only ideal in morality is actual in the religious experience. But at the end of the day Bradley believes that the old moral dichotomy between good and bad will break out again, with ‘sin’ replacing the ‘bad’ of morality. Thus, disharmony arises necessarily, and the moral self is not realized in religious experience.
None of this should surprise us. Bradley's view is that every study, whether it is of morality or the natural world or religion or whatever, begins from some working hypotheses. It is the job of metaphysics to lay bare these hypotheses and show how they all fit together. Were the final picture put together we would have an absolute and finished view of reality. But attaining this comprehensive and coherent view is impossible because of the nature of thought, and so the role of the notion of the Absolute—a coherent, comprehensive conception of Reality—has the logic of a limiting case. In morality we similarly seek an ideal self, one that is homogeneous (coherent) but also fully specified (comprehensive), but this is not attainable, as we have seen, thereby demonstrating that the notion of an ideal self that is an infinite whole also has the logic of a limiting case. It may guide our moral thinking and our practical reasoning, but it does not represent a condition anyone can achieve. Once we recognize that the end is not attainable, that is the end of morality, and this is not a result of weakness on the part of moral agents but a result of the logical structure of volitional choice.
Bradley never produced a book on political philosophy and the few published papers touching on social and political themes present views that do not diverge from the position he set out in Ethical Studies, in particular, in the fifth essay, My Station and its Duties. From that text we can see that Bradley would have sided with the Twentieth Century communitarians who opposed the individualistic political theories of Rawls and Nozick (see Kymlicka, Chapter 4). In terms of the more recent debates about Liberal neutrality (see Wall and Klosko'sPerfectionism and Neutrality)—in which the liberals advance the claim that that political institutions and society's laws and institutional structures are not to reflect any particular conception of the good—Bradley would undoubtedly have sided with the opponents of neutrality who think cultural, ethnic, religious and other such groups have a set of values that are central to who they are and which they rightly feel need protecting. Similarly, Bradley's views on individual rights are consistent with the social holism of “My Station.” He opposed natural rights, taking rights to be social constructs. Indeed, in a paper in 1894 he allied himself with the Utilitarians in claiming that the general welfare takes precedence over the rights of individuals and went so far as to say that “the right of the moral organism is absolute” over and against the rights of its members (Collected Essays, p. 158). In one discussion of punishment he takes seriously the “principle of social surgery” taken as “the right and the duty of the organism to suppress its undesirable growths” (Collected Essays, p. 152). All of this is consistent with the claim in Ethical Studies that the moral standards and demands of the society—and by implication, acceptance of society's political institutions—have a prima facie claim on the individual members of that society.
Bradley also recognized the importance of social nurturing and teaching that raise a human being from the level of its basic desires and impulses to the level at which she becomes, and is recognized as, a rational moral agent. Only if one has learned the normative language of the community and shows by one's behavior that the values and standards are understood, and that one is able to act with them in mind, does a person get recognized as a member of the moral community and treated as a full and equal member who can be reasoned with and who will take the values embedded in, and reflected in, society's social and political institutions into consideration in her volitional action. Social and political institutions are not created by atomic individuals out of some pre-social primordial material, and this marks the place that contract theories of the state go wrong. Their basic error is to think that talk of individuals abstracted from all social relations would have any meaning. This error is compounded by assuming that individuals are pure rational calculators without emotional attachments to others around them who enter into social cooperation only for personal gain. This error then gets connected to the earlier error in theories such as Locke's when it is claimed that these abstract atomic individuals enter the contracting situation with a bundle of natural rights which they hold as perpetual constraints on what others can do. Bradley and all the British Idealists thought that contract theories and individualistic approaches to social and political relations were grounding their political philosophies on false views of human nature and human society. In a word, their basic errors were mistakes in metaphysics.
Although he never developed what could be called a political theory, Bradley's contemporaries realized that he had done a service by exposing some of the errors of popular political theories of the day and by stressing the organic view of societies and individual members' places in it. In other words, his contemporaries tended to think that he had said what he mainly wanted to say about social and political matters in the fifth essay of Ethical Studies, in My Station and its Duties.
- Bradley, F. H., Appearance and Reality, 2nd edition. Oxford: Clarendon, 1930.
- Bradley, F. H., Collected Essays, Oxford: Clarendon, 1935.
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- Keene, Carol, 2009, “The Interplay of Bradley's Social and Moral Philosophy,” in William Sweet (ed.), The Moral, Social and Political Philosophy of the British Idealists, Exeter and Charlottesville: Imprint Press, pp. 87–110.
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- Wall, Steven, and Klosko, George (eds.), 2003, Perfectionism and Neutrality: Essays in Liberal Theory, New York and Oxford: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Wollheim, Richard, 1959, F. H. Bradley, Harmondsworth and Baltimore: Penguin.
- Wollheim, Richard, 1993, The Mind and Its Depths, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
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