Approaches to Feminism

First published Sun Oct 31, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jan 20, 2011

Feminist philosophy emerged in the US in the 1970s following only a decade behind the rise of the US women's movement in the 1960s. Although Simone de Beauvoir published her now highly influential The Second Sex in 1953, it would take at least a decade for women in the US to begin to organize around the injustices Beauvoir identified, and even longer for feminist philosophers in the US to turn to her work for inspiration.

Although I will focus in this introductory essay on the emergence of contemporary US feminist philosophies, it is important to stress that this is only one chapter in a larger history of feminist philosophy. Feminist philosophies have histories that date back historically at least to the early modern period, and have different genealogies in different geographical regions. Both the history of and particular character of feminist philosophy in other countries and in other time periods varies in important and interesting ways. It is crucial, therefore, to understand this essay only as an introduction to contemporary feminist philosophies in the U.S.

Understanding the emergence of feminist philosophy in the U.S. requires an overview of at least two contexts — the political context of what came to be called the “second wave of the woman's movement” and the nature of philosophy in U.S. academies.

1. The Political Context: The Rise of the U.S. Feminist Movement

The 1950s are a complex decade in the U.S. The country is at the height of the McCarthy era, yet it is the same decade that witnesses the rise of the Civil Rights Movement. In 1953 Barrows Dunham, chair of the philosophy department at Temple University is subpoenaed by the House Committee on Un-American Activities. Although he is tried and acquitted for refusing to provide more than his name, address, and age, Temple University fires him. A number of philosophers are called upon to testify before the HUAC and others are fired from positions because of their membership in the Communist Party. In 1955 Rosa Parks is arrested for keeping her seat in the front of a bus in Montgomery Alabama just one year after the Supreme Court in Brown vs. the Board of Education bans segregation in public schools. In 1957 Martin Luther King is named president of the newly formed Southern Christian Leadership Conference and begins his campaign to end race discrimination.

It is important to remember that 1950 is only five years into a campaign to encourage women to return to home and hearth, leaving the jobs they had taken on as part of the war effort.[1] As one telling example, consider Adlai Stevenson's 1955 address to the Smith College graduating class urging these educated women not to define themselves by a profession but to participate in politics through the role of wife and mother. While McCarthyism rooted out political subversion, science and the media worked to instill proper gender roles. A 1956 Life magazine published interviews with five male psychiatrists who argued that female ambition was the root of mental illness in wives, emotional upsets in husbands, and homosexuality in boys.

But the increasing involvement of women in freedom marches and, somewhat later, the protests of the Vietnam War give rise to a budding awareness of gender injustices. Looking back in the 1975 edition to her landmark study of the U.S. Women's Movement in 1959, Eleanor Flexner explains:

First in the South and eventually everywhere in this country, women were involved in these struggles. Some white women learned the degree to which black women were worse off than they were, or than black men. White and black women learned what the minority of women active in the organized labor movement had learned much earlier: that women were typically excluded from policy-making leadership roles of even the most radical movement, a lesson that would have to be relearned again and again in the political and peace campaigns of the late sixties (1975, xxix).

The National Organization for Women forms in 1966, petitioning to stop sex segregation of want ads and one year later to request federally funded childcare centers. By 1968 NOW begins to focus on legalizing abortion. In 1967 Eugene McCarthy introduces the Equal Rights Amendment in the Senate. In 1968 feminists in New York protest the Miss America pageant and crown a live sheep as Miss America and set up a ‘freedom trashcan’ in which to dispose of oppressive symbols, including bras, girdles, wigs, and false eyelashes. (Although there was no fire, it was this symbolic protest that the media transformed into the infamous ‘bra burning’ incident.) The Stonewall riot in 1969 marks the beginning of the gay and lesbian rights movement. In 1970 the San Francisco Women's Liberation Front invades a CBS stockholders meeting to demand changes in how the network portrays women, and a model affirmative action plan is published by NOW and submitted to the Labor Department. In this same year three key texts of the U.S. feminist movement are published: Shulamith Firestone's The Dialectic of Sex; Kate Millett's Sexual Politics; and Robin Morgan's Sisterhood is Powerful. In 1970 a press conference headed by women's movement leaders Gloria Steinem, Ti-Grace Atkinson, Flo Kennedy, Sally Kempton, Susan Brownmiller, Ivy Bottini, and Dolores Alexander expressed solidarity with the struggles of gays and lesbians to attain liberation in a sexist society. However, in 1971, at a Women's National Abortion conference, while adopting demands for repeal of all abortion laws, for no restrictions on contraceptives, and taking a stance against forced sterilization, the group votes down a demand for freedom of sexual expression, causing many in the audience to walk out in protest and seeding the development of a separatist movement within the feminist movement (See What is Feminism?).

It is out of this powerful social and political cauldron that feminist philosophy emerges in the U.S. While few would now dispute the claim that the development of ideas and theories in the sciences, as well as the social science and humanities, reflect and are influenced by their social, historical, and intellectual contexts, philosophers in the U.S. have, until recently, paid scant attention to the social contexts of twentieth century U.S. philosophy, particularly with how cultural and political factors have influenced the movements of philosophy within the academy (McCumber 2001). The emergence of feminist philosophy in the U.S. presents an excellent illustration of the close intersection between the development of philosophical positions and methods, and their social contexts.

2. The Rise of Feminist Philosophical Scholarship in the U.S.

Many of the early writings of U.S. feminist philosophers arose from attempts to grapple with issues that emerged from the women's movement: the identification of the nature of sexism and the underlying causes of the oppression of women, questions of how to best obtain emancipation for women — e.g., equal rights within the current political and social structure vs. revolutionary changes of that structure, the issue of ‘woman's nature,’ philosophical analyses of the morality of abortion, and so on. In this first decade of writing, feminist philosophers in the U.S. also turned their attention to the past to investigate how canonical philosophers dealt with the question of women, both to determine if their views might provide resources for addressing contemporary issues or whether the sexism of their theories continued to pervade contemporary philosophical and, perhaps, even social and political practices.

A snapshot, albeit a limited image, of the emergence of feminist philosophical scholarship in the U.S. and beyond can be obtained by looking at numbers of journal articles catalogued in The Philosophers Index.[2] The Philosopher's Index lists only three articles under the keyword ‘feminism’ until 1973 when the number leaps to eleven thanks in large part to a special issue of The Philosophical Forum edited by Carol Gould and Marx Wartofsky that became the basis for an important first anthology on feminist philosophy, Women and Philosophy: Toward a Theory of Liberation. From 1974 to 1980 these numbers increased to 109 entries for this seven year period, with the decade between 1981 to 1990 witnessing an explosion of work in the area of feminist philosophy with 718 entries listed in the Philosopher's Index.In the following 12 years 2,058 more articles are added to the Index under this heading.

Clearly there are a number of reasons for the startling expansion of feminist philosophical work in the U.S. Although I cannot trace all of them, I would like to identify a few that are particularly significant. First is the fact that many philosophers in the U.S. were involved in the social justice movements of the 60s. Most of the philosophers who contributed to the emergence of feminist philosophy in the 70s in the U.S. were active in or influenced by the women's movement. As a result of this participation, these philosophers were attentive to and concerned about the injustices caused by unfair practices emerging from the complex phenomena of sexism. Since their professional skills included the realm of philosophical scholarship and teaching, it comes as no surprise that they would turn the tools they knew best to feminist ends. Second, by the 1970s many women in traditionally male professions often experienced what Dorothy Smith called a ‘fault-line’ in which the expectations of the conventionally ‘proper role of women’ and their own professional experiences were in tension. As women moved through the profession of philosophy in the U.S. in increasing numbers, they often found themselves personally confronted by the sexism of the profession. Sexual harassment and other sexist practices contributed to creating a chilly climate for women in philosophy. But thanks to the consciousness-raising of their involvement in the women's movement, these women were less likely to internalize the message that women were, by nature, less capable of philosophical work or to give in to the sometimes unconscious efforts to exclude them from the profession.

In response to the sexism of the profession, U.S. feminist philosophers organized the Society for Women in Philosophy (SWIP) in 1972.[3] The emergence of SWIP is a third component in the swift rise in contemporary feminist philosophical scholarship in the U.S. SWIP was founded to promote and support women in philosophy. This goal took two forms: 1) working to overcome sexist practices in the profession and 2) supporting feminist philosophical scholarship. While the efforts of SWIP to overcome sexism in the profession certainly contributed to the inclusion and retention of more women in philosophy, it was in the latter goal that SWIP made a significant impact on scholarship. SWIP divisions were formed in a fashion parallel to the American Philosophical Association, with three divisions — Pacific SWIP, Midwest SWIP, and Eastern SWIP (plus a Canadian SWIP) — each of which held yearly or bi-yearly meetings that focused on feminist philosophical scholarship. In addition, the International Association of Feminist Philosophers (IAPh) was founded in 1974 in order to support international exchange of feminist philosophies.

After a decade of meetings, U.S. SWIP members decided to launch an academic journal, Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy. Hypatia was set up “to provide a forum for dialogue on the philosophical issues raised by the women's liberation movement” and published feminist philosophical work committed “to understanding and ending the sexist oppression of women, and a sense of the relevance of philosophy to the task.”[4] While Hypatia was certainly not the only forum in which feminist philosophy was published, it contributed to the creation of a sustained dialogue amongst feminist philosophers in the U.S. and beyond, and a forum for developing feminist philosophical methods and approaches.

3. The Inheritance from Philosophy

Those who drafted the first wave of contemporary feminist philosophical scholarship in the U.S. were influenced by another very important context, their philosophical training. Until very recently one could not go to graduate school to study ‘feminist philosophy.’ While students and scholars could turn to the writings of Simone de Beauvoir or look back historically to the writings of ‘first wave’ feminists like Mary Wollstonecraft, most of the philosophers writing in the first decades of the emergence of feminist philosophical scholarship both in the U.S. and in other countries brought their particular training and expertise to bear on the development of this area of scholarship.

Although many of the writings of the first decade of feminist philosophical scholarship in the U.S. were devoted to analyzing issues raised by the women's liberation movement, such as abortion, affirmative action, equal opportunity, the institutions of marriage, sexuality, and love, feminist philosophical scholarship increasingly focused on the very same types of issues philosophers had been and were dealing with. And since these feminist philosophers employed the philosophical tools they both knew best and found the most promising, U.S. feminist philosophy began to emerge from all the traditions of philosophy prevalent within the U.S. at the end of the twentieth century including analytic, Continental, and classical American philosophy. It should come as no surprise then that the thematic focus of their work was often influenced by the topics and questions highlighted by these traditions.

Feminist philosophical scholarship in the U.S. begins with attention to women, to their roles and locations. What are women doing? What social/political locations are they part of or excluded from? How do their activities compare to those of men? Are the activities or exclusions of some groups of women different from those of other groups and why? What do the various roles and locations of women allow or preclude? How have their roles been valued or devalued? How do the complexities of a woman's situatedness, including her class, race, ability, and sexuality impact her locations? To this we add attention to the experiences and concerns of women. Have any of women's experiences or problems been ignored or undervalued? How might attention to these transform our current methods or values? And from here we move to the realm of the symbolic. How is the feminine instantiated and constructed within the texts of philosophy? What role does the feminine play in forming, either through its absence or its presence, the central concepts of philosophy? And so on.

The ‘difference’ of feminist philosophical scholarship as it has developed in the U.S. proceeds not from a unique method but from the premise that gender is an important lens for analysis. Feminist philosophers in the U.S. and beyond have shown that taking gender seriously provides new insights in all the areas of philosophical scholarship: history of philosophy, epistemology, ethics, philosophy of science, aesthetics, social and political philosophy, metaphysics, etc.

4. Approaches to Feminist Philosophy: Overview of the Encyclopedia Sub-Entries

Feminist philosophical scholarship is not homogeneous either in methods or in conclusions. Indeed, there has been significant debate within feminist philosophical circles concerning the effectiveness of particular methods within philosophy for feminist goals. Some, for example, have found the methods of analytic philosophy to provide clarity of both form and argumentation not found in some schools of Continental philosophy, while others have argued that such alleged clarity comes at the expense of rhetorical styles and methodological approaches that provide insights into affective, psychic, or embodied components of human experience. Other feminists find approaches within American pragmatism to provide the clarity of form and argumentation sometimes missing in Continental approaches and the connection to real world concerns sometimes missing in analytic approaches.

While Hypatia has embraced the diversity of approaches in feminist philosophy, publishing work from all three traditions, feminist scholarship in each of these traditions is advanced and supported though scholarly exchange at various professional societies. The Society for Analytical Feminism, for example, was founded in 1991 to promote the study of issues in feminism by methods broadly construed as analytic, to examine the use of analytic methods as applied to feminist issues, and to provide a means by which those interested in analytical feminist can meet and exchange ideas. philoSOPHIA was established in 2005 to promote continental feminist scholarly and pedagogical development. The Society for Interdisciplinary Feminist Phenomenology is a network of scholars who do work in phenomenology from a feminist perspective or who use phenomenological approaches in their scholarly work. In the field of feminist pragmatism, an affiliated group of scholars have formed the Jane Collective to advance pragmatism in the spirit of the social philosophy of Jane Addams (1860-1935). The Society for the Study of Women Philosophers was established in 1987 to promote the study of the contributions of women to the profession of philosophy.

While feminists have clearly embraced approaches from various traditions within philosophy, they have also argued for the reconfiguration of accepted structures and problematics of philosophy. For example, feminists have not only rejected the privileging of epistemological concerns over ethical concerns common to much of U.S. philosophy, they have argued that these two areas of concern are inextricably intertwined. Such questioning of the problematic of mainstream approaches to philosophy has often led to feminists using methods and approaches from more than one philosophical tradition.

One key area of intersection noted by Georgia Warnke is the appropriation of psychoanalytic theory. (Feminist Approaches to the Intersection of Analytic and Continental Philosophy.) The importance of psychoanalytic approaches is also underscored in Shannon Sullivan's essay Feminist Approaches to the Intersection of Pragmatism and Continental Philosophy. Given the importance of psychoanalytic feminism for all three traditions, a separate essay on this approach to feminist theory is included in this section.

The following are links to essays in this section:

The essays in this section provide overviews of the dominant approaches to feminist philosophy in the U.S. It is important to note that U.S. feminist philosophy has been influenced by feminist philosophical work in other countries. For example, analytic feminism in the U.S. has benefited from the work of feminist philosophers in the United Kingdom and Canada; U.S. Continental feminist scholarship has been richly influenced by the work of feminist philosophers in Europe and Australia. But it is also important to note that, with only a few exceptions, the work of feminist philosophers in Asia, South America, Africa, and Russia have not been the focus of attention of most U.S. feminist philosophers.

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