Causal Processes

First published Sun Dec 8, 1996; substantive revision Mon Sep 10, 2007

Taking their point of departure from what science tells us about the world rather than from our everyday concept of a ‘process’, philosophers interested in analysing causal processes have tended to see the chief task to be to distinguish causal processes such as atoms decaying and billiard balls moving across the table from pseudo processes such as moving shadows and spots of light. These philosophers claim to have found, in the notion of a causal process, a key to understanding causation in general.

1. Russell's Theory of Causal Lines

An important forerunner of contemporary notions of causal processes is Bertrand Russell's account of causal lines. This may be surprising to those who are more accustomed to associate the name ‘Bertrand Russell’ with scepticism about causation. Russell's 1912/13 paper, ‘On the Notion of Cause’, is famous for the quote,

The law of causality, I believe, like much that passes muster among philosophers, is a relic of a bygone age, surviving, like the monarchy, only because it is erroneously supposed to do no harm. (Russell, 1913, p. 1).

In that paper Russell argued that the philosopher's concept of causation involving, as it does, the law of universal determinism that every event has a cause and the associated concept of causation as a relation between events, is “otiose” and in modern science is replaced by the concept of causal laws understood in terms of functional relations, where these causal laws are not necessarily deterministic.

However, in a later book written in 1948, entitled Human Knowledge Bertrand Russell outlines a similar view but does so in language which is much more flattering to causation. He still holds that the philosophical idea of causation should be seen as a primitive version of the scientific idea of causal laws. Nevertheless, his emphasis now is on certain postulates of causation which he takes to be fundamental to scientific (inductive) inference, and Russell's aim is to show how scientific inference is possible.

The problem with thinking about causal laws as the underpinning of scientific inference is that the world is a complex place, and while causal laws might hold true, they often do not obtain because of preventing circumstances, and it is impractical to bring in innumerable ‘unless’ clauses. But, even though there is infinite complexity in the world, there are also causal lines of quasi-permanence, and these warrant our inferences.

Russell elaborates these ideas into five postulates which he says are necessary “to validate scientific method” (1948, p. 487). The first is ‘The Postulate of Quasi-permanence’ which states that there is a certain kind of persistence in the world, for generally things do not change discontinuously. The second postulate, ‘Of Separable Causal Lines’, allows that there is often long term persistence in things and processes. The third postulate, ‘Of Spatio-temporal Continuity’ denies action at a distance. Russell claims “when there is a causal connection between two events that are not contiguous, there must be intermediate links in the causal chain such that each is contiguous to the next, or (alternatively) such that there is a process which is continuous.” (1948, p. 487). ‘The Structural Postulate’, the fourth, allows us to infer from structurally similar complex events ranged about a centre to an event of similar structure linked by causal lines to each event. The fifth postulate, ‘Of Analogy’ allows us to infer the existence of a causal effect when it is unobservable.

The key postulate concerns the idea of causal lines or, in our terminology, causal processes. Russell's 1948 view is that causal lines replace the primitive notion of causation in the scientific view of the world, and not only replace but also explain the extent to which the primitive notion, causation, is correct. He writes,

The concept “cause”, as it occurs in the works of most philosophers, is one which is apparently not used in any advanced science. But the concepts that are used have been developed from the primitive concept (which is that prevalent among philosophers), and the primitive concept, as I shall try to show, still has importance as the source of approximate generalisations and pre-scientific inductions, and as a concept which is valid when suitably limited. (1948, p. 471).

Russell also says, “When two events belong to one causal line the earlier may be said to ‘cause’ the later. In this way laws of the form ‘A causes B’ may preserve a certain validity.” (1948, p. 334). So Russell can be seen, in his 1948 book, as proposing the view that within limits causal lines, or causal processes, may be taken to analyse causation. So what is a causal line? Russell writes,

I call a series of events a “causal line” if, given some of them, we can infer something about the others without having to know anything about the environment. (1948, p. 333).
A causal line may always be regarded as a persistence of something, a person, a table, a photon, or what not. Throughout a given causal line, there may be constancy of quality, constancy of structure, or gradual changes in either, but not sudden change of any considerable magnitude. (1948, pp. 475-7).

So the trajectory through time of something is a causal line if it doesn't change too much, and if it persists in isolation from other things. A series of events which display this kind of similarity display what Russell calls ‘quasi-permanence’.

The concept of more or less permanent physical object in its common-sense form involves “substance”, and when “substance” is rejected we have to find some other way of defining the identity of a physical object at different times. I think this must be done by means of the concept “causal line”. (1948, p. 333).

Elsewhere Russell writes,

The law of quasi-permanence as I intend it … is designed to explain the success of the common-sense notion of “things” and the physical notion of “matter” (in classical physics). … a “thing” or a piece of matter is not to be regarded as a single persistent substantial entity, but as a string of events having a certain kind of causal connection with each other. This kind is what I call “quasi-permanence”. The causal law that I suggest may be enunciated as follows: “Given an event at a certain time, then at any slightly earlier or slightly later time there is, at some neighbouring place, a closely similar event”. I do not assert that this happens always, but only that it happens very often- sufficiently often to give a high probability to an induction confirming it in a particular case. When “substance” is abandoned, the identity, for commonsense, of a thing or a person at different times must be explained as consisting in what may be called a “causal line”. (1948, pp. 475-7).

This has relevance for the question of identity through time, and in Human Knowledge we find that Bertrand Russell sees that there is an important connection between causal process and identity, namely, that the concept of a causal line can be used to explain the identity through time of an object or a person.

So what we may call Russell's causal theory of identity (Dowe, 1999) asserts that the identity over time of an object or a person consists in the different temporal parts of that person being all part of the one causal line. This is the causal theory of identity (Armstrong, 1980) couched in terms of causal processes or lines. A causal line in turn is understood by way of an inference which is licensed by the law of quasi permanence.

2. Objections to Russell's Theory

Wesley Salmon has urged a number of objections against Russell's theory of causal lines. (1984, p. 140-5). The first objection is that Russell's theory is couched in epistemic terms rather than ontological terms, yet causation is itself an ontic matter not an epistemic matter. Russell's account is formulated in terms of how we make inferences. For example, Russell says

A “causal line,” as I wish to define the term, is a temporal series of events so related that, given some of them, something can be inferred about the others whatever may be happening elsewhere. (1948, p. 459).

Salmon's criticism of this is precisely that it is formulated in epistemic terms, “for the existence of the vast majority of causal processes in the history of the universe is quite independent of human knowers.” (1984, p. 145). Salmon, as we shall see in the next section, develops his account of causal processes as an explicitly ‘ontic’, as opposed to an ‘epistemic’ account. (1984, ch. 1).

There is a further reason why Russell's epistemic approach is unacceptable. While it is true that causal processes do warrant inferences of the sort Russell has in mind, it is not the case that all rational inferences are warranted by the existence (‘postulation’, in Russell's thinking) of causal lines. There are other types of causal structures besides a causal line. Russell himself gives an example: two clouds of incandescent gas of a given element both emit the same spectral lines, but are not causally connected. (1948, p. 455). Yet we may rightly make inferences from one to the other. A pervasive type of case is where two events are not directly causally connected but have a common cause.

The second objection is that Russell's theory of a causal line does not enable the distinction between pseudo and causal processes to be made, yet to delineate causal from pseudo processes is a key issue which needs to be addressed by any theory of causal processes. As Reichenbach argued (1958, pp. 147-9), as he reflected on the implications of Einstein's special theory of relativity, science requires that we distinguish between causal and pseudo processes. Reichenbach noticed that the central principle that nothing travels faster than the speed of light is ‘violated’ by certain processes. For example, a spot of light moving along a wall is capable of moving faster than the speed of light. (One needs just a powerful enough light and a wall sufficiently large and sufficiently distant.) Other examples include shadows, and the point of intersection of two rulers (see Salmon's clear exposition in his 1984, pp. 141-4). Such pseudo processes, as we shall call them (Reichenbach called them “unreal sequences”; 1958, pp. 147-9), do not violate special relativity, Reichenbach argued, simply because they are not causal processes, and the principle that nothing travels faster than the speed of light applies only to causal processes. Thus special relativity demands a distinction between causal and pseudo processes. But Russell's theory doesn't explain this distinction, because both causal processes and pseudo processes display constancy of structure and quality; and both licence inferences of the sort Russell has in mind. For example, the phase velocity of a wave packet is a pseudo process but the group velocity is a causal process; yet both licence reliable predictions.

3. Salmon's Mark Transmission Theory

In this section we consider Wesley Salmon's theory of causality as presented in his book Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World (1984). Although it draws on the work of Reichenbach and Russell, Salmon's theory is highly original and contains many innovative contributions. Salmon's broad objective is to offer a theory which is consistent with the following assumptions: (a) causality is an objective feature of the world; (b) causality is a contingent feature of the world; (c) a theory of causality must be consistent with the possibility of indeterminism; (d) the theory should be (in principle) time-independent so that it is consistent with a causal theory of time; (e) the theory should not violate Hume's strictures concerning ‘hidden powers’.

Salmon treats causality as primarily a characteristic of continuous processes rather than as a relation between events. His theory involves two elements, the production and the propagation of causal influence. (See, for example, 1984, p. 139.) The latter is achieved by causal processes. Salmon defines a process as anything that displays consistency of structure over time. (1984, p.144). To distinguish between causal and pseudo processes (which Reichenbach called “unreal sequences”; 1958, pp. 147-9). Salmon makes use of Reichenbach's ‘mark criterion’: a process is causal if it is capable of transmitting a local modification in structure (a ‘mark’) (1984, p. 147). Drawing on the work of Bertrand Russell, Salmon seeks to explicate the notion of ‘transmission’ by the ‘at-at theory’ of mark transmission. The principle of mark transmission (MT) states:

MT: Let P be a process that, in the absence of interactions with other processes would remain uniform with respect to a characteristic Q, which it would manifest consistently over an interval that includes both of the space-time points A and B (AB). Then, a mark (consisting of a modification of Q into Q*), which has been introduced into process P by means of a single local interaction at a point A, is transmitted to point B if [and only if] P manifests the modification Q* at B and at all stages of the process between A and B without additional interactions. (1984, p. 148).

Salmon himself omits the ‘only if’ condition. However, as suggested by Sober (1987, p. 253), this condition is essential because the principle is to be used to identify pseudo processes on the grounds that they do not transmit a mark (Dowe, 1992b, p. 198). Thus for Salmon a causal process is one which can transmit a mark, and it is these spatiotemporally continuous processes that propagate causal influence.

To accompany this theory of the propagation of causal influence, Salmon also analyses the production of causal processes. According to Salmon, causal production can be explained in terms of causal forks, whose main role is the part they play in the production of order and structure of causal processes. The causal forks are characterised by statistical forks; to Reichenbach's ‘conjunctive fork’ Salmon has added the ‘interactive’ and ‘perfect’ forks, each corresponding to a different type of common-cause.

Firstly there is the ‘conjunctive fork’, where two processes arise from a special set of background conditions often in a non-lawful fashion. (Salmon, 1984, p. 179). In such a case we get a statistical correlation between the two processes which can be explained by appealing to the common cause, which ‘screens off’ the statistical connection. This is the principle of the common cause (due originally to Reichenbach (1956)) which, stated formally, is that if, for two events A and B,

(1) P(A.B) > P(A).P(B)

holds, then look for an event C such that

(2) P(A.B|C) = P(A|C).P(B|C)

The events A, B, and C form a conjunctive fork (For the full account see Salmon, 1984, ch. 6). In Salmon's theory of causality, conjunctive forks produce structure and order from ‘de-facto’ background conditions.(1984, p. 179).

Secondly, there is the ‘interactive fork’, where an intersection between two processes produces a modification in both (1984, p. 170) and an ensuing correlation between the two processes cannot be screened off by the common cause. Instead, the interaction is governed by conservation laws. For example, consider a pool table where the cue ball is placed in such a position relative to the eight ball that, if the eight ball is sunk in one pocket A , the cue ball will almost certainly drop into the other pocket B. There is a correlation between A and B such that equation (1) holds. But the common cause C, the striking of the cue ball, does not screen off this correlation. Salmon has suggested that the interactive fork can be characterised by the relation

(3) P(A.B|C) > P(A|C).P(B|C)

together with (1). (1978, p. 704, n. 31). Interactive forks are involved in the production of modifications in order and structure of causal processes. (1982, p. 265; 1984, p. 179). In this paper ‘interactive fork’ is used to mean precisely ‘a set of three events related according to equations (1) and (3)’.

The idea of a causal interaction is further analysed by Salmon in terms of the notion of mutual modification. The principle of causal interaction (CI) states:

CI: Let P1 and P2 be two processes that intersect with one another at the space-time S, which belongs to the histories of both. Let Q be a characteristic of that process P1 would exhibit throughout an interval (which includes subintervals on both sides of S in the history of P1) if the intersection with P2 did not occur; let R be a characteristic that process P2 would exhibit throughout an interval (which includes subintervals on both sides of S in the history of P2) if the intersection with P1 did not occur. Then, the intersection of P1 and P2 at S constitutes a causal interaction if (1) P1 exhibits the characteristic Q before S, but it exhibits a modified characteristic Q* throughout an interval immediately following S; and (2) P2 exhibits R before S but it exhibits a modified characteristic R′ throughout an interval immediately following S. (1984, p. 171).

Thirdly, there is the perfect fork, which is the deterministic limit of both the conjunctive and interactive fork. It is included as a special case because in the deterministic limit the interactive fork is indistinguishable from the conjunctive fork. (1984, pp. 177-8). Thus, a perfect fork could be involved in either the production of order and structure, or the production of changes in order and structure of causal processes.

4. Objections to Salmon's Mark Transmission Theory

The major objection against Samon's account of causal processes concerns the adequacy of the mark theory (Dowe, 1992a; 1992b; Kitcher, 1989). The mark transmission (MT) principle carries a considerable burden in Salmon's account, for it provides the criterion for distinguishing causal from pseudo processes. However, it has serious shortcomings in doing this. In fact, it fails on two counts: it excludes many causal processes; and it fails to exclude many pseudo processes. We shall consider each of these problems in turn.

1. MT excludes causal processes. Firstly, the principle requires that processes display a degree of uniformity over a time period. This distinguishes processes (causal and pseudo) from ‘spatiotemporal junk’, to use Kitcher's term. One problem with this is that it seems to exclude many causal effects which are short lived. For example, short lived subatomic particles play important causal roles, but they don't seem to qualify as causal processes. On any criterion there are causal processes which are ‘relatively short lived’. Also, the question concerning how long a regularity must persist raises philosophical difficulties about degrees which need answering before we have an adequate distinction between processes and spatiotemporal junk. However, if these were the only difficulties I think that the theory could be saved. Unfortunately, they are not.

More seriously, the MT principle requires that causal processes would remain uniform in the absence of interactions and that marks can be transmitted in the absence of additional interventions. However, in real situations processes are continuously involved in interactions of one sort or another.(Kitcher, 1989, p. 464). Even in the most idealised of situations interactions of sorts occur. For example, consider a universe that contains only one single moving particle. Not even this process moves in the absence of interactions, for the particle is forever intersecting with spatial regions. If we required that the interactions be causal (at the risk of circularity), then it is still true that in real cases there are many causal interactions continuously affecting processes. Even in carefully controlled scientific experiments there are many (admittedly irrelevant) causal interactions going on. Further, Salmon's central insight that causal processes are self propagating is not entirely well founded. For while some causal processes (light radiation, inertial motion) are self propagating, others are not. Falling bodies and electric currents are moved by their respective fields. (In particular there is no electric counterpart to inertia.) Sound waves are propagated within a medium, and simply do not exist ‘in the absence of interactions’. Such processes require a ‘causal background’, some can even be described as being a series of causal interactions. These causal processes cannot move in the absence of interactions. Thus there are a whole range of causal processes which are excluded by the requirement that they would remain uniform in the absence of any interactions.

It seems desirable, therefore, to abandon the requirement that a causal process is one that is capable of transmitting a mark in the absence of further interactions. However, the requirement is there for a reason, and that is that without it the theory is open to the objection that certain pseudo processes will count as being capable of transmitting marks. Salmon considers a case where a moving spot is marked by a red filter held up close to the wall. If someone ran alongside the wall holding up the filter, then it seems that the modification to the process is transmitted beyond the space-time locality of the original marking interaction. Thus there are problems if the requirement is kept, and there are problems if it is omitted. So it is not clear how the theory can be saved from the problem that some causal processes can not move in the absence of further interactions.

2. MT fails to exclude pseudo processes. Salmon's explicit intention in employing the MT principle is to show how pseudo processes are different from causal processes. If MT fails here then it fails its major test. However, a strong case can be made for saying that it does indeed fail this test.

Firstly, there are cases where pseudo processes qualify as being capable of transmitting a mark, because of the vagueness of the notion of a characteristic. We have seen that Salmon's approach to causality is to give an informal characterisation of the concepts of ‘production’ and ‘propagation’. In these characterisations, the primitive notions include ‘characteristic’, but nothing precise is said about this notion. While Salmon is entitled to take this informal approach, in this case more needs to be said about a primitive notion such as ‘characteristic’, at least indicating the range of its application, because the vagueness renders the account open to counter-examples.

For example, in the early morning the top (leading) edge of the shadow of the Sydney Opera House has the characteristic of being closer to the Harbour Bridge than to the Opera House. But later in the day (at time t say), this characteristic changes. This characteristic qualifies as a mark by IV, since it is a change in a characteristic introduced by the local intersection of two processes, namely, the movement of the shadow across the ground, and the (stationary) patch of ground which represents the midpoint between the Opera House and the Harbour Bridge. By III this mark which the shadow displays continuously after time t, is transmitted by the process. Thus, by II, the shadow is a causal process. This is similar to Sober's counter-example of where a light spot ‘transmits’ the characteristic of occurring after a glass filter is bolted in place. (1987, p. 254).

So there are some restrictions that need to be placed on the type of property allowed as a characteristic. Having the property of “occurring after a certain time” (Sober, 1987, p. 254),or the property of “being the shadow of a scratched car” (Kitcher, 1989, p. 638) or the property of “being closer to the Harbour Bridge than to the Opera House” (Dowe, 1992b, sec. 2.2) can qualify a shadow to be a causal process. There is a need to specify what kinds of properties can count as the appropriate characteristics for marking. It is not sufficient to say that the mark has to be introduced by a single local interaction, for as the above discussion suggests it is always possible to identify a single local interaction.

The difficulty lies in the type of characteristic allowed. A less informal approach to the subject might link ‘characteristic’ to ‘property’ of which there are precise philosophical accounts available. (For example, (Armstrong, 1978) ). Rogers takes this approach, defining the state of a process as the set of properties of the process at a given time. (Rogers, 1981, p. 203). A ‘law of non-interactive evolution’ gives the probability of the possible states at a later time, conditional on the actual state.

However, even if that approach were successful, there are difficulties of a different kind. There are cases of “derivative marks” (Kitcher, 1989, p. 463) where a pseudo process displays a modification in a characteristic on account of a change in the causal processes on which it depends. This change could either be in the source, or in the causal background. A change at the source would include cases where the spotlight spot is ‘marked’ by a coloured filter at the source (Salmon, 1984, p. 142) or a car's shadow is marked when a passenger's arm holds up a flag. (Kitcher, 1989, p. 463).

The clause ‘by means of a single local interaction’ is intended to exclude this type of example: but it is not clear that this works, for does not the shadow intersect with the modified sunlight pattern locally? It is true that the ‘modified sunlight pattern’ originated, or was caused by, the passenger raising his arm with the flag, but the fact that the marking interaction is the result of a chain of causes cannot be held to exclude those interactions, for genuine marking interactions are always the result of a chain of causal processes and interactions. (Kitcher, 1989, p. 464) Similarly, there is a local spacetime intersection of the spotlight spot and the red beam.

5. The Conserved Quantity Theory

The idea of appealing to conserved quantities has its forerunners in Aronson's and Fair's appeal to energy and momentum. (Aronson, 1971; Fair, 1979) But the first explicit formulation was given in a brief suggestion made by Skyrms in 1980, in his book Causal Necessity (1980, p. 111) and the first detailed conserved quantity theory by Dowe (1992). See also Salmon, 1994, 1998 and Dowe, 1995, 2000. As the versions of Salmon and Dowe vary it's worth giving both versions:

Dowe's version (1995, p. 323):

CQ1. A causal interaction is an intersection of world lines which involves exchange of a conserved quantity.

CQ2. A causal process is a world line of an object which possesses a conserved quantity.

Salmon's version (1997, pp. 462, 468):

Definition 1. A causal interaction is an intersection of world-lines that involves exchange of a conserved quantity.

Definition 2. A causal process is a world-line of an object that transmits a nonzero amount of a conserved quantity at each moment of its history (each spacetime point of its trajectory).

Definition 3. A process transmits a conserved quantity between A and B (A ? B) if it possesses [a fixed amount of] this quantity at A and at B and at every stage of the process between A and B without any interactions in the open interval (A, B) that involve an exchange of that particular conserved quantity.

A process is the world line of an object, regardless of whether or not it possesses any conserved quantities. A process can be either causal or non-causal (pseudo). A world line is the collection of points on a space-time (Minkowski) diagram which represents the history of an object. This means that processes are determinate regions, or ‘worms’, in space time. Such processes, or worms in space time, will normally be time-like; that is, every point on its world line lies in the future lightcone of the process' starting point.

An object is anything found in the ontology of science (such as particles, waves or fields), or common sense (such as chairs, buildings, or people). This will include non-causal objects such as spots and shadows. It is important to appreciate the difference between an object and a process. Loosely speaking, a process is the development over time of an object. Processes are usually extended in time.

Worms in space time which are not processes Kitcher calls ‘spatiotemporal junk’ (1989). Thus a representation on a space time diagram represents either a process or a piece of spatiotemporal junk, and a process is either a causal or a pseudo process. In a sense what counts as an object is unimportant; any old gerrymandered thing qualifies (except time-wise gerrymanders) (Dowe, 1995). In the case of a causal process what matters is whether the object possesses the right type of quantity. A shadow is an object but it does not possess the right type of conserved quantities; for example, a shadow cannot possess energy or momentum. It has other properties, such as shape, velocity, and position but possesses no conserved quantities. (The theory could be formulated in terms of objects: there are causal objects and pseudo objects. Causal objects are those which possess conserved quantities, pseudo objects are those which do not. Then a causal process is the world line of a causal object.)

A conserved quantity is any quantity which is universally conserved, and current scientific theory is our best guide as to what these are. For example, we have good reason to believe that mass-energy, linear momentum, and charge are conserved quantities.

An intersection is simply the overlapping in space time of two or more processes. The intersection occurs at the location consisting of all the space time points which are common to both (or all) processes. An exchange occurs when at least one incoming, and at least one outgoing process undergoes a change in the value of the conserved quantity, where ‘outgoing’ and ‘incoming’ are delineated on the space-time diagram by the forward and backward light cones, but are essentially interchangeable. The exchange is governed by the conservation law, which guarantees that it is a genuine causal interaction. It follows that an interaction can be of the form X, Y, λ, or of a more complicated form.

‘Possesses’ for Dowe is to be understood in the sense of ‘instantiates’. We suppose an object possesses energy if science attributes that quantity to that body. It does not matter whether that process transmits the quantity or not, nor whether the object keeps a constant amount of the quantity. It must simply be that the quantity may be truly predicated of the object.

6. Objections to the Conserved Quantity Theory

6.1 Objection 1: Worries about Omissions and Preventions.

If causation must involve a physical connection between a cause and its effect, than many everyday causal claims will not count as causation. ‘I killed the plant by not watering it’ (Beebee 2004). If this is a case of causation then process theories are in trouble, because neither my not watering nor whatever I did instead are connected by a physical process to the plant's dying. The same is true for ‘my failure to check the oil caused my engine to seize’. Cases of causation by omission, absence, preventing (ie causing to not happen) and double prevention (e.g., I prevent someone preventing an accident, Hall 2004) all raise the same difficulty. If these are cases of causation then the process theory cannot be right (Hausman 1998, pp. 15-16, Schaffer 2000, 2004).

There is a long tradition that asserts that such are indeed cases of causation. Lewis is adamant (1986, pp 198-93, 2004) and Schaffer presents a detailed case (2000, 2004). Others have denied these are indeed cases of causation (Aronson 1971, Dowe 1999, 2000, 2001, 2004, Armstrong 2004, Beebee 2004). Some extend their account of causation, in ways that depart from their respective central theses, to include such cases (Fair 1979, pp 246-7; Ehring1997, pp 125, 139; Lewis 2004). According to Hall (2004) and Persson (2002) these cases show that there are two concepts of causation. According to Reiber (2002, pp 63-4) the account of causation in terms of the transfer of properties can handle these cases by translating negatives into the actual positives that obtain.

Dowe and Armstrong hold that while such cases are not genuine causation, they count as a close relative, which Dowe variously calls causation* (1999, 2000) or ‘quasi causation’ (2001, compare Ehring 1997, pp 150-1). Persson (2002) coins the term ‘fake causation’. This relation is essentially a counterfactual about causation (see also Fair 1979, pp 246-7). While admitting Schaffer's (2000) point that there are cases of quasi-causation which by intuition clearly count as causation, Dowe asserts that there is also an intuition of difference- other cases of quasi-causation which intuitively are not causation (2001, see also Reiber 2002). For a detailed rebuttal of the intuition of difference see Schaffer (2004, pp. 209-11) and, from a Davidsonian perspective, Hunt (2005). Further, Dowe attempts to explain why we might confuse causation with quasi-causation by appealing to the similar roles they play in explanation, decision-making and inference, and justifies this similarity on the grounds of the relation between causation and quasi-causation (again, quasi-causation is essentially possible causation). Armstrong points out that another reason we might confuse the two concepts is that in practice it is often difficult to distinguish the two (2004).

Dowe offers the following account of quasi-causation:

Prevention: A prevented B if A occurred and B did not, and there occurred an x such that

(P1) there is a causal interaction between A and the process due to x, and

(P2) if A had not occurred, x would have caused B.

where A and B name positive events or facts, and x is a variable ranging over events and/or facts. (Dowe 2001, p. 221, see also 2000, ch 6.4)

For example, bumping the table (A) prevented the ball going into the pocket (B) because there is an interaction between bumping the table and the trajectory of the ball (x), a causal interaction, and the true counterfactual ‘without A, x would have caused B’.

One reason that the above is stated only as a sufficient condition is that there is a need to account for alternative preventers, of which there are two types, preemptive prevention (cf. preemption) and overprevention (cf. overdetermination), since in both cases (P3) fails. To deal with the latter, Dowe disjoins (P2) with

(P2′) there exists a C such that had neither A nor C occurred, x would have caused B or …(adapted from Dowe 2000, sec 6.4)

Suppose as well as bumping the table I also subsequently knocked the moving ball with my elbow (C), again, preventing it from sinking (overprevention). (P2) is false, but by (P2′) A counts as a quasi-cause of B. So too does C, since substituted for A, it satisfies P(1). Suppose on the other hand C is some completely irrelevant event, and (P1-2) hold for A and B. Then although (P2′) holds for this A-C pair C will not count as a preventer of B because it does not satisfy (P1). (For a contrary view see Koons 2003, pp. 246)

Although the account in Dowe (2000) is unclear on this point, (P2′) will not handle preemptive prevention. Suppose I bumped the table, but didn't hit the ball with my elbow, although I would have had I not bumped the table. We need to add the further alternative:

(P2″) had A not occurred, C would have occurred and would have prevented B.

The possible prevention here is then analysed by (P1-2) from the perspective of that possible world.

Quasi-causation by omissions or absences are analysed as follows:

Omission: not-A quasi-caused B if B occurred and A did not, and there occurred an x such that

(O1) x caused B, and

(O2) if A had occurred then A would have prevented B by interacting with x

where A and B name positive events/facts and x is a variable ranging over facts or events, and where prevention is analysed as above. (Dowe 2001, p 222, see also Dowe 2000, sec 6.5)

For example, being careful not to bump the table (not-A) quasi-caused the ball to sink (B) because the trajectory of the ball (x) causes B and had the table been bumped that would have prevented B. Further cases can be added: prevention by omission, and prevention of prevention, prevention of prevention of prevention, etc (see Dowe 2000, sec 6.6). There is indeed a great deal of quasi-causation around, as Beebee has argued (2004).

Schaffer offers two criticisms of the counterfactual theory of quasi-causation. First, he argues, Salmon's and Dowe's process theory of causation is, ironically, ill-equipped to tell us what genuine causation is in these possible worlds (i.e. the worlds one might take to be the truthmakers of the counterfactuals in P2 and O2) since theirs is only an account of causation in the actual world, and worse, if one follows the semantics of Lewis to deal with the counterfactuals, it will probably turn out that our conservation laws don't hold in those possible worlds (2001, p. 811). At the very least, Dowe's stated view that ‘it's BYO semantics of counterfactuals’ (2001, p. 221) is not satisfactory. (For further discussion of this problem see Persson 2002, pp. 139-140.) And second, the account is semantically unstable, since as Dowe asserts quasi-causation plays the same role as causation for explanation, decision theory and inference, that relation is a better deserver of the role of best fitting causation's connotations than Salmon-Dowe's ‘genuine causation’ (Dowe 2000, p. 296, n. 13; 2001, pp. 811-2).

6.2 Objection 2: Worries about Conserved Quantities

Conservation can be defined in terms of constancy within a closed system. As Hitchcock points out (1995, pp. 315-6) it would be circular to define a ‘closed system’ as one that is not involved in causal interactions with anything external. Dowe suggests ‘we need to explicate the notion of a closed system in terms only of the quantities concerned. For example, energy is conserved in chemical reactions, on the assumption that there is no net flow of energy into or out of the system.’ (2000, pp. 95) Schaffer comments that this ‘looks to invoke the very notion of “flow” that the process account is supposed to analyze’ (2001, pp. 810). McDaniel suggests two possible responses to this. First, the theory could simply list the quantities held to be relevant to causation, Second, the theory could appeal directly to universally conserved quantities, in other words, doing away with appeal to any closed system besides the universe itself (McDaniel 2002, pp. 261).

Sungho Choi (2003) has provided a thorough examination of possible definitions of a closed system, and proposes the following:

DC: A system is closed with respect to a physical quantity Q at a time t iff

  1. dQin/dt = dQout/dt = 0 at t or,
  2. dQin/dt ≠ - dQout/dt = 0 at t

where Qin is the amount of Q inside the system and is Qout the amount of Q outside the system. (2003, pp. 519). For vector quantities the definition must apply to all components of the vector. This, Choi argues, does not involve any circular appeal to causation.

Alexander Rueger (1998) has argued that since in some general relativistic spacetimes, global conservation laws can not be formulated it would seem to follow that in such a spacetime there would not be causal processes at all. Dowe's response is that our world is not such a spacetime (2000, pp. 97-8). (Ad hominem, this may be a particular problem for Dowe who argues elsewhere that time travel and hence causation is possible in such spacetimes. See Schaffer 2001, pp. 811)

John Norton (2007) while endorsing the Salmon–Dowe tack of not tying the theory to any particular conserved quantity since that leaves the theory hostage to scientific developments, nevertheless warns that “if we are permissive in selection of the conserved quantity, we risk trivialization by the construction of artificial conserved quantities specially tailored to make any chosen process come out as causal.” (2007, draft: p. 4).

6.3 Objection 3: Worries about Pseudo Processes.

The differences between Salmon and Dowe indicated above focus attention on the distinction between pseudo and causal processes. For Salmon it is important that the conserved quantity is transmitted, and indeed that a fixed quantity is transmitted in the absence of interactions, in order to rule out cases ‘accidental’ process-like energy appearances. Dowe has concerns about the directionality built into ‘transmission’, and instead attempts to rule out accidental processes via the identity through time of the object in question. So, for Salmon the spotlight spot does not transmit energy in the absence of interactions, but involves a continual string of interactions. For Dowe it is not the spot that possesses energy, but rather the various distinct patches of wall illuminated.

Hitchcock (1995) produces the following counterexample: consider an object casting a shadow on the surface of a charged plate. At each point of its trajectory the shadow ‘possesses’ a fixed charge. But shadows are the archetypical pseudo process. Dowe (2000, pp. 98-9) and Salmon (1997, p. 472) claim that it is the plate that possesses the charge, and the shadow that moves. Salmon however suggests that the more problematic ‘object’ is the series of plate segments currently in shadow (ibid), in Dowe's terminology a ‘time-wise gerrymander’. Salmon's answer to this it that this object does not transmit charge or else charge in a region would augment when the shadow passes over it, and he proposes to add the corollary to explicitly apply the conservation law to this kind of case (critiqued in detail by Choi 2002, pp. 110-14):

When two or more processes possessing a given conserved quantity intersect (whether they interact or not), the amount of that quantity in the region of intersection must equal the sum of the separate quantities possessed by the processes thus intersecting (Salmon 1997, p. 473).

On the other hand, Dowe's answer is that the worldline of the moving shadow is the worldline of an object that does not possess charge, while the ‘worldline’ of the segments of shadowed plate segments is not the worldline of an object. (But see McDaniel 2002, p. 260 and Garcia-Encinas 2004).

Sungho Choi (2002, pp. 114-5) offers a further counterexample to Salmon's version. Suppose the plate contains a boundary such that there is twice as much charge density on one side compared to the other. Suppose the shadow crosses from the lower density to the higher density. Consider the worldlines of (i) the gerrymandered object which is the segments of plate when crossed by the shadow and (ii) the segment of plate just before the boundary. Their intersection will count as a causal interaction on Salmon's account since the worldline in (i) exhibits a change in the conserved quantity.

6.4 Objection 4: Worries about Causal Relevance.

This is a generalisation of the concern in Objection 3. Salmon and Dowe claim that they are offering a theory of causation, yet each acknowledge one way or another that the definitions above at best give just a necessary condition for two events to be related as cause and effect. As Woodward notes ‘we still face the problem that the feature that makes a process causal (transmission of some conserved quantity or other) tells us nothing about which features of the process are causally or explanatorily relevant to the outcome we want to explain.’ (2003, p. 357.) For example, putting a chalk mark on the white ball is a causal interaction linked by causal processes and interactions to the black ball's sinking (after the white ball strikes the black ball), yet it doesn't cause the black ball's sinking (Woodward 2003, p. 351).

Dowe offers the following account (restricting the causal relata to facts for simplicity):

Causal Connection: There is a causal connection (or thread) between a fact q(a) and a fact q′(b) if and only if there is a set of causal processes and interactions between q(a) and q′(b) such that:

  1. any change of object from a to b and any change of conserved quantity from q to q′ occur at a causal interaction involving the following changes: Dq(a), Dq(b), Dq′(a), and Dq′(a); and
  2. for any exchange in (1) involving more than one conserved quantity, the changes in quantities are governed by a single law of nature.

…where a and b are objects and q and q′ are conserved quantities possessed by those objects respectively. (Dowe 2000, sec 7.4; See Hausman (2002, pp. 720-21) for discussion).

The analysis would need to be expressed in a more general form for cases where there are more than two objects involved along the nexus of causal processes and interactions.

Condition (2) in the definition of causal connection states ‘for any exchange in (1) involving more than one conserved quantity, the changes in quantities are governed by a single law of nature’. This is an attempt to rule out accidentally coincident causal interactions of the sort identified by Miguel and Paruelo (2002). In one of their examples two billiard balls collide, and at the same instant, one of them emits an alpha particle. Condition (2) would not work for the case also mentioned by Miguel and Paruelo where the same quantity is exchanged in both interactions.

The account if successful tells us when two events are related causally, either as cause and effect or vice versa, or as common effects or causes of some event. It will not tell us which of these is the case (Hausman 2002, p. 719, Ehring 2003, pp. 531-32). To do that, both Salmon and Dowe appeal to a Reichenbachian fork asymmetry theory (Dowe 2000, ch 8). (Dowe's particular version of the latter has been subject to serious critique by Hausman (2002, pp. 722-3), which includes the point that his account of priority has nothing to do with the conserved quantity theory.)

Suppose a rolling steel ball is charged at a certain point along its trajectory. Suppose its trajectory is unaffected, and the ball subsequently hits another ball. The account should tell us that the fact that the ball gets charged not causally relevant to the fact that it hits the second ball. It does, since although on the Salmon-Dowe theory the ball's rolling is a causal process and the charging and the collision are causal interactions, and further, a change in ball's charge and the change in the ball's momentum are both the kinds of changes envisaged in (1), nevertheless there is no causal interaction linking the ball's having charge to the ball's having momentum as required in (1). Hence there is no causal thread as defined in (1) linking the two facts.

The account should also tell us that the tennis ball's heading towards the wall is not the cause of the wall's being stationary after the ball bounces off. It does, because although there is a set of casual processes and interactions linking these two events, there is a change of object along the ‘thread’—ball to wall—yet the wall undergoes no change in momentum, which it needs for the set of causal processes and interactions to count as a causal connection on this definition. (But compare Hausman 2002, p. 721, Twardy 2001, p. 268)

One might hope that the theory also tells us that the fact that a chalk mark is put on the white ball is not causally relevant to the fact that the black ball sinks since there is no causal thread as defined in (1) linking those two facts. However, such a results awaits a translation of ‘chalking a ball’ to a state involving a conserved quantity. (See the following section for a discussion of this issue.)

To this account Dowe adds the restriction that the facts that enter into causation should not be disjunctive. This is meant to deal with the following type of example. Suppose ‘… in a cold place, the heater is turned on for an hour, bringing the room to a bearable temperature. But an hour later the temperature is unbearable again, say 2°C. Then … the fact that the heater was turned on is the cause of the fact that the temperature is unbearable at the later time.’ (Dowe 2000, sec 7.4). According to Dowe ‘the temperature is unbearable’ is a disjunctive fact, meaning ‘the temperature is less than x’ for a certain x, which in turn means ‘the temperature is y or z or …’. The effect is simply that the room is 2°C. According to Ehring this result remains counterintuitive (2003, p. 532). (See also Lewis' discussion of fragility, Lewis 1986, ch 21, Appendix E.)

6.5 Objection 5: Worries about ‘Empirical Analysis’

The Conserved Quantity theory is claimed by both Salmon and Dowe to be an empirical analysis, by which they mean that it concerns an objective feature of the actual world, and that it draws its primary justification from our best scientific theories. ‘Empirical analysis’ is to be contrasted with conceptual analysis, the approach that says in offering a theory of causation we seek to give an account of the concept as revealed in the way we (i.e. folk) think and speak. Conceptual analysis respects as primary data intuitions about causation; empirical analysis has no such commitment (Dowe 2000, ch. 1).

This construal of the task of delivering an account of causation has drawn criticism from a number of commentators. According to Koons, it threatens ‘to turn [the] metaphysical account into a watered-down version of more-or-less contemporary physical theory’. (Koons 2003, p. 244). But Hausman notes that since causation is not a technical concept in science, ‘[w]ithout some plausible connection to what ordinary people and scientists take to be causation, the conserved quantity theory would float free of both physics and philosophy.’ (Hausman 2002, p. 718, see also Garcia-Encinas 2004, p. 45) And McDaniel asks what could justify one in believing a putative ‘empirical analysis’? He adds that if an empirical analysis is not at least extensionally equivalent (in the actual world) to the true conceptual analysis, then what would be the point? (2002, p. 259).

Despite their denial of a primary need to respect common sense intuitions about the concept of causation, Salmon and Dowe do still want to say their account deals with everyday cases of causation. This again raises the question of translation. As Kim puts it, there is the ‘question of whether the [Dowe-Salmon] theory provides a way to “translate” causality understood in the [Dowe-Salmon] theory into ordinary causal talk and vice versa.’ (Kim 2001, p. 242, and see especially Hausman 1998, pp. 14–17, 2002, p. 719).

6.6 Objection 6: Worries about Reduction.

According to Dowe the relata in true ‘manifest’ (common sense) claims of causation must be translated to physical states of the sort discussed above (‘object a has a value q of a conserved quantity’) such that the manifest causal claim supervenes on some physical causation. Even for purely physical cases such as ‘chalking the ball’ this is a complicated matter, and it is not obvious that it can be carried through.

Even if this could be made to work in purely physical cases, there remain questions about mental causation, causation in history, and causation in other branches of science besides physics (Woodward 2003, pp. 355-6, Machamer, Darden and Craver 2000, p. 7, Cartwright 2004, p. 812). In any case, to suppose that the conserved quantity theory will deal with causation in other branches of science also requires commitment to a fairly thorough going reductionism, since clearly there is nothing in economics or psychology that could pass for a conservation law.

An alternative to such reductionism is the view developed by Nancy Cartwright, which we might call causal pluralism After rejecting the conserved quantity theory (along with a range of major theories of causation) as an account of a ‘monolithic’ causal concept, on the grounds that it cannot deal with cases in economics, Cartwright summarises her position:

  1. There is a variety of different kinds of causal laws that operate in a variety of different ways and a variety of different kinds of causal questions that we can ask.
  2. Each of these can have its own characteristic markers; but there are no interesting features that they all share in common. (2004, p. 814, see also Hausman 2002, p. 723)

7. Related theories of causation

There is an increasing number of accounts of causation which are close relatives of the Process Theory, but which don't exactly fit the definition of a Process Theory given above. In this section we summarise some important theories that take causation to be the transfer or persistence of properties of a specific property, in particular, energy.

7.1. Aronson's transference theory

Aronson's theory is presented in three propositions:

  1. In ‘A causes B,’ ‘B’ designates a change in an object, a change which is an unnatural one.
  2. In ‘A causes B,’ at the time B occurs, the object that causes B is in contact with the object that undergoes the change.
  3. Prior to the time of the occurrence of B, the body that makes contact with the effect object possesses a quantity (e.g., velocity, momentum, kinetic energy, heat, etc.) which is transferred to the effect object (when contact is made) and manifested as B. (1971: 422)

Proposition (1) refers to a distinction Aronson draws between natural and causal changes—causal changes are those that result from interactions with other bodies; natural changes are not causal, and come about according to the normal course of events, when things happen without outside interference. Thus internal changes, or developments, are not seen by Aronson as cases of causation. Proposition (2) is Hume's requirement that causation occurs only by contact, which rules out action at a distance. It also means that, strictly speaking, there is no indirect causation, where one thing causes another via some intermediate mechanism. All causation is direct causation.

Proposition (3) is the key notion in Aronson's theory. It appeals to the idea of a quantity, which is possessed by objects, and which may be possessed by different objects in turn, but which is always possessed by some object. The direction of transfer sets the direction of causation. For a critique of this theory see Earman (1976).

7.2. Fair's transference theory

In (1979) David Fair, a student of David Lewis, offers an account of causation similar in many respects to that of Aronson. Fair makes the claim that physics has discovered the true nature of causation: what causation really is, is a transfer of energy and/or momentum. This discovery is an empirical matter, and the identity is contingent. Fair presents his account as a program for a physicalist reduction of the everyday concept, and he doesn't claim to be able to offer a detailed account of the way energy transfer makes true the fact that, for example, John's anger caused him to hit Bill. A full account awaits, Fair says, a complete unified science (1979: 236).

Fair's program begins with the reduction of the causal relata found in ordinary language. Events, objects, facts, properties and so forth need to be redescribed in terms of the objects of physics. Fair introduces ‘A-objects’ and ‘B-objects,’ which manifest the right physical quantities, namely energy and momentum, and where the A-objects underlie the events, facts, or objects identified as causes in everyday talk, while the B-objects underlie those identified as effects. The physical quantities, energy and momentum, underlie the properties that are identified as causes or effects in everyday causal talk.

The physically specifiable relation between the A-objects and the B-objects is the transfer of energy and/or momentum. Fair sees that the key is to be able to identify the same energy and/or momentum manifested in the effect as was manifested in the cause. This is achieved by specifying closed systems associated with the appropriate objects. A system is closed when no gross energy and/or momentum flows into or out of it. Energy and/or momentum transfer occurs when there is a flow of energy from the A-object to the B-object, which will be given by the time rate of change of energy and/or momentum across the spatial surface separating the A-object and the B-object.

Fair's reduction thus is:

A causes B iff there are physical redescriptions of A and B as some manifestation of energy or momentum or [as referring to] objects manifesting these, that is transferred, at least in part, from the A-objects to the B-objects. (1979: 236)

For one extended critique of Fair's theory see Dowe (2000: Ch 3).

7.3. Ehring's trope persistence theory

Douglas Ehring sets out a highly original theory of causation in his book Causation and Persistence (1997). Ehring takes the relata of causation to be tropes – i.e. non-repeating property instances. Causal connections involve the persistence of such tropes, and also their fission (partial destruction) and fusion. Trope persistence is endurantist, that is to say, tropes wholly exist at every time they exist, and that a particular trope at one time is strictly identical to itself at other times. Since tropes do not change they avoid the well-known problem for edurantists of temporary intrinsics.

Actually Ehring's theory has two parts. ‘Strong causal connection’ concerns trope persistence, and this is a symmetric matter. Causal priority on the other hand involves broader considerations including counterfactuals. Here are Ehring's definitions (following the summary in Ehring 2004):

Strong Causal Connection: Tropes P and Q, are strongly causally connected if and only if:

  1. P and Q are lawfully connected, and either
  2. P is identical to Q or some part of Q, or Q is identical to P or some part of P, or
  3. P and Q supervene on tropes P′ and Q′ which satisfy (1) and (2).

Causal Priority: Ehring employs counterfactuals to define a relation of ‘being a condition of a causal connection’, and then he uses this relation, together with the symmetrical relation of causal connection, to define causal direction. (1997: 145, 146, 148, 149, 151, 179).

Putting these two together, we get:

Causation: Trope P at t causes trope Q at t′ iff either

  1. P at t is strongly causally connected to Q at t′, and P at t is causally prior to Q at t′. or
  2. there is a set of properties (R1, …, Rn) such that P is a cause of R1, under clause (A), …, and Rn is a cause of Q under clause (A).

Clause (B) is to allow for events connected by a chain of indirect causation. For discussion of Ehring's theory see Beebee (1998).

7.4. Other theories

There are a number of notable and related theories of causation which space unfortunately forbids us to deal with in detail. The reader is encouraged to consult the references for details.

On Castaneda's (1980) transference theory of causation, ‘causity’, is the transmission of a physical element: energy, movement, charge. According to Bigelow, Ellis and Pargetter (1988) causation is the action of forces (see also Bigelow and Pargetter 1990), while for Heathcote (1989) causation is an interaction (as defined by a suitable quantum field theory). Collier (1999) develops the notion that causation is the transfer of information. Krajewski (1997) outlines several causal concepts including transfer of energy and the transfer of information. Kistler (1998, 2006) develops the trope persistence view in terms of conserved quantities. Reiber (2002) provides a conceptual analysis of causation in terms of property acquisition and transfer, and also gives references to many historical figures who hold a similar view. Finally, Chakravartty (2005) defines causal processes as systems of continuously manifesting relations between objects with causal properties and concomitant dispositions.


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causation: counterfactual theories of | causation: probabilistic | causation: the metaphysics of | physics: Reichenbach's common cause principle | Russell, Bertrand

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