Theories of the Common Law of Contracts

First published Fri Sep 11, 2015

Contract is a branch of private law. It thus concerns private obligations that arise in respect of symmetrical relations among natural and artificial persons rather than public obligations that arise in respect of hierarchical relations between persons and the state. Contract, at least in its orthodox expression, is distinctive for concerning chosen, or voluntary, obligations—that is, obligations constituted by the intentions of the contracting parties. This entry describes doctrinal and theoretical accounts of contract law with a special emphasis on the relationship between contract law and two near-neighbors—tort law and fiduciary law.

Section 1 briefly outlines the doctrinal structure of orthodox contract law, with an emphasis on contract’s character as chosen obligation. At the same time, contract law concerns obligations that might also be associated with adjacent bodies of doctrine that elaborate un-chosen obligations—in particular tort law and fiduciary law—and the norms—concerning due care and loyalty—that underlie these involuntary obligations. Section 2 describes encroachments by these bodies of law into contract and the doctrinal, economic, and moral ideas that each employs. Section 3 asks whether contract might remain doctrinally and theoretically separate from tort and fiduciary law and retain its distinctive character as chosen, private obligation.

1. Contract’s Doctrinal Distinctiveness

The idea that contract establishes chosen obligation highlights the affinity between contract obligation in law and promissory obligation in morals. And contracts indeed do characteristically arise through an exchange of promises. This is inscribed in legal doctrine, in the principles that contracts are created through offer, acceptance, and consideration. An offer, according to the U.S. second Restatement on Contracts,

is the manifestation of willingness to enter into a bargain, so made as to justify another person in understanding that his assent to that bargain is invited and will conclude it. (R2 Contracts: §24)[1]

To establish a contract, an offer must be met with an appropriate acceptance, characteristically

a manifestation of assent to the terms [of the offer] made by the offeree in a manner invited or required by the offer. (§50)

These requirements entail that all orthodox contracts contain promises. But not all promises establish contracts, among other reasons because the law further requires that contracts be supported by good consideration. The consideration doctrine, in its modern form, adds a bargain requirement to contract formation. The Restatement says that

[t]o constitute consideration, a performance or a return promise must be bargained for

and adds that

[a] performance or return promise is bargained for if it is sought by the promisor in exchange for his promise and is given by the promisee in exchange for that promise. (R2 Contracts: §71)

Contracts, that is, must arise not out of a simple, gratuitous promise, but rather out of an exchange of promises, in which each promise constitutes, in Oliver Wendell Holmes’s words, “reciprocal conventional inducement” for the other (Holmes 1881: 293–94).

Contract obligation so constituted possesses several fundamental features that distinguish it from adjacent forms of private obligation recognized by law, including in particular tort obligation on the one hand and fiduciary obligation on the other. Indeed, the formal structure of contract may be understood by establishing contrasts between contract obligation and these near-neighbors. Most importantly, contract is distinct from both tort and fiduciary law in that contract involves essentially chosen obligations. A contractual obligation, that is, does not just come into being in connection with a choice but is, rather, itself chosen—directly intended into existence. The lawyer Samuel Williston—who wrote a leading treatise and served as Reporter for the Restatement (First) of Contracts—once observed that he “[didn’t] see why a man should not be able to make himself liable if he wishes to do so” (Handbook NCCUSL 1925: 194). And orthodox contract law largely reflects this approach to contractual obligation. Philosophers, moreover, have produced several elaborations of the will theory of contracts that the orthodox approach invites.[2]

Orthodox contract is, in this respect, distinct from tort: a tort obligation might arise in connection with a choice—as the obligation not to be drunk arises in connection with the choice to operate a car; a contract obligation, by contrast, is itself immediately chosen—at the core of every offer and every acceptance lies, as the Restatement says, an intention to establish an obligation by communicating this intention.

The distinction between contract and tort may be understood in greater detail by reading it off the face of legal doctrine.

To begin with, in contradistinction to the classical obligations of tort law—including both obligations concerning intentional torts and negligence—contract obligation is not fault-based but rather strict liability. A contractual promisor might take all reasonable (that is, non-negligent or cost-justified in the sense associated with tort law) care to avoid making contracts that she cannot keep and might make every reasonable (cost-justified) effort to keep whatever contracts she has made. Yet she remains liable to her promisee when she makes and breaches a contract.

Furthermore, and again in contradistinction to tort obligation, contract obligation is forward-rather than backward-looking; contract concerns realizing promised gains rather than restoring a status quo ante disturbed by a wrong. A contractual promisor must not just avoid harming her promisee on account of his reliance on the promise, she must affirmatively vindicate her promisee’s expectations of performance. Contract remedies further reflect the forward-looking character of contract obligations. These remedies do not just make promisees who have been disappointed by breach whole, restoring them to the positions that they would have occupied had contractual promises never been made. Rather, the law requires promisors to put their promisees in positions as good as they would have occupied had the promisors performed. Typically, contract law achieves this end by awarding money damages that insure the promisees’ valuations of performance (under what the law calls the expectation remedy) (R2 Contracts: §344 cmt. a).[3]

Orthodox contract’s chosen character also distinguishes it from fiduciary duties. Fiduciary obligations need not be chosen—think of the duties that parents owe children or that a court-appointed lawyer owes her client. And even where fiduciary relations arise in connection with and perhaps through choices, the obligations themselves do not arise at the pleasure of the choices of the parties who owe them. The substantive duties that fiduciary relations involve, that is, are not cabined by the original intentions of the parties but instead reflect mandatory duties of fiduciary loyalty. Fiduciary duties may thus grow and change organically, ex post, with the relations themselves, as loyalty’s demands adjust to a beneficiary’s new vulnerabilities. By contrast, contract law limits contractual obligations according to the parties’ ex ante intentions and never requires a party to shoulder a new burden, not assumed up front, simply because changing circumstances make this best overall. Even long-term, relational contracts take their content from the parties’ (shifting and developing) intentions rather than from legally mandated principles of fairness, loyalty, or other-regard.

This general distinction is once again inscribed in greater detail in the doctrinal particulars of contract law.

Most notably, whereas the core fiduciary duty demands that fiduciaries display loyalty in favor of their beneficiaries,[4] the core duty of contract law requires only that promisors perform their contracts in good faith (see, e.g., R2 Contracts: §205 cmt. a; U.C.C. §1-304). Fiduciary loyalty necessarily involves a measure of affirmative, open-ended other regard. Contractual good faith, by contrast, expressly announces no substantive obligation additional to the terms of a contractual promise but instead articulates respect for the terms of this promise. In particular, good faith forbids the exercise of discretion during performance designed to recapture a benefit allocated to a counterparty at formation (Burton 1980: 373). Good faith thus does not so much introduce altruism into the contract relation as preclude contract obligation itself from exacerbating inequality in bargaining power, thus becoming a tool of exploitative advantage-taking. Whereas a fiduciary who promises to walk a mile with her beneficiary must, if new circumstances require, walk with him twain, a contractual promisor must walk only the precise mile, and along the precise path, that she promised. Apart from recognizing the side-constraint of good faith, a contractual promisor may remain as self-interested within her contract as she was without it.

This difference has practical consequences. A promisor who breaches a contract (for example, a seller who delivers her goods not to her initial buyer but to a third party who offers a higher price) may thus retain the ex post gains from this so-called “efficient breach”. This rule permits even an intentionally breaching promisor to vindicate only her promisee’s value of performance rather than, say, disgorging her own (greater) gains from breach. A contractual promisor who contemplates breach may thus consult exclusively her own self-interest in respect of the gains that breach creates. She retains the right to manage the performance on her own account, as it were, rather than as her promisee’s trustee. Similarly, a promisee confronted with breach must take all reasonable steps to protect her contractual expectations herself or risk being denied her full expectation remedy, under the doctrine that requires victims of breach to mitigate their damages. This doctrine reflects the fact that contracting parties will include a duty of reasonable mitigation in their agreements ex ante, in order to maximize the expected contractual surplus available for them to share. Contracts thus include implied agreements that promisors may require their promisees to reduce the losses associated with even self-interested breaches. Fiduciary loyalty would forbid this.

Contract thus falls in between tort and fiduciary obligation. Contracts create a special relationship between the parties to them, constituted by strict liability, forward-looking obligations that reach beyond the tort obligations of reasonable care that persons owe even to strangers. But at the same time, the special relationship that contract establishes retains an extremely thin character. The parties to contracts remain at arm’s length and assume no duties of loyalty or open-ended other regard for one another. Instead, contracting parties acquire only a duty of good faith respect for the contractual settlements that their agreements elaborate. As Charles Fried observed (in developing an account of contract law based on the law’s promissory roots and thus on the idea that contract obligation is “essentially self-imposed”) (1981: 2), contractual trust does not establish intimacy but rather serves “humdrum ends: We make appointments, buy and sell” (1981: 8).

2. Contract’s Vulnerability to Tort and Fiduciary Law

Even though contract asserts its distinctiveness from both tort and fiduciary law, each adjacent body of obligation has, at some point in the past half-century, emerged as a competitor to contract. Contract, that is, might be recast as a special case of tort or fiduciary obligation. This should perhaps come as no surprise. A legal form that establishes special obligations of a sort that do not arise among strangers but equally rejects the affirmative and open-ended obligations that arise among intimates deprives itself of the most natural arguments in its favor. And this has rendered the grounds of contract uncertain, and contract itself vulnerable to encroachments from tort or fiduciary law.

Suggestions that contract might be recast as tort or fiduciary law invariably proceed along two often-parallel lines: one concerns legal doctrine; and the other legal theory. Studying these suggestions yields insight into the strengths and weaknesses of accounts that understand contract, in the classical manner, as a free-standing form of chosen obligation.

2.1 Contract as Tort

Ever since contract emerged from tort in the common law, both doctrinal and theoretical forces have sought to restore contractual obligation to its tort-based origins. In each case, tort’s encroachment emphasizes the role that reliance plays in contractual obligation.

A contractual promise typically engenders reliance by its promisee. Indeed, the reliance is among the points behind the promise. By relying on the performance even before it is provided, the promisee increases its value to him: a buyer of cement, for example, increases its value by investing in gravel to mix with the cement and skilled workers to build with it. This increase in the performance’s value, moreover, increases the amount that the promisee will pay for the promise up front. Reliance and investment thus increase a contract’s value to both promisee and promisor.

The prospect of reliance suggests re-constituting contract on the model of tort. The explicit misrepresentation torts are narrowly cabined, to be sure. Fraud, for example, requires scienter (see R2 Torts: §526); and liability for merely negligent misrepresentation does not generally arise in connection with statements of intention.[5] But perhaps the body of doctrine nominally called “contract” in fact expands liability for misrepresentation from outside tort law’s official boundaries but nevertheless by deploying tort’s basic structures and principles. Perhaps “contract” is just the name that the law gives to the sub-class of tort obligations arising in respect of one person’s reliance on another’s representations concerning her future conduct or current intentions in respect of this conduct. Understanding contract doctrine in this way requires taking some interpretive license, but perhaps not so much as to require rejecting tort law’s basic colonizing claim.

To begin with, the distance between contractual strict liability for promises on the one hand and, on the other, tort-like duties of reasonable care in respect of representations concerning future conduct should not be overstated. Modern contract law employs a so-called “objective” standard to evaluate offer and acceptance. (Recall that the Restatement’s definition of offer refers not to the offeror’s actual state of mind but rather to manifestations that “justify another person in understanding” that assent is invited.) This standard plausibly transforms contract from chosen obligation—which arises at the pleasure of the promisor’s actual intentions—into obligation that arises involuntarily based on the intentions others reasonably believe the promisor to have. And even the requirement of privity—that contractual obligation arises only directly among the parties to a promise and not towards third parties who rely on promises—has been relaxed. It would go too far to say that this change makes a contractual promisor liable to all third parties whose reliance on her promises she has reason to foresee, but the retreat from privity opens up the possibility that such an approach no longer qualitatively misunderstands the positive law.

Furthermore, not just contract formation but the content of contractual obligation once established might also be recharacterized along the lines of tort law’s harm-based approach. Contract’s forward-looking obligations—to vindicate contractual expectations rather than just rectify reliance-based losses—are less distinctive than they might appear. It has been familiar at least since Lon Fuller and William Perdue pointed it out that where markets are thick, so that a promisee’s reliance on her promisor includes forsaking an effectively identically attractive offer from another promisor, then the promisee’s reliance interest equals her valuation of performance—her contractual expectation (Fuller & Perdue 1936). In addition, any number of legal doctrines—imposing requirements of foreseeability (see, e.g., Hadley v. Baxendale 1854), for example, or respecting the proof of lost expectations (see, e.g., R2 Contracts §351; U.C.C. §2-723)—cabin the expectation interest and remedy where markets are not thick. And there even exist cases in which courts have refused to vindicate contractual expectations that could not be recast as reliance losses in respect of forgone opportunities, including by reading a reliance requirement into the conditions for establishing certain contractual commitments (see, e.g., Overstreet v. Norden Laboratories 1982).

Finally, contract law’s black letter has—at least since the Restatement (First) of Contracts and more expansively still in the Restatement (Second)—included the doctrine that

[a] promise which the promisor should reasonably expect to induce action or forbearance on the part of the promisee or a third person and which does induce such action or forbearance is binding if injustice can be avoided only by enforcement of the promise. (R2 Contracts: §90)

This principle—called Promissory Estoppel—was initially narrowly construed by courts, so that it effectively applied only where all the essential elements of properly promissory (and hence orthodox contract) obligation obtained, but a technical failure, typically of consideration, nevertheless prevented a contract from arising in the ordinary fashion.[6] However, in the middle 1960s, some courts began to expand reliance-based obligation for promissory estoppel to arise in the absence of any completed promise, and based instead on manipulative (but not fraudulent or otherwise conventionally tortious) representations made during pre-contractual negotiations (The leading case remains Hoffman v. Red Owl Stores, Inc. 1965). This class of obligations—possessing a contractual character but arising out of reliance on pre-promissory representations and thus apart from any fully-formed promise—imposed contracts entirely apart from consent. If orthodox contract is distinctive on account of being voluntary or chosen private obligation, then obligation arising under §90 so interpreted displaces or colonizes contract, effectively in favor of tort. Thoughts such as these led Grant Gilmore to call promissory estoppel “anti-contract” (Gilmore 1974: 61) and worry that it opened up a class of reliance-based, essentially tort-like obligation that would one-day swallow contract whole.

These doctrinal developments were matched by several substantial theoretical innovations that sought to recharacterize contract as reliance-based and thus in effect a special case of tort.

Genealogical thinkers as different as Patrick Atiyah and Margaret Jane Radin wondered why the law should be especially solicitous of coordination through private exchange or of the promise-based contractual obligation through which market economies manage such exchange (see, e.g., Atiyah 1979 and Radin 1987). Atiyah thus proposed that the best reconstruction of contract law, in its full historical development, de-emphasizes chosen obligation and the promissory form in favor of the thought that contract law coordinates conduct, and rationalizes socially productive reliance on promises, based not on individual private wills but rather on shared public norms—in Atiyah’s words, on “the social and legal morality of a group of persons” (1981: 121). As if on queue, the rise of the unconscionability doctrine (U.C.C. §2-302) generated an apprehension, including in Gilmore (1974) and Fried (1981), that lawmakers were codifying the relevant public norms and legal morality, at least for consumer contracts and possibly beyond.

Economic approaches to contract law similarly de-emphasized contract’s promissory roots and have had (at least in the United States) a much greater impact on both law and legal theory.

The economic analysis of contract law begins, in effect, from Hume’s observation that

experience has taught us, that human affairs wou’d be conducted much more for mutual advantage, were there certain symbols or signs instituted, by which we might give each other security of our conduct in any particular incident. (Hume 1739 [1978]: bk. 3, pt. II, sec. v [Of the Obligation of Promises], p. 522; emphasis removed )

Contract law, as one prominent economic theorist put it, thus allows

individuals to bind themselves to a future course of conduct, to make it easier for others to arrange their lives in reliance on [a] promise. (Craswell 1989: 496; see generally Goetz & Scott 1980)

In this way, law enables persons to coordinate their conduct to their mutual benefit. Contract law, so understood, becomes a legal technology for producing efficient coordination. And contracts should be enforced just insofar as doing so (by increasing confidence in the promises that they contain) establishes optimal incentives for reliance and thus maximizes the joint surplus produced through contractual coordination (see, e.g., Schwartz & Scott 2003: 541).

This approach entails that nothing in the intrinsic character of contract law favors promise-based or chosen obligation; instead, everything depends on contingent facts (contingent on the states of legal, managerial, and economic technologies of production) about what legal forms coordinate reliance in the most efficient way. Many lawyer economists (just what share varies with the times) believe that placing promise at the center of contract fits this bill. But others argue that the law should be more solicitous of reliance—especially reliance on pre-contractual representations—than orthodox contract doctrine allows (see, e.g., Bebchuk & Ben-Shahar 2001: 427; Ben-Schachar 2004; Craswell 1996; Johnston 1999; Katz 1996). Some lawyer-economists have even proposed rejecting outright orthodox contract law’s intentionalist insistence on assent as a pre-requisite for obligation, in favor of a regime in which bargaining gives rise to a converging series of bilateral options, in which each bargaining party may be held to its representations although no agreement has been reached (Ben-Schachar 2004: 1830–35). In addition, and independently, the economic focus on sustaining optimal reliance rejects orthodox contract law’s categorical preference for remedies that, by vindicating a promisee’s forward-looking promissory expectations, possess a distinctively promissory form. It may be that such remedies happen to support optimal reliance, although it may of course not;[7] but in either event, the agreement-based idea of securing the promissee’s benefit of her bargain “will not have played any role in the analysis leading up to [the] conclusion” what remedy is optimal (Craswell 2000: 107).

In all these ways, the economic approach to contract law rejects the idea that contract and tort are categorically distinct. One prominent paper expounding a general economic theory of contract makes this plain in its title, proposing a general theory of contract law based on the tort-like principle of mitigation, or loss-prevention (Goetz & Scott 1983). This feature of economic approaches to contract is natural. It reflects the economic analysis of law’s more general disregard for doctrinal categories: law and economics, one commentator has observed, simply “does not take the doctrinal invocations and restatements as legal data to be explained”, but instead focuses its attention on explaining case outcomes (Kraus 2002: 692).

More explicitly philosophical accounts have also sought to re-characterize contract law as a special case of the broader class of harm-based obligations more familiarly associated with tort.

Broken agreements impose burdens on disappointed promisees: the burdens take the form of costs (including opportunity costs) incurred in reliance on a promised performance that never occurs and disappointments associated with expectations raised by a promise but never vindicated. If these costs might be classed as harms, then

[i]f there is a general principle that one ought not cause harm to others, that might be enough to justify some sort of rule against [agreement-breaking]. (Craswell 1989: 499)

Thoughts much like this led Adam Smith to suggest that contract is

founded on the reasonable expectation produced by a promise … [which is] a declaration of your desire that the person for whom you promise should depend on you for the performance of it. (Smith c.1764 [1985]: 263)

U.S. American lawyers have been familiar with the thought that contract might be best understood as a special case of tort at least since Lon Fuller and William Perdue suggested that reliance-based contractual obligations are easier to justify than expectation-based obligations (Fuller & Perdue 1936: 53–57). The basic impulse behind Fuller and Perdue’s view retains its attraction today. The leading contemporary exponent of this harm-based and thus tort-like theory of contractual obligation is T.M. Scanlon, who argues first that promises should be understood in terms of the morality of harm and second that contracts should be understood to import the moral principles governing promising into law (Scanlon 1998: 295–327, 2001: 93–94). Scanlon’s view grounds promisees’ faith in promissory assurances in pre-promissory moral principles that forbid certain forms of manipulating others and, moreover, require that persons exercise due care in leading others to form certain expectations.[8] Scanlon hopes, in this way, to explain the wrongfulness of making lying or careless promises through these pre-promissory values and then to defend a broader principle of promissory fidelity[9] by reference to the fact that promisees may reasonably trust promisors to avoid these narrower wrongs (Scanlon 1998: 308–09).

Scanlon recognizes that a harm-based theory of promise and contract must account for the ways in which these norms depart from the tort-like norms that generally govern the morality and law of harm:[10] including that promise and contract obligate promisors to perform their promises—to satisfy their promisees’ expectations—rather than merely to compensate disappointed promisees for lost reliance or merely to warn of non-performance in order to minimize such reliance losses;[11] and, that contract law enforces the promisor’s obligation to vindicate her promisee’s expectation and not merely reimburse his lost reliance.[12] Scanlon defends each of these rules of agreement-keeping by comparing the benefits that the rules confer to the burdens that they impose and arguing that, given the balance between these, it would be unreasonable for promisors who must bear the burdens to reject the rules, and that promisees may justifiably claim the benefits of the rules, as the formal structure of the harm theory requires.[13] With respect to the rule that promisors are obligated to satisfy promisees’ expectations and not merely warn them of non-performance or compensate their lost reliance, Scanlon argues that the benefits to promisees of protecting promissory expectations are substantial[14] and that, given the conditions of mutual knowledge, etc., that are built into the general account of promising, the burdens that this rule imposes on promisors are slight.[15] Given this balance, Scanlon concludes, promisees have reason to insist on having their expectations protected and promisors cannot reasonably reject this rule of promise-keeping (Scanlon 1998: 304–05). And similarly, with respect to the legal enforcement of promisees’ expectations, Scanlon argues that the benefits of legal enforcement are substantial,[16] while the costs of enforceability are much less weighty.[17] Scanlon therefore concludes, once again, that in light of this balance no person could reasonably reject a legal regime that enforces contractual expectations (Scanlon 2001).

Legal doctrine (both in its current state and through its genealogical reconstruction), economic theory, and moral theory might thus all be deployed against the view that contract represents a distinctive legal form. These arguments all propose that rather than constituting directly chosen obligation, contract merely reflects the application of broader, involuntarily imposed duties not to harm to the special case of harms imposed through representations of current intentions or future conduct.

2.2 Contract as Fiduciary Obligation

Efforts to assimilate contract to fiduciary obligation have a more recent vintage or at least vogue. Nevertheless, they have been gathering steam.

Here also, the argument against contract’s distinctiveness has a doctrinal component, with remedies playing an especially prominent role in the recent legal developments.

Recall that orthodox contract law’s preference for the expectation remedy, and the associated practice of efficient breach, permits a breaching promisor to retain for herself ex post gains produced by her breach. The contractual duty of good faith in performance requires the promisor to respect the contractual settlement, but vindicating the promisee’s expectation interest fully satisfies the required respect. Beyond this, the promisor may remain as self-interested within the contract as she was without it: once again, she may decide whether to perform or breach by consulting only her own account.

Courts and other legal actors have begun, especially in jurisdictions in the Commonwealth tradition but also (although more cautiously) in the United States, to require more of breaching promisors. Courts in England and in Israel are becoming increasingly sympathetic to “gain based damages” for breach of contract, which give disappointed promisees not just their contractual expectations but also, and additionally, a share of the ex post gains promisors have acquired through breach (see generally Adras Bldg. Material Ltd. v. Harlow & Jones, GmbH 1988; Cunnington 2008). And some U.S. American courts have similarly begun, at least where they perceive breaching promisors as grasping, not just to vindicate promisees’ expectations but also to require promisors to disgorge any gains that their refusals to perform create.[18] The Uniform Commercial Code has similarly liberalized the right to specific performance (U.C.C. §2-716). And the recently adopted Restatement of Restitution gives courts discretion to replace the expectation remedy with disgorgement for breaches that are material, deliberate, and profitable, on the generic ground that expectation damages are “inadequate” (see R3 Restitution; see also Kull 2001: 2023–24.).

The expectation remedy, by definition, provides the promisee with the same value as performance would have done—no less, but also no more. The supracompensatory remedies just described are therefore justified only insofar as a promisor owes her promisee not just good faith in respect of the contractual settlement, but also an obligation to administer contractual performance in the interests of the promisee, with respect to any further gains that become possible. This obligation amounts to a requirement that promisors display greater benevolence for their promisees in respect of unallocated gains within the contract than they were required to display in negotiations concerning these gains without the contract. The metes and bounds of the required benevolence must, moreover, remain open-ended, because the requirement is not limited to respecting the surplus allocation fixed in the initial contract. The move to gain-based damages thus adopts a fiduciary logic: it recasts contract to abandon the arm’s length perspective from which the contract was made in favor of an open-ended obligation of loyalty in favor of the promisee. It should therefore come as no surprise that cases imposing supracompensatory remedies sometimes adopt the idea of a constructive trust—in which the promisor is taken to administer the contractual performance on her promisee’s behalf—to explain their holdings (see, e.g., Gassner v. Lockett 1958).

As occurred in connection with tort, so fiduciary law’s encroachment on contract has attracted theoretical attention. The attention has come from both economically and philosophically minded commentators.

Scholars writing in a principally economic vein have thus observed that the efficiency of the expectation remedy—and in particular the optimal incentives associated with efficient breach—might be replicated by properly administered supracompensatory remedies also (Brooks 2006). The expectation remedy creates efficient incentives to perform or breach—incentives that produce performance when and only when the promisee remains the highest valuer of performance when performance comes due—by placing the decision whether to perform or breach unilaterally in the hand of the promisor (thereby avoiding the transactions costs of renegotiation) while at the same time forcing a breaching promisor to internalize the full costs of breach, including the promisee’s valuation of performance (thereby inducing the promisor to strike the optimal balance among these costs). This result is not unique, however, and a properly constructed restitutionary remedy—which permits the promisee to choose between specific performance of the promise and breach plus disgorgement by the promissor of the gains breach achieves—possesses the same efficiency. Once again, the decision whether to perform or breach falls unilaterally to a single party, this time the promisee who may insist on performance; and the unilateral decider once again internalizes the full costs of any performance he insists on, now understood as the lost opportunity to receive restitution of the gains that breach might have achieved. A theory of “efficient performance” thus perfectly mirrors, and perfectly replicates, orthodox contract law’s theory of efficient breach. This has led lawyer-economists to suggest that economic analysis ends at an impasse—neither orthodox contract nor fiduciary revisionism is more efficient than the other. Some legal scholars would break the economic impasse on moral grounds, favoring “more robust notions of contractual duty” over the feeble notion of duty that (the theory of efficient breach reveals) orthodox accounts of contract law invite (Brooks 2006: 753).

Certain moral theorists have, for some time and with increasing force, adopted a parallel line of attack against orthodox contract law. Orthodox contract remedies merely price breach; and they set prices so low (at levels that enable breaching promisors to profit from their wrongs) as to encourage breaches of the very obligations that contract law purports to establish. This feature of the orthodox doctrine, these critics say, undermines the immanent normativity of contract obligation and causes contract law to diverge from the morality of promise in unattractive ways (various of these claims appear in, for example, Friedman 1989; Shiffrin 2009, 2007; Brooks 2006) Moral critics of orthodox contract also, and relatedly, attack other features of established law, for example the mitigation doctrine. This doctrine supports the expectation remedy by requiring promisees to respond to breach by taking steps to minimize their contractual disappointments. Critics of orthodox contract law charge that the doctrine authorizes breaching promisors to draft their promisees involuntarily into their service, specifically by requiring promisees to exercise initiative in order to reduce the damages that breaching promisors owe (Shiffrin 2012). Supracompensatory remedies, moral critics of orthodox contract say, avoid these wrongs. A legal regime that responded to breach of contract by ordering specific performance, restitutionary disgorgement, or even punitive damages would truly sanction rather than merely pricing breach. Such a regime would thus support the internal norms of contract obligation and bring the law of contract into conformity with the morality of promise. Once again, the doctrines that achieve these ends insert fiduciary norms into contract law.

Accordingly—and as happened in connection with tort—legal doctrine, economic theory, and moral thought are once again deployed against the view that contract represents a distinctive legal form. These arguments again propose that rather than constituting distinctively chosen obligation, on terms fully fixed by the contracting parties’ ex ante intentions, contract should reflect the application of broader and not purely voluntary duties to the special case of agreements. The new assault on contract differs from the old in that it proceeds from contract’s opposite flank and invokes not the involuntary duties to avoid harm that tort law establishes among strangers but rather the involuntary duties of affirmative other-regard that fiduciary law imposes among intimates.

3. Can Contract Remain Chosen Obligation?

Both challenges—from tort and from fiduciary law—reject contract’s formal distinctiveness by rejecting contract’s character as chosen obligation. The challenge from tort casts contract as just a special case of the involuntary duty not to harm others, triggered by promissory representations concerning present intentions or future conduct. The challenge from fiduciary law casts contract as inextricably intertwined with mandatory duties of loyalty and other-regard, triggered by the relations of trust that promises establish.

To answer these challenges, orthodox accounts of contract must vindicate—both in doctrine and in theory—the distinctive and unmediated role of intentions in creating and fixing contractual obligations. Contract can remain distinct from tort only insofar as intentions specifically to obligate play a central role in contractual obligations. And contract can remain distinct from fiduciary law only insofar as contractual obligations cannot develop organically, outstripping the intentions though which contracts are created, but instead remain always cabined by the ex ante intentions through which contracting parties establish their contracts.

3.1 Contract and Tort Redux

Orthodox theories of contract contend that doctrine provides legal raw materials that might establish a structural distinction between contract and tort, and that legal theory can give this distinction an elaboration that emphasizes contractual obligation’s fundamentally and immediately chosen character.

Begin with doctrine

Offer and acceptance each specifically require an intention to establish an obligation through this very intention. The Restatement thus emphasizes that an offer manifests an intention (the Restatement calls this a “willingness”) to assume an obligation (in the words of the Restatement, a “bargain”) (R2 Contracts: §24). To be sure, modern contract law does not require that contracting parties in fact posses such intentions to obligate in their own particular minds but only that they act and speak in ways that would make a reasonable interlocutor conclude that they possess intentions to obligate. But this so-called “objective” approach to intention in contract formation does not necessarily remove intentions to obligate from the picture or transform contract into a species of tort. In particular, contract law continues—even in the face of the objective approach—to treat threshold questions concerning intentions to obligate qualitatively differently from the way it treats questions concerning the substantive content of intended performance, once the threshold of chosen obligation is crossed. Specifically, the law refuses to impute to potential traders a general intent to make efficient, or fair, or otherwise optimal contracts and then to imply contracts based on that intent. Even so called “objective” theories of offer and acceptance thus do not ask directly whether a reasonable person would have contracted but instead filter their reasonableness inquiry through the question whether the parties would understand each other as expressing the specific intent to be bound. In contrast, once a contract is established by specific intent, the law is willing, through any number of doctrines concerning both interpretation and gap-filling, to impute to the parties a general intent that their contracts contain optimal terms. Orthodox theories argue that this contrast—and the law’s separate emphasis on the threshold intent to be bound—institutes a structural distinction between contract and tort.

Moreover, orthodox accounts of contract law observe that, contrary to Gilmore’s fears, inclusion of promissory estoppel in contract law (through §90 of the Restatement) has not in the end caused the law to abandon contract’s intentionalist structure. The cases that invoke promissory estoppel to establish contract liability in the absence of any fully articulate promise (for purely non-promissory representations made during pre-contractual negotiations) turn out to have generated more fear than followers, and a systematic review of cases governed by these principles shows that absent conventional torts, non-promissory representations do not create liability for reliance incurred during negotiations (see Schwartz & Scott 2007: 672). As one court has put it, in order for pre-contractual understandings to receive legal recognition, more is needed than convergence on the details of a plan—there must be “overall agreement … to enter into the binding contract” (Teachers Ins. & Annuity Assoc. v. Tribune Co. 1987; emphasis added). Promise, understood as immediately chosen obligation, thus re-enters the doctrinal picture. Unconscionability—at least as a doctrine that recasts contract in terms of fairness-based rather than chosen obligations—has had a similarly truncated career. A few early cases toyed with suggestions that substantively unfair terms might in themselves and without more render a contract unconscionable.[19] But (with certain very narrowly cabined exceptions[20]) the law has settled on the view that unconscionability has an ineliminable procedural component, which requires a plaintiff to demonstrate not just that a contract’s terms are substantively unfair but also that she failed to exercise meaningful choice in accepting them.[21] Unconscionability thus also protects rather than supplants the chosen-ness of contract obligation.

Indeed, orthodox theories observe, tort law proper retains basic principles that demur to encroach directly or generally on contract. Most notably, Restatement (Second) of Torts §548, concerning fraudulent misrepresentation, insists that tort liability for misrepresentation requires that the party asserting liability has relied specifically on the truth of the representation upon which the claimed liability is based. The Restatement expressly adds that reliance “upon the expectation that the maker [of the false statement] will be held liable in damages for its falsity” cannot sustain a fraud claim (R2 Torts: §548). By contrast, the bootstrapping that tort law refuses is of the essence of contract and underwritten by the fact that contractual promisors, in contrast to those who make representations for purposes of tort law, intend not just to convey information but rather, directly though the self-same intentions, to assume obligations. Contract, orthodox theories insist, countenances bootstrapping precisely because it contemplates chosen obligations.

Finally, orthodox theories observe that concrete cases embrace the distinctive features that they accord to contract (admittedly not uniformly, see, e.g., Overstreet v. Norden Laboratories 1982, but sufficiently often and in sufficiently important cases to render plausible contract’s claim to constitute a separate legal form). Warranties, for example, may create obligations even though they warrant facts that could not possibly obtain. As Judge Learned Hand once explained, because a promisor “obviously cannot control what is already in the past”, a warranty

is intended precisely to relieve the promisee of any duty to ascertain the fact for himself; it amounts to a promise to indemnify the promisee for any loss if the fact warranted proves untrue. (Metropolitan Coal Co. v. Howard 1946)

Another court similarly observed that the “crucial question” raised by a contractual promise (such as a warranty) thus “is not whether the buyer believed in the truth of the warranted information but whether it believed it was purchasing the seller’s promise as to its truth” (CBS, Inc. v. Ziff-Davis Publishing Co. 1990: 1001). The court, moreover, expressly explained its reasoning by observing that its approach reflected “the prevailing perception of an action for breach of express warranty as one that is no longer grounded in tort, but essentially in contract” (CBS, Inc. v. Ziff-Davis Publishing Co. 1990: 1001). Nor is this approach—which recognizes that contracts establish obligations unsupported by reliance or associated tort norms—limited to the warranty context. In one prominent case, a court enforced a promise that created an 8 billion dollar windfall—and hence cannot have induced any reliance, not even in the form of lost opportunities—to the promise’s full extent (see Texaco, Inc. v. Pennzoil, Co. 1987). Such a verdict cannot readily be assimilated to tort; it is most naturally explained and justified by the recognition of contract as a distinctive legal form.

Next, consider theory

Orthodox accounts of contract marshal the doctrinal features of contract law that resist assimilation to tort in a separate effort to emphasize that theoretical accounts of contract must accommodate contract’s character as chosen obligation.

Economic theories that emphasize contract’s usefulness as a technology for sustaining efficient reliance must confront the fact that contract law protects promissory reliance even where this is not efficient and fails to protect non-promissory reliance even where this would be efficient. On the one hand, philosophical theories of promising as various as Rawls’s and Raz’s emphasize that promissory obligation endures even where, as things have developed, keeping a promise would not be best overall (Rawls 1955; Raz 1977). Charles Fried (1981) makes the same point concerning contract. On the other hand, the economic approach, as James Gordley has observed, makes it “puzzling, to put it mildly, that the law enforces promises more readily than other commitments” (1991: 235; a similar point is made in Atiyah 1981). These and related difficulties have led many (although not all) lawyer-economists to abandon the effort to explain orthodox contract law in terms of efficient reliance in favor of an alternative campaign to reform the law to suit economic theory.

The piecemeal reforms described in the earlier section on efforts to reframe contract in terms of tort belong to this program. The program also shows a more general and systematic face, especially in commercial law, in the form of an effort to reconstruct contract doctrine with the single-minded purpose of

facilitating the ability of firms to maximize welfare [which in this context means joint contractual surplus] when making commercial contracts. (Schwartz & Scott 2003: 556)

Because firms are artificial persons, this program can ignore concerns for respecting party autonomy that contract law must otherwise address. And insofar as firms (by assumption) are owned by perfectly diversified shareholders, who thus possess equal interests in both sides of all commercial transactions, the program can ignore both distributive and corrective justice. But these observations, even as they shore up the economic case for reforming contract law, also reveal the deep and pervasive radicalism of the economic reform program. Orthodox approaches to contract thus insist that this program abandons the most basic presupposition from which the study of contract law as the law of agreements ordinarily departs. Whereas contracts, intuitively understood, involve coordination among multiple parties, the transactions addressed by the economic theory ultimately involve only the one perfectly diversified shareholder; and they are, therefore, not in the end agreements at all.

Orthodox accounts of contract thus respond to economically motivated encroachments on the role of choice in contract by raising the stakes. They observe that the movement of thought begun by the economic observation that contract promotes efficient reliance does not end merely by assimilating contract to the misrepresentation torts. Instead, it ends by rejecting the broader conception of private law as regulating the interactions among distinctive and independent persons that conventional understandings of both contract and tort embrace.[22]

Finally, orthodox contract’s insistence that contract is chosen obligation also underwrites theoretical resistance to moral views, such as Scanlon’s, that seek to explain contractual obligation in terms of the involuntarily imposed obligation not to harm others. These theories find it difficult to account for both the strictness of contractual obligations to keep agreements and also contract law’s commitment to vindicating promissory expectations.

Begin by considering contract’s strict-liability character. Not every lost reliance or disappointed expectation constitutes a harm that tort-like duties require avoiding. Indeed, even in ordinary cases in which reliance and expectations are foreseeable and in fact foreseen, no harm-based obligations need arise, as Charles Fried vividly observed in connection with defending his preferred voluntarist account of contract. Imagine, Fried supposed, that a musician convenes a string quartet in his apartment and that this causes a music lover to buy the unit next door. Surely, Fried claimed, even if the musician knows of the reliance, she is under no obligation to continue to convene the quartet or to reject a suggestion to play at the cellist’s house instead (see Fried 1981: 10–11; for further examples, see Raz 1977: 216–17). Indeed, even reliance or expectations based on a promise need not ground obligation (in either promise or contract): where a third person other than the promise overhears an agreement between two others and relies on or forms expectations of its performance, this does not (without more) create promissory or contractual obligations in favor of the third. (This example is presented by Raz 1977: 217 and taken up by Cartwright 1984: 243.)

Accounts that cast contract as chosen obligation (on the orthodox model) emphasize that these cases all illustrate that harm-based obligations can arise out of contractual promises only insofar as the reliance or expectations that might underwrite such obligations are justified. But contractual promises, taken alone, seem capable of justifying contractual reliance or expectations only insofar as they obligate. Accounts that seek to assimilate contract to tort by casting contractual obligations as harm-based thus confront a circle. As Randy Barnett observes:

a person, rather than being entitled to legal enforcement because reliance is justified, is justified in relying on those commitments that will be legally enforced. Reliance theories [that is, harm-theories] therefore must appeal to a criterion other than reliance to distinguish justified acts of reliance. (Barnett 1986: 276)[23]

Finally, harm-based theories of contract must do more than just show that agreement-based reliance (or expectations) can be justified when the surrounding circumstances are right. Contracts generate obligations of agreement-keeping quite generally, without any need for support from considerations (such as friendship or some other form of solidarity) that come from outside the morality of agreements.

Orthodox views thus insist that the harm-based theory of contract is in a difficult bind. On the one hand the theory cannot bootstrap its way into validity by grounding promissory assurances in the very obligation of agreement-keeping that it is charged to explain. And on the other, it must show that a contractual promise can, at least ordinarily, by itself render relying on, or forming expectations based on, the promise justified, quite apart from any broader or richer attendant factors. Orthodox views propose that until it can escape this circle, the effort to assimilate contract to the tort-like morality of harm cannot get off the ground.[24]

Moreover, orthodox accounts of contract observe that even if a harm-based theory can successfully explain strict liability for promise-keeping in a non-circular and yet non-reductive way, the theory remains unable to explain why contracts create entitlements in respect not just of reasonable reliance but also in respect of promissory expectations. Tort law, after all, remains backward-looking: the obligations it contemplates (including obligations associated with representations concerning current intentions or future actions) are limited to preventing losses. And the remedies it recommends (for example, the damage awards contemplated in the law of torts) are limited to the compensation necessary to restore the status quo ante. Contract law by contrast differs in each of these respects, and the harm-based view, as Scanlon recognizes, must explain why contract requires promisors to satisfy their promisees’ expectations rather than merely to compensate disappointed promisees for lost reliance and why contract remedies vindicate contractual expectations rather than merely reimbursing lost reliance.

Scanlon defends each of these rules of agreement-keeping by comparing the benefits that the rules confer to the burdens that they impose and arguing that, given the balance between these, it would be unreasonable for promisors who must bear the burdens to reject the rules, and that promisees may justifiably claim the benefits of the rules, as the formal structure of the harm theory requires. Scanlon argues that the benefits to promisees of protecting promissory expectations are substantial (Scanlon 1998: 302–3)[25] and that, given the conditions of mutual knowledge, etc., that are built into the general account of promising, the burdens that this rule imposes on promisors are slight.[26] Given this balance, Scanlon also concludes, the benefits of legal enforcement of contracts are substantial,[27] while the costs of enforceability are much less weighty.[28] Scanlon therefore concludes, once again, that in light of this balance, no person could reasonably reject a legal regime that enforces contractual expectations (Scanlon 2001:108).

Orthodox theories of contract reply that this conclusion comes too quickly to be earned. To succeed, Scanlon’s view must show not only that contract cannot be reasonably rejected in favor of an alternative of no obligations of agreement-keeping, but also that contract cannot be reasonably rejected in favor of any alternative rule of agreement keeping. This makes it natural to ask how the harm-theorist can sustain the conclusion that no alternative principles may reasonably be preferred over orthodox contract law’s scheme of chosen obligation. And earlier arguments—especially those associated with the economic analysis of law—suggest that the harm-theorist cannot sustain the position that orthodox contract law may be reasonably rejected in favor of limiting contractual obligation according to tort law’s morality of harm. At the very least, orthodox views of contract conclude, these considerations argue the harm-based effort to ground contract not in choice but rather in the morality of harm to a stalemate.

3.2 Contract and Fiduciary Law Redux

Orthodox theories of contract seek to defend the view that contract is quintessentially chosen obligation against encroachment from fiduciary law also. Once again both doctrinal and theoretical considerations figure in the defense.

The most important doctrinal consideration against the fiduciary reconstruction of contract law develops a fundamental distinction between the duty of good faith that governs contracts and the various duties of loyalty that arise within fiduciary relations (here see generally Daniel Markovits (2014a,b).

The duty of good faith in performance, which both the Uniform Commercial Code and the Restatement (Second) of Contracts make mandatory for every contract that they govern, requires parties to display “honesty in fact and the observance of reasonable commercial standards of fair dealing” (U.C.C. §§1-201, 2-103) and to avoid types of conduct that “violate community standards of decency, fairness or reasonableness” (R2 Contracts: §205 cmt. [a]). Critically, however, the duty of good faith in performance “does not create a separate duty of fairness and reasonableness which can be independently breached” (U.C.C. §1-304 [cmt. 1]). Thus, as one prominent judge has more colorfully explained, “even after you have signed a contract, you are not obliged to become an altruist toward the other party” (Mkt. St. Assocs. Ltd. P’ship v. Frey 1991: 594).[29] Nor does good faith require contracting parties to adopt even an attitude of substantive impartiality between their contractual interests and the interests of their contracting partners. The law does not seek, “in the name of good faith, to make every contract signatory his brother’s keeper” (Mkt. St. Assocs. 1991: 593.). Instead, Good faith characterizes contract obligation’s form and identifies an attitude towards contractual obligations: good faith supports the parties’ contractual settlement, working to “effectuate the intentions of the parties, or to protect their reasonable expectations” (Burton 1980: 371)[30]. It is thus, fundamentally, an attitude of respect for the contract relation, and the measure of good faith is the contract itself. The duty of good faith in performance permits the parties to remain as self-interested within their contracts as they were without them, save that they must respect the terms of their contractual settlements as side-constraints on their self-interest and may not use the inevitable room to maneuver that arises within every contract, and the strategic vulnerabilities that a contract itself thus creates, “to recapture [during performance] opportunities forgone upon contracting” (Burton 1980: 373).

Orthodox accounts of contract deploy these observations to argue that good faith in contract law requires less of parties than fiduciary loyalty and devotion. A fiduciary is “required to treat his principal as if the principal were he” (Mkt. St. Assocs. 1991: 593). But good faith, by contrast,

does not mean that a party vested with a clear right is obligated to exercise that right to its own detriment for the purpose of benefiting another party to the contract (Rio Algom Corp. v. Jimco Ltd. 1980).

As another prominent U.S. American court explains,

“[G]ood faith does not envision loyalty to the contractual counterparty, but rather faithfulness to the scope, purpose, and terms of the parties” contract. (ASB Allegiance Real Estate Fund v. Scion Breckenridge Managing Member, L.L.C. 2013[31])

The distinction, orthodox accounts insist, marks a deep feature of contract law. As Jack Beatson observes,

[o]ne of the hallmarks of English common law is that it does not have a doctrine of abuse of rights: if one has a right to do an act then, one can, in general, do it for whatever reason one wishes. (Beatson 1995: 266)

This entails that

[e]xcept where the contracting parties are also in a fiduciary relationship, self-interest is permissible, and indeed is the norm in the exercise of contractual rights. (Beatson 1995: 267)

Once again, a fiduciary whose beneficiary asks her to walk a mile with him must, if circumstances develop to require it, walk with him twain; but a contractual promisor must walk only the mile, and only along the path, that she promised. As long as she respects her promise, mere self-interest cannot be bad faith.

These doctrinal distinctions, once again, may be given theoretical elaborations, in both economic and moral registers.

Begin with economics, and recall that critics of orthodox contract who seek to assimilate contract to fiduciary ideals propose that contractual promisors should manage contractual performance not purely on their own but rather also on their promisees’ accounts, in a kind of constructive trust for their promisees’ benefits. That is the device that organizes and rationalizes the critics’ various suggestions that breaching promisors should disgorge any gains produced by their breaches to their promisees in restitution or pay punitive damages on account of the betrayals that their breaches involve.

Views that seek to maintain the distinction between contract and fiduciary obligation emphasize that this regime will not leave promisor behavior undisturbed. In particular, a promisor who faces restitutionary claims for any gains produced by an efficient breach will seek to recapture some of these gains for herself by refusing to realize them—threatening, as it were, to perform—unless her promisee waives a portion of his restitutionary claim. And this entails that the restitutionary remedies preferred by those who propose to recast contract in fiduciary terms expose contracting parties to the risk of costly renegotiations, which destroy contractual surplus and thus set back the interests of both promisors and promisees. That is why, recall, the efficient performance regime can mirror orthodox contract’s expectation-remedy-plus-efficient breach only by coupling restitutionary disgorgement with a power, in the promisee, to command her promisor to “breach” and disgorge. That power is necessary if the parties are to avoid surplus-destroying renegotiations.

These observations cast light on the economic relationship between promisees and promisors under the fiduciary reconstruction of contract’s full efficient performance regime. Promisees, under this regime, possess a right to capture any gains that a promised performance produces, no matter how deployed, and also a power to command their promisors to deploy the contractual performance in the optimal way. This seemingly complex relationship admits a much simpler characterization—a promisee who possesses the comprehensive entitlements and powers associated with the efficient performance regime in effect owns his promisor (at least in respect of the contractual performance).

Orthodox theories of contract argue that this characterization reveals that the efficient performance regime possesses a fundamentally non-contractual character. As Ronald Coase famously proposed, the scope of the firm—the boundary between coordinating economic activity within a firm through ownership and managerial control and coordinating economic activity across firms by contract—is fixed by the balance between the transaction costs of each coordinating mechanism (Coase 1938). Coase’s insight applies naturally to the efficient performance regime, to recharacterize that regime in a fundamental way. Where the balance of transactions costs really does make it efficient, as the efficient performance remedy supposes, for promisees to exercise managerial control over their promisors’ actions, those actions will already fall within the promisees’ firms. There will thus be no need for the contracts that the efficient performance remedy seeks to vindicate.

These observations invite a simple restatement of the orthodox account of contract: where the allocation of discretion and control associated with the efficient performance remedy really is optimal, there will be no separate legal entities to begin with and hence no contracts. The legal norms associated with orthodox contract law—the expectation remedy, the practice of efficient breach, and more generally self-interest side-constrained by good faith respect for the contractual settlement—may thus be cast as constitutive of economic coordination by contract.

Finally, orthodox accounts propose a moral interpretation of these economic ideas, which they marshal in reply to orthodox contract law’s moralist critics. These critics, recall, object to the fact that orthodox contract (insofar as the expectation remedy encourages efficient breach, for example, or the mitigation doctrine permits promisors to draft promisees into their service) encourages promisors to consult their narrow self-interest in dealing with promisees. The critics believe that a morally better relation would require contracting parties to display some measure of affirmative other regard towards each other, on the model of fiduciary loyalty.

Orthodox views reply that contract—understood on the orthodox model that permits side-constrained self-interest—does not involve simply less other-regard than fiduciary loyalty but rather different other-regard. They add that the contractual version of other-regard possess properties that make it morally appealing, at least within the spheres of life that contract typically governs (Markovits 2004a).

Loyalty requires a fiduciary to adjust open-endedly to the interests of her beneficiary as circumstances develop ex post. To make the required adjustments, and discharge her duty of loyalty, the fiduciary must adapt her conduct in light of her beneficiary’s particular, substantive interests, about which she must form her own opinions. Otherwise, she will not know what to deploy her loyalty in favor of. This necessarily imports a measure of paternalism into every fiduciary relation. Indeed, the paternalism is part of the point of the fiduciary relation, which displaces the beneficiary’s own worse judgment in favor of her fiduciary’s better judgment; and the fiduciary’s duty of loyalty serves to guarantee that the fiduciary will indeed exercise her judgment on the beneficiary’s behalf. Fiduciary paternalism can have real value, especially where beneficiaries reasonably mistrust their own judgment. But fiduciary paternalism has costs also. In particular, beneficiaries find fiduciaries more helpful in promoting their interests than in asserting ongoing, independent control over their own lives.

Orthodox views emphasize that contractual other-regard, by contrast, possesses a thoroughgoingly anti-paternalist character. The duty of good faith in performance, including specifically by resisting altruism and ratifying (side-constrained) self-interest within the contract relation, insists that all contractual sharing must be fixed ex ante, according to the intentions of the contracting parties. A contractual promisor must take her promisee’s intentions at face value; she may not look behind them, and even override them, in the service of the promisee’s true interests, as a fiduciary must do for her beneficiary. Contract law in this way forbids paternalism within contracts once made just as surely as it forbids paternalism in determining which contract might be made. The duty of good faith in performance thus extends freedom of contract into the interstices of the contract relation.

Those who defend contract’s departure from fiduciary law thus emphasize that fiduciaries are required by loyalty to engage their beneficiaries concretely, in terms of the beneficiaries’ particular interests and for the particular persons whom they are. But contract-partners, by contrast, engage each other only abstractly, through their general personalities. That is, they contract based simply on formal contractual capacity and take each other’s stated intentions at face value, never second-guessing each other’s substantive purposes. Orthodox approaches thus cast contract as better than fiduciary law—morally better—for sustaining coordination at arm-length among independent traders, who wish to benefit from joint projects with others, and indeed to share the gains from these projects with their counterparties, without assuming responsibility for their counterparties and all-the-while retaining rights to ongoing control over their own lives.


  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1978, “Rights, Rules, and Promises”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 3(1): 318–323. Reprinted in 1981, Ethics, Religion, and Politics, 97.
  • Atiyah, Patrick, 1979, The Rise and Fall of Freedom of Contract, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1981, Promises, Morals, and the Law, New York: Clarendon Press.
  • Barnett, Randy E., 1986, “A Consent Theory of Contract”, Columbia Law Review, 86: 269–321. [Barnett 1986 available online]
  • Benson, Peter, 2011, “Contract as a Transfer of Ownership”, William and Mary Law Review, 48: 1673–1731 [Benson 2011 available online].
  • Beatson, Jack, 1995, “Public Law Influences in Contract Law”, in Jack Beatson & Daniel Friedmann, (eds.), Good Faith and Fault in Contract Law, 263–288.
  • Bebchuk, Lucian Arye & Omri Ben-Shahar, 2001, “Precontractual Reliance”, Journal of Legal Studies, 30: 423–457. [Bebchuk and Ben-Shahar 2001 available online]
  • Ben-Schachar, Omri, 2004, “Contracts Without Consent: Exploring a New Basis for Contractual Liability”, University of Pennsylvania Law Review, 152: 1829–1872. [Ben-Schachar 2004 available online]
  • Birmingham, Robert L., 1970 “Breach of Contract, Damage Measures, and Economic Efficiency”, Rutgers Law Review, 24: 273–292.
  • Brooks, Richard R.W., 2006, “The Efficient Performance Hypothesis”, Yale Law Journal, 116: 568–596.
  • Burton, Steven J., 1980, “Breach of Contract and the Common Law Duty to Perform in Good Faith”, Harvard Law Review, 94: 369–404.
  • Cartwright, J.P.W., 1984, “An Evidentiary Theory of Promises”, Mind, 93: 230–248.
  • Coase, Ronald, 1938, “The Nature of the Firm”, Economica, 4(16): 386–405. Reprinted in, 1988, The Firm, The Market, and the Law, 33, 43–44.
  • Craswell, Richard, 1988, “Precontractual Investigation as an Optimal Precaution Problem”, Journal of Legal Studies, 17(2): 401–436.
  • –––, 1989, “Contract Law, Default Rules, and the Philosophy of Promising”, Michigan Law Review, 88: 489–529.
  • –––, 1996, “Offer, Acceptance and Efficient Reliance”, Stanford Law Review, 48: 481–553.
  • –––, 2000, “Against Fuller and Perdue”, University of Chicago Law Review, 67(Winter): 99–161.
  • Cunnington, Ralph, 2008, “The Assessment of Gain-Based Damages for Breach of Contract”, Modern Law Review, 71: 559–586.
  • Edlin, Aaron S., 1996, “Cadillac Contracts and Up-front Payments: Efficient Investment Under Expectation Damages”, Journal of Law, Economics, and Organization, 12: 98–118.
  • Edlin, Aaron S. and Alan Schwartz, 2003, “Optimal Penalties in Contracts”, Chicago-Kent Law Review, 78: 33–54. [Edlin and Schwartz 2003 available online]
  • Fried, Charles, 1981, Contract as Promise: A Theory of Contractual Obligation, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Friedman, Daniel, 1989, “The Efficient Breach Fallacy”, Journal of Legal Studies, 18: 1–24.
  • Fuller, L. L. and William R. Perdue, Jr., 1936, “The Reliance Interest in Contract Damages: 1”, Yale Law Journal, 46: 52–96. [Fuller and Perdue 1936 available online]
  • Gilmore, Grant, 1974, The Death of Contract, Columbus, Ohio: Ohio State University Press.
  • Goetz, Charles and Robert Scott, 1980, “Enforcing Promises: An Examination of the Basis of Contract”, Yale Law Journal, 89: 1261–1322.
  • –––, 1983, “The Mitigation Principle: Toward a General Theory of Contractual Obligation”, Virginia Law Review, 69: 967–1024.
  • Gordley, James, 1991, The Philosophical Origins of Modern Contract Doctrine, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, 1881, The Common Law, reprinted 1991, Dover Publications.
  • Hume, David, 1739 [1978], A Treatise of Human Nature, 2nd ed., Oxford University Press.
  • Johnston, Jason Scott, 1999, “Communication and Courtship: Cheap Talk Economics and the Law of Contract Formation”, Virginia Law Review, 85(3): 385–501.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1797 [1996], The Metaphysics of Morals, 57 [6:271], (Mary Gregor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Katz, Avery W., 1996, “When Should an Offer Stick? The Economics of Promissory Estoppel in Preliminary Negotiations”, Yale Law Journal, 105: 1249–1309.
  • Kimel, Dori, 2003, From Promise to Contract: Towards a Liberal Theory of Contract, Hart Publishing.
  • Kolodny, Niko and R. Jay Wallace, 2003, “Promises and Practices Revisited”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 31: 119–154.
  • Kraus, Jody, 2002, “Philosophy of Contract Law”, in Jules Coleman and Scott Shapiro (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Jurisprudence and Philosophy of Law, 687–751.
  • –––, 2009, “The Correspondence of Contract and Promise”, Columbia Law Review, 109: 1603–1649.
  • Kronman, Anthony, 1978, “Specific Performance”, University of Chicago Law Review, 45: 351–382. [Kronman 1978 available online]
  • Kull, Andrew, 2001, “Disgorgement for Breach, the ‘Restitution Interest,’ and the Restatement of Contracts”, Texas Law Review, 79: 2021–2053.
  • Markovits, Daniel, 2004a, “Contract and Collaboration”, Yale Law Journal, 113: 1417–1518. [Markovits 2004a available online]
  • –––, 2004b, “The No Retraction Principle and the Morality of Negotiations”, University of Pennsylvania Law Review, 152: 1903–1921. [Markovits 2004b available online]
  • –––, 2006, “Making and Keeping Contracts”, Virginia Law Review, 92: 1325–1374. [Markovits 2006 available online]
  • –––, 2012, Contract Law and Legal Methods, New York, NY: Foundation Press.
  • –––, 2014a, “Good Faith as Contract’s Core Value”, in Gregory Klass, George Letsas, and Prince Saprai, (eds.), The Philosophical Foundatios of Contract Law.
  • –––, 2014b, “Sharing Ex Ante and Sharing Ex Post: The Non-Contractual Basis of Fiduciary Relations”, in Andrew S. Gold and Paul B. Miller, (eds.), The Philosophical Foundations of Fiduciary Law, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 209–224.
  • Markovits, Daniel and Alan Schwartz, 2011, “The Myth of Efficient Breach: New Defenses of the Expectation InterestL”, Virginia Law Review, 97: 1939–2008. [Markovits & Schwartz 2011 available online]
  • –––, 2012a, “The Expectation Remedy Revisited”, Virginia Law Review, 98: 1093–1107. [Markovits & Schwartz 2012a available online]
  • –––, 2012b, “The Expectation Remedy and the Promissory Basis of Contract”, Suffolk Law Review, 45: 799–825. [Markovits & Schwartz 2012b available online]
  • NCCUSL, 1925, Handbook of the National Conference of Commissioners on Uniform State Laws and Proceedings of the 35th Annual Meeting (NCCUSL), Detroit, Michigan.
  • Owens, David, 2012, Shaping the Normative Landscape, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Polinsky, A. Mitchell, 1983, “Risk Sharing Through Breach of Contract Remedies”, The Journal of Legal Studies, 12(2): 427–444.
  • Polinsky, A. Mitchell and Steven Shavell, 1998, “Punitive Damages: An Economic Analysis”, Harvard Law Review, 111: 869–962.
  • Quillen, Gwyn, 1988, “Note, Contract Damages and Cross-Subsidization”, Southern California Law Review, 61: 1125–1141.
  • Radin, Margaret Jane, 1987, “Market Inalienability”, Harvard Law Review, 100: 1849–1937.
  • Rawls, John, 1955, “Two Concepts of Rules”, The Philosophical Review, 64: 3–32.
  • –––, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Raz, Joseph, 1977, “Promises and Obligations”, in P.M.S. Hacker & Joseph Raz (eds.), Law, Morality, and Society, 210–228.
  • [R2 Contracts] Restatement (Second) of Contracts, 1981.
  • [R2 Torts] Restatement (Second) of Torts, 1977.
  • [R3 Restitution] Restatement (Third) of Restitution and Unjust Enrichment §39 (Tentative Draft No. 4, 2005).
  • Scanlon, T.M., 1982, “Contractualism and Utilitarianism”, in Amartya Sen & Bernard Williams (eds.), Utilitarianism and Beyond, 103–129.
  • –––, 1998, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Promises and Contracts”, in Peter Benson (ed.), The Theory of Contract Law: New Essays, 86–117.
  • Schwartz, Alan and Robert Scott, 2003, “Contract Theory and the Limits of Contract Law”, Yale Law Journal, 113: 541–619. [Schwartz and Scott 2003 available online]
  • –––, 2007, “Precontractual Liability and Preliminary Agreements”, Harvard Law Review, 120: 661–707.
  • Shavell, Steven, 1980, “Damage Measures for Breach of Contract”, The Bell Journal of Economics, 11(2): 466–490.
  • Shiffrin, Seana Valentine, 2007, “The Divergence of Contract and Promise”, Harvard Law Review, 120: 708–753.
  • –––, 2009, “Could Breach of Contract be Immoral?”, Michigan Law Review, 107: 1551–1568.
  • –––, 2012, “Must I Mean What You Think I Should Have Said?”, Virginia Law Review, 98: 159–176.
  • Smith, Adam, c.1764 [1985], “Of Contract”, in, 1978, Lectures on Jurisprudence, edited by R. L. Meek, D. D. Raphael & P. G. Stein, p. 472. Quoted in R.S. Downie, 1985, “Three Accounts of Promising”, Philosophical Quarterly, 35(140): 259–271.
  • Smith, Stephen, 2000, “Towards a Theory of Contract”, in Jeremy Horder (ed.), Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence: Fourth Series, 107–129.
  • –––, 2004, Contract Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • [U.C.C.] Uniform Commercial Code, 2003.
  • Weinrib, Ernest J., 1975, “The Fiduciary Obligation”, University of Toronto Law Journal, 25(1): 1–22.


  • 200 North Gilmor, LLC v. Capital One, National Association, 863 F. Supp. 2d 480 (D. Maryland, 2012).
  • Adras Bldg. Material Ltd. V. Harlow & Jones, GmbH, 42(1) PD 221 [1988] (Israel), translated in, 1995, Restitution Law Review, 3: 235.
  • ASB Allegiance Real Estate Fund v. Scion Breckenridge Managing Member, L.L.C., 50 A.3d 434 (Del. Ch. 2012) aff’d in part, rev’d in part on other grounds, 68 A.3d 665 (Del. 2013).
  • CBS, Inc. v. Ziff-Davis Publishing Co., 553 N.E. 2d 997 (N.Y. 1990).
  • Daily v. Gusto Records, Inc., 2000 U.S. Dist. LEXIS 22537 (M.D. Tenn. Mar. 31, 2000).
  • Dastgheib v. Genentech, Inc., 457 F. Supp. 2d 536 (E.D. Pa. 2006).
  • EarthInfo, Inc. v. Hydrosphere Res. Consultants, Inc., 900 P.2d 113, 119 (Colo. 1995).
  • Feinberg v. Pfeiffer co., 392 S.W.2d 163 (Mo. App. 1959).
  • Gassner v. Lockett, 101 So. 2d 33 (Fla. 1958).
  • Hadley v. Baxendale, 156 Eng. Rep. 145 (Court of Exchequer, 1854)
  • Hoffman v. Red Owl Stores, Inc., 133 N.W.2d 267 (Wis. 1965).
  • Jones v. Star Credit Corp., 298 N.Y.S.2d 264 (1969).
  • Mkt. St. Assocs. Ltd. P’ship v. Frey, 941 F.2d 588, 594 (7th Cir. 1991) (Posner, J.).
  • Metropolitan Coal Co. v. Howard, 155 F.2d 780, 784 (2d Cir. 1946).
  • Overstreet v. Norden Laboratories, Inc., 229 F. 2d 1286 (6th Cir. 1982).
  • Patterson v. Walker–Thomas Furniture Co., Inc., 277 A.2d 111 (District of Columbia Court of Appeals, 1971).
  • Parev Prods. Co. v. I. Rokeach & Sons, Inc., 124 F.2d 147 (2d Cir. 1941).
  • Perkins v. Standard Oil Co., 383 P.2d 107, 111–12 (Or. 1963) (en banc).
  • Rio Algom Corp. v. Jimco Ltd., 618 P.2d 497, 505 (Utah 1980).
  • Ryder Truck Rental, Inc. v. Cent. Packing Co., 341 F.2d 321, 323–4 (10th Cir. 1965).
  • Sessions, Inc. v. Morton, 491 F.2d 854, 857 (9th Cir. 1974).
  • Teachers Ins. & Annuity Assoc. v. Tribune Co., 670 F. Supp. 491, 497 (S.D.N.Y. 1987).
  • Texaco, Inc. v. Pennzoil, Co., 729 S.W. 2d 768 (Tex. App. Hous. (1 Dist.) 1987).
  • Univ. of Colo. Found., Inc. v. Am. Cyanamid Co., 342 F.3d 1298 (Fed. Cir. 2003).

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2015 by
Daniel Markovits <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free