Disability: Health, Well-Being, and Personal Relationships

First published Thu Feb 18, 2016

In the past 50 years, there has been burgeoning philosophical interest in well-being, health, and personal relationships. There has also been increasing philosophical writing on disability, particularly in relation to justice and equality. Until recently, however, there has been little philosophical discussion of disability's relevance to well-being, health, or personal relationships—in contrast to the growing scholarship on these topics in the social sciences. Until the past decade, most philosophical discussions of well-being simply treated disabilities as conditions that reduced it. Philosophical accounts of health and disease have mentioned disability, but mainly to treat it as a form of disease or ill-health; they have had little to say about the complex, contested relationship between disease and disability. And with the notable exception of parental attitudes toward one’s actual or possible disabled children, the role of disability in personal relationships has provoked scant philosophical interest.

This Entry will proceed as follows. Part 1 will discuss disability and well-being. It will begin by reviewing debates on the application of three standard accounts of well-being to disability. It will note the divergence between first- and third-person assessments of the impact of disability on well-being under all these accounts and suggest some reasons for this divergence. We will then examine what we regard as the most difficult challenge to the claim that many or most disabilities do not necessarily reduce well-being: the widely-held view that it is desirable to prevent, correct, or mitigate disabilities, and generally undesirable to acquire one. The concluding section of Part 1 will examine how assumptions about disability and well-being inform a number of contemporary debates in medicine and health care.

Part 2 will examine philosophical writing on health and disease. It will review different definitions of health and their implications for the question of whether it is necessarily unhealthy to be disabled. It will consider the few attempts that have been made to distinguish disability from disease. It will also note a tension for disability scholars in making the distinction between disease and disability: although that distinction provides a basis for separating the medical from the socially constructed aspects of disability, it can also oversimplify the experience of people with disabilities.

Part 3 will discuss disability and personal relationships. It will examine widely shared assumptions concerning the impact of disabilities on a variety of relationships, in particular the doubts expressed by many laypeople about the capacity of adults with disabilities to become friends, lovers, and parents. This Part will also consider how historical and contemporary accounts of friendship and love apply to persons with disabilities.

After exploring the relevance of disability to well-being, health, and personal relationships, this Entry will conclude by examining common features of the philosophical treatment of disability in the three domains. Philosophical scrutiny is particularly needed in these areas, because of the strength and persistence of popular assumptions about the adverse impact of disability on all three.

The impact that disability has on each domain is largely a function of the view or model of disability one accepts. Disability scholars and philosophers of disability now refer to two models of disability, the medical and the social (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience). For present purposes, we understand the social model of disability as holding that the physical and social environment are the primary source of the limitations and disadvantages faced by people with almost all impairments. This model has obvious relevance for the accounts of well-being, health, and personal relationships we will examine. It suggests that if people with disabilities appear to be unhappy, unhealthy, or socially isolated, it is primarily due to contingent features of their physical and social environments, not to any intrinsic features of their impaired functions. In some cases, this recognition will require a reassessment of their present well-being, health, or social relationships. In other cases, it will not challenge that assessment, but will alter the prescription for improving their well-being, health, or relationships, or the expectation of success in doing so.

1. Disability and Well-Being

The relationship between disability and well-being is important both theoretically and practically. How philosophers, social scientists, policy makers, and lay people understand that relationship matters for the theories of welfare and flourishing we construct, the judgments about our lives we make on a regular basis, and the social and health policies we adopt.

Assumptions about well-being, tacit as well as explicit, pervade our thinking about disability. Decisions about abortion after a “positive” prenatal test result are often based on the parents’ judgment about the child’s expected quality of life. Decisions about life-sustaining treatment for severely disabled infants and critically ill adults are often made on the same basis, although what counts now as an acceptable quality of life may differ from what is considered acceptable when contemplating the futures of fetuses and newborns. Judgments of well-being also figure in allocation decisions, where scarce resources may be diverted away from persons who, because of certain disabilities, are deemed to have poor prospects for an acceptable quality of life, and toward persons with “better” prospects. The examples could be multiplied, and they are not confined to health-related matters.

Disability is often initially encountered as an atypical mental or physical condition whose impact on well-being is mediated by the physical and social environments. For example, an individual is deciding whether to undertake expensive and risky surgery to restore functioning lost in an accident; a couple is deciding whether to continue a pregnancy with a fetus diagnosed with a genetically-based health condition; a legislature is deciding how much money to allocate to competing injury-prevention programs. All these decision makers first confront disability as a biological phenomenon—a sudden or gradual loss of functioning; a genetic condition with various health effects; a range of vehicular, recreational, household, and workplace injuries. Their concern is with the effect of disability, encountered this way, on lives they care about or are charged with protecting: their own, their future children’s, or their constituents’.

As these examples suggest, the fact that disability-related disadvantages often reflect contingent features of the social environment may have different relevance for different decisions and decision makers. Parents deliberating about whether to have a child with a severe disability may need to treat as “given” the adverse effects on well-being of social stigma or inadequate educational resources. It is far less clear that legislators would be justified in treating as “given” the reduction in well-being associated with these social conditions, given that they are in a position to modify those conditions, by, for example, prioritizing funding for inclusive education.

1.1 Disability and Subjective Theories of Well-Being

We begin by examining the impact that disabilities have, or are expected to have, on various accounts of well-being. Philosophical discussions of what makes life go well generally recognize three distinct types of accounts. T.M. Scanlon distinguishes

“experiential theories…which hold that the quality of a life for the person who lives it is determined completely by…its experiential quality;”

“desire theories…which hold that the quality of a person’s life is a matter of the extent to which that person’s desires are satisfied;”

and

“substantive-good theories…which hold that there are standards for assessing the quality of a life that are not entirely dependent on the desires of the person whose life it is”. (Scanlon 1998: 109ff)[1]

The first two accounts are “subjective”, in that they define well-being as relative to the individual’s mental states, whereas the last theory is “objective”, assuming a substantive view about what makes a life go well that is independent of the individual’s mental states (see SEP entry on well-being).

These rival accounts of well-being clearly have different implications for the bearing of disability on individual well-being. If, as hedonic experiential theories hold, well-being is a matter of having positive experiences, whether disability reduces well-being depends on whether and to what extent it reduces the number or intensity of positive experiences enjoyed by persons with disabilities. On these theories, the self-reports of persons with disabilities carry considerable weight in assessments of well-being, at least if we accept the assumption that people are in a better position, epistemically, to assess the quality of their own experiences than other people’s. Indeed, most research on the well-being of people with disabilities relies on self-reports, and those reports do not confirm the grim views of third parties. Most people with disabilities report a quality of life similar to people without disabilities (Saigal et al. 1996; Albrecht and Devlieger 1999; Gill 2000; Goering 2008).

For similar reasons, self-reports ought to carry considerable evidentiary weight on desire-based accounts of well-being—though perhaps not as much weight as on the experiential view, if we have less first-person authority with respect to what our desires and their fulfillment than t we do with respect to our experiences. Self-reports have the most limited and contingent relevance on objective accounts, since individuals will not always be in the best position to know how well they are doing in various physical, social, and professional domains.

Some philosophers regard the implication that persons with disabilities can achieve levels of well-being equal to those of their able-bodied counterparts as a reductio of subjective accounts (see Sen 1980; Crocker 1995). And some disability scholars have been drawn to subjective metrics on the basis of their considered judgment that persons with disabilities can achieve levels of well-being that are at least comparable to those of their able-bodied counterparts. Despite this, subjective accounts may offer only thin practical support for the claim that disabled people are not handicapped in the pursuit of happiness. Many nondisabled philosophers and laypeople are inclined to doubt the reliability of disabled persons’ self-reports to the effect that they are doing well. Some suspect that these ratings are deliberately overstated to take account of their expected discounting by nondisabled people. Others regard them less as self-reports than as directives against pity or sympathy.

Even when self-reports are accepted as sincere, the interpretation of self-reported well-being is disputed (Menzel et al. 2002; McClimans et al. 2013; Barnes 2009b). Some psychologists and philosophers see those reports as distorted by adaptation or response-shift; by habituation to aversive experiences or a shift to more modest objectives or comparison classes (Menzel et al. 2002; Murray 1996; McClimans, et al. 2013). Indeed, the phenomenon of adaptation highlights some of the differences among rival accounts of well-being. Adaptation refers to a group of processes, though which newly disabled people change their habits, activities, and goals to accommodate their disabilities. Among those processes are developing new skills, changing comparison classes and goals, and habituating to pleasant or unpleasant experiences (Menzel et al. 2002). Although the first of these processes—the acquisition of new skills—might reflect a change in objective well-being, the latter two would not (unless feelings of satisfaction and pleasure are included on the “objective” list). But habituating to unpleasant experiences might improve well-being under a hedonic account by making the individual feel less pain or more pleasure. Similarly, insofar as changing one’s goals involves changing one’s desires, and insofar as one’s new desire-set is more satisfiable than one’s old desire set, the second process of adaptation would also yield an improvement in well-being on the desire-satisfaction view. By contrast, on an objective account of well-being, mere habituation and goal-downsizing habituation would not necessarily improve well-being.

1.2 Disabilities and Objective Lists

Derek Parfit has coined the term “objective list theories” to refer to accounts that assess well-being in terms of a set of goods and activities that are objectively good for people (Parfit 1984: 493ff). Some of the more contentious questions about the relationship between disability and individual well-being concern what objective goods are indispensable for a good life and at what level of generality they should be described. Although “objective list theories” may suggest a simple checklist, they are better seen as recognizing (i) that there is an irreducible plurality in the goods of life and (ii) that their contribution to well-being cannot be expressed in terms of a common metric, like utility. Both (i) and (ii) distinguish objective list theories as a special case of objective or substantive-good theories of well-being. Martha Nussbaum, an influential objective list theorist, includes the following among her valuable capabilities and functionings: health, nourishment, shelter, sex, mobility; the ability to use one’s senses and to imagine, think, and reason; family and other relationships, attachments and love; living a life one has thought about and in some way chosen; laughter, play, and living in contact with the natural world (Nussbaum 1998: 135–156). It is difficult to see what unifies all these different categories, but item by item there would probably be widespread agreement on their value and importance for individual well-being.

Given that several of the items on Nussbaum’s ’98 list cannot be enjoyed by many people with disabilities, it follows that if high levels of well-being cannot be attained by someone who cannot enjoy all of the items on the list, then high levels of well-being are not attainable by many people with disabilities. If that implication is false, then the list must be changed. For example, even if it is necessary to include substantive goods or normative ideals in an account of individual well-being, it is not clear that all of the categories in Nussbaum’s list, for example, are necessary for high levels of well-being. As Jerome Segal (1998) points out, most of us would agree that a life can go very well without one or more of the capabilities Nussbaum regards as essential. Indeed, the most successful of lives of people lacking a single capability may go as well as the most successful lives of people with a standard complement of sensory and motor functions. Although a life could hardly go well without at least some of these capacities, we have no clear basis for establishing a minimum set.

In understanding how disability may be compatible with high levels of well-being, understood in objective terms, it is helpful to distinguish intrinsic from instrumental value. An activity may valuable for itself, e.g., seeing as a rich sensory experience; or instrumentally, for what it achieves or contributes to, e.g., seeing as a means of finding an object. As intuitive as the distinction seems, it is difficult to make clearly. First, there is deep disagreement about what is of ultimate value. Second, it is possible to parse many activities and conditions indefinitely into instrumentally valuable means and intrinsically valuable ends, e.g., making money or friends can be seen as an end in itself, or as a means to obtaining comfort and security (see SEP entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic value).

The social model of disability encourages us to recognize that many of the activities precluded by certain disabilities can be seen instrumentally, as means to valuable ends—ends that can be achieved by other means that are not precluded by those disabilities. As Asch contends (2003),

Those who maintain that disability forecloses opportunity, and that any foreclosed opportunity diminishes life, focus too narrowly on the activity and do not see it as a means to an end, e.g., … walking instead of mobilizing or exploring; talking instead of communicating.

As Asch suggests, much of what we value in seeing, talking, and walking is instrumental. We value them as ways of achieving communication with other people, reading, and moving from place to place, are themselves be bearers of intrinsic value. (Of course, we also recognize that these activities have instrumental value as well, e.g., for finding social partners and business opportunities). None of these valuable activities, however, is precluded by deafness, blindness, or paraplegia. Each can be achieved in alternative ways, by signing, reading braille, or operating a wheelchair. If these considerations are on the right track, they show that the instrumental value of species-typical functioning is exaggerated, because its ends can frequently be achieved in multiple ways, many of which are available to people with fewer, impaired, or atypical functions.

Disability scholars do not deny that typical sensory and motor functions can have great intrinsic as well as instrumental value, but they argue that their intrinsic value is often understood too narrowly. If, for example, we see the intrinsic value in sight not specifically in visual experience, but in sensory and aesthetic experience, then that value is not precluded by blindness.

It may be true that someone who cannot see or hear lacks experiences of great intrinsic value that are available to someone who can see or hear. However, the broad characterization favored by disability scholars seems most appropriate for assessing the role of intrinsic value in how well our lives go. For example, one obvious source of intrinsic value for standard sensory functions and activities is aesthetic—the beauty, richness, and complexity of the experiences they enable. But we do not regard color-blindness, tone-deafness, or impairments of smell or taste as inimical to well-being, although they preclude vast ranges of rich aesthetic experience. There is no reason to doubt that someone who has never had, or has long lost, those sensory functions (as opposed, say, to an visual artist or food critic who relies on them for her vocation) can lead a life as rich and rewarding aesthetically as someone who has those functions, despite lacking admittedly valuable experiences. This suggests that we cannot infer from the fact that there is great value in a function that those who lack it have lives that go significantly less well. It is only plausible to claim that a good life needs to contain certain kinds of valuable experiences and activities if those kinds of experience and activity are characterized very broadly. We will have more to say about this below, in reviewing the debate over whether disabilities can be seen as “neutral” characteristics.

Finally, even granting the significance of objective goods for well-being, it is not only their possession that makes a life go well. Also relevant is how a life seems to the person living it, and this reintroduces subjective elements. Common sense supports the view that individual well-being must have a subjective as well as an objective aspect; “two strands”, as Jonathan Glover puts it (Glover 2006: Chapter 3). Roughly speaking, well-being consists partly in having certain substantive goods and partly in being happy with (or being content with, or enjoying, or taking pleasure in) one’s life. But these strands may not be readily separable: the positive valuation of objective goods may be necessary for the possession of those goods to count towards well-being, or for their absence to count against it. Moreover, any plausible objective list must include enjoyment or pleasure, either as a free-standing good or as an aspect of valued states, activities or relationships.

1.3 Cognitive Disability and Well-Being

The differences among standard accounts of well-being are particularly significant in thinking about the well-being of people with severe cognitive impairments. We believe that a separate discussion of this topic is warranted, but not because cognitive impairments are in a class by themselves. As we have noted, there are great differences among all types of impairments. Cognitive impairments, however, have until recently received relatively little attention in philosophy, and we give them special emphasis as a corrective.

Subjective accounts of well-being, hedonic and simple-desire accounts, appear easier to apply to people with such impairments, for two reasons. First, joy, pain, satisfaction, and frustration are more readily conveyed and assessed than the more complex mental states that informed-desire and objective list theories take into account. Second, people with cognitive impairments appear less capable of enjoying or attaining some items on standard objective lists: not merely various forms of achievement, but also a variety of social relationships and aesthetic experiences. More broadly, persons with cognitive impairments may be unable to form and pursue a conception of the good life. The conviction that persons with severe cognitive impairments can and often do enjoy relatively high levels of well-being thus seems to favor a more subjective account of well-being than that adopted for everyone else.

Even Martha Nussbaum (2006), a strong proponent of an objective account of well-being and of the capabilities of people with disabilities, fears that the premium her capabilities account places on choice may be excessive in assessing the well-being of people with the most severe cognitive disabilities, who lack the capacity to make meaningful choices in some or many domains. She favors a greater emphasis on functionings than capabilities for people with cognitive disabilities: on what they actually do or experience than on their capacity to choose among experiences, activities, and life plans. This suggests a way to modify her account so that more people with such disabilities reach a threshold of well-being. But it adopts different standards for people with severe cognitive disabilities as compared to other people, and raises the question of where and how to draw the line between those to whom each standard applies.

Some disability scholars may worry that the use of a double-standard is fraught with elitism and condescension. But it has a stubborn appeal, insofar as objective accounts seem too demanding when applied to cognitively disabled people. Jeff McMahan concedes that it seems “deeply and perniciously inegalitarian” to place people with severe congential cognitive impairments in a separate comparison class from cognitively normal people for purposes of assessing their well-being (2001: 160). But he argues that it is even less plausible and attractive to view such individuals as suffering grave misfortune, however well they do with their limited potential.

Of course, it could simply be the case that all else equal, people with severe cognitive disabilities do have lower levels of well-being than people without these disabilities. But all else need not be equal: it may be that many people with cognitive disabilities can achieve levels of well-being as high as others if they receive certain forms of support. For example, recognizing that cognitively disabled persons may require assistance if they are to develop and carry out conceptions of the good life, Nussbaum (2006, 2009) and Francis (2009) have proposed structured ways of assisting them to do so. Nussbaum suggests that people with even severe cognitive disabilities can have representatives or surrogates who enable them to participate, at least vicariously, in most social and political activities (2009; but see Wasserman and McMahan 2012 for limits on meaningful surrogate agency); Francis discusses “mental prostheses” that aid in constructing a personal conception of the good. She offers, as an example of a mental prosthesis, an actual device that allows people with Alzheimer’s to locate objects in their houses by touching an icon on their computer screen. The use of that device would not deny the user agency in locating the device, any more than a prosthetic foot would deny its bearer agency in running (Francis 2009: 203–204). Such a device could also allow cognitively disabled persons to communicate their preferences, but it is unclear how it enables them to form a conception of the good.

These are different approaches to securing the well-being of people with cognitive impairments, with different purposes. Nussbaum seeks to facilitate the exercise of, or the capacity for, valuable functionings such as social affiliation, meaningful work, and political activity. Francis’s goal is broader and less concrete: to promote the participation of people with cognitive impairments in developing conceptions of the good that accord with their desires and that offer reasonable prospects for fulfillment.

Both approaches receive some support from empirical research. Disability theorists such as Goode 1994 and Ferguson 2001 maintain that people with significant cognitive and communicative impairments can and do have the capacity to choose among alternatives if those choices can be formulated in ways they can comprehend, or if their non-impaired intimates or caregivers can learn to read the ways in which they actually express their preferences, in order to help them make their lives go the way they want.

1.4 The Claimed Neutrality of Disability

Many plausible accounts of well-being can explain why life can and often does go comparably well for people with most disabilities relative to people without disabilities. There are unresolved issues about how broadly the objective elements of well-being can be framed without becoming so broad as to lose distinct content. But these questions may be less about disability and more about objective list theories generally.

Some philosophers have argued more affirmatively that disabilities are “neutral” characteristics or “mere differences”, with no average or generally adverse impact on well-being. They argue that disability should be regarded as a characteristic like race or sex, which are widely seen as neutral with respect to well-being, once discrimination and its effects are factored out—or even if they are not. Disability is grouped with these characteristics in anti-discrimination law. But it is also grouped with those characteristics by writers who argue, more ambitiously, that disability, no less than race or sex, is a neutral characteristic—one that, in the absence of social exclusion, does not make lives go any worse on average (Barnes 2009a; McBryde-Johnson 2003). These writers do not deny that becoming disabled may make life go worse for some time, but no more so than other wrenching changes, like losing a job, home, or loved one. In the former case as well as the latter, the bad or harm is in the transition—in the loss and disruption—and not in the end state. Any disadvantage that persists after the transition is plausibly attributed to social factors.

There are various ways to distinguish disabilities, on the one hand, from neutral characteristics like race and sex, on the other. The distinction can be easily made on a maximalist view of well-being which holds that life is presumptively better with more valuable capacities. In contrast to race and sex, disabilities, by definition, involve fewer valuable capacities, so they presumptively make life go worse. It is simply better to have more senses, more intelligence, and a greater range of motion, even if they do not make one happier, have limited practical value, and do not advance one’s specific projects. This view regards standard disabilities as among the most salient limitations to which humanity is subject. Less is always worse, although how much worse will depend on contingent circumstances. But many philosophers reject maximalism, in part because they balk at the implication that we should strive to acquire, and bear children who will possess, the greatest number and range of possible capacities.

Jeff McMahan offers a non-maximalist argument against the neutrality of disabilities, based on a view of how people with single impairments flourish despite them:

A single disability may seem neutral because it can be compensated for by other abilities that develop to fulfill its functions. Blindness, for example, may be compensated for by the enhancement of other senses, particularly hearing. But if disabilities were individually entirely neutral, they ought also to be neutral in combination; but they are not (2005: 96).

Some might dispute McMahan’s claim that disabilities cannot be neutral in combination, but our focus here is his claim that neutrality for individual disabilities implies neutrality in combination. In support of this claim, he argues the effects of disabilities on well-being “are largely additive”, because with each further disability, it becomes harder to compensate for other disabilities. This argument assumes that the possibility of living as well without as with any given ability depends on the possibility of compensating for its absence. This assumption may be mistaken: the possibility of flourishing with a single disability may depend not on compensation but on what we could call “saturation”. A blind person can live as well as a sighted one not because she develops better hearing—she may not—but just because the senses and abilities she has are more than adequate to allow her to live as fully and richly as possible. As Asch and Wasserman argue:

[H]uman beings enjoy a fortunate redundancy in many of the capacities that are instrumental for, or constitutive of, valuable human goods and activities, from intimate relationships to rewarding work. Humans with a standard complement of senses and motor functions rarely use all of these functions in achieving such goods, and humans lacking those skills can use only some. But those are usually sufficient (2005: 208 ).

There may be a limited number of ways to realize important human goods like rich aesthetic experience, and those with disabilities may have fewer ways to do so. But the ways they have may be as good as the ways they lack, and employing the ones they have need not be seen as compensating for their inability to employ the ones they lack. Having more ways to realize a good does not mean that you can realize it more fully.

This response, however, suggests two final sources of difference, both of which involve what we might call “welfare security”. Even if people with a single major disability can live as well as people without one, 1) it requires more effort or luck for them to do so, and 2) they are at greater risk of lacking the means to do so. The first claim is that the fewer means there are to achieve a particular good like rich aesthetic experience, the more difficult it may be to achieve it. An individual who can meet his aesthetic quota, so to speak, with sunsets or symphonies, doesn’t have to work as hard or need as aesthetically rich an environment as one who can meet his quota only with symphonies. The second claim is that people with single disabilities are at greater risk than people without any disabilities of losing the means to achieve various goods, since they have a smaller surplus or reserve. The plausibility of these claims depends on a myriad of unresolved issues: Is there an irreducible plurality of objective goods and if so, how they are individuated? Are there a limited number of means for attaining those goods? If it requires greater effort to attain a particular good with fewer functions, does that additional effort itself enhance or reduce well-being?

Another argument for the conclusion that disabilities entail setbacks to well-being is suggested by the human variation model (Scotch and Shriner 1997). This treats disabilities not as a distinct category, but as conditions falling on a continuum of physical or mental difference. It is not intrinsically disadvantageous to be near the end of such a continuum but may be disadvantageous in a society in which only a small proportion of people fall near that end. This is because many of the physical structures and social practices of that society will inevitably be designed for its average members. No matter how just a society, how committed to inclusion, there would still be some disadvantage in being toward the end of the spectrum. There may be some truth to this claim, but it is easy to overstate. Universal design advocates argue that it is, or will become, feasible to build structures and practices that fully or equally accommodate individuals across large ranges of human variation. Even if their claims are also overstated, they suggest a need for caution in concluding that minority status is intrinsically disadvantageous.

Perhaps the most tenacious source of resistance to the “mere difference” claim comes from a stubborn asymmetry, which appears to distinguish disability from race and sex and to challenge its neutrality. We generally seek to prevent individuals who are not disabled from becoming disabled, but not vice-versa. We strongly support measures to prevent disability, if prevention can be accomplished without coercion, harmful side effects, or the loss or disruption of personal or narrative identity. Consider a form of prevention widely seen as unproblematic: taking folic acid during pregnancy to prevent spina bifida. Some governments mandate that certain food be enriched with folic acid. These mandates are controversial, but the controversy concerns the issues of involuntary medication and possible side-effects rather than the intended preventative effect. Few, if any, disability advocates object to these mandates, any more than they object to the myriad safety measures imposed by the modern state, from requiring seat belts to restricting teratogenic drugs. Many object to the needlessly grim depiction of disability in some safety campaigns; few to the campaigns themselves (Emens 2012).

No such asymmetry exists for other allegedly neutral characteristics. There would be strong opposition to government measures to prevent them, alter them, or reduce their incidence. Imagine that a dietary supplement as safe as folic acid could alter the sex of the fetus, or lighten its complexion. We suspect that most people would find it troublesome for pregnant women to take that drug voluntarily, let alone for the government to put it in the food supply. Or imagine a fluoride-like substance with a similar effect, which could be safely added to the water supply. Fluoridation to prevent female sex or dark skin would strike most people as offensive, even though it would not prevent the existence of anyone on the basis of a disfavored characteristic, at least if personal identity survives alteration of race or sex. The claim that women or people of color lead worse lives on average due to pervasive discrimination would not be seen as a justification for changing sex or race. Undertaken by an individual, it would be seen as complicit with sexism or racism regardless of its motivation; undertaken by the state, it would be seen as an egregious expression of racism or sexism. Public health measures to prevent disability, like dietary supplements, would not provoke similar objections. In general, measures to alter other significant characteristics—not only race and sex, but minority cultures, sexual orientations, and social identities—would be considered unjustifiable or only justifiable in special circumstances. By contrast, measures to prevent disabilities are considered presumptively acceptable.

The contrast between sex and race, on one hand, and disability on the other, is especially striking in light of the fact that in the former, measures to alter stigmatized social identities are often regarded as more objectionable than measures to alter dominant social identities that are not stigmatized. Just the reverse is true for disability. Giving deaf children cochlear implants is somewhat controversial; deafening hearing children would be considered criminal abuse. And this would be so even if the children were too young to have the self-conscious experience of hearing, had no other effects from being deafened, and faced no discrimination on the basis of deafness. These contrasts raise the question of whether the asymmetry with respect to disability-prevention is compatible with the view that disabilities are neutral characteristics—that they do not make life go worse overall.

Recently, Elizabeth Barnes has sought to challenge this perceived asymmetry between measures to prevent or correct disabilities and other significant characteristics. She attributes much of the objection to changing sex or gender to moral considerations equally applicable to “correcting” disability: 1) they would violate the individual’s right to control her own body unless consented to; if consented to, they would be permissible elective procedures (as would, Barnes maintains, procedures to create disabilities); and 2) such procedures generally involve considerable loss and transition costs—but so do procedures to correct disabilities, as many “cure” narratives attest. For preventative measures not involving bodily modification, loss, or transition costs, Barnes argues that the claimed difference between preventing disabilities and preventing less favored races or sexual orientations is simply question-begging—no good reason has been given to accept the former and reject the latter, merely the “negative-difference” view the intuition is supposed to support.

Barnes’ argument, not surprisingly, has proven controversial. Several commentators sympathetic with mere-difference claims for some disabilities have questioned Barnes categorical claim for all disabilities; others have questioned whether she is too quick to accuse those claiming an asymmetry in the case of preventative measures of begging the question (see Dougherty 2014).

Yet even if disability could be regarded as neutral if other features contingently associated with it, such as social exclusion, physical pain, and the loss of valued functions, are factored out, that conclusion might have limited practical significance for decision makers who cannot factor out those features. As noted earlier, the question of whether it is disadvantageous may have a different answer for those who can significantly modify the physical and social environment and those who cannot. Many decision makers, from prospective parents to healthcare policy makers, will fall in the latter category.

Before discussing specific decision making contexts, then, we need to consider arguments that significant disabilities can be neutral, in the sense of not reducing overall well-being, even if various contingent harmful features are not excluded. We will examine two grounds for claiming that disabilities, including painful, disruptive, and stigmatized ones, need not reduce overall well-being, although they may still be conditions worth preventing: 1) if disabilities deny some valuable experiences and achievements, they provide others, which may not be accessible, or may be less accessible, to nondisabled people; and 2) there is a non-additive relationship between parts or aspects of a life and life as a whole.

Barnes (2009a) argues that having a disability can make an individual’s life more difficult and challenging at some points without making it go worse overall, or even making it more probable that it will. The challenges of disability are like those of other minority characteristics such as homosexuality; facing those challenges can give a life greater depth or direction. For example, some individuals who are disabled in adolescence or adulthood find that their previously shallow or aimless lives gained focus and purpose from the challenges they faced, and some individuals find that they acquired new skills or interests more rewarding than those precluded by their impairments. Because such enriching responses are so common, there is no basis for concluding that people with disabilities have a lower quality of life overall. But because disabilities

are, in general, the kinds of things that make life harder—they impose limitations, they cause pain, they subject their bearers to stigmas and discrimination (2009a: 339)

—they are associated with with harms and should be prevented in some circumstances. They should not, however, be regarded as “negative difference-makers”—conditions that necessarily make lives worse overall.

In blocking the inference from disability as a harm to disability as a negative difference-maker, Barnes adduces instances of the positive consequences that disabilities have had for specific individuals, despite or sometimes because of the “local” hardships they cause. It may be, however, that no positive consequences are needed to “neutralize” the hardships associated with a disability. Those hardships may simply get absorbed in the immense complex of factors that make a life go better or worse. It is only on a simple additive view of the relationship of parts to whole that a local harm would necessarily make a life go worse unless compensated for. It is difficult to be more precise about the impact of disability on whole lives, however, because it is not clear how the goodness or badness of parts of a life contribute to the goodness of the whole, on either objective or subjective accounts of well-being (Feldman 2008). David Velleman has argued that whatever one’s particular theory of individual well-being, the parts of a life do not contribute to the goodness of a life additively. That is, the goodness of a whole life is not the sum of the goodness of its parts. Instead, the goodness of a whole life is to be understood in terms of the narrative relations between its various parts. From this perspective, successes or failures at particular times in one’s life can retrospectively alter the meaning or significance of earlier ones (Velleman 1991).

Recent accounts of noncomparative harm (Harman 2009; Shiffrin 2012, 1999) provide additional reasons to challenge the inference from disability as harm to disability as negative difference-maker. These accounts reject the prevailing, counterfactual analysis of harm as a setback to an individual’s interests with reference to some baseline—her past, her expectations, or the average of her group or society. Instead, they understand harms as fundamentally bad states or events, like pain, disability, and death; states or events that (proponents of these accounts claim) can be regarded as bad without reference to any baseline. On these views, an individual is harmed merely by suffering pain or injury, regardless of whether that pain or injury leaves her worse off overall. She is harmed by painful life-saving surgery, although that averts a greater harm, or life-transforming disability, although her life may go much better as a result.

Obviously a critical question for these accounts is what makes something a noncomparative harm (Bradley 2012). Harman (2009) offers no general characterization of noncomparative harms; Shiffrin characterizes such harms in terms of a significant chasm, conflict, or other form of significant disconnect between one’s will and one’s circumstances (2012: 388). Disabilities, injuries, and illnesses and typically regarded as harms in these terms because they “often significantly impede one’s capacity to achieve substantial congruity between one’s will and one’s life (2012: 384). Shiffrin recognizes both that one’s circumstances may narrow that chasm considerably, and she considers it a strength of her account “that it can recognize quotidian conditions such as ordinary conditions as harms” (2012: 387, n. 46). Although Shiffrin does not take this additional step, it would seem that if ordinary conditions can be harmful in damaging one’s agency, extraordinary ones can be harmless, if they were congenital, predictable, or successfully adapted to, such that congruity between one’s will and one’s life is never lost, or is quickly restored. Further, although Harman and Shiffrin, like Barnes, regard the onset of most disabilities as harms, they also, like Barnes, hold that such harms need not make life go worse overall.

Another factor associated with disability—reduced lifespan—arguably has an adverse impact on well-being. Many disabilities, or their associated disease processes, result in lower-than-average life expectancy, though it is worth emphasizing that the relationship between disability and reduced lifespan is contingent, and so even if reduced lifespan necessarily reduces well-being, it would not follow that disability necessarily reduces well-being. Moreover, it is not clear that reduced lifespan necessarily reduces well-being. It is at least arguable that living to 80, with the last 5 years of one’s life in severe pain, does not yield more well-being than a life of 75 relatively painless years. And it is at least arguable that longer lives correlate with greater well-being because they enable one to pass through all of life’s stages—childhood, adolescence, young adulthood, middle age, and gradual aging—but that having passed through all of life’s stages, additional years yield small increases in well-being. Clearly, these are complicated issues that deserve more attention. We simply note that there is no straightforward inference to be drawn from disability’s correlation with reduced lifespan to disability’s having an adverse effect on well-being.

1.5 The Impact of Disability on Well-Being: What is at Stake?

This subsection will examine how assumptions about the relationship between disability and well-being that have been challenged in academic debate continue to play a significant role in reproductive and health-care decision making. We discuss four contexts in which these assumptions have been relied upon in policies and personal decisions about creating or sustaining lives: reproductive testing for disability, neonatal care, “end-of-life“ decision making, and the use of ”quality-adjustment” measures to assess the cost-effectiveness of health-care and other interventions.

In all of these cases, objections have been raised besides those concerning the assumption that lives with serious disabilities must be substantially worse than lives without them. For example, in the case of life-termination, the debate also concerns the decisional capacity of newly disabled individuals; in the case of quality-adjustment, the debate also concerns the assumption that the quality of a life should affect its priority in allocating scarce resources. We will, however, focus on the objections that concern well-being.

1.5.1 Reproductive testing

Some prospective parents see life with some disabilities as worse than no life at all. This claim is often made with respect to such conditions as Tay-Sachs, Lesch-Nyan, and trisomies 13 and 18. Even for those conditions, however, that view is not universally held (Wilkinson 2011). The notion of a life so bad that it is a harm to the individual living it came to popular and philosophical attention in the 1980s, when a number of lawsuits in the U.S claimed that physicians or parents had wronged the child by failing to diagnose its condition in utero and/or prevent its birth. These lawsuits appeared to require a comparison of existence and non-existence, which most courts and some philosophers rejected. A majority of philosophers, however, starting with Joel Feinberg (1986), have concluded that the notion can be useful in theory if not necessarily in practice.

In cases involving less severe disabilities, some prospective parents think that they are protecting the welfare of “their child” by preventing the existence of a child who would have a disability. This attitude involves seeing the future child not as a particular individual who can only exist with a disability, but as a role that prospective parents do not want to fill with a disabled child. Philosophers have debated the appropriateness of regarding future children in this way (Malek 2008; Hare 2007; Velleman 2008; Wasserman 2008; Heyd 2009). Even if this view were appropriate, its moral force would depend on the extent to which the diagnosed condition could reasonably be expected to reduce the child’s welfare, as well as the existence and strength of a moral reason not to bring into existence persons with such welfare deficits.

In the context of prenatal testing, as with assessments of adult functioning, the extent to which a disabling condition reduces well-being depends on the conception of well-being that is adopted. With prenatal testing, however, there is an additional complication: there is massive uncertainty about how the detected variants will be expressed in the developing child. That depends on their their interplay with other genes and interaction with a variety of environments. The formidable challenges of predicting phenotype may be more readily acknowledged by health professionals than the even more daunting challenges in the non-medical assessment of how life with a given phenotype could go for the person living it.

1.5.2 Withdrawal of Life Support from Disabled Newborns

The debate over the withdrawal of life support for very premature and severely disabled newborns surfaced in the 1980s with the 1982 Bloomington, Indiana Baby Doe case and the adoption of federal guidelines for support of newborns and termination of life-sustaining treatment. The debate continues as medical technology permits an increasing number of severely disabled newborns to survive. Some of the debate appears fairly abstract, concerning whether there should be a “grey area” around “a life (just barely) worth living”, in which parents and physicians would be permitted to decide for themselves whether to continue or withdraw life-support (Wilkinson 2011). Disability scholars, however, have the more practical concern that decisions about life-support, whether made by parents or caretakers, too often rely on inaccurate or misleading medical indicators of expected well-being, resulting in significant discrimination against newborns with disabilities (Silvers and Francis 2011). Although the accuracy of medical prediction may improve after birth, it remains difficult to assess the potential of a neonate to develop higher cognitive functions. And although the prediction of the course of physical impairments has improved, that improvement offers only a partial safeguard against the tendency of many parents and health professionals to exaggerate the hardships of life with an impairment—a tendency driven as much by stigma as by medical error and uncertainty.

1.5.3 “End-of-Life” Decision Making

Assumptions about disability and well-being play an important if somewhat less salient role in this context. They figure most prominently when the individual is no longer capable of deciding for herself whether to receive, continue or refuse life-sustaining treatment. For adults once capable of making such decisions, two standards apply to surrogate decision making: substituted judgment and best interest. The first involves judging what the individual would have wanted or chosen if she could want or choose for her current situation; the second involves judging the person’s interests by a standard other than her own. In cases where the adult never had decisional capacity and there is no basis for making a judgment about what the patient would have chosen, the best interest standard applies. But those who judge the best interests of such an adult are prone to the same errors of projection as nondisabled people judging the well-being of disabled people. A nondisabled surrogate might be devastated at losing capacities the cognitively impaired individual never had, or assume that the inability to understand the source of, or reason for, physical pain must be even more traumatic for that individual than it would be for the surrogate. Such judgments are not clearly wrong, but rather speculative; the primary error is in overconfidence.

Assumptions about disability and well-being also play a significant role in judging the reasonableness of requests by competent adults to end, or not receive, life sustaining treatment. Many jurisdictions recognize the right of such individuals to make this decision for themselves, but disability advocates remain concerned that their decisions are more likely to be considered reasonable, and respected, if they are made in response to severe, permanent disabilities. Thus, in the influential case of Elizabeth Bouvia, the court allowed a fully competent, severely disabled, women to refuse the medical support that could have prolonged her life indefinitely. Critics of the decision maintained that both Bouvia and the court were unduly swayed by the perceived indignity of her physical dependence, and by their difficulty in seeing how life could go very well with a severe disability (Asch 2005; Gill 1992; Longmore 1987).

1.5.4 Health Related Quality-of-Life Measures

Perhaps the setting in which the relationship of disability to well-being has received most attention is the assessment of “quality of life” (see, generally, Wasserman, et al. 2005a). For judging the cost-effectiveness of medical interventions, it is useful to have measures of well-being that facilitate quantitative comparison. Quality-of-life measures in medicine and health care offer benchmarks for assessing the well-being of groups of people, focusing on the aspects of well-being most amenable to reliable assessment. There is no guarantee that individuals who are doing well by such measures are actually living good lives according to more robust philosophical criteria of well-being. Any uniform metric for quality of life will provide an oversimplified assessment of an individual’s well-being, and to some extent this is unavoidable from a policy perspective. But the worry when these judgments are applied to people with disabilities is not oversimplification so much as systematic bias.

Assumptions about the adverse effect of disability on well-being pervade the measurement of “health-related quality of life” (HRQL). In particular, two features of many standard approaches to measuring HRQL treat disability as inimical to well-being: 1) assuming that an individual’s adaptation to a disability is a source of distortion or a measurement artifact in assessing how well he or she is doing; 2) expanding the definition of health outcomes to include not only the physiological and sensory-motor effects of disease and injury, but their “sequelae”—their effect on daily living and social participation. The first feature ignores the extent to which adaptation involves changes that would count as improvements in well-being on most objective as well as subjective accounts (Menzel et al. 2002; Barnes 2009a). The second fails to distinguish the contribution of medical and social/environmental factors to the restriction or loss of objectively valuable activities (Wasserman, et al. 2005a). These features not only exaggerate the adverse impact of disabilities, but in some contexts, threaten adverse consequences for people with disabilities.

The inclusion of functional and activity limitations as health outcomes is in tension with the social model of disability, which treats many of those limitations as due to an exclusionary environment. It also conflicts with the view, discussed below, that an individual can be disabled but healthy. The assumption that adaptation to disability cannot be an accurate measure of well-being has motivated a reliance on health professionals to assess the quality of life with specific disabilities, rather than on people with those disabilities (Murray 1996). The refusal to treat people with disabilities as reliable witnesses to, or authorities on, their well-being is particularly striking, given that nondisabled people also adapt to the vicissitudes of their lives (Brickman and Campbell 1971). As Wasserman, et al. note:

The lives of people with disabilities are assumed to be of low quality, whatever environmental factors mediate the impact of their impairments, and their own testimony to the contrary is seen as inherently unreliable. Their adaptations to their impairments appear not as instances of the universal processes of adjustment to changed circumstances, but as disability-specific strategies for recovering the ground that has been lost, or for covering up its loss through benign self-deception (2005a: 11).

This view of disability is not merely inaccurate. Its use to assess the effectiveness of health care interventions has disturbing implications for the lives of people with disabilities. Effectiveness measures typically treat a disability as equivalent for assessment purposes to a shorter life-span. Health outcomes are measured by life-years saved or gained; life-years are “adjusted” by their quality, and their rated quality is substantially reduced if the intervention fails to correct, risks causing, or causes a disability. As a result, people who have, or will be left with, disabilities also have their future life-years adjusted downward in light of the presumed lower quality of those life-years. As a result, the priority of persons with disabilities for life-saving interventions is substantially reduced. Because it employed such discounting, the 1990 Oregon Health Care Plan to set priorities for Medicaid-funded procedures was found to discriminate against people with disabilities (Bodenheimer 1997). Several years later, the most comprehensive international effort to develop summary measures of population health proposed a more explicit and very sharp discounting of lives with disabilities in assessing the “Global Burden of Disease” and in setting priorities for its reduction (Murray 1996). Although some objectionable features of the discounting methodology have been modified (Saloman and Murray 2002), the Global Burden of Disease frameworks continue to adopt procedures that result in strikingly low quality-of-life estimates for many disabilities.

Many mainstream philosophers and bioethicists question the use of summary health measures in priority setting (Harris 1987; Brock 1995). They argue that their proposed use is based either on a questionable utilitarian assessment of lives as more valuable if they “contain” more utility, or on the controversial distributive principle that society should give scarce goods to those who will benefit most from them. But many still defend the general assumptions about disability and quality of life that informed those measures (Brock 2005). Other philosophers and disability scholars have challenged these assumptions (Bickenbach 2005). Some have gone even further, questioning whether quality-of-life assessments place an exaggerated premium on the prevention or correction of impairments that do not, in hospitable environments, preclude rich and rewarding lives (Barnes 2009a; Asch and Wasserman 2010).

2. Disability and Health

People appear to regard health as one of the most important goods, more important than wealth, status, or professional success. Health is seen as special in part for instrumental reasons, because it is thought to be a prerequisite for many or most other goods. So the relationship of health to disability is an issue of central concern for those who seek to replace or supplement a medical model of disability (Bickenbach 1993; Shakespeare 2006).

The social model of disability, which informs the Americans with Disabilities Act and kindred legislation, may appear to move disability away from health policy and toward civil rights. Yet movement in one direction does not preclude movement in the other. People with disabilities have significant health care needs, and their needs may depend to some extent upon their disabilities. For philosophers as well as policy makers, the challenge posed by the social model is to acknowledge the importance of health and health care for people with disabilities without assuming that all people with disabilities are unhealthy just because they are disabled, and without overemphasizing the correction or mitigation of impairments. This requires a careful examination of the relationship between health and disability. Do all disabilities result from, or in, a loss of health? Can a person with a disability be in good or even “perfect” health? To answer such questions, we need a serviceable theory, concept, or definition of health.

There are a variety of competing philosophical accounts of health (see SEP entry on concepts of health and disease). They can be distinguished in several ways: 1) some regard health as the mere absence of disease (e.g., Hofman 2005); others regard health as a form of well-being or flourishing, and treat the absence of disease as at most a necessary condition of health (e.g., Carel 2007 and WHO 1948); 2) some regard the concept of health as value-laden, or normative, in the sense that the good of health enters into its very concept (e.g., Engelhardt 1986; DeVito 2000); others regard health as value-neutral, or non-normative, defined by bio-statistical or other biological criteria (e.g., Boorse 1987 and Wachbroit 1998); 3) some see the value of health as instrumental, in the capacity of the agent or organism to achieve certain goals (e.g., Nordenfeldt 1995); others see its value as intrinsic as well, as good in itself (e.g., Becker 2005).

These distinctions are not independent of each other. Non-normative accounts of health tend to treat health as the absence of disease, dysfunction, or deformity. These accounts also tend to be instrumental: they define health as normal or species-typical biological functioning, which is itself defined in such goal-oriented terms as survival and reproduction. On the other hand, instrumental accounts that define health in terms of the pursuit of an individually, culturally, or other variable range of goals will tend to weaken the connection of health to bodily, cognitive, or affective functioning.

If health is defined simply as the absence of disease, then a person can be disabled but healthy if and only if he can be disabled but not diseased. If, however, health is a state of psychophysical flourishing or vitality, then an individual can be healthy, although perhaps not perfectly healthy, even if disabled or diseased, and unhealthy even if free of disability or disease.

Many philosophers and bioethicists take it that “health”, “disease”, and “disability” are value-laden, that it is part of their meaning that the conditions to which they refer are (inherently) desirable or undesirable (e.g., Engelhardt 1986 and DeVito 2000). Two notable exceptions are Christopher Boorse and Robert Wachbroit, who offer biomedical definitions that are value-neutral, or as Boorse claims, as value-neutral as biology itself (Boorse 1987: 359–93; Wachbroit 1998: 533–38). They define health in terms of normal or species-typical physical and mental functioning, so that disabilities are by definition unhealthy. But such value-neutral accounts do not assume that disabilities are therefore bad or undesirable, merely atypical.[2]

Since they deny that the goodness of health is part of its definition, value-neutral accounts stress the enormous, but contingent, instrumental value of health. The leading attempt to explain the importance of health in these terms is Daniels’ account of health-care as maintaining or restoring fair equality of opportunity (Daniels 1985). Daniels’ account gives a priority to the maintenance of typical functioning and the correction of disabilities that many critics find excessive (Wasserman 1998: 152–58). Still, the core intuition, concerning the enormous practical value of species-typical functioning, can be accepted without accepting medical normalization as the preferred or default response to atypicality; indeed, without accepting the claim that species have functions with species- typical levels defined in biological terms (see Amundson 2000). Further, the claim that species-typical functioning is instrumentally valuable leaves open the question of why departures from species-typical functioning are instrumentally disvaluable: is it because they render one vulnerable to discrimination, subject one to an unaccommodating environment, cause medical problems, or all of the above?

Yet most people have a strong conviction that practical advantages do not exhaust the value of health, nor practical disadvantages its disvalue. To accommodate this conviction, those accepting a narrow definition of health as the absence of disease may want to acknowledge that disease, or its usual symptoms or consequences, has inherent disvalue, while distinguishing disability from the other symptoms or consequences of disease, particularly pain and death. Those adopting a broader definition of health as an aspect of well-being or flourishing may also want to claim that being unhealthy has inherent disvalue, while distinguishing disability from a lack of health.

2.1 The First Approach: Distinguishing Disability from Disease

The distinction between disease and disability has received surprisingly little attention in the philosophical literature. Most statutory and other official definitions either treat serious diseases as disabilities or make “impairment”, “loss of function”, or “structural/functional abnormality” an element of disability, leaving the relationship of disease to disability unclear (e.g., Americans with Disabilities Act, 1990 or Disability Discrimination Act, 1995). One of the few detailed analyses of the relationship between disease and disability was offered by Ron Amundson, who proposed that disability should be understood as one of the three general consequences of disease, along with pain and death (Amundson 1992: 105–119). Amundson adopted Boorse’s value-neutral account of health, but argued that Boorse defined “disease” too broadly, as a “deviation from the functional organization of typical members of a species”—a definition which would encompass most disabilities. Amundson contended that it was both clearer and closer to common usage to treat disease as an atypical process that tended to result in disability, pain, or death.[3]

Amundson defined disability as the loss or deviation from a particular kind of species-typical function: action at the personal level, e.g., the inability to move one’s arm, as opposed to the inability to metabolize sugar. Disabilities that are not products of a process that leads to pain, death, or further impairment are not symptomatic of disease in Amundson’s sense. They are consistent with health narrowly defined. Yet some philosophers (Hausman 2001: 254) find the notion that individuals can be in excellent health if they are blind, deaf, or paraplegic sufficiently implausible to count against analyses of health with that implication.

The disagreement between Amundson and Boorse on the distinction between disease and disability is not just a matter of semantics. The critical point in Amundson’s analysis is a practical one. Medical interventions are the presumptive response to disease; they seek to slow, arrest, or reverse processes that cause pain and may lead to physiological dysfunction, (further) disability (in Amundson’s terms), or death. But on Amundson’s view, which makes disability consistent with health, the presumptive response to disability need not be medical as opposed to environmental or social. Furthermore, the loss of opportunity associated with disabilities can often be prevented or mitigated more effectively and (in the long run) more economically by modifying the physical and social environment than by medical intervention. This is true even though environmental measures are likely to fare poorly against medical interventions in the competition for scarce resources, because of the prestige and perceived importance of medical treatment. The failure to distinguish disease and disability, and the tendency to favor a medical response for both, reflects the sway of the medical model, and offers a clear illustration of how it differs from the social model (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience).

Recently, Peter Hucklenbroich has proposed a harm-oriented account of health as the absence of a “disease” process. Such a process is pathological in the sense that:

  1. it is immediately lethal or definitely life-shortening, [or]
  2. it is a condition of pain, suffering, or other specific complaints, [or]
  3. it is a condition of infertility (incapability of biological reproduction), [or]
  4. it is a condition of inability or impairment for living together in human symbiotic communities, [or]
  5. it is a non-universal disposition of the organism to develop a condition that is pathological according to one or more of these criteria. (12)[4]

Hucklenbroich’s account defines health in terms of a list of reasonably health-specific harms and it restricts health to the absence of biological conditions that either (a) directly involve harm or (b) dispose one to suffer harm.

An account along these lines may have the potential to distinguish disease from disability so as to make the former immediately relevant to well-being in a way the latter is not. Unlike purely non-normative accounts, it only finds a health-decrement where something bad comes from the state of the body. Unlike capaciously normative accounts, it defines these “bads” in terms of a general and health-specific harm; not just any body-based limitation on the pursuit of our (potentially idiosyncratic) goals makes us unhealthy. And finally, defining health in terms of bodily dispositions could help to explain why extrinsic factors, like those cited by social models of disability, are irrelevant to health. It could distinguish between harms that come from social responses to the body from harms that come from the body itself; thereby distinguishing between harms that generate claims on health care and harms that generate claims against discrimination or the denial of fair equality of opportunity.

Despite the importance of distinguishing disease from disability, there are at least three reasons why it is difficult to do so. First, as noted above, many or most diseases are defined as disabilities by disability discrimination laws or their judicial and administrative interpretations; they are subject to the same legal protections and requirements of reasonable accommodation as “Amundsonian” disabilities. This legal treatment may, however, be justifiable, because some diseases, such as AIDS, are stigmatized as severely as many or most disabilities. Second, many disabilities, such as the inability to walk, may be associated with diseases, such as MS, which have a progressive character, causing pain and further impairment, and sometimes increasing the risk of death (Wendell 2001).[5] Third, a society such as our own, where atypical functionings are often not well accommodated, accords a higher priority to the prevention or treatment of some non-fatal diseases than would a society that better accommodated them.

2.2 The Second Approach: Health as More or Other than the Absence of Disease

An alternative approach to the relationship between health and disability involves a broad or positive conception of health as more than, or distinct from, the absence of disease or disability. This approach has more and less instrumental versions. The former is represented by Nordenfelt’s account of health as the ability of an individual to reach her “vital goals”—those whose achievement is independently necessary and jointly sufficient for minimal happiness (Nordenfeldt 1995). On such an instrumental account, the relationship of disability to health depends on the goals that are considered vital or central and on the role of typical functions in achieving them. Some impairments will hinder the pursuit of some goals (goal-based accounts of health vary in whether or how they specify the relevant environment(s) affecting their pursuit), other impairments will have no effect, and some will enhance the pursuit of some goals. Any generalizations about the impact of impairments on health will depend on the assessment of their net effect on the pursuit of the specified goals.

The breadth of an instrumental approach is apparent in Sridhar Venkatapuram’s variation on Nordenfeldt, which replaces the latter’s mix of universal and personal “vital goals” with the “basic capabilities for minimal happiness”, as enumerated by Martha Nussbaum. “What is important”, Venkatapuram maintains, is “the idea of health as the capability to achieve a cluster of basic capabilities and functionings” (277). Far from denying that this conception resembles the much-ridiculed 1948 WHO definition of health as “a state of complete physical, mental, and social well-being”, Venkatapuram just alters that definition to refer to a capability for minimal well-being. Nor does he shirk from the practical implications of this conception:

“Health policy and expertise will have to encompass all the determinants of the core human capabilities that constitute a minimally decent life” (278).

At the same time, he recognizes a narrower conception of health, treating it as one of the more specific capabilities that health in his broader conception encompasses. Health in this narrow sense is just the capacity to avoid disease and impairment. But it is unclear why even health in this narrow sense should be a constituent of well-being, given the fact of human mortality and vulnerability.

Lawrence Becker has proposed a broad but less instrumental conception of health, examining positive conceptions of health in other disciplines, specifically models of positive mental health in psychology, which incorporate notions such as resilience, robustness, developmental maturity, character strength, and subjective well-being (Becker 2005). Such conceptions go beyond the absence of disease in two ways: they are positive, requiring psychophysical vitality—robustness, vigor, and resilience—and they are broad, concerned not merely with biomedical functioning but with more comprehensive well-being.

More recently, Becker (2012) argues for “basic good health” as the metric for “basic justice”. For Becker, basic good health is defined in interactive terms, as “reliably competent physical and psychological functioning in a given environment” (2012: 45). As David Crocker (2013) observes, this notion

has both negative and positive elements. The negative dimension includes absence of disease, illness, disability, and other impairments. The positive aspect is … ”robustly active agency. To be healthy is to have a kind of agency appropriate to the stages on life’s way—from infancy to mature adulthood to old age.

This positive aspect of basic good health, if not the notion as a whole, gives support and structure to the claim that one can be disabled but healthy. It could also promote the development of health interventions for people with disabilities that are not directed at the normalization of their atypical or impaired functions. One challenge for this approach is to limit the scope of positive health, so that it does not encompass all aspects of well-being, but remains anchored in biomedical functioning. A second challenge for this approach is to explain how cognitive and affective conditions bear on health, and how any adverse effects of such conditions can be mitigated or eliminated without medical normalization.

3. Personal Relations, Family, and Disability

Although the connection between disability and interpersonal relationships is a topic worth exploring in its own right, it also has important implications for well-being and health. Numerous empirical studies across a number of behavioral science and medical disciplines have shown the importance of close interpersonal relationships for health and well-being (Cohen, Gottlieb, and Underwood 2001; Uchino, Cacioppo and Kiecolt-Glaser 1996; Cohen and Wills 1985). For example, more than 130 empirical studies have shown that on a number of well-being indices, married men and women are generally happier and less stressed than unmarried people (Coombs 1991). Personal relationships, including love and friendship, are for most people an essential ingredient of the life they want for themselves, something to value for their own sake as well as for the support they provide during stressful times. However, many people see disability as an obstacle to friendship, romantic love, and rewarding family life. Disability scholars and activists reject this widespread belief, arguing that the obstacles that exist to accessing such relationships are due primarily to features of the social and physical environment.

In this section, we discuss the perceived barriers to such relationships. Clearly, one’s view about the effect of disability on interpersonal relationships depends on one’s conception of disability and on one’s conception of the relevant interpersonal relationships, such as friendship and love. As is evident from the discussions in the “Friendship” and “Love” entries in this encyclopedia, there is lively debate among philosophers concerning the nature and value of love and friendship.

3.1 The Nature of Personal Relationships

The term “personal relationship” encompasses relationships of widely varying sorts. We will focus on relationships typically understood as enduring and in some way intimate: between parents and children, siblings, friends, and committed partners. In that respect, our conception of personal relationships is narrower than the broad conception of a relationship that figures in some of the literature on relational egalitarian theories of justice (see, for example, Anderson 2010; though for a principle of relational egalitarianism that is derived from consideration of what spouses owe one another, see Scheffler 2014). The close relationships we have in mind—whether of friendship, partnership, or family—involve some degree of mutual regard, personal disclosure, and particularized knowledge. They also involve material and emotional mutuality, but need not involve equal exchanges between the parties.

Philosophers have often treated equality of some kind as a prerequisite of friendship (see SEP entry on friendship). In the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle distinguished among three kinds of friendship: friendships of pleasure, of utility, and of virtue. The last, the highest or truest form, required similarity of character. Philosophers since Aristotle have rejected some of his prerequisites for friendship, such as equality of social or economic status, but they have shared his view that friendship must be a relationship among equals. The debate has largely focused on the kind of equality that is required. Thus, Aristotle denied that parents and their children could ever be true friends, since the inequality between them could never be overcome no matter how much the child does for his parents. This position is rejected by English (1979) and Kristjansson (2006). Generally, contemporary accounts of friendship place less emphasis on equality or similarity of specific traits and more on equality of respect, investment, and commitment. Given the vast range of differences among close friends in talents, interests, and tangible contributions, it would not seem that disabilities pose any general barrier to intimacy.

Nevertheless, philosophers and bioethicists have tended to look skeptically on the possibility that a person with a disability could offer the mutuality and equality required for a satisfying relationship with a nondisabled friend, romantic partner, or family member. Even in those relationships where unequal contributions and asymmetric dependence are the norm, as with parents and their children, a child’s disability has been seen as an obstacle to a desirable and rewarding relationship. The disability is perceived as creating an uncomfortable degree of inequality and dissimilarity; parents have difficulty picturing the child growing into a productive adult and parent, fulfilling some of the goals people have for undertaking childrearing (Ruddick 1998). Additionally, the child’s disability has been viewed as imposing burdens on parents that differ from and greatly exceed those posed by raising children who do not have disabilities (Botkin 1995). Moreover, the child’s disability is presumed to extend the duration of parental care (Botkin 1995; Kittay 1999; Lindemann and Nelson 2008). Similarly, when the bioethics literature considers people with disabilities as parents, it is largely to assess whether it will be harmful for children to be raised by disabled parents (Coleman 2002; Robertson 2004); or whether adult children will have to give up their other life projects to care for their newly-disabled parents (Callahan 1988).

In this literature, relationships involving disabled people are chiefly viewed from the perspective of those without disabilities. Whether the topic is end-of-life decision making (Hardwig 2000), treatment decisions for low birth weight, premature or otherwise disabled newborns (Stack 1987), the rehabilitation of persons after traumatic brain injury (Nelson and Frader 2004), or selection for or against disabling traits in embryos or fetuses (Botkin 1995; Ruddick 2000; Green 2008), the focus is on how nondisabled people are affected by a (potential) relationship with someone who has a disability. What is largely missing from these accounts is serious consideration of the perspective of the person with a disability; of how her life will be affected, for good or ill, by the family or friendship relationships in which she is embedded. In addition, little attention is paid to relationships in which all involved parties have disabilities. As Chappell (1994) has noted, writers assume that it is in the interest of people with disabilities to aspire to relationships with nondisabled people, even if it is not is the interest of the latter. It seems clear that if the consequences of personal relationships for the flourishing of persons with disabilities were given the same weight as the consequences for nondisabled persons, it would encourage a deeper and fuller appreciation of the goods of personal relationships.

3.2 Peer Relationships: Friendship and Love

At the heart of the negative portrayal of disability’s impact on interpersonal relationships is the presumed inequality imposed on the relationship when one participant has a disability but others do not. The type of inequality and its explanation are not always made explicit. Does it result from the (perceived) inability of people with disabilities to participate in activities that are important to some, most, or all friendships? Or does it arise from the (perceived) need on the part of the person with a disability for technological or human assistance to manage typical life tasks? Does it stem from a belief that the person with a disability does not possess the social or psychological resources to prove a stimulating and rewarding friend?

The influence of a dichotomous conception of disability, that is, of a conception of disability as a personal attribute one either has or lacks, is evident even in the way questions about disability and personal relationships are framed. In asking questions like “Are relationships between disabled and nondisabled people necessarily unequal?” we tend to assume that disability is a categorical characteristic: that there is a distinct subset of the population that is disabled and everyone else is nondisabled. If, instead, we adopted the human variation model of disability (see SEP entry on disability: definitions, models, experience), we could reframe such questions. That model conceives of an impairment as an arbitrary range on the continuum of variation for a human attribute. Moreover, the model sees disability as an interaction between atypical functioning or embodiment and an unaccommodating environment. Consequently, it emphasizes that most people are “disabled” in some particular physical or social context, insofar as they have some atypical characteristic which fits poorly in that context. The model also suggests that a disability, like an impairment, ought to be considered as a graduated characteristic: just as there are degrees of functioning, there are degrees of fit between functioning-embodiment and social environment.

On this view, the question “Are relationships between disabled and nondisabled people problematically unequal?” would be better reformulated as

Is there a positive correlation between the degree to which the parties to a relationship differ in overall level of disability, on the one hand, and the degree of problematic interpersonal inequality, on the other?

Although this is largely an empirical question and cannot be answered by philosophical reflection alone, philosophy can clarify the concepts that figure in the question: what is it to have a disability, what sorts of equality matter in valuable interpersonal relationships, and is there a reason, given what disability is and what sorts of equality matter, to think ex ante that such a correlation would exist?

One reason having or acquiring a physical, intellectual, or emotional disability lessens the chances that relationships will move beyond acquaintanceship is that the disability looms so large in the minds of the nondisabled person (and perhaps the disabled person as well) that it obscures or eclipses other features on which an intimate relationship can be solidly grounded. Most people do not yet see disability as one among many characteristics with respect to which humans can vary. In this way, one aspect of a person comes to dominate the whole, an aspect of stigmatization that elsewhere we have described as “synecdoche” (Asch and Wasserman 2005).

3.3 Romantic Love and Sexual Intimacy

These points apply as well to the relationship between disability and romantic and sexual intimacy. This aspect of romantic leave can amplify the concerns of people already skeptical about the ability of persons with disabilities to contribute to thriving friendships. Many nondisabled people may doubt that people with disabilities can be fulfilling partners in any loving adult relationship. Prominent explanations of love, again based in Aristotle, hold that having loving relationships promotes self-knowledge, insofar as one’s beloved acts as a kind of mirror, reflecting back one’s character (see SEP entries on love and friendship). Many nondisabled people may find it hard to imagine seeing their reflection in a disabled partner. According to LaFollette (1996), love, at least ideally, brings out the best in the participants. For nondisabled people, it may be hard to see past the impairment to imagine that a partner with a disability can bring out their best, be similar enough to understand them, enhance their self-worth, or meet their deepest needs.

Disability creates a number of challenges to forging intimate physical and emotional relationships. People with sensory-motor impairments who were disabled beginning in early life often report that they were socially segregated from other children, either directly because they were tracked into different classes or different schools, or indirectly because other students avoided them. Consequently, many disabled children have not been socialized about sex in the way other children have been: even playground misinformation can play a role in developing and affirming a sense of nascent sexual identity in able-bodied children, yet disabled children are often excluded from this process. To make matters worse, many disabled children do not receive sex education until a much later age than their able-bodied peers (if at all), a reflection of the pervasive stereotype that disabled people are infantile and asexual (Shakespeare 1996).

These challenges persist into adulthood. When disabled people form intimate relationships with other adults, cultural stereotypes and prejudices continue to exact a high cost. Disabled people are often expected to be “with their own kind”, and if they do form intimate relationships with unimpaired people, they must confront patronizing assumptions about the “real” reasons for the relationship: dependency, pity, etc.. When disabled people form intimate relationships with one another, they must overcome psychological barriers to intimacy that result from society’s views about what an appropriate partner would be or what acceptable sexual activity is. Or they must battle family opposition to being with a partner whose similar or different disability prevents that partner from assuming the role of “caregiver” or personal assistant. Emens (2009) shows how institutional practices, along with physical and communication barriers, perpetuate and reinforce prevailing views that people with disabilities will be incapable of participating in sexual and partner relationships.

For various reasons, people with intellectual disabilities have been thought incapable of understanding and appreciating the value of romantic, sexual, or partner relationships. But as first-person narratives attest, disabled people have grown quite adept at navigating and even overcoming these challenges (Shakespeare 1996). Narratives and research demonstrate that even people with developmental disabilities or dementia can and often do consent to mutual, sustained sexual relations (Kaeser 1992). This is not to deny, obviously, that some disabled people lack the cognitive abilities necessary to genuinely consent to sex.

3.4 Parenting and Disability

The assumption that people with disabilities will not be able to enter into intimate relationships, or will impose onerous burdens on their intimates, may play a significant role in the routinization of prenatal testing and abortion for disability. The reluctance of many parents to have a disabled child often rests on an exaggerated view of the physical and emotional demands of raising such children, or on a failure to appreciate the capacities of such children to form rewarding parent-child relationships. The latter is likely to play a major role in the strength of the desire to avoid having a child with a serious cognitive impairment. Indeed, surveys show that prospective parents are far more reluctant to have a child with a cognitive or affective impairment than a sensory or motor impairment (Wertz 1998).

This reluctance may also rest to a great extent on the overwhelming salience of the impairment in a setting where little else can be known about the future child. That salience reinforces the already-powerful tendency to see only the stigmatized trait. Botkin may express the dominant view among prospective parents in arguing that the burden of raising a child with a disability should be treated as equivalent to the burden of raising an unwanted child (Botkin 1995: 32–39). Ferguson argues that the findings from research and from parent narratives in the past thirty years contradict such assertions and demonstrate that families with a child who has a disability look much like other families in terms of satisfaction, stress, and system functioning (Ferguson 2001: 373–95). Other research suggests that raising children with severe cognitive and other disabilities has greater stresses but similar rewards (Aschbrenner, et al. 2010; Blacher and Baker 2007; Gerstein et al. 2009).

Prospective parents with disabilities are less likely to be encumbered by these stereotypes about disabled children, but they may believe that their disabilities have been sufficiently difficult for them that they do not want to pass them on to their children. Moreover, even if their impairment is not genetic and they are likely to become the biological parent of a child without a disability, they must struggle with deeply-rooted skepticism about their own ability to parent disabled or nondisabled children. If one of the most pervasive assumptions about disability is its association with a need for help or “care” from others, the person with a disability may think herself incapable of doing so for others.

The prospect of parenting by people with disabilities provides an opportunity to consider the question of which components of customary parent-child relationships are essential to good parenting (Blustein 1982; Ruddick 1998; O’Neill 2002). Parents with disabilities, particularly cognitive disabilities, are often regarded as unfit to meet the “special needs” of disabled children, and incapable of serving as mentors and role models for nondisabled children. Although some judicial decisions, empirical reports, and personal narratives recognize that many people with physical, sensory, affective, and cognitive impairments can effectively raise children alone or with some assistance, daily life, social service agencies, and attitudes of professionals and the public still thwart people with disabilities in their parenting goals (Collins and Llewellyn 2012; Picciuto 2015). However, social attitudes are gradually changing as examples of successful parenting by people with disabilities proliferate (Mutcherson 2008).

3.5 Personal relationships and third-party assistance

Disability theorists and activists reject the assumption that disabilities pose unique difficulties for personal relationships on the grounds that this assumption reflects an overly narrow view of the mutuality required in an intimate relationship. That said, not all persons with and without disabilities have the same views about possibility of combining intimacy with disability-specific personal assistance. To accommodate these differences, some theorists and activists have argued for options that separate instrumental assistance from close relationships. These options involve providing by paid staff for personal assistance in cases where this helps to preserve the mutuality, sharing, and interdependence of friendships, partner relations, and family life (Litvak et al. 1987; Asch 1993; Ratzka 2004). There is much to be said in favor of making third-party assistance available. The lack of education and training of family members in meeting a person’s disability-related needs, the societal treatment of these needs as different from and more shameful than other needs, and the scarcity and inaccessibility of other supportive services for meeting these needs, can indeed place enormous strain on intimate relationships between nondisabled and disabled persons. Further, the constant reliance upon intimates for assistance with travel, communication, or preparation for work or school may thwart the desires of persons with disabilities to select what they wear, when they come and go, or with whom they associate in their free time. The idea of an entitlement to state-subsidized personal assistance has been developed on a policy level by Litvak, Heumann, and Zukas (1987), Adolf Ratzka (2004), and Americans Disabled For Attendant Programs Today (ADAPT).

It might be thought that the argument for state-subsidized personal assistance undermines the claim that disability does not pose any general barriers to intimacy. Those arguing that the state should subsidize personal assistance for people with disabilities might seem to share the assumption of Callahan (1988) and Wertz and Fletcher (1993) that disability-related needs differ in kind as well as in degree from other material and emotional needs for which state-subsidized assistance is not defended.

Disability advocates would reject this conclusion for at least two reasons. First, it is the stigmatization of disability-related needs, more than the actual cost of meeting them, which serves as a barrier to intimacy. The stigmatization of disability-related needs creates an aversion to meeting those needs and a tendency to exaggerate the costs of doing so. There is an inclination to see meeting those needs as falling outside the scope of an intimate relationship, when meeting relevantly similar needs of a nondisabled relative are seen as part and parcel of intimate relating. By subsidizing personal assistance, the state helps to overcome the exclusionary effects of deeply entrenched social attitudes that pose a barrier to intimacy. If these attitudes change so that the dominant culture does not find it shameful to have disability-specific needs and distasteful to meet them, there might well be less need for personal assistance programs. The remaining need for personal assistance would not sharply distinguish persons with disabilities from friends and intimates who also call upon each other for various forms of assistance.

Second, the fact that some people with disabilities require more assistance than most nondisabled people to achieve their life goals does not mean that disabilities must pose a barrier to intimacy. Intimate relationships often impose special demands on participants unrelated to disability. An individual with expensive projects or commitments may cost significantly more to befriend or marry, but unless those projects and commitments are extravagant or all-consuming, we would not see them as a general barrier to intimacy. Likewise, even in an Internet age, it may be more costly to maintain friendships with people who live in remote areas. Yet we tend to see those costs as incidental to the relationships we form, even if they limit them in ways we may regret (Amundson 2005).

A state-subsidized personal assistance response to disability-related needs is not welcomed by all disability theorists and activists. Wendell (1989, 1996) sees people with disabilities, in their dependence, as having lessons to teach nondisabled people about human interdependence. Similarly, Eva Kittay has argued for the importance of kinship caregiving. Kittay stresses the importance of a loving and “sustaining” relationship between the caregiver and the care-recipient, which may be absent when care is professionally outsourced. Moreover, family caregivers are more likely to maintain trusting and long-lasting relationships, as opposed to professional caregivers, who may come and go. Furthermore, Kittay stresses the significance of including disabled people in familial and cultural activities rather than relegating them to paid caregivers, although it is not clear why having a paid assistant is inimical to participating in familial and communal activities (Kittay 2003). (See also Longmore 1995 and Levine 2004.).

These arguments about the value of kinship caregiving do not undermine the case for making professional caregiving relationships a dignified and economically viable option. There are many families ill-equipped or poorly disposed to adopt that option. But there are also many circumstances in which the differentiation of personal assistant from parent, spouse, or friend will give the person with a disability the freedom and privacy that nondisabled people take for granted. In circumstances where kinship assistance would strain rather than enhance intimate relationships between family members, it seems clear that third-party assistance should at least be made available as an option, even if it is not encouraged across-the-board.

Subsidizing third-party assistance is a means by which the state can help to create the conditions for the flourishing of positive relationships. The provision of paid third-party assistance is not intended to force the separation of instrumental help from close relationships, but to give friends and family members the freedom to decide how much of such assistance they want to incorporate into their relationships. Friends and family members may be entirely comfortable meeting someone’s disability-specific needs, just as they are prepared to meet other needs of the people with whom they have intimate relationships (Asch 1993). In other cases, and with respect to other needs, they may not. Close relationships are not all of a piece, and persons with disabilities, their friends, family members, and lovers should be able to determine for themselves what kind of relationship they will have and what role there is in it for third-party assistance.

4. Conclusion

Having separately discussed well-being, health, and personal relationship, the Entry concludes by considering the links among these three domains, as they pertain to disability.

On most plausible accounts of well-being, health and personal relationships are either instrumentally conducive to well-being or partially constitutive of it. An account of well-being which entailed that health and personal relationships were not important means to or constituents of well-being would be prima facie implausible. Consequently, an account of health entailing that persons with disabilities are necessarily unhealthy, or an account of personal relationships entailing that persons with disabilities cannot enjoy many of the goods of those relationships, will also have the implication that persons with disabilities cannot attain the same level of well-being as able-bodied persons absent compensating capacities or achievements in other domains.

Many laypersons, policymakers, and philosophers implicitly or explicitly adopt theories of health and personal relationships with this implication. But there are plausible accounts of health and personal relationships which do not entail that disability is inimical to well-being. And on most plausible accounts of well-being, disability need not present a formidable barrier to living a good life. This is so on appropriately pluralistic, flexible and broadly-framed objective-list accounts as well as on subjective accounts. A blind or deaf person cannot exercise all five senses. But there are plausible arguments for the conclusion that they can have lives with rich aesthetic experience, pleasure, and joy.

We suggest that the difficulty in appreciating that people with disabilities may have lives as good as those of people without disabilities, objectively as well as subjectively, may arise in part from a failure of imagination by nondisabled people. A body of empirical research indicates that people without disabilities rate the subjective well-being of people with disabilities far lower than they rate it themselves. (Albrecht and Devlieger 1999; Gill 2000; Goering 2008). If all persons enjoy a defeasible presumption of epistemic authority with respect to the quality of their experiences, this divergence suggests that the widely shared assumption that disabilities reduce quality of life should be regarded as controversial, not self-evident. Although we have no empirical research to support us, we suspect the same is true for the divergent assessments of the prospects for objective well-being of people with disabilities. Non-disabled people may have greater difficulty imagining how people with disabilities can enjoy or develop the capabilities for the various constituents of objective well-being, particularly those concerning health and personal relationships.

This highlights a broader point connecting all three domains, as well as the relationship between philosophy and disability more generally. Most philosophical discussions of disability have implicitly assumed the perspective of persons who do not have a disability. They have asked whether other people, the people with disabilities, have lower levels of well-being; whether other people, the people with disabilities, are less healthy; whether other people, the people with disabilities, will pose a comparatively higher burden as friends or intimates. In much recent work in political philosophy, disability has figured most prominently as a paradigm example of bad luck, and the question is whether and to what extent we the able-bodied should compensate disabled others for their misfortune (see SEP entry on disability and justice). By implicitly adopting the perspective of nondisabled persons, from which persons with disabilities appear only in the third-person, much mainstream work in philosophy has failed to take seriously the perspectives of persons with disabilities—even when those perspectives are directly relevant to the conceptual question under discussion: what is the nature of well-being, or friendship, or health? We hope that this entry can be a point of departure for a discussion of these concepts that takes into account a wider range of relevant considered judgments, intuitions, and perspectives.

Bibliography

  • ADAPT (American Disabled for Attendant Programs Today), “A Disability Perspective on Home Health Care”, available online, Albertson, NY: National Center on Employment of the Handicapped, Human Resources Center, accessed August 22, 2014.
  • Albrecht, G.L. and G. Devlieger, 1999, “The disability paradox: high quality of life against the odds”, Social Science and Medicine, pp. 977–988.
  • Americans with Disabilities Act (ADA), 1990, United States. [ADA available online]
  • Amundson, R., 1992, “Disability, Handicap, and the Environment”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 23(1) 105–19.
  • –––, 2000, “Against Normal Function”, Studies in History, Philosophy, Biology and Biomedical Science, 31(1): 33–53.
  • –––, 2005, “Disability, Ideology, and Quality of Life: A Bias in Biomedical Ethics”, in Wasserman, Wachbroit, and Bickenbach 2005b: 101–124.
  • Anderson, Elizabeth, 2010, The Imperative of Integration, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Asch, A., 1993, “Abused or neglected clients—or abusive or neglectful service systems?” Ethical Conflicts in the Management of Home Care, R.A. Kane & A.L. Caplan (eds.), New York: Springer Publishing Company, 113–21.
  • –––, 2003, “Disability, Equality and Prenatal Testing: Contradictory or Compatible?”, Florida State University Law Review, 30(2): 315–342.
  • –––, 2005, “Recognizing Death while Affirming Life: Can End of Life Reform Uphold a Disabled Person’s Interest in Continued Life?” The Hastings Center Report, 35(7): s31-s36.
  • Asch, A. and M. Fine, 1988, “Introduction: Beyond Pedestals”, in Fine and Asch 1988: 1-40.
  • Asch, A. and D. Wasserman, 2005, “Where Is the Sin in Synecdoche: Prenatal Testing and the Parent-Child Relationship”, in Wasserman, Wachbroit, and Bickenbach 2005b: 172–216.
  • –––, 2010, “Making Embryos Healthy or Making Healthy Embryos: How much of a Difference between Prenatal Treatment and Selection?” in The “Health” Embryo: Social, Biomedical, Legal and Philosophical Perspectives, J. Nisker, F. Baylis, I. Karpin, C. McLeod, and R. Mykitiuk (eds), New York: NY: Cambridge University Press, 201–219.
  • Aschbrenner, K.A., J.S. Greenberg, S.M. Allen, M.M. Seltzer, 2010, “Subjective burden and personal gains among older parents of adults with serious mental illness”, Psychiatric Services, 61(6): 605–611.
  • Barnes, E., 2009a, “Disability, Minority, and Difference”, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 26(4): 337–355.
  • –––, 2009b, “Disability and adaptive preference”, Philosophical Perspectives, 23:1, pp 1–22.
  • –––, 2014, “Valuing Disability, Causing Disability”, Ethics, 125(1): 88–113.
  • Becker, L.C., 1998, “Afterword: Disability, Strategic Action, and Reciprocity”, in Silvers, Wasserman, and Mahowald 1998: 293–303.
  • Becker, L., 2000, “The Good of Agency”, in Americans with Disabilities: Implications of the Law for Individuals and Institutions, L. Frances and A. Silvers (eds.), New York: Routledge: 54–63.
  • –––, 2005, “Reciprocity, Justice, and Disability”, Ethics, 116(1): 9–39.
  • –––, 2012, Habilitation, Health, and Agency: A Framework for Basic Justice, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Bickenbach, J., 1993, Physical Disability and Social Policy, Toronto and London: University of Toronto Press.
  • –––, 2005, “Disability and Health Systems Assessment”, in Wasserman, Wachbroit, and Bickenbach 2005b: 237–66.
  • Blacher, J. and B.L. Baker, 2007, “Positive impact of intellectual disability on families”, American Journal on Mental Retardation, 112(5): 330–348.
  • Blustein, J., 1982, Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Bodenheimer, T., 1997, “The Oregon health plan: lessons for the nation”, New England Journal of Medicine, 337(10): 720–3.
  • Boorse, C., 1987, “Concepts of Health”, in Health Care Ethics: An Introduction, D. VanDeveer and T. Regan (eds.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 359–393.
  • Botkin, J.R. 1995, “Fetal Privacy and Confidentiality”, The Hastings Center Report, 25: 32–39.
  • Bradley, B., 2012, “Doing away with Harm”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 85(2): 390–412.
  • Brickman, P. and D. Campbell, 1971, “Hedonic relativism and planning the good society”, in Adaptation-level theory: a symposium, M.H. Apley (ed.), New York: Academic Press, pp. 287–305.
  • Brightman, A.J., 1985, Ordinary Moments: The Disabled Experience, Baltimore: Human Policy Press.
  • Brock, D.W., 1995, “Justice and the ADA: does prioritizing and rationing health care discriminate against the disabled?”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 12(2): 159–185.
  • Brock, Dan, 2005, “Preventing Genetically Transmitted Disabilities while Pespecting Persons with Disabilities”, in Wasserman, Wachbroit, and Bickenbach 2005b: 67–100.
  • Callahan, D., 1988, “Families as Caregivers: The Limits of Morality”, Archives of Physical Medicine and Rehabilitation, 69(5) 323–8.
  • Campbell, S.M., 2014, “When the Shape of a Life Matters”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 18(3): 565–575.
  • Carel, H., 2007, “Can I Be Ill and Happy?” Philosophia, 35: 95–110
  • Chappell, A.L., 1994, “A question of friendship: community care and the relationship of people with learning difficulties”, Disability and Society, 9(4): 419–434.
  • Cohen, S., B. Gottlieb, and L. Underwood, 2001, “Social Relationships and Health: Challenges for Measurement and Intervention”, Advances in Mind-Body Medicine, 17(2): 129ff.
  • Cohen, S. and T. Wills, 1985, “Stress, Social Support and the Buffering Hypothesis”, Psychological Bulletin, 98(2): 310–357.
  • Coombs, R., 1991, “Marital Status and Personal Well-Being: A Literature Review”, Family Relations, 40(1): 97–102.
  • Coleman, C.H., 2002, “Conceiving Harm: Disability Discrimination in Assisted Reproductive Technologies”, UCLA Law Review, 50: 17.
  • Collins, S., and G. Lewellyn, 2012, “Children of Parents with Intellectual Disability: Facing Poor Outcomes or Faring Okay?”, Journal of Intellectual and Developmental Disability, 37(1): 65–82.
  • Crisp, R., 2013, “Well-Being”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2013/entries/well-being/>.
  • Crocker, D., 1995, “Functioning and Capability: The Foundations of Sen’s and Nussbaum’s Development Ethics: Part II”, in Women, Culture, and Development, Martha Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds), New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 153–98.
  • Crocker, D.A., 2013, “Review of Habilitation, Health, and Agency: A Framework for Basic Justice by Lawrence C. Becker”, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2013.02.28. [Crocker 2013 available online]
  • Daniels, N., 1985, Just Health Care, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Davis, F., 1961, “Deviance Disavowel: The Management of Strained Interaction by the Visibly Handicapped”, Social Problems, 9(2): 120–132.
  • DeVito, S., 2000, “On the Value-Neutrality of the Concepts of Health and Disease: Unto the Breach Again”, Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 25: 538–67
  • Disability Discrimination Act (DDA), 1995, United Kingdom. [DDA 1995 available online]
  • Dougherty, Tom, 2014, “Ethics Discussion at PEA Soup: Elizabeth Barnes’ Valuing Disability, Causing Disability, with Critical Précis by Tom Dougherty”, PEA Soup: A blog dedicated to philosophy, ethics, and academia, November 25, 2014. [Dougherty 2014 online]
  • Emens, E.F., 2009, “Intimate Discrimination: The State’s Role in the Accidents of Sex and Love”, Harvard Law Review, 122: 1307–1402.
  • –––, 2012, “Framing Disability”, University of Illinois Law Review, 5: 1383–1441.
  • Engelhardt, H.T. Jr., 1986, The Foundations of Bioethics, New York, Oxford University Press.
  • English, J., 1979, “What Do Grown Children Owe Their Parents?” in Having Children: Philosophical and Legal Reflections on Parenthood, O. O’Neill and W. Ruddick (eds), New York: Oxford University Press: 351–356.
  • Feinberg, J., 1986, “Wrongful life and the counterfactual element in harming”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 4(1): 145–178.
  • Feldman, F., 2008, “Whole life satisfaction concepts of happiness”, Theoria, 74(3): 219–238.
  • Ferguson, P.M., 2001, “Mapping the Family: Disability Studies and the Exploration of Parental Response to Disability”, in Handbook of Disability Studies, Gary L. Albrecht, Katherine D. Seelman, and Michael Bury (eds.), Thousand Oaks, California: Sage Publications, 373–95.
  • Fine, M. and A. Asch (eds.) 1988, Women with Disabilities: Essays in Psychology, Culture, and Politics, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Fisher B. and R. Galler, 1988, “Friendship and fairness: How disability affects friendship between women”, in Fine and Asch 1988: 172–194.
  • Francis, L.P., 2009, “Understanding Autonomy in Light of Intellectual Disability”, in Disability and Disadvantage, K. Brownlee and A. Cureton (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press: 200–215
  • Gerstein, E.D., K. Crnic, J. Blacher, and B.L. Baker, 2009, “Resilience and the course of daily parenting stress in families of young children with intellectual disabilities”, Journal of Intellectual Disability Research, 53(12): 981–997.
  • Gill, Carol J., 1992, “Suicide Intervention for People with Disabilities: A Lesson in Inequality”, Issues in Law & Medicine, 8(1): 37–54.
  • –––, 2000, “Health Professionals, Disability, and Assisted Suicide: An Examination of Empirical Evidence”, Psychology, Public Policy, and Law, 6(2) 526–45.
  • Gliedman, J. and W. Roth, 1980, The Unexpected Minority: Handicapped Children in America, New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich.
  • Glover, J., 2006, Choosing Children: The Ethical Dilemmas of Genetic Intervention, Oxford: Clarendon Press, Ch. 3.
  • Goering, S., 2008, “’You say you’re happy, but …’: Contested Quality of Life Judgments in Bioethics and Disability Studies”, Journal of Bioethical Inquiry, 5: 125–135.
  • Goode, D.A. (ed.), 1994, Quality of Life for Persons with Disabilities: International Perspectives and Issues, Brookline, MA: Brookline Books.
  • Green, R., 2008, Babies by Design: The Ethics of Genetic Choice, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Hardwig, J., 2000, Is There A Duty to Die?, New York: Routledge.
  • Hare, C., 2007, “Voices from Another World: Must We Respect the Interests of People Who Do Not, and Will Never, Exist?” Ethics, 117(3): 498–523.
  • Harman, E., 2009, “Harming as Causing Harm”, in Roberts and Wasserman 2009: 137–154.
  • Harris, John, 1987, “QALYfying the Value of Life”, Journal of Medical Ethics, 23:227–23.
  • Hausman, D., 2001, “Valuing Health”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 34(3) 246–79
  • Heyd, D., 2009, “The Intractability of the Nonidentity Problem”, in Roberts and Wasserman 2009: 3–25.
  • Hofman, B., 2005, “Simplified Models of the Relationship between Health and Disease”, Theoretical Medicine and Biology, 26: 355–377.
  • Kaeser, F., 1992, “Can People with Severe Mental Retardation Consent to Mutual Sex?” Sexuality and Disability, 10(1): 33–42.
  • Kahane, G.; Savulescu, J., 2009, “The Welfarist Account of Disability”, in Disability and Disadvantage, K. Brownlee and A. Cureton (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press: 14–53.
  • Kittay, E.F., 1999, Love’s Labor: Essays on Women, Equality, and Dependency, New York and London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2003, “When Caring Is Just and Justice Is Caring: Justice and Mental Retardation”, in The Subject of Care: Feminist Perspectives on Dependency, E.F. Kittay and E.K. Feder (eds), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 257–276.
  • Kristjansson, K., 2006, “Parents and Children as Friends”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 37(2): 250–265.
  • LaFollette, H. 1996, Personal Relationships: Love, Identity, and Morality, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell Press.
  • Levine, C., 2004, Always on Call: When Illness Turns Families into Caregivers, Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Lindemann, H. and J.L. Nelson, 2008, “The Romance of the Family”, The Hastings Center Report, 38(4): 19–21.
  • Litvak, S., Heumann, J. and Zukas, H.,1987, Attending to America: Personal Assistance for Independent Living, Berkeley: World Institute on Disability.
  • Longmore, P.K. 1987,“Elizabeth Bouvia, Assisted Suicide and Social Prejudice”, Issues in Law & Medicine, 3(2): 141–170.
  • –––, 1995, “The Second Phase: From Disability Rights to Disability Culture”, Disability Rag, 16(Sept/Oct): 4–11.
  • Malek, J. 2008, “Disability and the Duties of Potential Parents”, St. Louis University Journal of Health, Law and Policy, 2: 119–134.
  • McBryde-Johnson, H., 2003, “Unspeakable Conversations”, New York Times (Magazine section), February 16.
  • –––, 2005, Too Late to Die Young: Nearly True Tales from a Life, New York, Henry Holt & Co.
  • McClimans, L., J. Bickenbach, M. Westerman, L. Carlson, D. Wasserman, and C. Schwartz, 2013, “Philosophical perspectives on response shift”, Quality of Life Research, 22(7): 1871–1878.
  • McMahan, J., 2001, The ethics of killing: Problems at the margins of life, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2005, “Causing Disabled People to Exist and Causing People to be Disabled”, Ethics, 116(1): 77–99.
  • Menzel, P., P. Dolan, J. Richardson, and J.A. Olsen, 2002, “The Role of Adaptation to Disability and Disease in Health State Aaluation: a Preliminary Normative Analysis”, Social Science & Medicine, 55(12): 2149–2158.
  • Murray, C., 1996, “Rethinking DALYs”, in The Global Burden of Disease: A Comprehensive Assessment of Mortality and Disability From Diseases, Injuries, and Risk Factors In 1990 and Projected to 2020, C. Murray, and A. Lopez (eds.), Geneva: World Health Organization.
  • Mutcherson, K., 2008, “Making Mommies: Law, Pre-Implantation Genetic Diagnosis, and the Complications of Pre-Motherhood”, Columbia Journal of Gender and Law, 18: 313.
  • Nelson, J.L. and J. Frader, 2004, “Brain Trauma and Surrogate Decision Making: Dogmas, Challenges, and Response”, Journal of Clinical Ethics, 15(4): 264
  • Nordenfelt, L., 1995, On the Nature of Health: An Action-Theoretic Perspective, 2nd ed., Dordecht: Kluwer.
  • Nussbaum, M., 1998, “Aristotelian Social Democracy”, in G. Brock (ed.), Necessary Goods: Our Responsibilities to Meet Others’ Needs, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 135–156.
  • –––, 2006, Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2009, “The Capabilities of People with Cognitive Disabilities”, Metaphilosophy, 40(3/4): 331–351.
  • O’Neill, O., 2002, Autonomy and Trust in Bioethics, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Overall, C., 2003, Aging, Death, and Human Longevity, Berkeley, CA: Norton & Company.
  • Parfit, D., 1984, Reasons and Person, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 493–502.
  • Picciuto, E., 2015, March 16, “Mom With Disabilities and Daughter Reunited After Two-Year Court Battle”, The Daily Beast. [Picciuto 2015 available online]
  • Ratzka, A.D., 2004, “Model National Personal Assistance Policy”, A project of the European Center for Excellence in Personal Assistance (ECEPA). [Ratzka 2004 available online]
  • Roberts, M.A. and D.T. Wasserman (eds), 2009, Harming Future Persons: Ethics, Genetics and the Nonidentity Problem, Netherlands: Springer.
  • Robertson, J.A., 2004, “Procreative Liberty and Harm to Offspring in Assisted Reproduction”, American Journal of Law & Medicine, 30(1): 7–40.
  • Ruddick, W., 1998, “Parenthood: Three Concepts and a Principle”, in Morals, Marriage, and Parenthood: An Introduction to Family Vales, L.D. Houlgate (ed.), Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • –––, 2000, “Ways to Limit Prenatal Testing”, in Prenatal Testing and Disability Rights, E. Parens and A. Asch (eds.), Washington, D.C.: Georgetown University Press: 95–107.
  • Saigal, Saroj and P. Rosenbaum, 1996, “Health Related Quality of Life Considerations in the Outcome of High-Risk Babies”, Seminars in Fetal and Neonatol Medicine, 1(4): 305–312. doi:10.1016/S1084-2756(96)80050-9
  • Salomon, J.A. and C. Murray, 2002 “Estimating Health State Valuations Using a Multiple-Method Protocol”, Summary Measures of Population Health: Concepts, Ethics, Measurement and Applications, Geneva: World Health Organization.
  • Scanlon, T.M., 1998, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 109ff.
  • Scheffler, Samuel, 2014, “The Practice of Equality”, Social Equality: Essays on What it Means to be Equals, Carina Fourie, Fabian Schuppert, and Ivo Wallimann-Helmer (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Scotch, R.K. and K. Schriner, 1997, “Disability as Human Variation: Implications for Policy”,The Annals of the American Academy of Political and Social Science, 549(1): 148–159.
  • Segal, J.M., 1998, “Living at a High Economics Standard: A Functionings Analysis”, in Ethics of Consumption: The Good Life Justice, and Global Stewardship, David Crocker and Toby Linden (eds), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 342–365.
  • Sen, A., 1980, “Equality of What?” in S. MacMurrin (ed.) Tanner Lectures on Human Values, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Shakespeare, T., 1996, The Sexual Politics of Disability, London, UK: Cassell.
  • –––, 2006, Disability Rights and Wrongs, London: Routledge.
  • Shiffrin, S., 1999, “Wrongful Life, Procreative Responsibility, and the Significance of Harm”, Legal Theory, 5: 117–148.
  • –––, 2012, “Harm and Its Moral Significance”, Legal Theory, 1(1): 1–42.
  • Silvers, A. and L.P. Francis, 2009, “Thinking About the Good: Reconfiguring Liberal Metaphysics (or Not) for People with Cognitive Disabilities”, Metaphilosophy, 40(3–4): 475–498.
  • –––, “Cloudy crystal balls do not ‘gray’ babies make”, American Journal of Biothics, 11(2): 36–38.
  • Silvers, Anita, D. Wasserman, and M.B. Mahowald (eds.), 1998, Disability, Difference, Discrimination: Perspectives on Justice in Bioethics and Public Policy, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Stack, M.F., 1987, “Who Should Pay for Infertility?” The Hastings Center Report, 17(6): 3–4.
  • Temkin, L.S., 2008, “Is Living Longer Living Better?” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 25(3): 193–210.
  • Urchino, B., J. Cacioppo, and J. Kiecolt-Glaser, 1996, “The Relationship Between Social Support and Psychological Processes: A Review with Emphasis on Underlying Mechanisms and Implications for Health”, Psychological Bulletin, 119(3): 488–531.
  • Velleman, J.D., 2008, “Persons in Prospect”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 36(3): 221–288.
  • –––, 1991, “Well-Being and Time”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 72: 48–77
  • Venkatapuram, S., 1998, Health Justice: An argument from the capabilities approach, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Wachbroit, R., 1998, “Health and Disease, Concepts of”, Encyclopedia of Applied Ethics vol. 2, Ruth Chadwick, Daniel Callahan, and Peter Singer (eds), Waltham, MA: Academic Press, pp. 533–538.
  • Wasserman, D., 1998, “Distributive Justice”, in Silvers, Wasserman, and Mahowald 1998: 147-207.
  • –––, 2008, “Hare on De Dicto Betterness and Prospective Parents*”, Ethics, 118(3): 529–535.
  • Wasserman, D., R. Wachbroit, and J. Bickenbach, 2005a, “Introduction”, in Wasserman, Wachbroit, and Bickenbach 2005b: 1–26.
  • ––– (eds), 2005b, Quality of Life and Human Difference: Genetic Testing, Health Care, and Disability, New York: Cambridge University Press,
  • Wasserman, David and Jeff McMahan, 2012, “Cognitive Surrogacy, Assisted Participation, and Moral Status”, Medicine and Social Justice: Essays on the Distribution of Health Care, New York: Oxford University Press, 325–333.
  • Wendell, S., 1989, “Toward A Feminist Theory of Disability”, Hypatia, 4(2): 63–81.
  • –––, 1996, The Rejected Body: Feminist Philosophical Reflections on Disability, Hove, East Sussex, UK: Psychology Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Unhealthy disabled: Treating chronic illnesses as disabilities”, Hypatia, 16(4): 17–33.
  • Wertz, D., 1998, “What’s Missing from Genetic Counseling: A Survey of 476 Counseling Sessions”, abstract, Journal of Genetic Counseling, 7(6): 499–500.
  • Wertz, D.C. and J.C. Fletcher, 1993, “A Critique of Some Feminist Challenges to Prenatal Diagnosis”, Journal of Women’s Health, 2(2): 173–188
  • Wilkinson, D., 2011, “A Life Worth Giving? The Threshold for Permissible Withdrawal of Life Support from Disabled Newborn Infants”, The American Journal of Bioethics, 11(2): 20–32.
  • Williams, B., 1973, “The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality”, Problems of the Self, Cambridge University Press: 82–100.
  • World Health Organization [WHO], 1948, “WHO Definition of Health”, in Preamble to the Constitution of the World Health Organization, as adopted by the International Health Conference, New York, 19–22 June, 1946; signed on 22 July 1946 by the representatives of 61 states (Official Records of the World Health Organization, no. 2, p. 100), and entered into force on 7 April 1948. [WHO 1948 available online]

Copyright © 2016 by
David Wasserman <dtwasserm@gmail.com>
Adrienne Asch
Jeffrey Blustein <jblustein@ccny.cuny.edu>
Daniel Putnam <daniel.putnam@yale.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free