Mental Illness

First published Fri Nov 30, 2001; substantive revision Mon Feb 22, 2010

Psychiatry involves theories of the mind, theories of the causes of mental disorders, classification schemes for those disorders, research about the disorders, proven treatments and research into new treatments, and a number of professions whose job it is to work with or on behalf of people with mental disorders. The philosophical study of psychiatry discusses conceptual, ethical, metaphysical, social, and epistemological issues that arise in all these aspects of psychiatry. Central to this study is the nature of mental illness.

The central philosophical debate over mental illness is not about its existence, but rather over how to define it, and whether it can be given a scientific or objective definition, or whether normative and subjective elements are essential to our concept of mental illness. One desideratum for a successful definition of mental illness is that it will settle debates over particular purported mental illnesses.

The connection between philosophical issues in the study and treatment of mental illness and these other areas of philosophy is in many cases obvious, as in the question of when and how people with mental disorders are responsible for their actions is connected with the insanity defense in law, and the more general debate over the justification of punishment. The philosophical investigation of the nature of mental illness is therefore relevant to many other areas of philosophy. While there is no sharp divide between the philosophical discussion of the nature of mental illness and the wider philosophical discussion of psychiatry, we can focus on four major issues that have preoccupied the philosophical literature.

1. What is Mental Illness?

While there is debate over how to define mental illness, it is generally accepted that mental illnesses are real and involve disturbances of thought, experience, and emotion serious enough to cause functional impairment in people, making it more difficult for them to sustain interpersonal relationships and carry on their jobs, and sometimes leading to self-destructive behavior and even suicide. The most serious mental illnesses, such as schizophrenia, bipolar disorder, major depression, and schizoaffective disorder are often chronic and can cause serious disability.

What we now call mental illness was not always treated as a medical problem. Descriptions of the behaviors now labeled as symptomatic of mental illness or disorder were sometimes framed in quite different terms, such as possession by supernatural forces. Anthropological work in non-Western cultures suggests that there are many cases of behavior that Western psychiatry would classify as symptomatic of mental disorder, which are not seen within their own cultures as signs of mental illness (Warner, 2004, p. 173). One may even raise the question whether all other cultures even have a concept of mental illness that corresponds even approximately to the Western concept, although, as Kleinman (1988) points out, this question is closely tied to that of adequately translating from other languages, and in societies without equivalent medical technology to the west, it will be hard to settle what counts as a concept of disease.

The mainstream view in the West is that the changes in our description and treatment of mental illness are a result of our increasing knowledge and greater conceptual sophistication. On this view, we have conquered our former ignorance and now know that mental illness exists, even though there is a great deal of further research to be done on the causes and treatment of mental illness. Evidence from anthropological studies makes it clear that some mental illnesses are expressed differently in different cultures and it is also clear that non-Western cultures often have a different way of thinking about mental illness. For example, some cultures may see trance-like states as a form of possession. This has led some to argue that Western psychiatry also needs to change its approach to mental illness. (Kleinman, 1988, Simons and Hughes, 1985) However, the anthropological research is not set in the same conceptual terms as philosophy, and so it is unclear to what extent it implies that mental illness is primarily a Western concept.

A more extreme view, most closely associated with the psychiatrist Thomas Szasz, is that there is no such thing as mental illness because the very notion is based on a fundamental set of mistakes. While it is not always easy to delineate the different arguments in Szasz's voluminous work, (Reznek, for instance, separates out at least six different arguments within his work [Reznek, 1991, Chapter 5]), Szasz has compared psychiatry to alchemy or astrology (1974, pp. 1–2), contending that the continued belief in mental illness by psychiatrists is the result of dogmatism and a pseudoscientific approach using ad hoc defenses of their main claims. He has also argued that the concept of mental illness is based on a confusion.

[The belief in mental illness] rests on a serious, albeit simple, error: it rests on mistaking or confusing what is real with what is imitation; literal meaning with metaphorical meaning; medicine with morals. (Ibid, p. x.)

More specifically, Szasz has argued that by definition, “disease means bodily disease,” (Ibid, p. 74); and, given that the mind is not literally part of the body, disease is a concept that should not be applied to the mind. Although Szasz's position has not gained widespread credence, his writings have generated debate over questions such as whether disease must, by definition, refer to bodily disease.

More recent critics of psychiatry have been more focused on particular purported mental illnesses. The most heated controversies about the existence of particular mental illnesses are often over ones that seem to involve culturally-specific or moral judgments, such as homosexuality, pedophilia, antisocial personality disorder, and premenstrual dysphoric disorder. Other controversies exist over disorders that are milder in character and are on the borderline between normality and pathology, such as dysthymia, a low level chronic form of depression (Radden, 2009).

To reiterate, however, the dominant view is that mental illness exists and there is a variety of ways to understand it. Modern psychiatry has primarily embraced a scientific approach, looking for causes such as traumatic experiences or genetic vulnerabilities, establishing the typical course of different illnesses, gaining an understanding of the changes in the brain and nervous system that underlie the illnesses, and investigating which treatments are effective at alleviating symptoms and ending the illness. One of the central issues within this scientific framework is how different kinds of theory relate to each other (Ghaemi, 2003; Perring, 2007). Reductionist approaches try to reduce social explanations of mental illness to explanations at “lower” levels such as the biological, while pluralist approaches encourage the co-existence of explanations of mental illness at a variety of levels.

As alternatives to reductionist approaches there is also the first-person phenomenology and narrative understanding of mental illness. These focus on the personal experience of living and struggling with mental illness, and give careful descriptions of the associated symptoms. Some see a careful phenomenology as essential to scientific psychiatry (e.g., Ghemi 2007), while others (Murphy, 2006) argue that phenomenology is not essential to psychiatric explanation. The work in this phenomenological tradition is especially important in pressing the question of what it is to understand or explain mental illness, and how a phenomenological approach can relate to scientific approaches. (See for example, Ratcliffe, 2009 and Gallagher, 2009)

2. How are Mental Illnesses Different from Physical Illnesses?

The terms “mental illness” and “mental disorder” normally refer to conditions such as major unipolar depression, schizophrenia, manic depression, and obsessive compulsive disorder. “Physical illness” and “physical disorder” refer to conditions such as influenza, cancer, broken bones, wounds, and arthritis. There has been considerable discussion of how to draw a distinction between the two. Given the current debate, the prospects of finding a principled way of drawing the distinction that matches our current practices may be slim. The main practical reason for trying to draw distinctions between physical and mental illnesses comes from demarcating boundaries between professional competencies, and, in particular, from distinguishing the domain of neurology from that of psychiatry. However, this boundary is not sharply drawn and has moved over time. It is likely that as neuroscience progresses, the domains of neurology and psychiatry will start to merge.

Most agree that the distinction between mental and physical illness cannot be drawn purely in terms of the causes of the condition, with mental illnesses having psychological causes and physical illnesses having non-psychological causes. While we have not identified the causes of most mental disorders, it is clear that many non-psychological factors play a role; for example, there is strong evidence that a person's genetic make-up influences his or her chances of developing a mood or psychotic disorder. Conversely, psychological factors such as stress are reliably associated with increased susceptibility to physical illness, which strongly suggests that those psychological factors are, directly or indirectly, part of the cause of the illness.

Nor can we draw any simple distinction between mental and physical illnesses in terms of the conditions' symptoms. First, it is often unclear whether to categorize symptoms as mental or physical. For example, intuitions are mixed as to whether pain is a physical or mental symptom. It is also unclear whether we would want to classify insomnia and fatigue as physical or mental symptoms. However we classify fatigue, it is a symptom of illnesses normally characterized as physical (such as influenza) and those characterized as mental (such as depression).

Furthermore, distinguishing between physical and mental illness in terms of symptoms may give counterintuitive results. A person who suffers a stroke can have emotional lability, and a person who has experienced a brain injury may become disinhibited; both may suffer memory loss. Yet stroke and brain injury would generally be classified as physical rather than mental disorders.

In the light of these problems, some recommend doing away with any principled distinction between physical and mental disorder. First, certain researchers with a strong reductionist inclination argue that mental disorders are ultimately brain disorders; mental disorders are best explored through neuroscience. (See Guze, 1992). Second, some researchers with a strong belief in a biopsychosocial approach, according to which all disorders have biological, psychological, and social dimensions, argue that, while we should maintain a distinction between the psychological and the biological ways of understanding people's illnesses, no particular illness is purely mental or purely physical. (Engel's work (1977) may be seen as compatible with such an approach, even if he does not directly endorse it.)

Others defend retaining the distinction between physical and mental disorders, but to non-traditional ends. Murphy (2006), for instance, argues that it is important to have a distinction between physical and mental disorder so that it is possible to have a distinctive science of psychiatry. He argues for an expansive definition that includes problems in all psychological mechanisms. While this would entail that forms of blindness due to neural dysfunction count as mental disorders, which goes against our normal usage, his goal is not to completely capture our intuitions, but rather to have an adequate set of definitions to accommodate a theory of psychiatric explanation within the field of cognitive neuroscience. As with Guze, on Murphy's view, the distinction between psychiatry on the one hand and clinical neurology and neuropsychology on the other should disappear.

Thus we see that there are few defenders of the traditional distinction between mental and physical illnesses. Some theorists advocate refiguring the distinction so that it becomes that between brain-based and non-brain-based disorders. Others who take a more holistic view are skeptical that even this distinction is a useful way to separate illnesses into two groups.

3. Classification of Mental Illness

There is ongoing debate concerning the way that mental illnesses should be classified. There are two aspects to this: which conditions get classified as mental illnesses rather than normal conditions, and, among those conditions we agree are mental illnesses, how they are grouped together into different kinds. Controversial diagnostic categories have historically included homosexuality, personality disorders, attention deficit hyperactivity disorder, dysthymia, and pre-menstrual dysphoric disorder. For example, in 1973, the American Psychiatric Association voted to remove homosexuality from its diagnostic manual, after much internal argument and intensive lobbying from activist groups. For both autism and schizophrenia, it has been suggested that these are not unitary conditions but rather collections of quite difference disorders lumped together in one category. These kinds of debates span both empirical and philosophical issues, and it is the former aspect, and the distinction between normality and psychopathology, that has gained the most philosophical scrutiny. The primary questions of concern are:

  1. Will it be possible in the future to classify mental illnesses according to their causes, as we do in much of the rest of medicine?
  2. Given that we currently classify most mental illnesses according to their symptoms rather than their causes, is there any reason to think that our current diagnostic categories (e.g., schizophrenia, depression, manic depression, anxiety disorders) correspond with natural kinds?
  3. Is it possible for our current classification scheme in psychiatry to be in any important sense “atheoretical” and independent of any particular theories of the etiology of mental disorders?
  4. Is it possible for any classification scheme of mental illnesses to be purely scientific, and is it possible for a classification scheme to be independent of values—or to ask the reverse, do our classification schemes in psychiatry always rest on some non-scientific conception, normative of what should count as a normal life?

This last question can be extended to all illnesses, not just those with a psychiatric classification. Many have urged, though, that it is in psychiatry that there is most reason to believe that values enter into the classification scheme, and that there is concern that the profession might be medicalizing what should be seen as normal conditions. (Fulford, 1989, Horwitz, 2001)

The concepts of disease, illness, abnormality, malady, disorder and malfunction are closely related, but they are not the same. Much careful work has been done trying to find if one of these is more basic than any of the others, or if some of these concepts can be completely analyzed in terms of the others. For our purposes here, we shall gloss over the differences between these concepts. For the most part, we will simply refer to the concept of illness.

A main approach to psychiatric classification is the “medical model.” This holds that psychiatric classification is capable of being both scientific and objective. The best-known defender of such an approach is Christopher Boorse, in a series of influential papers (1975, 1976, 1977, 1997). A middle range of views, sometimes called “mixed” (e.g., Wakefield 1992), hold that diagnostic categories do match real mental illnesses but that their determination is grounded both in facts about the world and an irreducible element of value or normativity. At the other end of the spectrum are theories that psychiatric classification depends solely on the whim or values of those doing the classification, that there is nothing objective about it at all, and that there are no facts about what is normal. These subjective theories are generally proposed in a spirit of criticizing or undermining psychiatry, and are often very sympathetic to the Szaszian view that there is really no such thing as mental illness, and so there could not be a legitimate objective classification of different kinds of mental illness. Accompanying these theories, often, is the at least implicit suggestion that classification schemes suit the needs of those in power (see, for instance, the work of sociological theorists Peter Sedwick and Thomas Scheff. (See Reznek, 1991, Chapters 6 and 7). Michel Foucault argued in a similar vein that the growth of psychiatry as a supposedly scientific discipline was really a way to impose bourgeois morality on people who did not accept it. (Gutting, 2008) As for its plausibility, the view that the classification is totally subjective or arbitrary stands or falls with antirealism about mental illness, and it has not received much support in the last twenty years.

It would be highly implausible for a defender of the medical model to insist that values have never in fact entered into the psychiatric taxonomy—a brief study of the history of various categories show that empirical research and neutral scientific facts are certainly not the only things that have been played a role in the formation of classification schemes. (Sadler, 2005; Bayer, 1987; Potter, 2009; Thomas and Sillen, 1972) The medical model claims (a) that it is possible to have a value-neutral classification scheme and (b) it is best to use a value-neutral classification scheme. In justifying part (b) of their claim, some defenders of the medical model might claim we can discover a conceptual truth of the form:

a disease/illness/malady/disorder/malfunction is a condition that …

where the ellipsis is filled by some clause such as “reduces the lifespan of the organism,” “reduces the productivity of the organism,” or “reduces the ability of the genes of the organism to reproduce themselves.” Many will urge that such an approach is problematic, both because it is very difficult to establish non-trivial conceptual truths about controversial concepts, and because our actual usage for the last few centuries of words like disease, illness, or malady do not correspond well with such purported definitions. They are either too broad, too narrow, or both. (See Wakefield, 1992)

An alternative approach to defending (b) is to argue that medicine, and psychiatry especially, should be value-neutral and so its classification scheme should be value-neutral. Of course, there are obvious ways in which we want medicine to not be neutral: for example, it should not be neutral about saving lives or improving health.

We can distinguish different forms of neutrality of diagnostic categories. The ones that are dominant in the psychiatric and psychological literature concern validity and reliability of diagnostic criteria. The validity of a category is a measure of how well it measures what it is intended to measure, while the reliability concerns how well the criteria enable those using them to consistently diagnose people with the condition. Validity and reliability are certainly virtues of diagnostic categories, although there are debates on exactly how objective they are (Sadler, 2005; Thornton, 2007). At the same time, there are ways in which theorists embrace the values behind psychiatric categorizing, and argue that they should simply be made public. (See Fulford et al, 2005).

Those who argue that psychiatry and the rest of medicine are inevitably normative do not infer from this that medicine is always biased; instead, their view is that the nature of psychiatric classification requires that some normative rather than purely scientific assumptions be made about what counts as health and what counts as illness. They generally then suggest that, since medicine and psychiatry have to make such assumptions, they should be as open and honest about it as possible so that debates about certain categories of psychopathology are not based on a misunderstanding of the kind of enterprise involved. Such theorists often add the suggestion that in a democracy, there should be public debate about what values should be at the heart of medicine and psychiatry. (Sadler, 2005; Fulford, 2004)

Those who argue that psychiatric classification is necessarily value-laden rarely rest their argument on the claim that all of science is value-laden, or even more controversially, that all of science is subjective. For the sake of argument, it is possible for all sides of the debate to concede that we can know facts about the causes and consequences of the conditions we label as illnesses, and that these facts are entirely value-neutral. (There are of course some who would dispute the possibility of there being, or our knowing, any value-neutral facts, but this is an extreme view, and it does not single out medical classification as an interesting and unusual case of value-ladenness. So we will set it aside.)

We now can ask why those who think that psychiatric classification must be value-laden think so, and how those who think it can be value-neutral propose to find such a classification.

If a theory can, by itself, provide us with a way of demarcating human health from pathology, then the theory must, on its own, have some account of what healthy function is, and what should count as a malfunction of a human being. Those who believe in value-neutral classification generally argue that “health” can be defined scientifically, and thus without value-laden assumptions. Those who disagree think that the criteria used to define “health” are always value-laden, even if they are also based in scientific understanding.

Thus Boorse, who argues for the value-neutral view of classification, suggests that evolutionary theory can tell us what conditions are healthy. In one paper, he gives the following definition of health:

An organism is healthy at any moment in proportion as it is not diseased; and a disease is a type of internal state of the organism which:

  • interferes with the performance of some natural function—i.e., some species-typical contribution to survival and reproduction—characteristic of the organism's age; and
  • is not simply in the nature of the species, i.e. is either atypical of the species or, if typical, mainly due to environmental causes. (Boorse, 1976, page 62.)

This purported definition has received a great deal of critical discussion (Bolton, 2008; Murphy & Woolfolk, 2000; Sadler and Agich 1995). Those in opposition mount three kinds of claims:

(C1) In much of medicine, and especially psychiatry, we do not know with any certainty what is evolutionarily natural, because our scientific studies are still in their early stages or highly programmatic, and it can be very difficult to find data that will settle scientific controversies. For many conditions, such as homosexual behavior or mild depression, it is not clear whether these conditions help or hinder the continuance of the species (or the continuance of whatever set of genes the theory says is fundamental). Therefore the idea of settling the debates of what should count as illnesses with science is at best a proposal for a distant future time. It is likely that many of the scientific questions will never receive satisfactory answers, in which case we will never be able to use science completely to determine our answers.

(C2) Even were we to have a complete theory of evolutionary psychology, it would still be controversial whether to use such a theory in determining whether particular conditions are normal or abnormal. That is to say, many dispute whether medicine should base its view of naturalness on conditions that help the promotion of the species. For instance, many would claim that in medicine we are more concerned with what hinders a particular individual, whether or not it helps the rest of the species, or would have helped the species in times when we were developing evolutionarily.

(C3) The answers that evolutionary psychology seems to suggest on controversial cases often don't match with our contemporary medical classifications of health and pathology (Murphy and Stich, 2000). If we want to hold onto our present medical classifications, then there is serious doubt that a model of health provided by evolutionary psychology is the one that we should adopt.

Mixed models

Even if the medical model of illness is wrong, it may only require a small modification in order to become acceptable. This is what has been argued by Jerome Wakefield in a number of influential publications. Wakefield (1992) attempts to keep the concept of a natural function, and the concept of dysfunction, central in our understanding of mental disorder. He argues that disease is a condition that is both dysfunctional and disvalued, and on his view, dysfunction is a purely factual scientific concept. So some conditions, even though they may be judged negatively, will not count as disorders because they are neither are nor are caused by dysfunctions. For example, some have claimed that children who masturbate have “childhood masturbation disorder.” Wakefield says that there is no such disorder, for, whatever one's values, such behavior is not unnatural according to the scientific theory of evolutionary psychology.

On the other hand, Wakefield claims, not all dysfunctions are disorders, for not all are disvalued. For example, even if evolutionary theory could show that homosexuality stems from an internal dysfunction, we might not classify homosexuality as a disorder because we might decide that it is not harmful in our society. Our society may have changed so much since the times when our natures were formed that even if a person lacks certain abilities, for example, to be a hunter, and was evolutionarily speaking unnatural, we could agree that the ability to be a hunter is no longer necessary in our society, and so lacking hunter abilities does not mean one has a disorder. Further, some deficits may make us less than perfect, but still we would not judge that we are so lacking as to have a disorder.

This leads Wakefield to the following analysis of a disorder:

A condition is a disorder if and only if (a) the condition causes some harm or deprivation of benefit to the person as judged by the standards of the person's culture (the value criterion), and (b) the condition results from the inability of some internal mechanism to perform its natural function, wherein a natural function is an effect that is part of the evolutionary explanation of the existence and structure of the mechanism (the explanatory criterion). (Wakefield, 1992, in Edwards, 1997, pp. 87–8)

Such a theory is still susceptible to concerns C1 and C2 set out above. It is less clear that C3 applies to it, since Wakefield's allowing considerations of value to enter in helps the model to better match our intuitions and existing practice.

A different mixed model comes from Culver and Gert (1982, p. 81). This too has been influential. On this view, “a person has a malady if and only if he has a condition, other than his rational beliefs and desires, such that he is suffering, or at increased risk of suffering, an evil (death, pain, disability, loss of freedom or opportunity, or loss of pleasure) in the absence of a distinct sustaining cause.”

This model includes a role for objective fact both in the chance of death, pain, etc., and also in determining whether a condition is caused by a distinct sustaining cause. For example, it would seem that being homosexual can often cause a person to be unhappy, but in at least many and probably most instances, the reason for this is societal prejudice against homosexuals. The model does insist that values also enter into the determination of what counts as a malady, most obviously in the decision of which beliefs and desires are rational and which irrational.

The approach of Culver and Gert does not rely on evolutionary psychology, and so avoids the concerns set out in (C1) and (C2) above. Some may be concerned, though, that their definition of malady suffers from a problem of circularity. For example, recent debates over the use of and insurance coverage for medication for erectile dysfunction have vividly illustrated the question for physical disorders; if a man has a condition that means that he is only able to have sex twice a week without taking medication, does that mean he has a disability? It is hard to see how one could provide an answer to this question without making assumptions about what is normal. Also, in recent years, some advocates for the deaf have argued that deafness is not a disability, but is rather simply a difference from people who can hear; this too suggests that values can enter into our understanding of what counts as disability. For an example in mental health, we can consider a case where a person who in her teen years experienced productive and pleasurable hypomanic episodes: if by her twenties she no longer has such episodes, has she undergone a change that should count as a disability or loss of opportunity?

Multiple Personality

One condition that has gained particularly strong philosophical scrutiny is multiple personality. Philosophers have been particularly interested in this phenomenon because it raises important issues for understanding the unity of consciousness, as well as provocative questions about personal identity, and whether traditional assumptions that there can no more than one person “in” one body are appropriate. In order to discuss these aspects of the phenomenon, philosophers have had to first address what the phenomenon really is. In particular, various skeptics have argued that there is no such thing as multiple personality, or that it is in some way artificial or inauthentic.

In multiple personality, (more recently given the label of dissociative identity disorder) a person presents as having the appearance of at least two distinct personalities within one person. These personalities, or “alters,” apparently have profoundly different voices, speech patterns, self-descriptions, memories, character traits, beliefs, desires, and levels of education. Different alters within one body can describe themselves as being of different ages, genders, ethnicities, skin color, height, weight, and eye color. Different alters within one body can fail to be aware of each other, but there can be interaction between them. Sometimes awareness is one-directional: A is aware of the thoughts and actions of B without B being aware of A. Sometimes one alter can appear to directly interfere with the thoughts or actions of another alter. The number of people diagnosed with multiple personality has varied greatly over time and place: it was first described in the nineteenth century, especially in France and the USA; diagnoses radically diminished in the first half of the twentieth century, and grew again in the second half, especially in the USA.

There has been a great deal of empirical and methodological debate about the causes and the treatment of multiple personality. Many support the hypothesis that it is linked with childhood abuse, and that dissociating may be a way of coping with a traumatic experience while it is happening or after it is over. Skeptical claims about multiple personality disorder come in different strengths, although they are often mixed together. The most skeptical view is that multiple personality does not exist at all, and is a hoax by patients and therapists seeking attention, money, or to use it as an excuse for criminal behavior A more moderate claim is that multiple personality is not really a separate phenomenon, but rather an unusual form of more familiar mental disorders such as manic depression, schizophrenia, or borderline personality disorder. This raises a taxonomic issue of when a condition should be classified as an atypical form of a known mental disorder rather than as an instance of a separate, independent mental disorder.) Milder still is the view that multiple personality, while a separate disorder, is caused not by traumatic childhood experiences but is iatrogenic, caused by overenthusiastic and irresponsible therapists who, encouraging their patients to believe that they have been abused as children, and often hypnotizing them, end up encouraging forms of psychic dissociation. (Piper, 1996; Spanos, 1998) These empirical debates are on-going, and considerable controversy still surrounds the diagnosis of Dissociative Identity Disorder, yet it remains as a category in the American Psychiatric Association's DSM-IV-TR .

The most sophisticated philosophical work on the reality of multiple personality has been by Ian Hacking, in a series of papers and books since the mid 1980s. Hacking combines careful historical research, an understanding of statistical methods and scientific research, and a grasp of philosophical debates about realism, truth, and nominalism. Hacking is sympathetic with mild skepticism regarding multiple personality and also to some of the insights of social constructionism – to the idea, that is, that the classification of multiple personality reflects a social rather than a natural kind. But he goes beyond most simple forms of social constructionism, and introduces the idea that the people classified by social categories will themselves be affected by the classification. So the issue is more than simply a matter of discussing what concepts we use in framing psychopathology:

People of these kinds can become aware that they are classified as such. They can make tacit or even explicit choices, adapt or adopt ways of living so as to fit or get away from the classification applied to them. These very choices, adaptations, or adoptions have consequences for the group, for the kind of people that is invoked. The result may be particularly strong interactions. What was known about people of a kind may become false because people of that kind have changed in virtue of what they believe about themselves. I have called this phenomenon the looping effects of human kinds. (Hacking, 1999, p. 34)

Hacking has suggested that once we understand these interactions between our categories and the people categorized, we should stop wanting a simple yes or no answer to the question “is multiple personality real?” He argues that there has been a great deal of confusion in debate between the sides often labeled as constructionists and realists, not just about multiple personality, but a whole range of phenomena and categories, including subatomic particles, childhood, emotions, and women refugees. He argues that a central assumption for anyone who argues that X is socially constructed is

[0] In the present state of affairs, X is taken for granted; X appears to be inevitable.

Those who argue for some forms of social construction of X argue that it is not in fact inevitable, and could be different. Some are content to be purely descriptive about this, while others, taking a stronger position against X, argue that we should construct our categories differently and do away with X, or at least view the category of X with some suspicion and recognize its contingency.

Even though Hacking finds the language of “social construction” mostly unhelpful, he views dissociation and multiple personality with some suspicion. He calls it an example of an interactive kind, created by looping effects, and he explicitly hopes that the category dies away (Hacking 1998, p. 100). He further argues that it is problematic to use cases of multiple personality and dissociation to draw conclusions about the fundamental nature of the mind or personal identity. “Multiple personality teaches nothing about ‘the self’ except that it is an idea that can be exploited for many ends.” (Ibid, p. 96).

Hacking has provided us with the most detailed and careful philosophical approach to addressing issues in classification of mental disorder, and his work has been very influential.

4. When are People with Mental Illnesses Responsible for Symptomatic Behavior?

Issues of mental illness intersect with important questions about responsibility. While some philosophical positions contend that people are never responsible for their behavior (e.g. Strawson, 1994), this is an extreme position. In contrast, substantive questions about when people with significant mental illnesses are fully responsible for those actions symptomatic of their illnesses are very much up for debate. Three mental illnesses have received especially intense attention from philosophers and psychiatric theorists on the issue of responsibility: schizophrenia, psychopathy, and alcoholism. (There are of course many other mental illnesses where the issue of responsibility arises: obvious examples are depression, obsessive-compulsive disorder, manic episodes, paraphilias, and borderline personality disorder. Despite the fact that the various theories of the etiology and nature of these disorders are very suggestive of ways to understand the responsibility of those with the disorders for their symptomatic behavior, these and other mental disorders have received surprisingly little discussion from philosophers vis-à-vis responsibility for action. One exception is Arpaly, 2005))

Schizophrenia

One of the central symptoms of schizophrenia is delusion. When people with schizophrenia are suffering extreme and pervasive delusions, they do not understand what they are doing. It is no simple matter to define a delusion, and it is highly problematic to simply equate it with a false belief, but it is safe to say that paradigm cases of delusion imply a significant lack of, or distortion in, understanding of one's situation. In paranoid schizophrenia, for example, patients tend to interpret what other people say with what might be called a hermeneutics of fear and suspicion, and in extreme cases, will have elaborate and fixed fantastic theories about ways in which others are aiming to harm them.

While schizophrenia causes other distortions as well, including great emotional problems that contribute to the bizarre behavior of people with the disorder, it is the distortions in belief and reasoning that provide the clearest excuse and make it plausible that often they are not responsible for their behavior. It is this sort of case that is central to the insanity defense in the law, and which has received considerable discussion by philosophers and psychiatrists interested in the justification of punishment. (Morris, 1984, Gerber 1975). There are many different kinds of cases in which mentally ill people seem to have some grasp of what they are doing, and that what they are doing is wrong, and it is very difficult to draw clear lines between somewhat similar cases.

Psychopathy

The category of psychopathy is one of the more controversial within psychiatry. The closest that the diagnostic manual DSM-IV-TR comes to this diagnosis is antisocial personality disorder, and the whole category of personality disorder has come under critical scrutiny. Antisocial personality disorder, and the corresponding diagnoses for youth (behavioral disorders and oppositional defiant disorder), have been especially questioned because they include as symptoms destructive and often criminal behavior. There is a great deal of suspicion of any attempt to excuse the symptomatic behavior of psychopaths. (Black, 1999). The philosophical literature on the moral responsibility of psychopaths is extensive; it was started by Murphy, (1972)

Some of the debate hangs on the correct explanation of the behavior of psychopaths. Psychopaths are often intelligent and calculating, yet they are also impulsive and pay as little regard for their own long-term interests as they do for that of other people. They can be very emotional, yet they also seem to lack some emotional capacities. In particular, it is still an open question to what extent they comprehend the wrongness of their actions, and can be said to have a conscience. If their moral understanding is extremely limited—for example an ability to list the kinds of actions that would be classed as morally wrong, but no ability to empathize with those who suffer—then there is still philosophical work to be done in deciding what this implies for moral responsibility, punishment or treatment. Another characterization of psychopaths is that they are simply people with deeply flawed characters and no use for morality. This characterization is probably closer to media portrayals of psychopaths than clinical reality, but it still raises philosophical issues. In particular, we can ask, if a person has a bad character, and lacks any interest in or feeling for the welfare of others, then he may not be able to behave well. How can we blame someone for doing what is in his nature? This is an issue for moral theory generally, and arises especially for virtue theory. It is of particular practical consequence when it comes to judging psychopaths, if this account of their behavior matches any real psychopaths.

Alcoholism

There has been a great deal of discussion of whether alcoholism should count as a disease, by physicians, philosophers, legal theorists and policy makers. (Jellinek, 1960; Fingarette, 1988; Leshner, 1997; Schaler, 1999; Heyman, 2009). It is generally assumed that if alcoholism is a disease, then alcoholics are less morally responsible for their actions directly connected with their drinking, and if it is not a disease, then they are morally responsible. However, as is clear from the case of psychopathy, having a mental disorder does not automatically imply that the person is not morally responsible for the associated behavior. Thus further argument on moral responsibility is required.

Often one finds claims in popular discourse to the effect that alcoholics are not responsible for their drinking because the drinking is a symptom of a disease, or because it is the disease that causes them to drink. (See for example the material accompanying the HBO series Addiction, which emphasizes that addiction is not a moral failure and that drugs and alcohol “hijack” the brain's reward system and pleasure pathways. Hoffman [2007].) If this is the case, there must be independent evidence that alcoholism is a disease: various sorts of evidence have been suggested, including the withdrawal symptoms that alcoholics experience when they abstain from drinking, physical changes that occur in the brain as a result of excessive long-term drinking, and epidemiological studies that show that there is a genetic component to alcoholism.

These sorts of evidence can't by themselves prove that alcoholism is a disease, however. How one proves that a condition is a disease depends partly on what criteria of disease we can agree upon, but even without giving a definition of disease, one can see that the claim that the empirical evidence entails that alcoholism is a disease is highly contestable. The existence of withdrawal symptoms does show that it is difficult to stop drinking, but there is a great logical distance between having a habit that is hard to give up and having a disease. The fact that brain abnormalities occur in excessive drinkers is suggestive of a physical disorder, but abnormalities in themselves do not constitute diseases or disorders. The fact that heavy drinking causes changes in people's brains is not in itself surprising. Further evidence about what the effect of the brain abnormality has on the person would be needed, and its correlation with heavy drinking is not enough. Finally, the fact that a habit such as heavy drinking has a genetic component again does not prove that it is a disease. Laziness and cowardice could also turn out to have genetic components, but that would not make them diseases.

The problem for the disease status of alcoholism is that a habitual drinker can be described with such strongly evaluative terms as weak, self-deceiving, selfish, self-destructive, shortsighted, uncaring about other people, and even pathetic. Some would claim that such psychological characteristics provide the best explanation of an alcoholic's problem drinking, and if this is right, then the alcoholism-as-disease explanation is at best secondary, and at worst, utterly wrong-headed. While it is hard to find a description of self-destructive heavy drinking that makes it simply a matter of personal decision, an expression of one's values, or a rational choice, it does seems that problem drinking can often be a self-perpetuating way of life. It is difficult or impossible to locate a specific single cause of the drinking, and it also seems that the drinker has a role in perpetuating her problem. It is not simply something that happens to her.

Nevertheless, the testimonials and behavior of alcoholics also provide grounds for thinking that they have extreme difficulty in giving up drink, and often no simple exertion of willpower or resolution to give up will solve the problem. Often heavy drinkers try to stop or cut back but fail to do so, even when they know full well that terrible consequences will result from their continuing to drink, and when drinking does not provide pleasure or lasting benefit.

This sort of argument suggests that the issue of personal responsibility may be logically prior to determining whether alcoholism is a disease: alcoholism would be a disease because alcoholics cannot control their drinking.

Given that self-control is likely a matter of degree, this raises questions about whether a threshold of lack of control must be realized in order for a condition to count as a disease, or whether the status of some diseases, such as alcoholism, is not all-or-nothing. Public policies tend not to recognize part or semi-diseases, and may hence have to look to extra-scientific or psychological considerations, such as the social and economic effects of labeling alcoholism a disease, to tip the classificatory scales one way or the other. This may provide a justification of current practice where alcoholism counts as a disease for some purposes but not others. For example, under US law, alcoholism is not a disability covered by the Americans with Disabilities Act, and so is not a condition employers must make allowances for. But treatment of alcoholism by federal health care organizations (such as the Veterans Administration) is mandated by law.

Philosophers have started to discuss the irrationality of alcoholics, how to explain their symptomatic behavior, and to what extent they are responsible for their behavior. Notable examples are and Elster (1999a), Mele (1996),Wallace (1999) Watson (1999a & 1999b),. There is a great deal of empirical research on the subject and many psychological models aiming to explain alcoholism; philosophers may find, as they have found with much work on emotion and social psychology, that the literature contains questionable assumptions about fundamental psychological concepts. Central to the philosophical discussion is the examination of the possibility of irresistible desires and the way that cravings can reduce an addict's self-control. Indeed, addiction can provide an important test case for any theory of the nature of action, since it is a prime example of irrationality, and it is important that theories about the nature of practical reasoning be able to give an adequate account of the nature of irrationality.

There is some overlap between this topic and that of the responsibility of weak willed agents, although so far there has been little systematic discussion by philosophers of the relation between addiction and weak willed action.

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Further Reading

  • Bolton, D., 2008, What is Mental Disorder? An Essay in Philosophy, Science, and Values, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Braude, S., 1991, First Person Plural: Multiple Personality and the Philosophy of Mind, New York: Routledge.
  • Brendel, D. H., 2003, “Reductionism, Eclecticism, and Pragmatism in Psychiatry: The Dialectic of Clinical Explanation.” The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy 28(5–6): 563–580.
  • Clark, L. A., (ed.), 1999, “Special Section: The Concept of Disorder: Evolutionary Analysis and Critique”; Journal of Abnormal Psychology, 108(3): 371–472,
  • Ciocchetti, C., 2003, “The Responsibility of the Psychopathic Offender” Philosophy, Psychiatry, & Psychology, 10:175–184 .
  • Cooper, R., 2004, “Why Hacking is Wrong about Human Kinds.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 55: 73–85
  • –––, 2008, Psychiatry and Philosophy of Science, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
  • Elliott, C., 1996, The Rules of Insanity: Moral Responsibility and the Mentally Ill Offender, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Graham, G., and G. L. Stephens, (eds.), 1994, Philosophical Psychopathology, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Hacking, I., 2007, “Kinds of People: Moving Targets.” Proceedings of the British Academy 151:285–318.
  • Haslam, N., 2002, “Kinds of Kinds: A Conceptual Taxonomy of Psychiatric Categories.” Philosophy, Psychiatry, & Psychology, 9: 203–218.
  • Horwitz, A.V., 2001, Creating Mental Illness, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Humber, J. M. and R. F. Almeder, (eds.), 1997, What is Disease? Totowa, NJ: Humana Press, 1997.
  • Kendler, K. and J. Parnas, (eds.), 2008, Philosophical Issues in Psychiatry: Explanation, Phenomenology, and Nosology, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Kennett, J., 2007, “Mental Disorder, Moral Agency, and the Self” in Oxford Handbook of Bioethics, edited by B. Steinbock, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lennox, J. G., 1995, “Health as an objective value.” The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 20: 499–511.
  • Martin, N., 2001, “Feminist Bioethics and Psychiatry.” The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 26:431–441.
  • Matthews, S. and J. Kennett, (eds), 2004, Special Issue on “Responsibility and Mental Impairment.” International Journal of Law and Psychiatry, 27: 395–503.
  • Pickering, N., 2003, “The Likeness Argument and the Reality of Mental Illness.” Philosophy, Psychiatry, & Psychology, 10: 243–254,
  • Radden, J., 1996, Divided Minds and Successive Selves: Ethical Issues in Disorders of Identity and Personality, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • ––– (editor), 2004, The Philosophy of Psychiatry: A Companion, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2008, Moody Minds Distempered: Essays on Melancholy and Depression, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Reznek, L., 1987, The Nature of Disease, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Sadler, John Z., (ed.), 2002, Descriptions and Prescriptions: Values, Mental Disorders, and the DSMs, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press,
  • Sadler, J. Z, and K. W. M, Fulford, (eds.), 2000, “Special Issue: Aristotle, Function, and Mental Disorder.” Philosophy, Psychiatry, & Psychology.7(1).
  • Sadler, J. Z., O. P. Wiggins, and M. A. Schwartz, (eds.), 1994, Philosophical Perspectives on Psychiatric Classification, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Wilkinson, S., 2000, “Is ‘Normal Grief’ a Mental Disorder?”, Philosophical Quarterly 50: 289–304.
  • Zachar, P., 2000, Psychological Concepts and Biological Psychiatry: A Philosophical Analysis, Amsterdam: John Benjamins.

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