Concepts of God

First published Thu Dec 21, 2006; substantive revision Wed Dec 19, 2012

The object of attitudes valorized in the major religious traditions is typically regarded as maximally great. Conceptions of maximal greatness differ but theists believe that a maximally great reality must be a maximally great person or God. Theists largely agree that a maximally great person would be omnipresent, omnipotent, omniscient, and all good. They do not agree on a number of God's other attributes, however. We will illustrate this by examining the debate over God's impassibility in western theism and a dispute over God's relation to the space-time world in Indian theism. The entry concludes by examining some concepts of limited deities.


1. Ultimate Concern and Maximal Greatness

Paul Tillich believed that the essence of religious attitudes is “ultimate concern.” Ultimate concern is “total.” Its object is experienced as numinous or holy, distinct from all profane and ordinary realities. It is also experienced as overwhelmingly real and valuable—indeed, so real and so valuable that, in comparison, all other things appear empty and worthless. As such, it demands total surrender and promises total fulfillment.[1]

Tillich's claim is not self-evident. For one thing, it is doubtful that ultimate concern is either a necessary or a sufficient condition of a religious attitude. A late pagan's attitude towards his gods was often too casual to be described as ultimate in Tillich's sense and yet was surely religious. Moreover, Tillich himself believed that a commitment to one's nation or party could be ultimate in his sense (although he thought that if one's concern were to take this form, it would be “idolatrous”). Whether the Nazi's attitude towards his nation and party can be properly described as religious is doubtful, however. Strictly speaking, then, Tillich's claim is probably false. Nevertheless, ultimate concern does appear to be a distinctive feature of the religious attitudes of devout members of the major religious traditions.

These attitudes seem fully appropriate only if their object is maximally great—so perfect and splendid that nothing greater is conceivable. And, in fact, the major religious traditions have (if only implicitly) construed the object of their devotion in precisely these terms. The nature of maximal perfection is controversial, however.

For one thing, the form a religious community's ultimate concern takes (and the conception of its object with which it is bound up) varies from one religious community to another. Ultimate concern may take the form of worship, and involve praise, love, gratitude, supplication, confession, petition, and the like. But it can also take the form of a quest for the ultimate good. The object of the quest is an existentially appropriated knowledge of the ultimate good or a union with it that transforms us and overcomes our wrongness. The two forms of ultimate concern may be combined or exist separately. Christianity and theistic Hinduism combine both. In Theravada Buddhism and Taoism, on the other hand, ultimate concern typically takes the second form but not the first.

In practice, a religious community's conception of the divine is largely determined by its conviction that the object of its devotion is maximally great, by the spoken or oral texts it regards as authoritative, and by metaphysical assumptions and valuations widely shared by the community's members. Of course these sources aren't independent of each other. The form ultimate concern takes in a community incorporates its most fundamental evaluations, and the authoritative texts which express and shape its ultimate concern present pictures of the world and our place in it which include explicit or implicit metaphysical claims. The Buddhist's picture, for example, expresses the vision of a world in constant flux—devoid of fixity or any kind of permanent substance.

Since the form ultimate concern takes, the texts regarded as authoritative, and the metaphysical assumptions and evaluations inextricably bound up with these forms and texts vary from one religious community to another, it is hardly surprising that conceptions of maximal greatness vary as well.

The most striking disagreement is between those who regard the divine reality as personal and those who do not. Theists believe that even though the object of their ultimate concern transcends all finite realities it is more like a person than anything else with which we are ordinarily familiar, and typically conceptualize it as a maximally perfect person. Persons are rational agents, however—beings who have beliefs about themselves and the world and act on the basis of them. The major theistic traditions have therefore described ultimate reality as an omniscient mind and an omnipotent will. Other religious traditions are non-theistic. Advaita Vedanta is an important example.

Advaita Vedanta's rejection of theism is a consequence of its insistence that “Brahman [ultimate reality] is without parts or attributes…one without a second.” (Shankara [traditional attribution], second half of the 8th century: 101) If the Brahman has no properties, it necessarily lacks the properties of omniscience, perfect goodness, omnipotence, and personhood, and cannot therefore be understood as God.

The rejection of theism also follows from Advaita's conviction that Brahman contains no internal diversity (“is without parts”) and is identical with the whole of reality (”is one without a second”). If Brahman is all there is, for example,then there is nothing outside Brahman that could serve as an object of its knowledge. And if it is devoid of internal diversity, there can be no self-knowledge either, for self-knowledge involves an internal differentiation between the self as knower and the self as known. Nor can the Brahman be a causal agent. If Brahman is maximally perfect, it must be unlimited. But it is limited if something exists outside it. The Brahman must therefore be all there is. If the Brahman is identical with the whole of reality, though, and Brahman contains no plurality, then reality as a whole is an undifferentiated unity. The space-time world with its distinctions between times, places, and events is consequently unreal. Real causal relations are relations between two real things, however. So Brahman is neither the cause of the space-time world as a whole nor of the events in it, and is thus neither the space-time world's creator nor its ruler. It follows from these considerations that Brahman is neither an omniscient mind nor an omnipotent and active will. It cannot be a maximally perfect person, therefore, and so cannot be God.

Advaita does contain what might be called “theistic elements.” For example, it distinguishes the nirguna from the saguna Brahman. The former is the Brahman without attributes. The latter is the Brahman with attributes, and is roughly described in the way that theists describe God. The nirguna Brahman is the Brahman as it really is, however, while the saguna Brahman is ultimately illusory. The concept of the saguna Brahman is a useful tool for those who are still on their spiritual journey but is finally cast aside by the fully enlightened. Yet even though Advaita believes that, like all conceptualizations of the Brahman, the idea of an omnipotent, omniscient, and all good cause of the space-time world is ultimately false, they regard it as superior to others. Furthermore, Advaita describes the real Brahman as an infinite, joyous consciousness (albeit a consciousness that has no objects or contents and is thus “empty”). Because Advaita refuses to ascribe either knowledge or activity to ultimate reality, though, it is essentially non-theistic. Its maximally perfect reality isn't the God of the theistic traditions—all powerful, all knowing, all good, the sovereign lord of heaven and earth. It is instead an “infinite ocean” of joyous empty consciousness—impersonal, inactive, and anonymous.

Some schools of Vedanta are theistic, however, and their response to Advaita is instructive. Vishishtadvaita Vedanta, for example, maintains that Brahman is personal and, indeed, the supreme person (paramatman)—creator and lord (ishvara) who leads the world's creatures to salvation. Far from being devoid of attributes, Brahman (which Vishishtadvaita identifies with Vishnu) is the sum of all “noble” attributes—omniscient, omnipotent, omnipresent, and all merciful.

What accounts for this difference? In part, the suspicion that the Advaitin account of a maximally great reality is incoherent. Ramanuja (1017?-1137?), for instance, argued that Advaita's conception of the Brahman is logically incoherent because it conceives of Brahman as a substance without properties whereas, by definition, a substance is what has or underlies properties. Furthermore, because cognitively gasping something involves classifying or identifying it as a thing of a certain kind, and things are classified or identified on the basis of their properties, one can't cognitively grasp a thing without properties. It follows that the Advaitin's Brahman can't be known, and that Advaita itself thus doesn't know it. Finally, Ramanuja argued that the denial of the reality of distinctions undercuts Advaita's appeal to scripture. If the scriptures are valid, then some language accurately describes reality (for scriptural language does so). But language necessarily involves distinctions (between subject and verb, noun and adjective, and the like) and so, if any language accurately describes reality, some distinctions must be real. Therefore, if distinctions aren't real (as Advaita maintains), the scriptures it appeals to aren't valid.

Advaitins aren't without recourse, of course. For example, they will deny that they are construing Brahman as a substance without properties. Since, in their view, no concept applies to the Brahman, neither the concept of a property nor the concept of substance applies to it. Again, even if conceptual cognition necessarily involves classification or identification, Advaitins will insist that not all cognition is conceptual. The fact that Brahman can't be conceptually cognized thus doesn't entail that it can't be known. The important point in the present connection however, is that the Vishishtadvaitin's and Advaitin's disagreements on these issues are rooted in basic differences in metaphysics and epistemology—whether a reality without properties is possible, for instance, and whether cognition involves at least some conceptual content.

Other differences are even more fundamental. All the Vedantin schools profess to elucidate the true meaning of a common set of scriptures—the Brahma Sutras, the Bhagavad Gita and, preeminently, the Vedas (especially their last part, the Upanishads). In practice, though, both theistic and non-theistic Vedantins privilege some texts over others. Advaitins, privilege the Isha and other non-theistic Upanishads and interpret theistic sounding texts in their light. Theistic Vedantins, on the other hand, privilege the Bhagavad Gita and theistic Upanishads such as the Shvetashvatara Upanishad, taking these texts pretty much at face value, and then explaining away apparent inconsistencies between their privileged texts and others which, on their face, seem clearly non-theistic.

These differences are themselves rooted in fundamental differences in spiritual practice.

Advaitins, for example, emphasize ascetic practices designed to existentially appropriate the truth of the “great words”of scripture such as “Thou art that [you are the Brahman],” “All that is is one only,” or “All is one without distinction,” and place a high value on “monistic” mystical experiences—joyous states of consciousness in which the mind is emptied of contents and distinctions disappear. While these experiences aren't the aim of the Advaitin's quest, they are more or less explicitly regarded as a model of the unifying and transfiguring Brahman-knowledge that is the goal of their religious journey. Theistic Vedantins, on the other hand, were Vaishnavas (devotees of Vishnu), and their attitudes, outlook, and actions were profoundly shaped by devotional practices designed to express and cultivate love of, and surrender to, Vishnu. While theistic Vedantins did not deny the reality of monistic mystical consciousness, they downplayed its significance for, in their view, the ultimate aim of the religious life is an ecstatic and permanent loving union with God (Vishnu).

In short, while Advaitins and theistic Vedantins agree that the proper object of ultimate concern is maximally great, they disagree on just how maximal greatness should be construed. This disagreement, in turn, is rooted in metaphysical and epistemological disagreements, in differences in scriptural interpretation, and in differences in religious practice and aspiration. The most fundamental difference, however, is, arguably, a difference in evaluation. Theistic Vedantins prize love in a way in which Advaitins do not. Since love is a relation between persons, it is not surprising that, in their view, maximal greatness necessarily includes personhood.

But while theists agree that a maximally great reality must be a transcendently great person, they sometimes disagree over just what other attributes maximal greatness includes. Most theists do think that God is omnipresent, omniscient, omnipotent, and all good, although there are disagreements over just how these attributes should be construed. Other differences are more radical. I will illustrate this point by examining the debate over God's impassibility in western theism and a dispute over God's relation to the space-time world in Indian theism.

2. Impassibility

Most theists agree that God is (in Ramanuja's words) the “supreme self” or person—omniscient, omnipotent, and all good. But classical Christian theists have also ascribed four “metaphysical attributes” to God—simplicity, timelessness, immutability, and impassibility. The doctrine of simplicity states that each of God's real or intrinsic properties is identical with his other real or intrinsic properties, and with his being or nature. God's knowledge is identical with his power, for example, and both are identical with his being. Just as “Thomas Jefferson” and “the third president of the United States” have different meanings but refer to the same person, so “the knowledge of God” and “the power of God,” although differing in meaning, refer to the same reality, namely, the infinitely perfect divine life or activity.

Many classical western theists have also thought that God is timeless—altogether outside of time. God resembles abstract objects like numbers or propositions in having no temporal location or extension. God isn't an abstract object, of course, but an infinitely perfect life or activity. One shouldn't think of this life and activity as being in time, however—not even as everlasting. Thus God timelessly knows and wills that conscious life will emerge on earth after certain events and before others. But while temporality is a property of what God knows and wills, it isn't a property of God's act of knowledge or will. The objects of God's knowledge and act of will are in time but God himself and his activity are not.

God is also believed to be immutable. Something is immutable if its real properties can't change. Immutability follows from God's simplicity. An object undergoes real change when it loses one real property and/or acquires another. Real change thus entails that some of the object's real properties aren't identical. (If P, Q, and R are real properties, and x retains P through a change but loses Q and acquires R, then P, Q, and R are different properties.) So if God is simple, he can't undergo real change. God's immutability also follows from his timelessness since change entails a temporal transition from one state to another.

Finally, classical western theists have thought that God is impassible. God creates, sustains, and governs the world. It depends on him both for its being and for its qualities. But nothing acts on God or causally affects him. While the world is affected by God, God is not affected by it.

Why think that the metaphysical attributes are perfections? For several reasons. Most religious traditions stress the imperfections of the temporal order. The space-time world is a world in constant flux. Nothing in it is permanent or secure. All temporal values are threatened and ultimately lost. In human experience, complexity, time, change, and dependency are bound up with loss and imperfection. It thus isn't surprising that religiously sensitive people often conclude that a maximally perfect reality must be free from them. Moreover, this conclusion is reinforced by the experiences of Christian and other mystics who claim to have glimpsed a divine reality exhibiting the metaphysical attributes—a holy unity transcending distinctions and time and change, wholly active and never passive, and upon which they and everything else are absolutely dependent.

There are obvious tensions between these themes and other strands of the Christian tradition, however. Even though the Bible asserts that God is beginningless and endless, for example, he is depicted as if he were in time. He is also depicted as changing (although his existence and character are said to remain constant). In addition, the God of the Bible not only acts upon his creatures, he is affected by them—pitying their distress, being angered by their sin, responding to their petitions, and the like. These considerations aren't conclusive of course since even the most scripturally centered theists agree that not everything in the Biblical pictures can be taken literally. God isn't literally jealous, for instance, nor does he literally repent of his former actions. So perhaps those features of the Biblical picture of God which seem inconsistent with God's possessing metaphysical attributes can also be interpreted as metaphors or analogies or symbols. Other difficulties are more serious, however. God's personality is essential to theism, and many wonder whether personhood is compatible with simplicity, timelessness, immutability, and impassibility. One may also wonder whether a God with these attributes is the God of popular devotion. We will explore this question by examining the attribute of impassibility in more depth.

According to the doctrine of impassibility, God is not affected by his creatures. Everything other than God depends upon him for both its existence and qualities. God himself, though, depends upon nothing. Critics think this has two unacceptable consequences.

In the first place, impassibility seems inconsistent with God's knowledge of the world. Knowledge relates two terms, the knower and the object he or she knows. Typical instances of the relation exhibit two important features. First, the act of knowledge involves a real modification of the knower but not of the object he or she knows. And, second, the act of knowledge depends on its object while the object of knowledge does not depend on the subject's knowledge of it. I know, for example, that the Pittsburgh Steelers won the Superbowl in 2006. But while my knowledge that the Steelers won is a real property of mine, it is not a real property of the Steelers' victory. Knowing that the Steelers won the Superbowl really modifies me (I am internally different than I would have been if I did not know that they had won); it does not modify or make a real difference to the Steelers' winning. Moreover, my knowledge that the Steelers won depends on the Steelers having won whereas the Steelers' winning does not depend on my knowledge of it.

But if God is impassible, his knowledge of the world can't be like that. For the doctrine of impassibility implies that God's real properties depend on nothing other than himself. So if God's knowledge of the world is a real property of God (as theists have usually thought), it cannot depend on its object and is thus very different from paradigmatic instances of knowledge like the one discussed in the previous paragraph.

One way of handling this difficulty is to claim that everything other than God is determined by him. Many theists believe that it is. Madhva (whom we will discuss later), orthodox Muslims, Augustine, Luther, Calvin, and some Thomists are examples. In their view, God knows that the Steelers won the Superbowl in 2006 because he eternally decreed that they would. God's knowledge of their victory is an aspect or consequence of his willing it and thus doesn't depend on it.

However, other theists believe that God does not fully determine everything. In their view some of our actions are free in the metaphysical libertarian's sense. They lack sufficient causes, and thus aren't determined either by antecedent natural conditions or by God's decrees. If they aren't, God can't know them in knowing his decrees. So, in this case at least, God's knowledge appears to depend upon its object. But if it does, God cannot be impassible. (It should be noted that this difficulty can't be evaded by appealing to the doctrine of middle knowledge. For even though God's knowledge of our free actions does not depend upon those actions on this view, it does depend upon his knowledge of what creatures would freely do in various circumstances in which he might place them, and the truth of subjunctive conditionals like “If Adam were placed in the Garden of Eden, he would freely sin,” while contingent, is not determined by God.)

The second and more pressing problem for the doctrine of divine impassibility, however, is this. All theists describe God as compassionate. Each chapter of the Quran, for instance, begins with the words “In the name of Allah, the compassionate and merciful.” Yet if God really is compassionate, then it would seem that his knowledge of free actions isn't the only divine property that depends upon the world, for his affective states do so as well. God isn't aloof or unmoved by our distress but shares our griefs as we share those of people we love. His joy is thus tempered by sympathetic sorrow. The degree and quality of God's happiness is partly determined by the state of sentient creatures.

Charles Hartshorne, for instance, has argued that while certain forms of independence are admirable others are not. “One should not simply agree to every whim of [one's] child,” for example, “but neither should one try to act and think and feel just as one would have acted or thought or felt had the child's joy been sorrow, or her sorrow joy…” Nor is there anything admirable about a happiness that is unaffected by the sorrows of others. We don't admire people who “can be equally happy and serene and joyous regardless of how men and women suffer around” them. (Hartshorne: 43–44) Human sympathies are necessarily limited, of course. But a perfect being would be maximally responsive to the joys and sufferings of other. If it is, it could not be impassible.

Classical Christian theology provides several attempts to reconcile God's compassion with his impassibility. Thus, Anselm argued that while God acts as if he were compassionate, he does not experience compassion. “For when You look upon us in our misery it is we who feel the effect of Your mercy, but You do not experience the feeling. Therefore you are both merciful because You save the sorrowful and pardon sinners against You; and You are not merciful because You do not experience any feeling of compassion for misery.” (Anselm: chapter viii) This seems unsatisfactory, however, for a compassion without feeling isn't real compassion. A recognition of this may have led Bernard of Clairvaux and Thomas Aquinas to offer their own, rather different, solutions.

Bernard claimed that while God neither suffers nor experiences compassion in his own nature, he does suffer and experience compassion in the human nature that he assumes at the Incarnation. God became man so that he might “learn by his own experience how to commiserate and sympathize with those who are…suffering and tempted.” (Bernard: chapter 3). Bernard's solution is superior to Anselm's because it implicitly recognizes that compassion necessarily includes feeling or emotion. It isn't available to non-Christian theists, however, and fails to locate compassion in the divine nature itself.

Thomas Aquinas's solution does so. Some emotions can be literally (albeit analogically) ascribed to God. Love and joy are examples. Other emotions such as anger and sorrow cannot. What accounts for this difference? Love and joy are “pure perfections” (good-making properties that entail no imperfection). As such they can be literally ascribed to God although the mode in which God experiences them differs from that in which we do so. (God's love and joy are purely active emotions, qualifications of his will. Our love and joy, on the other hand, are both actions and passions, partly voluntary and partly involuntary reactions of our animal nature.)

Anger and sorrow can be appropriate, and hence good-making, qualities of the person who experiences them. But they are not pure perfections because they entail perturbation and suffering. They cannot, then, be literally ascribed to God. Even so, compassionate sorrow differs from anger. When God acts as a justifiably angry person would we can ascribe anger to God metaphorically. But nothing in God (no internal modification of God) corresponds to the feeling or emotion of anger in us. By contrast, “God is said to be saddened in so far as certain things take place contrary to what He loves and approves.” (Aquinas: Book One, chapter 7, #17) Hence, while God doesn't literally grieve with us, there is something in God that we apprehend as sorrow, namely, his love. For Aquinas, “God is compassionate” not only entails that God acts as a compassionate person would (as it does for Anselm), it also entails that those actions are expressions of a divine emotion or “feeling state”—an emotion or feeling state which qualifies the divine nature itself, and not just the assumed human nature (as Bernard thought).

While Aquinas's solution is superior to those of Anselm and Bernard, it does have problems. Aquinas's distinction between anger and compassion may be specious, since it seems that both could be treated in the same way. Since God's righteousness or love of justice is a pure perfection we can ascribe it to God literally. God's anger can then be interpreted as the way God's righteousness is apprehended by those who have rejected him or recognize that he has been rejected. God not only acts as a justifiably angry person would act, those acts are the expression of an internal modification (namely, his love of justice) which is a real property of God's own being. A more important problem, though, may be the fact that the emotion or feeling state which grounds God's acts of compassion, according to Aquinas, isn't literally tinged with sorrow. For it is at least doubtful that a “compassion” that doesn't include sympathetic suffering is really compassion.

The most important point in the present connection, however, is this. The debate between modern theists like Hartshorne, on the one hand, and classical theists like Aquinas, on the other, revolves around the following question: Can a maximally perfect being be touched by suffering? Hartshorne thinks it must since a maximally perfect being would be maximally responsive to the joys and sorrows of others, and would therefore grieve with all who grieve. Friedrich von Hügel, on the other hand, speaks for the tradition when he says that not only is suffering intrinsically evil, it is inconsistent with unalloyed goodness and perfect joy. God is “Perfect Love, Unmixed Joy, Entire Delectation…We will not admit the presence of any Evil, be it sin or even only sorrow, be they actual or even only potential, in Him Who thus dwarfs for us all our little human goodness and earthly joy by his utter Sanctity and sheer Beatitude.” (von Hügel: 208–09) The controversy over God's impassibility is thus ultimately rooted in a clash of value intuitions, a deep disagreement over what properties God must have to be unqualifiedly admirable and worthy of worship.

3. Theistic Vedanta and God's Relation to the World

Our second example of how a dispute over what constitutes maximal greatness can affect one's concept of God is furnished by a disagreement between the great Vishishtadvaitin, Ramanuja, and the founder of the Dvaita school of Vedanta, Madhva (1197–1276).

Vishishtadvaita maintains that God is related to the world as the soul (jivatman) is related to its body. According to Ramanuja, bodies are “absolutely dependent” upon their souls. A soul-body relationship is a relation between (1) support and thing supported (bodies are incapable of separate existence), (2) controller and thing controlled, and (3) “principal” (sheshin) and “accessory” (shesha). (“The accessory is that whose [whole] nature is…to render due glory to…the principal.” [Ramanuja, quoted in Lipner: 131], that which can fulfill itself only in serving its principal. Examples of principal-accessory relationships are the relation between an owner and his or her disposable property and the relation between a master and “born servant.”) The point of saying that bodies are related to souls as supported to support and controlled to controller is that bodies are ontologically and epistemically dependent on souls. They can neither exist nor act apart from them, and they can only be understood in relation to them. The point of saying that bodies are related to souls as accessory to principal is that bodies are also evaluatively dependent on their souls—they have no worth apart from their relation to them.

To say that the world is God's body, then, is to say that God is the world's support, controller, and principal. Just as bodies are absolutely dependent on their souls, so the world is absolutely dependent on God. And, in fact, the dependence in the latter case is even more complete than it is in the former. For souls need bodies to accomplish their purposes whereas God does not need the world. (In support of this contention, Ramanuja quotes the Bhagavad Gita: “I am the supporter of all beings; they are of no help to me at any time.” [Lott: 49]) Moreover, human bodies enjoy a certain temporary and limited independence when death separates them from their souls. The world's dependence on God, on the other hand, is complete. The upshot is that the body-soul relation is only fully exemplified by the world-God relation. The world is absolutely dependent on God; God in no way depends upon it. (It is worth noting that classical western theism's principal objections to the claim that the world is God's body—that it makes God dependent on the world and subject to its imperfections—aren't relevant to Ramanuja's position. For, in the latter's view, not only does the dependence relation run only one way [from body to soul and not vice versa], but the body's defects do not affect the soul.)

Ramanuja and Madhva were both theists, both Vedantins, and both Vaishnavas (that is, both identified God with Vishnu), sharing a common allegiance to the same set of scriptures and engaging in similar religious practices. Yet in spite of these similarities, the flavor of their views is quite different. The central motif of Madhva's theology is God's infinite majesty, utter transcendence, and absolute sovereignty: “What is incompatible with the divine sovereignty should be rejected. Inconsistency with the divine majesty is itself the criterion of what is unworthy of acceptance.” (Madhva, quoted in Lott: 58) This motif works itself out in a number of ways. For example, while Ramanuja has a very strong doctrine of grace, he appears to allow some room for libertarian free will. Madhva does not. From eternity souls have different qualities or potentialities (different “aptitudes”). Because of the eternal difference in their qualities and potentialities, souls have different destinies. Some (those with “an innate aptitude for good”) are destined for various levels of bliss. Others (those with “an innate aptitude for evil”) are destined for different levels of suffering. (Thus Dvaita is one of the few Hindu schools with something like a doctrine of eternal damnation. Some souls are permanently bound to this world with its endless cycle of births and rebirths.) The important point is that these differences in the souls' qualities and potentialities (“aptitudes”) are determined by God's will. Hence, says Madhva, “The Lord is the real doer, and the cause of the soul's activity.” (Quoted in Lott: 114) Everything depends upon the divine will, and salvation is through grace alone. (It should be noted that Madhva's view was modified by some of his followers. Thus Vyasa Raya [1460–1539] insisted that because innate aptitudes for good or for evil are beginningless, they are not caused by God.)

Madhva's most striking departure from Ramanuja, however, is his absolute rejection of the notion that the world is God's body. In Madhva's opinion, the Vishishtadvaitin view compromises God's transcendence and independence. The relation between God and the world isn't a relation between a soul and its body but between a sovereign will and its effect. “He is the supreme Lord by whose grace exist matter, action (karma), time, nature and souls, and by whose displeasure all these cease to exist.” (Quoted in Lott: 111) However, surprisingly (from a western perspective at least), Madhva thinks that while prakriti (the material or stuff out of which the space-time world is composed), time, space, and souls derive their qualities from God, they don't derive their existence or substantial being from him. God's being and activity explain why spatio-temporal things have the properties they do but doesn't explain why they exist in the first place.

Ramanuja, by contrast, thinks that it does. Because bodies depend upon souls for their existence, and the world is God's body, the world depends upon God for its being as well as for its qualities. The world's dependence upon God is thus more complete in Ramanuja's theology than it is in Madhva's.

What accounts for this difference? Why, in particular, does Madhva adopt a position which seems inconsistent with his emphasis on God's absolute sovereignty? The answer appears to Madhva's equally emphatic insistence on God's transcendence and independence.

Indian thought tended to assume that the cause of a thing's being or existence must be a kind of material or substratum (a “material cause”) which is then shaped or formed to make it an existent being of a particular sort—an existent elephant, for example, or an existent earth or water atom. The substratum is the cause of a thing's being or existence; the process of shaping or forming is the cause of its being a particular kind of being or existent, that is, of its having one set of qualities rather than another. (Thus, the potter's activity causes the clay to be a pot; but the clay gives the pot its being or existence.) If God were the cause of the existence of the world as well as the cause of its qualities (that is, if he were its material as well as its efficient cause), then God would be the world's substratum. (As he in a sense is for Ramanuja. Prakriti is the world's substratum, and prakriti, according to Ramanuja, is an aspect of God's body.) But this is inconsistent with God's transcendence and independence of the world. If God is truly perfect, then, he cannot be the cause of the world's existence.

This example is particularly instructive because it illustrates how an emphasis on different aspects of God's perfection (the absolute dependence of everything other than God on God, on the one hand, and God's transcendence and independence, on the other) can cause theologians with otherwise quite similar views to draw very different conclusions about God.

4. Limited Deities

Are limited deities counter examples to this entry's claim that religious consciousness tends to construe ultimate reality as maximally perfect? Most apparent counter examples are merely apparent. The limited deity is either not thought to be ultimate or it isn't really believed to be limited (that is, less perfect than a being could possibly be). The following two examples illustrate these possibilities.

Plato introduced the concept of the demiurge (from the Greek demiourgos, meaning “artisan” or “craftsman”) in his Timaeus. Being perfectly good, the demiurge wishes to communicate his own goodness. Using the Forms as a model, he shapes the initial chaos into the best possible image of these eternal and immutable archetypes. The visible world is the result. The demiurge is the highest god and the best of causes. He is nonetheless limited. For the material he shapes isn't created by him and, because it is disorderly and indeterminate, partially resists his ordering. The demiurge is not ultimate, however, since his ontological and axiological status is lower than that of the Forms, especially the Form of the Good. Plato's concept of the demiurge thus isn't a counter example to the thesis that religious consciousness tends to construe ultimate reality as maximally perfect.

The God of process philosophy illustrates the second possibility. While differences among process philosophers make generalizations difficult, its critics accuse its God of being a mere demiurge, one power among others who, while influencing everything, controls nothing. Whether God, rather than the process of becoming of which God is a part, is ultimate in this system is a moot point. More important for our purposes, however, is the fact that the God of the most theologically interesting process philosopher is thought to be maximally perfect. Charles Hartshorne agrees that God's power and knowledge are limited. While God influences everything that transpires he neither determines nor controls it. Nor does God know with any certainty just what the future holds in store. But Hartshorne denies that these “limitations” are imperfections. In his view, persuasion or influence is a better or more perfect form of power than control, and knowledge of the contingent future is metaphysically impossible. Although God's power and knowledge are limited, they are as perfect as power and knowledge could possibly be. If a maximally perfect being is the most perfect possible being, then God is maximally perfect.

John Stuart Mill's picture of God, on the other hand, may constitute a genuine counter example to the thesis that conceptions of God are attempts to articulate the concept of a maximally great ultimate reality. Mill believes that there is some evidence for the existence of a “demiourgos” of enormous power and intelligence, and some benevolence. But because nature's contrivances are imperfect, because omnipotence could altogether dispense with contrivances, and because organisms are principally contrived for the mere persistence of the individual or species and not for pleasure or happiness, the evidence not only fails to point to a being of unlimited power, intelligence, and benevolence, it is actually incompatible with it. Still, the evidence is compatible with the existence of a being of limited power and/or intelligence but unlimited benevolence. Furthermore, there are good pragmatic reasons for imaginatively dwelling on the possibility that such a being exists, and for hoping that it does. For if the demiurge's benevolence is infinite then, given its enormous power and intelligence, there is some reason to think that death will not have the last word and that good will eventually get the upper hand over evil. And “the beneficial effect” of this “hope with regard to the government of the universe and the destiny of man after death…is far from trifling. It makes life and human nature a far greater thing to the feelings and gives greater strength as well as a great solemnity to all” our nobler sentiments and to our resolve to “cultivate the improvement of character up to the end of life.” Furthermore, “there is another and a most important exercise of the imagination which…has been kept up principally by means of religious belief” which reinforces the first, and which Mill not only countenances but endorses since “human excellence greatly depends upon the sufficiency of the provision made for it”—“the idealization of our standard of excellence in a person.” (Mill: 81–82)

Does Mill's position provide a counter example to our thesis? The answer isn't entirely straightforward. On the one hand, Mill doesn't begin with the idea of a maximally great reality as mature religious consciousness normally does, and then—given his metaphysical, empirical, and evaluative commitments—ask how maximal greatness should be construed On the other hand, Mill's reflections on religion are shaped from their beginning by his conceptions of value—of what is truly “God-befitting” or worthy of admiration and emulation. But, for Mill what matters for humankind's spiritual growth and development are ideals of moral, not metaphysical perfection. It isn't surprising, then, that in spite of the fact that Mill's divinity isn't maximally perfect tout court, it is maximally morally perfect. In short, while Mill's reflections on God aren't driven by a concept of maximal perfection simpliciter, they are importantly driven by a concept of maximal moral perfection.

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Related Entries

Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Hartshorne, Charles | Hume, David: on religion | Mill, John Stuart | monotheism | omnipotence | omnipresence | omniscience | process philosophy | simplicity: divine

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