Continental Rationalism

First published Wed Nov 21, 2007; substantive revision Tue Aug 14, 2012

The expression “continental rationalism” refers to a set of views more or less shared by a number of philosophers active on the European continent during the latter two thirds of the seventeenth century and the beginning of the eighteenth. Rationalism is most often characterized as an epistemological position. On this view, to be a rationalist requires at least one of the following: (1) a privileging of reason and intuition over sensation and experience, (2) regarding all or most ideas as innate rather than adventitious, (3) an emphasis on certain rather than merely probable knowledge as the goal of enquiry. While all of the continental rationalists meet one or more of these criteria, this is arguably the consequence of a deeper tie that binds them together—that is, a metaphysical commitment to the reality of substance, and, in particular, to substance as an underlying principle of unity.


1. Introduction

The seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries saw the heyday of metaphysical system-building, but the expression “continental rationalism” primarily connotes rather a set of epistemological views. By contrast to British empiricism, which traces all knowledge to sensory experience, these views emphasize a reliance on reason (ratio in Latin, hence rationalism), the resources of which are taken to be sufficient in some sense for what we know. Thus, a signature doctrine of rationalism is the doctrine of innate ideas, according to which the mind has built into it not just the structure of knowledge but even its content. Nonetheless, among the philosophers comprising the extension of the expression, metaphysical issues, particularly the ontology of substance, occupy the central place. Certainly, this is true of Leibniz and Spinoza, but also of Malebranche and other Cartesians, and even of Descartes when properly understood.

If there seems to be a gap between the connotation of the term and its denotation, this can be overcome somewhat by thinking of it in terms of Plato's divided line, which establishes a parallel between objects known and the means by which they are known. In fact, the order of objects, the ordo essendi ranging in importance down from the Good to other forms, to individual things, and to images, and the order of knowing, the ordo cognoscendi, ranging from intuition of various sorts down to sensory experience, is itself to be found in various versions among the later rationalists. The important point, in any case, is that, for the continental rationalists as for Plato, the epistemological distinctions are grounded in ontological distinctions. Or, to put it terms that reflect rationalist thinking on a number of issues, there is only a distinction of reason between the two orders. The orders of being and knowing are not really distinct; they differ only in our ways of thinking about them.

There is a good explanation of the close connection seen by the rationalists between the epistemological and ontological orders, one that also accounts for their notable reliance on reason. It derives from their answer to what Leibniz called the grand metaphysical question: why is there something rather than nothing at all? There is something because there must be something; there cannot be nothing (and this way of putting it shows the ultimate debt of the rationalists to a tradition that goes back to Parmenides). Reality, or at least some part of it has necessary existence, and that necessity is something like logical necessity. With this answer, a whole philosophical outlook falls into place. First of all, any significant role for sensory experience falls away, since what exists can be known a priori by logic alone. Causal connections tend to be viewed as logical connections; a principle of sufficient reason falls out which tends to be read as a matter of logical deduction. One result is that there is an impulse toward monism: if the ultimate cause must exist, then that for which it is the sufficient reason must also exist, and just how the two can be distinguished becomes problematic (again, the Parmenidean antecedent is clear).

This outlook was not articulated as such by any rationalist except, perhaps, Spinoza—indeed most were concerned to avoid such consequences of their views. But the outlook does capture the intuitions behind the metaphysical systems they elaborated. And it certainly draws the contrast between them and the empiricists, who tended toward tychism, the view that the world is largely, or even entirely, a product of chance. On the empiricist account, the universe consists of many independent individuals, which, if they are connected, are so only accidentally, reducing causation to nothing more than a matter of constant conjunction. (This physical, metaphysical and logical atomism is in the tradition of Democritus, Epicurus and Lucretius). Under such circumstances, only experience of the world can provide knowledge of it.

While such a juxtaposition of rationalism with empiricism may be useful as an interpretive tool, it should be borne in mind that such schematic outlooks are constructions in retrospect. British philosophers in the relevant historical period were far less disconnected from the continent than they are today. (Recall Passmore's report in this regard of the newspaper announcement of fog on the English channel: “continent isolated.”) In the period presently under consideration, philosophical crossings from Britain were frequent and fruitful. In particular, Locke, Berkeley and Hume all crossed the Channel. In contrast, the rationalists stayed on the continent, both literally and figuratively.

The early modern period of philosophy, including continental rationalism, is generally, and correctly, supposed to have been driven by the new science to a radical departure from the Aristotelianism of the late medieval or renaissance period immediately preceding it. The mechanization and mathematization of the world demanded by the inertial physics of a moving Earth led to a revolutionary philosophy better described, at least in its rationalist version, as Platonic, or even Pythagorean. Even so, Aristotelian concepts and terminology persisted. Both were appropriated and deployed to deal with the new problems. The principal Aristotelian concept taken over by the rationalists was the concept of substance.

Aristotle's term ousia is usually translated as “substance.” What exactly Aristotle meant by the term is a thorny matter, much debated in the literature. His account of substance in the Categories holds individual things, which he terms “proper substances,” to be paradigmatic of substance. On this account, substance is best understood by analogy with a grammatical subject—it takes a predicate, and is not predicable of anything further. Thus, while animal is predicable of horse, and horse of Bucephalus, Bucephalus stands by himself, impredicable of, and hence, numerically different from anything else. Much of Aristotle's account in the Metaphysics—written years later—seems to accord with this. However, Metaphysics (1017b10–26) complicates the story. Aristotle there describes four uses of the term. He concludes by reducing these to two broad senses—(1) substance as hypokeimenon, the ultimate substratum, which is not predicated of anything further; and (2) substance as form—that which makes each thing the kind of thing that it is. Indications within the text suggest that, by the time that he was giving the lectures that are collected in the Metaphysics, Aristotle regarded not individual things but the matter of which these individual things are formed, as the ultimate subject of predication. On this conception, there is some sense in which Bucephalus is himself predicable of matter. Thus, while the substance of the Categories serves as a principle of individuation, the substance of the Metaphysics is more complicated, serving both to individuate Bucephalus and Seabiscuit and to capture the connection or sameness that holds between them.

That substance should be called upon to account for both difference and sameness in the world indicates an inherent tension in the concept. Certainly, the two senses of the term ‘substance’ were in tension during the seventeenth century. The momentum of rationalist argument was to resolve the tension by folding the first sense into the second: there is no real differentiation in the world, only the appearance of difference. Seventeenth century rationalists assigned to substance three roles of connection. Substance was taken (1) to connect attributes as attributes of the same thing at a time (a given shape and a given size as the shape and size of the same thing), (2) to connect them over time (the later shape and size, perhaps different from the earlier, as nonetheless the shape and size of the very same thing), and (3) to connect them as somehow related to the thing as a certain kind of thing (for the Cartesians, shape and size would indicate the thing to be of the kind “extended”). However, Spinoza alone among the continental rationalists fully embraced the conception of substance as a fundamental connection between things. The other members of the movement struggled to retain a notion of substance as individuator, but did so with varying degrees of success.

2. Descartes

The rationalism of the most famous of the rationalists is problematic on two counts. First, Descartes is known as the father of modern philosophy precisely because he initiated the so-called epistemological turn that is with us still. Since Descartes, philosophy has been especially concerned with the theory of knowledge, both in itself and as it affects other areas of philosophy. Ethics, for example, has often been concerned with how the good might be known rather than with what the good might be. With his fundamental objective of achieving certainty for his beliefs, Descartes has thus been principally responsible for the incomplete characterization of rationalism as not just etymologically but essentially connected to the claims of reason. While Descartes certainly sought to justify the claims of reason and relied upon them, even for him there are corresponding ontological views that are no less important to his system.

The second problematic aspect of Descartes's rationalism is more difficult to resolve. Descartes was a radical voluntarist who thought that all truth, including what we take to be necessary truth, depends on the will of God. Care needs to be taken in how this view is expressed, for Descartes did not hold simply that what we take to be necessary in fact is contingent. He held that actually necessary truth depends on God's unconstrained will, such that even propositions that are logically contradictory might simultaneously be true. Reason itself thus seems no longer reliable, and experience would seem to be the only way of determining which of the worlds even beyond logic such a powerful and unconstrained God has created. Not many of the rationalists, even among the Cartesians, followed Descartes in this radical voluntarism, and some in recent times have seen the view as ultimately incoherent. Even so, Descartes seems to have taken the view as the basis at least of his physics, and perhaps of his whole system. Indeed, on some accounts, it was this doctrine of created truth that enabled Descartes to frame the most radical doubt hitherto conceived, when in the Meditations he entertained the possibility that he was always deceived by a mendacious deity, even when considering what appeared to him most obviously true, to wit, the existence of the “simplest things” that are the subjects of arithmetic and geometry. (Against this view, Margaret Wilson, 105–114, observes that, in Meditation 1, God need only have the power to deceive me about the eternal truths, not to create them.) While a doubt (and a doctrine) this radical might lead one to despair of ever achieving sure knowledge, for Descartes, it was the catalyst for his discovery of the cogito, and with it, his first indubitable truth—the truth of his own existence.

At every stage of Descartes's argument in the Meditations, there are ontological implications: the mind's independence of sensory perceptions (perceptions whose reliability is ultimately upset by the possibility that he is dreaming), the literally unimaginable sort of thing that a physical object such as a piece of wax must be, the existence of a veracious God, who provides a guarantee for the reliability of reason, and finally the existence of a physical world consisting of extended things. Arnauld immediately suggested to Descartes that his argument contained a circle: we can rely on reason only if we know that God exists, but we know that God exists only by relying on reason. Thus, Descartes has established the certainty only of his own existence, but nothing beyond that. Descartes thought that he had a response to this criticism, but whether he did, and how cogent it is as a rebuttal, have been perennial questions of debate among Descartes scholars. One way to understand Descartes's procedure is that while he does not claim to prove even that he exists, he does claim to show that it is unreasonable to think otherwise. That is, he shows that the argument of the skeptic fails because the consistent application of reason leads to the view not that reason is unreliable, but precisely the opposite. The skeptic might be right, but he is unreasonable. Descartes thus emerges at least as a bootstrap rationalist, in a way that mirrors the non-absolute status of his necessary truths. The rationalist connection between the orders of being and knowing is thus preserved.

But what sense can be made of the doctrine of created truth? By what kind of causality did God create the eternal (necessary) truths? In response to this very question Descartes replied that God did so in just the way that He created everything else, that He is the total and efficient cause not only of the existence of created things, but also of their essence. The eternal truths are just this essence of created things. As before, Descartes did not elaborate his answer, but, once again, he provided enough elsewhere for us to do so. It is clear that for Descartes, as for many other theologically orthodox thinkers, the existence of things results from an unconstrained exercise of God's omnipotent will to create ex nihilo. What Descartes might be saying, then, is that an eternal truth or essence is also something that is created ex nihilo. The eternal truths might thus be instances of what Descartes called substance.

In the Principles, Descartes defined “substance” as a thing that exists such that its existence does not depend on any other thing. He immediately added that, strictly speaking, the term applies only to God, who, as uncreated, alone depends on nothing else to exist. However, he allowed that in an extended sense it applies to things that depend only on God's creation and continuing conservation. These created substances are really distinct from other substances insofar as they are conceivable apart from each other. They do not require a subject of inherence, and are thus ontologically, if not causally, independent. These created substances are distinguished from other things, such as qualities, which not only depend on God causally, but also depend ontologically on other things, ultimately on created substances, as subjects of inherence. In this sense, a created substance for Descartes is like the hypokeimenon of Aristotle, playing both its roles, as individuator and bearer of qualities. However, with his definition of the real distinction, he built in an unintended tendency toward monism—a tendency that Spinoza exploited. For Descartes, one thing is really distinct from another just in case it can be conceived apart from that other. But, if this test of independence is applied to causal relations, it produces the result that there is but one substance, God.

What types of things counted as created substances for Descartes? Clearly, he takes an individual mind to be a created substance. If a mind did not have this status, then Descartes's argument for its immortality, that it can be conceived apart from all else except God, and a fortiori from the body, would collapse. Beyond minds, however, an ambiguity appears. Although there are texts in which Descartes speaks of individual things like a piece of wax as substances, there are others that indicate that there is but a single extended substance, of which individual things are the modes. At a minimum, there is an asymmetry in his treatment of minds and material things, perhaps reflecting the tension between a hypokeimenon, accounting for difference, and the other sense of ousia, accounting for sameness. To say that Peter and Paul are substances is to say that their minds are numerically distinct; but to say that a piece of wax and piece of wood are substances might be to say that they are both extended things.

However many instances of each kind there might be, there is a dualism of two kinds of substance, according to Descartes: thinking things, or minds, and extended things, or bodies. This dualism generated two well-known problems, resolved by Descartes with only partial success. His polite critic, Elisabeth of Bohemia, wanted to know how in voluntary action the will, which is a property of the unextended mind, could have an effect on the body, given that, according to Descartes's mechanistic physics, a material thing can be affected only by what is in contact with it. Descartes replied with a rather mysterious account of how the mind and body formed a unique kind of composite.

Descartes's effort to resolve a second difficulty is more promising, and also exemplifies the rationalistic character of his thought. The problem is to show how the mind can know something such as a material thing that is different in kind from it, given a long-standing principle that only like can know like. He rejected this essentially Aristotelian principle, but still had to give an account of such knowledge. From scholastic sources, Descartes was able to construct a theory of ideas according to which to know something is to have an idea of it, the idea being the very thing known in so far as it is known. He saw the term “idea” as ambiguous: taken materially, it has formal reality, as a mode of the mind; taken in another sense, it has objective reality, as the thing represented. But there is no real distinction between these realities, only a rational distinction. They are really the same thing considered differently. A welcome epistemological upshot of this rationalist gambit is that Descartes has no skeptical problems generated by ideas standing as a tertium quid between the knower and what is known.

This result is indicated by Descartes's use of the term, picked up and emphasized by Malebranche, according to which there are no false ideas; every idea in this sense is materially true in that it has an object, and that is the object it appears to have. This conception of an idea is the basis for Descartes of what has been called the transparency of mind: I cannot be mistaken that I am thinking about what I am thinking about. Malebranche (whose entire philosophy was colored by his struggles with Descartes's theory of ideas), in fact, later erected such incorrigible intentionality into the fundamental principle of his epistemology. Meanwhile, Descartes's view that material or formal reality and objective reality are only rationally distinct might be taken to mean that minds are intrinsically intentional. A mind just is the sort of thing whose states are about something else. Arnauld extended this thesis, which adumbrates later thinkers such as Brentano, to include all mental phenomena, even sensations.

3. Malebranche

The battle between the Cartesians and their opponents in the latter half of the seventeenth century was one of the great struggles in the history of philosophy, but it was one in which the lines were not clearly drawn. For, although those in the Cartesian camp claimed the banner of Descartes, there were as many differences among them as between them and their opponents. Perhaps the most important difference among them hinged on whether or not they accepted Descartes's doctrine of created truth. Desgabets and his student Régis were the most important among the few who did accept the doctrine. Along with their acceptance of the doctrine, however, came nascent tendencies toward empiricism. On the other hand, Malebranche, the most notable among the Cartesians who rejected the doctrine of created truth, developed a philosophical system with a purer rationalistic character than Descartes's own. Descartes had advised his followers to follow not him but their own reason. Malebranche, like other heterodox Cartesians, justified his differences from Descartes as the result of following this injunction. On his view, his rejection of the doctrine of created truth followed from his commitment to other, deeper views in Descartes. He thus represented himself as more Cartesian than Descartes himself.

The philosophy of Malebranche is sometimes portrayed as a synthesis of Descartes and Augustine, but a more precise way to put this relation is that Malebranche used Augustine to rectify shortcomings he perceived in the philosophy of Descartes. Chief among these was Descartes's theory of ideas, which, according to Malebranche, not only fails to reflect human beings' proper dependence on God, and, moreover, leads inevitably to skepticism. Initially, Malebranche thought that he agreed with Descartes's theory, but in the long debate over the nature of ideas he had with Arnauld, who held a close version of Descartes's theory, Malebranche came to see a need for a different account.

Not implausibly, Arnauld took Descartes's claim about the ambiguity of the term “idea” to mean that “idea,” or “perception,” refers to one and the same thing, a thing which stands in two different relations. Insofar as it is related to what is known, it is called an idea; insofar as it is related to the mind, it is called a perception. This (act of) perception he took to be related to the mind as a mode of it. It is at this point that Malebranche detected the threat of skepticism. What we know, indeed what we know in the most important instances of knowledge, is universal, necessary, and infinite, as in the case of certain mathematical knowledge. But nothing that is the mode of a particular, contingent and finite mind can be universal, necessary or infinite. If ideas were modes of the mind, then we would not have such knowledge; but since we do have such knowledge, ideas must be something else. Malebranche argued that the only being in which such ideas could exist is God. Following Augustine, he took ideas to be the exemplars in the mind of God after which He creates the world. This construal had the additional advantage for Malebranche of guarding against skepticism because, although idea and object are no longer identical, they are nonetheless necessarily connected as exemplar and exemplum. Even so, it remained true for Malebranche that, when we look at a material thing, what we in fact see is not that thing but its idea. This is the core of his view of “vision of all things in God,” which he welcomed as an indication of human beings' dependence on the deity. The immediate vehicle whereby we have such knowledge is a particular, contingent, and finite mode of the mind; but the universal, necessary, and infinite object of that mode can exist only in some other kind of being. How are these ideas known to the mind if they are not in it, at least not as modes of it? Although ideas are not innate to the mind, for that would make them modes of it, they are nonetheless always present to it. In seeking to know, whether we realize it or not, we are consulting Reason, which Malebranche identifies with the second person of the Trinity, the logos of neo-Platonic theology. Our effort to know is a “natural prayer” that Reason always answers. Malebranche was thus a majuscule rationalist.

As for individual substances, Malebranche clearly thought that every material thing and every mind is a substance in the sense of a hypokeimenon. But when pressed late in his life to show how this status for them comported with the rest of his system, how they could be anything but modes of a single substance, in short how he avoided the drift into Spinozistic monism, he was in fact hard pressed. In the Search After Truth, Malebranche clearly committed himself to the view that everything is either a substance or a mode. In addition, he accepted Descartes's criterion for a substance that it be conceivable apart from everything else. However, he maintained that any given portion of extension is conceivable apart from the rest of extension and is thus a substance. (Descartes did not think this, otherwise void space would be possible for him.) Since extension is conceptually divisible to infinity, Malebranche is committed to an infinite number of extended substances. Apart from the whole of extension, moreover, every substance contains an infinite number of substances, of (each of) which it is a mode. It is also a part of an infinite number of substances, which are modes of it. The explanatory value of the concept of substance would seem to have been lost with such results as these. Malebranche's view seems to be a degenerate version of Descartes's texts to the effect, surprising but coherent, that there is but one material substance, res extensa, whose modes are particular material things. Here the effect is to reverse the Aristotelian logic of substance. To say of x, a particular thing, that it is extended E, is to say not that a substance x has a property E, but that x is a mode of res extensa.

These difficulties in accounting for substance on Malebranche's part seem to derive from his Platonism. As a Platonist, he was interested less in substance as the hypokeimenon, which accounts for difference, than in its other sense of ousia, which accounts for sameness. Thus, Malebranche's skid to Spinozism is greased even when he talks about mind, the essence of which is thought—not this or that thought, “but substantial thought, thought capable of all sorts of modifications or thoughts.” Since the same substantial thought is had by all possessed of a mind, Malebranche's view smacks even of the single intellectual soul for all men of the Latin Averroists. In this sense too, then, his heterodoxy as a Cartesian is part and parcel with his deep commitment to rationalism, and in particular with his rationalistic reduction of phenomenal difference to real sameness.

The final rationalistic aspect of Malebranche's thought that deserves attention here is his theory of causation. For Malebranche, a cause is that between which and whose effect there is a necessary connection. On his view, the causal connection that is characterized by this kind of necessity is that between God's will and its effects. Thus, for Malebranche, only God has causal efficacy. What we take to be real causes—for example the motion of a billiard ball that collides with another that then begins to move—are in fact only occasional causes, the occasions for the operation of the only real cause. Given Malebranche's combined rationalistic and theological commitments, none of this is surprising. The surprise, or at least irony, comes when Malebranche's arguments that natural causes—even and especially human volitions—cannot be real causes cross the channel and are deployed by Hume. The radical empiricist account of causation that Hume gave in terms of constant conjunction is just Malebranche's rationalist occasionalism without the role assigned to God. For Hume, Malebranche's occasional causes are the only causes.

4. Spinoza

The centrality of substance for the continental rationalists is further borne out by the importance of that concept for Spinoza, especially within his Ethics. Spinoza devoted the entire first part of that work to a consideration of substance, or, as he also termed it “Deus sive Natura” (“God, in other words, Nature”). The remaining parts trace the consequences of his conception of substance for epistemology, psychology, physics, and ethics. While Spinoza's account of substance is quite rightly regarded as a development and working-out of Descartes's metaphysics, there are also (as with Descartes and Malebranche) considerable, and important, differences between the two. What is important for our present purposes, however, is that, (as with Malebranche) Spinoza's departures from Descartes are almost always the manifestation of a form of rationalism purer than Descartes's own. Most radically, Spinoza replaced Descartes's substance pluralism with a monistic account modelled on Cartesian extended substance. Just as, in some places, Descartes treats bodies are mere modes of a single extended substance, so, for Spinoza, all individuals—both bodies and minds—are modes of a single substance.

Spinoza arrived at this position by way of a decidedly un-Cartesian account of attributes. While Descartes held that two substances of the same type can share the same principal attribute, Spinoza rejected this. Any two substances, argued Spinoza, must be distinguished either by their attributes (Spinoza dropped the modifier “principal”.) or by their modes. But, since modes are themselves both ontologically and causally dependent on the substances of which they are affections, they cannot be the individuating principle for them. Thus, it must be the attributes themselves that individuate substances (and not just types of substances, as Descartes argued). Similarly, while Descartes held that each substance is characterized by one and only one principal attribute, Spinoza invoked the principle of plenitude to show that substance must have infinite attributes. Based on a variation of the ontological argument, he maintained that substance is pure, utterly unlimited being. It must therefore, he argued, possess infinite attributes, in the dual sense of possessing unlimited attributes and of possessing all attributes. Since substance is characterized by infinite attributes, and since no two substances can share a single attribute, there can be only one substance.

Spinoza's one substance is at the farthest possible remove from Aristotle's proper substances. Whereas, for Aristotle, individual things such as Bucephalus, are paradigmatic substances, Spinoza denies their substantiality. But does this mean that, unlike Aristotelian proper substances, which are not predicable of anything else, Spinoza's finite modes are predicable of substance? Scholars are divided on this point. Curley has argued that Spinoza retains the conception of the substance-mode distinction as a distinction between independent and dependent being, but rejects the view that the substance-mode distinction correlates to the distinction between a subject of predication and its predicate. Bennett, however, argues that Spinoza does indeed regard finite modes as predicable of substance, or, as he puts it, as “adjectival on the world.” Bennett characterizes Spinoza's account of substance as a “field metaphysic” in which individual things are simply clusters of qualities within regions of space. Just as a blush is merely a confluence of properties on a region of a face, so the face—indeed, the person whose face it is—is a confluence of properties “on a region” of substance.

Whether or not Spinoza rejected the predicability of finite modes, it is clear that he did not regard them as either causally or conceptually independent in the way that is requisite for substance. For Spinoza, substance is “in itself and is conceived through itself,” whereas a mode is “in something else and is conceived through something else.” The “in itself/in something else” aspect of these two definitions captures Descartes's conception of causal independence, while the “conceived through itself/through something else” aspect refers to Descartes's conceivability-apart criterion for ontological independence. Descartes, it will be recalled, regarded divine substance as both causally and ontologically independent, but created substances as ontologically, but not causally, independent, since they depend on God's creative (and conservative) power for their existence. It is in this sense that, for Descartes, the term “substance” is used equivocally for God and created substances. Spinoza, however, denied that “substance” is an equivocal term. In so doing, he eliminated two asymmetries in Descartes's metaphysics—that between divine and created substance, and that between extended and thinking substance. For Spinoza, finite minds are not themselves substances, but rather modes of thinking substance. That is, for Spinoza, at the most fundamental level, all minds reduce to the thinking substance of which they are affections.

Spinoza's account of the eternal verities marks a similar rationalistic advance over Descartes's metaphysics. For Spinoza, God is just substance simpliciter. He lacks volition and personality; his only characteristics are pure being, infinity, necessity and activity. While Spinoza agreed with Descartes that God is the cause of all things, he regarded him not as a transeunt cause, creating the universe “from the outside” through an act of will, but as an immanent cause, from whom the universe unfolds out of his own necessity. For Spinoza, all things therefore follow by logical (and not merely causal) necessity from God's eternal and infinite nature. In this sense, not only mathematical truths but indeed such apparently contingent facts as Caesar's having crossed the Rubicon are necessary truths for Spinoza. The difference between them is not the necessity of the truths themselves but rather the route that we take to arrive at them. While mathematical truths, for instance, are deducible by reason alone, Spinoza recognized that the finitude of human understanding prevents, or at least impedes, our similarly deducing empirical facts about the world. In contrast with the empiricists, who regard cause and effect as mere constant conjunction, for Spinoza, the relationship between cause and effect has the force of a logical entailment; empirical facts are themselves necessary truths. The universe is thus, in principle at least, perfectly intelligible to reason.

For Spinoza, as for Descartes, the metaphysical commitment to substance underwrote a rationalist epistemology that strongly privileges reason and intuition over sensation and imagination. The distinctive character of Spinoza's epistemological rationalism is rooted in his principle that “the order and connection of ideas is the order and connection of things.” For Descartes, the mind and the body are, though intimately connected, radically heterogeneous. How it is that the mind comes to know things about the physical world therefore remains, despite his best efforts, a somewhat murky business. By rejecting the substantiality of both minds and bodies, and by regarding them both as modes of a single substance, Spinoza obviated this difficulty. For Spinoza, the mind and the body are the very same thing conceived in two different ways. Persistent clusters of qualities in space are bodies. The ideas—or, in Descartes's terminology, the objective reality—of these bodies are minds. Just as a single body has a corresponding objective reality, so collections of bodies characterized by various relations also have a corresponding objective reality with isomorphic parts and relations. Since there is no gap between minds and bodies, there is therefore no difficulty in principle in perceiving the physical world. On Spinoza's account, we perceive the physical world in two ways—(1) by perceiving the actions of our own bodies, and (2) by perceiving the effects of other bodies on ours. Thus, when one's body runs, the correlative ideas are in one's mind. Likewise, when someone steps on one's toe, the physical effects on the toe likewise have their counterparts in the mind's ideas.

Despite the necessary connection the mind has with the body, argued Spinoza, sensation and imagination are inherently limited. The idea of substance qua substance must be a perfect unity. However, the idea which constitutes the human mind is complex—not a unity but a plurality of ideas. That idea is therefore confused, rather than clear and distinct. Clear and distinct understanding, on Spinoza's account must partake of the unity of the idea of substance, and not of the fragmentary nature of the idea of the human body and its affects. This cognitive unity is achieved in two ways—through reason (which Spinoza termed “knowledge of the second kind”) and through intuition (“knowledge of the third kind”). When we cognize through sensation and imagination (“knowledge of the first kind”), we try to grasp many ideas at once, and thereby produce confusion. Reason and intuition, by contrast, provide us with access to just one idea—the substantial unity underlying our body and our mind. Reason does this from “the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things,” while intuition proceeds “from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God.” To understand the substantial unity that is the necessary cause of our body and our mind is to grasp them sub specie aeternitatis.

This epistemological ideal forms the core of Spinoza's rationalistic ethics—and, hence, on one plausible account, the core of his Ethics. Spinoza's monism entails that the sort of individuals that Aristotle regarded as primary substances are distinguished not by their own substantial unity, but by their conatus—their striving to persist. Thus, self-preservation is not just one possible goal of ethical agents; it is the very thing that makes those agents individuals. Our essence, and our ethical task, is thus to be active, whereas, by contrast, to be passive threatens our persistence. The mind persists through activity and is threatened by passivity. It is therefore in our self-interest to pursue adequate ideas through knowledge of the second and third kinds. The more we join our minds with God through adequate knowledge of things under the form of eternity, the less we are affected by external things and, hence, by our own passions, which are nothing but our passivity in the face of forces external to us. Adequate knowledge of God gives us equanimity and calm, and literally ensures our persistence. Ethical virtue is thus fundamentally epistemological. For Spinoza, the most rationalist of figures discussed here, the good life is the utterly rational life.

5. Leibniz

As we have seen, rationalist epistemology is grounded in a metaphysical commitment to substance. The concept of substance allowed the rationalists to reduce all complexity and plurality to an underlying simplicity and unity, versus the empiricists, who, in their skepticism about substance, were committed to regarding reality as fundamentally plural and complex. Spinoza's metaphysics marked the culmination of this rationalist momentum. In Leibniz, the last great continental rationalist, we see its final movement. Leibniz, like other rationalists before him, regarded quotidian things as phenomena that ultimately reduce to perfectly simple substances. However, for Leibniz, there is an infinite number of these simple substances, each of them causally and perceptually isolated from all of the others. Leibniz reasoned that this is the best of all possible worlds because it balances the maximal possible complexity with the maximal possible order. In thus privileging neither unity nor plurality, neither simplicity nor complexity, and in striking the balance that he did on purely rational principles, Leibniz exemplified a more complex, more comprehensive and, ultimately, more mature rationalism than that of his predecessors.

For Leibniz, at the most fundamental level, reality is characterized by simple substances, or “monads”. Since there are composites, Leibniz argued, there must be simple substances that, together, constitute these composites. Being simple, monads have neither parts, nor extension, nor form, nor divisibility. Leibniz saw them as the “true Atoms of nature.” While Leibniz thus retained a strong commitment to substance, he resisted rationalism's synechistic momentum by rehabilitating substance's Aristotelian role as an individuator. However, while, for Aristotle, Bucephalus is a proper substance, Leibniz regarded Bucephalus not as a substance but as himself comprising a collection of simple substances. Leibniz agreed with Aristotle's characterization of substance as the grammatical subject of predication and not itself predicable of anything else. However, he complained that this account does not go far enough. For Leibniz, the essence of substance lies not in the fact that it is the subject of predication, but in the fact that every possible predicate may be asserted or denied of it. In this way, every individual substance has a complete concept, a conception so complete (that is, so fully determinate) that every fact about the substance, and about its situation in the universe—past, present or future—follows from it analytically. In fact, Leibniz offered a statement of this very principle as his Principle of Sufficient Reason.

Leibniz's insistence that every individual substance has a complete concept entailed that, unlike Spinoza, he regarded Cartesian thinking substance and not Cartesian extended substance as paradigmatic of substance. Descartes' extended substance (like Spinozistic substance) is, on Leibniz's account, not a substance at all since it does not afford a principle of individuation. Leibniz argued that, whereas a real substance has a complete concept, the Cartesian notion of extended substance is an abstraction arrived at through an incomplete concept. Matter on its own is insufficient to form or to constitute a substance. For Leibniz, a body could never be a candidate for substance since bodies are susceptible to alteration and are infinitely divisible. We can thus never arrive at a body of which it can be said, “Here really is an entity.” Moreover, whereas Cartesian extended substance is totally inert, Leibniz insisted that activity is the hallmark of substance. Anything that acts is a substance; every substance constantly and uninterruptedly acts. For Leibniz, this position follows from God's perfection. God's planning of the universe was so perfect that it only required to be set in motion by him. True substances (that is, entia per se) are active and self-causing. On Leibniz's account, God would lack all dignity were he the sole cause in the universe—that is, if occasionalism or interventionalism were necessary. God's perfect planning avoids the necessity for (continual or continuous) extraordinary concourse. Thus, God's perfection entails that all substances are active; passive extension is only matter, not substance.

The activity, or appetition, that Leibniz regards as characterizing the monads is intimately bound up with his Principle of Sufficient Reason. For Leibniz, a monad contains its whole history because each monadic state (except for those states—creation is paradigmatic of these—that are the result of divine causation) has its sufficient cause in the preceding state. In turn, the present state is the sufficient cause of all succeeding states. Despite this emphasis on the inherent activity of substance, Leibniz, like Spinoza, rejected the possibility of transeunt causation among substances. Monads are “windowless” and neither admit nor emit causal influence. Moreover, being thus windowless, monads can no more receive perceptions from the world than they can any other external causation. Rather, a monad's perceptions are built-in at creation. By pre-established harmony, these perceptions perfectly align with the universe's infinite monadic states. This entails that while there is no genuine transeunt causation at the monadic level, a kind of pseudo-causation results from monads' harmonized perceptions of each other as their respective appetitions convey them through successive changes. For Leibniz, causal relations thus reduce to logical relations in that every change in a substance follows from its concept.

While Leibniz's view that every substance has a complete concept reinforces the centrality of reason in his epistemology, in doing so, it seems to undercut human and even divine volition, and thereby to slide toward Spinozism. If every fact about Julius Caesar, and indeed, every other fact about the universe is rationally deducible from the Roman Dictator's complete concept, then it would seem that only one course for the universe is possible. However, this is not a step that Leibniz was willing to take. Were there no distinction between contingent and necessary truths, argued Leibniz, fatalism would be true, and human liberty of the will would be impossible. Leibniz sought to avert this result by distinguishing between hypothetical and absolute necessity. Absolute necessity, he argued, is governed by the principle of contradiction. Something is absolutely necessary if its negation is logically impossible. Hypothetical necessity, on the other hand, describes a state of affairs that is necessary ex hypothesi—that is, just in case a particular antecedent holds—but not logically necessary. On Leibniz's account, the fact that Caesar crossed the Rubicon is only hypothetically necessary; it follows necessarily from the existence of the individual substance that is Caesar, but its denial is not logically impossible. According to Leibniz, God at creation conceived of an infinite array of possible worlds. The myriad contingent facts of each of these worlds are only hypothetically necessary. That is, they would only be necessary if God were to instantiate that world. Since the present world is the one that God chose to instantiate, all of the contingent facts of this world are certain. However, they are nonetheless contingent since their negation implies no absurdity. That is, there was no logical impossibility preventing Caesar from deciding not to cross the Rubicon. In this sense, his will—and, indeed, human will generally—is free. Leibniz's argument for hypothetical necessity has an obvious antecedent in Descartes's doctrine of created truth. However, unlike Descartes, Leibniz limited the doctrine's scope to contingent truths. He nonetheless hoped to avoid Spinozist necessitarianism. Whether or not he succeeded in doing so is a matter of debate in the literature.

Inasmuch as it characterizes the universe as composed of a plurality of individual existences, none of which has any genuine causal efficacy over any other, Leibniz's position shows considerable affinities with Hume's empiricism. However, while Hume inferred from this the importance of empirical experience, Leibniz instead took this ontology to preclude adventitious knowledge. He thus remained committed on metaphysical grounds to the doctrine of innate ideas. In his rejection of transeunt causation among substances, Leibniz rejected the notion that we can learn new things about the world in the sense of gaining new ideas that do not already exist in our souls. On Leibniz's account, the temporal coincidence of a certain phenomenon with one's “learning” of the phenomenon was pre-established at creation in the same way that all monadic states were. Leibniz admitted that it is idiomatically acceptable to speak about acquiring knowledge via the senses. However, he regarded all sensory reports as reducible to, and explicable as, descriptions of logical relations. Leibniz's theory of knowledge thus relegates the Aristotelian idea of human beings as blank slates who learn through induction to a mere façon de parler. By contrast, he strongly endorsed Plato's doctrine of recollection to the extent that it locates all knowledge in ideas already residing in the soul. Socrates's exchange with Meno's slave boy, argued Leibniz, shows that the soul already possesses the ideas upon which truths about the universe depend, and needs only to be reminded of them.

On Leibniz's account, substances have built into them perceptions of the whole universe. Every substance, he argued, is a mirror of the whole universe to the extent that everything that has ever happened or existed or will ever happen or exist are included in its complete concept. The perceptions of all substances, he maintained, thus resemble God's infinite perception in their unlimited scope. It is with respect to clarity and distinctness that the perceptions of created substance fall short of God's. For Leibniz, the best of all possible worlds is that world that balances the maximal possible complexity with the maximal possible order. The existing world satisfies this through the infinite variety of perspectives taken by the monads. By the principle of order, each monad reflects the very same world as do the other monads. However, by the principle of complexity, the monads reflect the world from an infinite number of unique perspectives. This infinite variety in perspectives entails that each monad reflects all of the others with varying degrees of clarity and distinctness. In this way, the universe is replete with an infinite number of different representations of God's works. Among these, only God's perceptions are universally clear and distinct. While the complexity requirement for the best of all possible worlds would seem to preclude in principle the possibility of human beings achieving knowledge of the universe sub specie aeternitatis, Leibniz made a special exception for human souls. On Leibniz's account, all monads have low-level perceptions, of the kind that we experience when we are in a stupor. However, the souls of living things have, over and above this, feelings and memories. Human souls have, besides this, through divine election, the power of reason. It is reason that allows us to understand the universe as a system, through the use of models and idealizations, and thereby to grasp the eternal truths. In this way, argued Leibniz, human minds are not only mirrors of the universe of created things, but indeed mirror God himself. While the rise of British empiricism, and of Kant's critical philosophy marked the end of continental rationalism as a movement, Leibniz's elegant vision was a fitting paean to the movement and, indeed, to the power of human reason.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Catholic Encyclopedia, maintained by Kevin Knight of the New Advent Catholic website. Includes entries on all of the figures discussed in the above article.
  • Descartes E Il Seicento, maintained by Giulia Belgioioso (Director, Centro Interdipartmentali Di Studi Su Descartes E Il Seicento), Jean-Robert Armogathe (Centre d'études cartésiennes) et al.
  • Leibnitiana, maintained by Gregory Brown at the University of Houston.
  • The Houston Circle for the Study of Early Modern Philosophy, jointly hosted by the University of Houston Department of Philosophy and the Rice University Philosophy Department.
  • Necessarily Eternal, this so-called “Catablog of (All) Things Spinoza” has not been updated since 2009. Nonetheless, it houses a very impressive linked list of active Spinoza scholars and other useful resources.
  • Leibniz, maintained by Jan Cover of the Purdue University Department of Philosophy.
  • Studia Spinoziana, maintained by Ron Bombardi, Department of Philosophy, Middle Tennessee State University.

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