# Measurement in Quantum Theory

*First published Tue Oct 12, 1999; substantive revision Wed Aug 22, 2007*

From the inception of Quantum Mechanics (QM) the concept of measurement proved a source of difficulties that found concrete expression in the Einstein-Bohr debates, out of which both the Einstein Podolsky Rosen paradox and Schrödinger's cat paradox developed. In brief, the difficulties stemmed from an apparent conflict between several principles of the quantum theory of measurement. In particular, the linear dynamics of quantum mechanics seemed to conflict with the postulate that during measurement a non-linear collapse of the wave packet occurred. David Albert puts the problem nicely when he says:

The dynamics and the postulate of collapse are flatly in contradiction with one another ... the postulate of collapse seems to be right about what happens when we make measurements, and the dynamics seems to be bizarrelywrongabout what happens when we make measurements, and yet the dynamics seems to berightabout what happens whenever wearen'tmaking measurements. (Albert 1992, 79)

This has come to be known as “the measurement problem.” In what follows, we study the details and examine some of the implications of this problem.

The measurement problem is not just an interpretational difficulty internal to QM. It raises broader issues as well, such as the philosophical debate between, on the one hand, a Lockean “realist” account according to which perception involves the creation of an “inner reflection” of an independently existing external reality, and, on the other hand, a Kantean “anti-realist” concept of the “veil of perception.” In this article, I trace the history of these debates in relation to Quantum Mechanics, and indicate some of the interpretative strategies that they have stimulated.

- 1. The Birth of the Measurement Problem
- 2. The End of Copenhagen Monocracy
- 3. Cats in Singlets
- 4. The World of Many Interpretations
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Birth of the Measurement Problem

The measurement problem in QM (Quantum Mechanics) grew out of early debates over Niels Bohr's “Copenhagen interpretation”. Bohr maintained that the physical properties of quantum systems depend in a fundamental way upon experimental conditions, including conditions of measurement. This doctrine appeared explicitly in Bohr's 1935 reply to Einstein, Podolsky, and Rosen: “The procedure of measurement has an essential influence on the conditions on which the very definition of the physical quantities in question rests” (Bohr 1935, 1025; see too Bohr 1929). To be specific, Bohr endorsed the following principle:

(P) If a quantityQis measured in systemSat timetthenQhas a particular value inSatt.^{[1]}

But, instead of taking the dependence of properties upon experimental conditions to be causal in nature, he proposed an analogy with the dependence of relations of simultaneity upon frames of reference postulated by special relativity theory: “The theory of relativity reminds us of the subjective [observer dependent] character of all physical phenomena, a character which depends essentially upon the state of motion of the observer” (Bohr 1929, 73). In general terms, then, Bohr proposed that, like temporal relations in special relativity, properties in QM exhibit a hidden relationalism — “hidden”, that is, from a classical, Newtonian point of view. Paul Feyerabend gave a clear exposition of this Bohrian position in his “Problems of Microphysics” essay (Feyerabend, 1962). It can also be found in earlier commentaries upon Bohr by Vladimir Fock and Philip Frank (Jammer 1974, section 6.5).

Many of Bohr's colleagues, including his young *protege*
Werner Heisenberg, misunderstood or rejected the relationalist
metaphysics that underpinned Bohr's endorsement of (P). Instead, they
favored the positivistic, anti-metaphysical approach expressed in
Heisenberg's influential book, *The Physical Principles of the
Quantum Theory* (Heisenberg 1930): “It seems necessary to demand
that no concept enter a theory which has not been experimentally
verified at least to the same degree of accuracy as the experiments to
be explained by the theory.”
(1).^{[2]}
On this view, (P) may be
strengthened to the principle (P)′:

(P)′ It is meaningless to assign Q a valueqforSattunlessQis measured to have valueqforSatt.

Heisenberg's approach, as presented in *The Physical Principles
of the Quantum Theory*, quickly became a popular way of reading (or
misreading, as Bohr would claim) the philosophically more forbidding
complexities of the Copenhagen interpretation. As Max Jammer points
out: “It would be difficult to find a textbook of the period
[1930-1950] which denied that the numerical value of a physical
quantity has no meaning whatsoever until an observation has been
performed” (Jammer 1974, 246).

Bohr disagreed with Heisenberg's positivistic gloss of the
Copenhagen interpretation, which, Bohr objected, illegitimately reduced
questions of “definability to measurability” (Jammer 1974, 69). The
disagreement was no casual matter. Heisenberg reports a discussion that
arose while preparing his 1927 *Zeitschrift für Physik*
paper in the following terms: “I remember that it ended with my
breaking out in tears because I just couldn't stand this pressure from
Bohr” (Jammer 1974, 65). Nevertheless, the two men agreed in broad
terms that ways of describing quantum systems depended upon
experimental conditions. This agreement was sufficient to create at
least the appearance of a unified Copenhagen
position.^{[3]}

The assumptions that framed the Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation were, in turn, rejected by Albert Einstein (Jammer 1974, chap.5; see too Bohr 1949). Einstein's disagreement with the Copenhagen school came to a head in the famous exchange with Bohr at the fifth Solvay conference (1927) and in the no less famous Einstein, Podolsky, Rosen paper of 1935. Arguing from a “realist” position, Einstein contended that under ideal conditions observations (and measurements more generally) function like “mirrors” (or, as Crary argues, camera obscura) reflecting an independently existing, external reality (Crary 1995, 48). In particular, in the Einstein, Podolsky, Rosen paper, we find the following criterion for the existence of physical reality: “If without in any way disturbing a system we can predict with certainty...the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to this physical quantity” (Einstein et al 1935, 778). This criterion characterizes physical reality in terms of “objectivity” understood as independence from any direct measurement. By implication, then, when a direct measurement of physical reality occurs it merely passively reflects rather than actively constituting that which is observed.

Einstein's position has roots in empiricist, and specifically Lockean notions of perception, which oppose the Kantian metaphor of the “veil of perception” that pictures the apparatus of observation as like a pair of spectacles through which a highly mediated sight of the world can be glimpsed. To be specific, according to Kant, rather than simply reflecting an independently existing reality, “appearances” are constituted through the act of perception in a way that conforms them to the fundamental categories of sensible intuition. As Kant makes the point in the Transcendental Aesthetic: “Not only are the drops of rain mere appearances, but...even their round shape, and even the space in which they fall, are nothing in themselves, but merely modifications of fundamental forms of our sensible intuition, and...the transcendental object remains unknown to us” (Kant 1973, 85).

By contrast, the realism that I am associating with Einstein takes
the point of view that, insofar as they are real, when we observe
objects under ideal conditions we are seeing things “in themselves”,
that is, as they exist independently of being perceived. In other
words, not only do the objects exist independently of our observations
but also, in observing them, what we see reflects how they really are.
In William Blake's succinct formulation, “As the eye [sees], such the
object [is]” (Crary 1995, 70). According to this realist point of view,
ideal observations not only reflect the way things are during but also
immediately before and after
observation.^{[4]}

Such realism was opposed by both Bohr and
Heisenberg.^{[5]}
Bohr took a
position that, by taking acts of observation and measurement more
generally as constitutive of phenomena, aligned him more closely with a
Kantian point of view. To be specific, Bohr took it that “measurement
has an essential [by which I take him to mean constitutive] influence
on the conditions on which the very definition of the physical
quantities in question rests” (Bohr 1935, 1025).

As Henry Folse points out, however, it is misleading to take the
parallel between Bohr and Kant too far (Folse 1985, 49 and 217-221).
For example, Bohr disagreed with the Kantian position that “space and
time as well as cause and effect had to be taken as *a priori*
categories for the comprehension of all knowledge” (Folse 1985, 218), a
disagreement that reflected a deeper division between Bohr and Kant. To
be specific, whereas for Kant “concepts played their role prior to
experience and give form to what is experienced” (Folse, 220), for Bohr
it was the other way around: objective reality, in particular
conditions of observation, determine the applicability of concepts.
Thus, although for Bohr no less than for Kant, observation took on a
role in determining the forms that structure the world of visible
objects, the two men conceived the way in which that role is discharged
quite differently. For Kant subjective experience was structured in
terms of certain prior forms, whereas Bohr argued for a hidden
relationalism in the domain of appearances, and in particular contended
that the properties in terms of which a system is described are
relative to the conditions of measurement.

This difference between Bohr and Kant may be seen as an aspect,
indeed radicalization, of a more general shift in nineteenth century
conceptions of vision, exemplified in Johannes Müller's
compendious summary of current physiology, *Handbuch der Physiologie
des Menschen* (1833). Müller (a mentor of the influential
physicist Hermann von Helmholtz) may be seen as physiologizing the
Kantian conception of observation. As Jonathon Crary makes the
point:

His [Müller's] work, in spite of his praise of Kant, implies something quite different. Far from being apodictic or universal in nature, like the ‘spectacles’ of time and space, our physiological apparatus is again and again shown to be defective, inconsistent, prey to illusion, and, in a crucial manner, susceptible to external procedures of manipulation and stimulation that have the essential capacityto produce experience for the subject. (Crary 1995, 92)

Crary implies here that during the nineteenth century observation, and specifically vision, were both reconceptualized not as a Kantian universal faculty but rather as physiological processes. In particular, it was assumed that observable phenomena and the terms in which we reported them were conditioned, not by universal forms of sensible intuition, but rather by the sorts of external physical factors that affected bodily and specifically physiological processes more generally.

Bohr extended this position by proposing that the “external
procedures” that affect the forms of sensible intuition include the
processes of observation themselves. Thus Bohr stood at the end of a
long historical trajectory: Kant conceived the apparatus of observation
as an inner mental faculty, analogous to a pair of spectacles that
mediated and in particular gave form to and interpreted raw sense
impressions. Neo-Kanteans projected the interpretative aspect of vision
outwards, reconceiving it as a bodily, and specifically physiological
process (Müller, Helmholtz, and Johann Friedrich Herbart, Kant's
successor at Königsberg). Bohr took this further by including
observation as one among many “external procedures” that affect not
merely what we see but also the terms in which we describe
it.^{[6]}

Heisenberg too, like Bohr, opposed Einstein's “realism”. But whereas
Bohr's opposition was rooted in a neo-Kantian relationalism that
reversed Kant by externalizing the inner mental faculties, Heisenberg
opposed Einstein from a more straightforwardly positivistic standpoint
that disagreed not only with Einstein but also with
Bohr.^{[7]}

To be specific, Heisenberg took as meaningless the sorts of metaphysical speculations about the “true nature of reality” that preoccupied both Einstein and Bohr, speculations that, according to Heisenberg, betrayed their metaphysical nature by divorcing questions of truth from more concrete issues of what is observed:

It is possible to ask whether there is still concealed behind the statistical universe of perception a ‘true’ universe in which the law of causality would be valid. But such speculation seems to us to be without value and meaningless, for physics must confine itself to the description of the relationship between perceptions. (Heisenberg 1927, 197)

## 2. The End of Copenhagen Monocracy

By embedding QM within the formal theory of Hilbert spaces, John von
Neumann, a brilliant pure mathematician, provided the first rigorous
axiomatic treatment of QM (von Neumann 1955 — the original German
edition of this book appeared in 1932). Unlike Bohr and Einstein, he
took seriously QM's formalism, not only providing the theory with
rigorous mathematical foundations but also allowing a new conceptual
architectonic to emerge from within the theory itself rather than
following Heisenberg, Bohr, and Einstein who imposed a system of
concepts *a priori*.

Von Neumann also intervened decisively into the measurement problem.
Summarizing earlier work, he argued that a measurement on a quantum
system involves two distinct processes that may be thought of as
temporally contiguous stages
(417-418).^{[8]}
In the first stage, the
measured quantum system *S* interacts with *M*, a macroscopic measuring
apparatus for some physical quantity *Q*. This interaction is governed by
the linear, deterministic Schrödinger equation, and is represented
in the following terms. Suppose that at time *t*, when the
measurement begins, *S*, the measured system, is in a state represented
by a Hilbert space vector *f* that, like any vector in the
Hilbert space *H*(*S*) of possible state vectors for *S*, is decomposable
into a linear superposition of the form
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}, for some
set {*c*_{i}} of complex numbers, where
*f*_{i}, the so-called eigenvector of *Q* corresponding to
possible value *q*_{i}, is that state of *S* at *t*
for which, when *S* is in that state, there is unit probability that *Q*
has value
*q*_{i}.^{[9]}
*M*, the measuring
apparatus, is taken to be in a “ready” state *g* at time
*t* when the measurement begins, where *g* is a vector in
the Hilbert space *H*(*M*) of possible states for *M*. According to the laws
of QM, this entails that *S*+*M* at *t* is in the “tensor product”
state
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*, , which belongs to the Hilbert space *H*(*S*+*M*), which is the
direct product of the Hilbert spaces *H*(*S*) and *H*(*M*).

If we assume that the measurement process conserves *Q*, and the
representation of *Q* is non-degenerate in *H*(*M*) then the Schrödinger
equation entails that at time *t*′, when the first stage
of the measurement terminates, the state of *S*+*M* is
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i}, where, it is assumed, *g*_{i} is
a state of *M* for which there is probability 1 that *M* registers the
value
*q*_{i}.^{[10]}
Such states, represented by a linear
combination of products of the form *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i}, have been dubbed “entangled
states”.^{[11]}.

Von Neumann assumes that after the first stage of the measurement
process, a second non-linear, indeterministic process takes place, the
“reduction (or collapse) of the wave packet”, that involves *S*+*M*
“jumping” (the famous “quantum leap”) from the entangled state
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i} into the state *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i} for some *i*. This, in turn (according to the laws
of QM) means that *S* is in state *f*_{i} and *M* is in the
state *g*_{i}, where *g*_{i} is the state
in which *M* registers the value *q*_{i}. Let
*t*″ denote the time when this second and final stage of
the measurement is
finished.^{[12]}
It follows that at *t*″, when
the measurement as a whole terminates, *M* registers the value
*q*_{i}. Since the von Neumann reduction of the
wave-packet is indeterministic, there is no possibility of predicting
which value *M* will register at *t*″. QM gives us
additional *statistical* information, however, via the so called
Born statistical interpretation:

The probability ofq_{i}being registered is |c_{i}|^{2}, wherec_{i}is the coefficient off_{i}(the eigenvector ofQcorresponding to valueq_{i}) when the initial measured state ofSis expressed as a linear superposition of eigenvectors ofQ.

In short, QM does not predict what the measured value will be, but does at least tells us the probability distribution over various possible measured values.

From its introduction within measurement theory, the second stage of
the measurement, with its radical, non-linear discontinuities, has been
the source of many of the philosophical difficulties that have plagued
QM, including what von Neumann referred to as its “peculiar dual
nature” (417). Indeed, Schrödinger foreshadowed such difficulties
even before the formal devlopment of measurement theory. For example,
he was moved to say during a visit to Bohr's institute during September
1926: “If all this damned quantum jumping [*verdamnte
Quantenspringerei*] were really to stay, I should be sorry I ever
got involved with quantum theory” (Jammer 1974, 57).

The classical von Neumann model of the measurement process that I have
presented here must be modified, however, if it is to reflect
accurately real world measurements. In particular, since the measuring
apparatus is a macroscopic system, it ought to be described at any
time by a statistical mixture of many possible microstates, all
compatible with its macrostate. And indeed, if one does this then one
might hope to explain the different results in different runs of a
measurement by differences in the (uncontrollable) microstate of the
apparatus, using only the linear dynamics and without introducing a
special discontinuous second stage of the measurement. But, as von
Neumann remarks at the beginning of his discussion of measurement in
quantum mechanics (von Neumann, 1955, section VI.3), it is impossible
to obtain in this way the correct distribution of results for all
intial states, unless the statistical mixtuure describing the
apparatus before the measurement already depends upon the incoming
state of the system to be measured. The most general proof of this
result, which goes by the name of the “insolubility theorem” for
quantum measurement, has been given recently by Bassi and Ghirardi
(2000). They prove that by sticking to the Schrödinger linear
dynamics we are stuck also with the result that at the end of the
measurement process, there must be “superpositions of macroscopically
distinct states of the apparatus, and in general of a macro-system”
(Bassi and Ghirardi, 2000, 380). And this result, they point out, is
contrary to experience, since, at the end of the measurement process,
although we may be uncertain of the position of the pointer, the
pointer itself is never in an indeterminate superposition of different
positions. Thus, it seems, von Neumann is right that the orthodox
linear dynamics of quantum mechanics must be surrendered in the
context of the measurement process (Bassi and Ghirardi, 2000, 380; see
also the discussion in the entry on Collapse Theories). Another
problem with von Neumann's formulation of the measurement process is
more technical. It is traditional to assume that the various
*g*_{i} are mutually orthogonal eigenvectors of a
macroscopic physical quantity — call it *X* — which
corresponds to the location of the tip of a pointer on some scale. In
particular it is assumed that *M* being in state *g*_{i}
means that there is unit probability of the pointer falling in the
*i*-th division of the scale. There are formidable difficulties
for this model, however. For example, Araki and Yanase (1960) have
shown that under very general conditions, even the relatively
uncontroversial linear first stage of the measurement interaction is
simply not possible. By slightly weakening the assumption of
orthogonality, and instead assuming that the various
*g*_{i} are only approximately orthogonal, we can avoid
this difficulty, however. And indeed, as Bassi and Ghirardi (2000)
point out, “everyone” agrees with the need for some such
modification.

A third difficulty arises for the von Neumann model. Suppose that at the end of the measurement process the pointer is localized in the sense that there is zero probability of finding it outside of a finite region of space (such as the nth division of a scale) — that is, in technical terms, its state enjoys “compact spatial support.” But also suppose that at this point of time the dynamics of the measuring apparatus reverts to the orthodox linear Schrödinger form. Then, as Ghirardi points out in the entry on collapse theories, the state of the measuring apparatus “will instantaneously spread acquiring a tail that extends over the whole of space” (p. 14), a result that is in tension with Shimony's requirement that “one should not tolerate tails in wave functions which are so broad that their different parts can be discriminated by the senses, even if very low probability amplitude is assigned to them” (Shimony 1990, cited by Ghirardi, p. 13). Ghirardi takes this difficulty as reason for adopting the drastic step of surrendering not only the orthodox linear dynamics of Quantum Mechanics but also the standard Hilbert space representation of states.

## 3. Cats in Singlets

Von Neumann's work sets the scene for the various paradoxes that have
haunted QM. One of these is the famous Schrödinger cat paradox
(Schrödinger 1935b). This paradox dramatizes the fact that,
according to von Neumann, the observer's intervention at the end of the
first stage of the measurement process precipitates *S*+*M* from an
entangled state for which the value that *M* registers is “indeterminate”
to a state in which *M* registers precisely one such value. In the case
of the cat paradox, matters are so arranged that a cat being dead or
alive corresponds to the differing states of *M*. Thus, it seems, the act
of observing the cat precipitates it from a strange zombie-like state
in which it is indeterminate whether it is dead or alive to a state in
which it is merely uncertain whether it is dead or alive. “Looks can
kill”, as we might say.

The measurement problem was exacerbated by another argument that
arose in the context of the Einstein-Bohr debate, namely what has come
to be called the EPR (Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen) paradox (Einstein,
Podolsky, Rosen 1935). It should be stressed that in their original
article EPR presented their argument as a proof of the incompleteness
rather than inconsistency of QM. Nevertheless, in the subsequent
literature their argument quickly took on the role of a paradox, one
that is most perspicuously presented in terms of the formalism
developed by Bohm and Aharonov (Bohm and Aharonov 1957). Consider a
pair of electrons *S*_{1}, *S*_{2} at time *t* when
they are in a so-called singlet state, represented by the vector

{(f_{x-}⊗g_{x-}) + (f_{x-}⊗g_{x+})}/√2,

where *f*_{x+} and
*f*_{x-} represent the two possible eigenstates
of the *x*-directed spin of *S*_{1} corresponding to the
two possible spin values +1/2 and −1/2 respectively;
*g*_{x-} and *g*_{x+}
represent the corresponding eigenstates for *S*_{2}. From the
Born statistical interpretation it is easy to deduce that when
*S*_{1}+*S*_{2} is in the singlet state, the
*x*-spin values of *S*_{1} and *S*_{2} are
anticorrelated, that is, the conditional probability of measuring the
*x*-spin of *S*_{1} to have value +1/2 given that the
*x*-spin of *S*_{2} is measured to have value −1/2 is 1,
and vice versa. It is also a theorem of QM that the linear
decomposition of the singlet state vector is invariant under rotation
and in particular invariant under interchange of *x* and
*y*:

(f_{x+}⊗g_{x-}) − (f_{x-}⊗g_{x+}) = (f_{y+}⊗g_{y-}) − (f_{y-}⊗g_{y+})

Now suppose that *S*_{1} and *S*_{2} have been allowed to
drift out of each other's immediate spheres of influence, so that a
disturbance of *S*_{1} has no immediate effect upon
*S*_{2}. Suppose too that we measure the *x*-spin of
*S*_{1} just before *t*, and that the value revealed by
measurement is +1/2. In that case, the anti-correlation between the
*x*-spin values for *S*_{1} and *S*_{2} makes it
possible to predict with certainty that, in the event that the
*x*-spin of *S*_{2} is measured just before *t*,
the value revealed by measurement is −1/2. The possibility of making
this prediction means that the *x*-spin measurement on
*S*_{1} also counts as an *x*-spin measurement on
*S*_{2}, albeit an indirect measurement since it is carried out
in a region of space remote from *S*_{2}. By applying the
reduction of the wave-packet postulate to this indirect measurement, we
conclude that, at time *t* immediately after the measurement,
the state of *S*_{2} is *g*_{x-}, the
eigenvector of *x*-spin for value −1/2.

But now assume that a second measurement has been carried out just
before *t*, one that *directly* measures the spin of
*S*_{2} in the *y* direction. There is no difficulty in
simultaneously conducting both of these measurements since, because
they take place in remote regions of space, they cannot interfere with
each other. By applying the reduction of the wave-packet postulate to
this second measurement, we conclude that the state of *S*_{2}
immediately post-measurement is either *g*_{y-}
or *g*_{y+}, depending on whether the measured
value for *y*-spin is −1/2 or +1/2. Thus we arrive at a direct
contradiction, since the state of *S*_{2} post-measurement cannot
be both *g*_{x-} and one of
*g*_{y-} or *g*_{y+}.
Here, then, lies the nub of the EPR paradox, showing that QM is
inconsistent with the reduction of the wave-packet postulate. (In its
original form the EPR argument merely showed that without the reduction
of the wave-packet postulate, QM is
incomplete.^{[13]})

## 4. The World of Many Interpretations

The measurement problem and its associated paradoxes have generated a
multitude of responses. One such, based upon von Neumann's work with
density operators, is due to Josef M. Jauch (Jauch 1968, chapter 11).
The post measurement entangled state of *S*+*M*,
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i}, is a “pure state”, represented by a single
Hilbert space vector. There are, however, other sorts of states in QM,
namely “mixed states”, represented not by single vectors but rather by
so called density operators. It is characteristic of *S* being in a mixed
state that, from the point of view of statistical distributions over
possible results of measurements on *S*, *S* behaves as if, for some set of
vectors {*f*_{i}} and some set of numbers
{*p*_{i}} for which Σ*p*_{i} = 1,
there is probability *p*_{i} that *S* is in the pure state
*f*_{i}, for *i* = 1,2,.... (Mathematically, such a state
is represented by a so-called density operator,
Σ*p*_{i} | *f*_{i}><*f*_{i} |,
where | *f*_{i}><*f*_{i} | is
the projection operator onto the vector
*f*_{i}.^{[14]})
Von
Neumann proved that if *S*+*M* is in the entangled state
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i} then *S* is in such a mixed state — specifically,
*S* behaves as if there were probability |*c*_{i}|^{2} of being in pure state
*f*_{i}, for *i* = 1,2...; similarly *M* is in a mixed
state, behaving as if there were probability |*c*_{i}|^{2} of being in pure state
*g*_{i}, for *i* = 1,2.... (von Neumann 1955, 424). This,
in turn, means that, already at the end of the first stage of the
measurement, *S* behaves as if there is probability |*c*_{i}|^{2} that *Q* has value
*q*_{i} in *S* and *M* behaves as if there is probability |*c*_{i}|^{2} of *M* being in state
*g*_{i} and hence of registering the value
*q*_{i} for *Q*. Thus, it seems, the “reduction of the
wave packet” is redundant, since already at the end of the first stage
measurement the measuring apparatus behaves as if it registers the
appropriate possible values with probabilities in agreement with the
Born statistical interpretation. As such, those paradoxes of QM, such
as EPR and Schrödinger's cat, that depend upon the reduction of
the wave packet seem to
disappear.^{[15]}

But a difficulty remains. The state of *S*+*M* at the end of the first
stage of the measurement is an entangled state
Σ*c*_{i} *f*_{i}⊗
*g*_{i}, where *f*_{i} ⊗
*g*_{i} is an eigenvector of *Q* in *H*(*S*+*M*) corresponding
to value *q*_{i}. It follows that from the perspective
of *S*+*M*, the value of *Q* is indeterminate, suspended between the various
possible values *q*_{1}, *q*_{2}, and so
on. More seriously, it seems that the measuring apparatus suffers from
a similar indeterminacy: that is, it is indeterminate which value it
registers. In short, it seems that, from the point of view of the
combined measuring and measured system, Schrödinger's cat paradox
(although not his cat) survives
unscathed.^{[16]}

Jauch's approach suffers another drawback, which it shares with
hidden variable interpretations of QM (for a discussion of the latter
interpretations, see Belinfante 1973). In the special situation
described by the EPR paradox, for which the density operator of the
measured system is an identity operator, these interpretations assign
determinate values to *all* physical quantities for a particular
quantum
system.^{[17]}
Thus they fall prey to a new generation of
paradoxes that depend upon Gleason's theorem and the related Kochen and
Specker
theorem.^{[18]}

The Italian School of Daneri, Loinger, Prosperi, *et al.*
responded to this problem by advancing what has come to be called a
“phase wash out” or “decoherence” theory (Daneri, Loinger and Prosperi
1962). They showed that in virtue of statistical thermodynamic features
of the measuring apparatus, the state of *S*+*M* at *t*′ (the
end of the first stage of measurement) approximates a mixed state -
also called the “reduced state” — in which there is probability |*c*_{i}|^{2} that *S*+*M* is in the state
represented by the product vector *f*_{i} ⊗
*g*_{i}, for all the various *i* = 1,2,..... In this
reduced state the nagging indeterminacy effects vanish.

A serious difficulty remains, however. It may well be true that *S*+*M*
is approximately in a mixed state. But this does not solve the cat
paradox. That is, although it may be true that to a good approximation
Schrödinger's cat is either dead or alive, the air of paradox
remains if, when we examine in detail the micro-correlations between
the measured and measuring systems, we see that the cat is in a zombie
like dead-and-alive state.

The paradoxes and questions raised by the measurement problem have
spawned a host of interpretations of QM, including hidden variable
theories that continue Einstein's search for a “complete” account of
physical reality, and the Everett-Wheeler “many worlds interpretation”
(Wheeler and Zurek 1983, II.3 and III.3; Bell 1987, chapters 4 and 20).
Most physicists bypass these philosophical resolutions of the
interpretative difficulties of QM, and revert instead to some version
of the Bohr interpretation or the early Heisenberg's positivistic,
anti-metaphysical approach. It is as if the long history of failure to
resolve the acrimonious disputes surrounding the interpretation of QM
has led quantum physicists to become disenchanted with the garden of
metaphysical delights. As John S. Bell has made the point, despite more
than seventy years of interpreting QM and resolving the measurement
problem, the Bohr interpretation in its more pragmatic, less
metaphysical forms remains the “working philosophy” for the average
physicist (Bell 1987,
189).^{[19]}

## Bibliography

- Albert, D., 1992,
*Quantum Mechanics and Experience*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard university Press - Araki, H., and Yanase, M.M., 1960. “Measurement of quantum
mechanical operators”.
*Physical Review*, 120: 622-626. - Bassi, A., and Ghirardi, G.C., 2000. “A general argument against
the universal validity of the superposition principle”.
*Physics Letters A*, 275: 373-381. - Belinfante, F.J., 1973.
*A Survey of Hidden-Variables Theories*, New York: Pergamon Press. - Bell, J.S., 1987.
*Speakable and unspeakable in quantum mechanics*, New York: Cambridge University Press. - Beller, M., and Fine, A., 1994. “Bohr's Response to E-P-R”. In
*Niels Bohr and Contemporary Philosophy*, edited Jan Faye and Henry Folse, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - Beller, M. 1996. “The Rhetoric of Antirealism and the Copenhagen
Spirit”.
*Philosophy of Science*, 63: 183-204. - Bohm, D., and Aharanov, Y., 1957. “Discussion of experimental proof
for the paradox of Einstein, Rosen and Podolsky”.
*Physical Review*, 108: 1070-1076. - Bohr, N., 1929. “
*Die Atomtheorie und die Prinzipien der Naturschreibung*”.*Die Naturwissenschaften*, 18: 73-78. - Bohr, N., 1935. “Quantum Mechanics and Physical Reality”.
*Nature*, 136: 1025-1026. - Bohr, N., 1959. “Discussion with Einstein on epistemological
problems in atomic physics”. in
*Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist*, edited Paul A. Schilpp, New York: Harper and Row. - Bunge, M., 1967.
*Foundations of Physics*, Berlin: Springer. - Crary, J., 1995.
*Techniques of the Observer: On Vision and Modernity in the Nineteenth Century*, Cambridge Mass: October Books. - Daneri, A., Loinger, A., and Prosperi, G.M., 1962. “Quantum theory
of measurement and ergodicity requirements”.
*Nuclear Physics*, 33: 297-319. - Einstein, E., Podolsky, B., and Rosen, N., 1935, “Can
quantum-mechanical description of physical reality be considered
complete?”.
*Physical Review*, 47: 777-780. - Feyerabend, P., 1962. “Problems of Microphysics”. in
*Frontiers of Science and Philosophy*, edited Robert G. Colodny, Pittsburgh: Pittsburgh University Press. - Folse, H., 1985.
*The Philosophy of Niels Bohr: The Framework of Complementarity*, Amsterdam: North-Holland. - Healey, R., and Hellman, G., (eds.), 1998,
*Quantum Measurement*, Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press - Heisenberg, W., 1927. “
*Über den anschaulichen Inhalt der quantentheoretischen Kinematik und Mechanik*”.*Zeitschrift für Physik*, 43: 172-198. - Heisenberg, W., 1930.
*The Physical Principles of the Quantum Theory*, trans. Carl Eckhart and F.C. Hoyt, New York: Dover. - Jammer, M., 1974.
*The Philosophy of Quantum Mechanics*, New York: Wiley - Jauch, J.M., 1968.
*Foundations of Quantum Mechanics*, Reading: Addison-Wesley. - Kant, I., 1973.
*Critique of Pure Reason*, trans. Norman Kemp Smith, London: Macmillan. - Krips, H., 1990.
*The Metaphysics of Quantum Theory*, Oxford: Clarendon. - Popper, K., 1968.
*The Logic of Scientific Discovery*, London: Hutchinson. - Popper, K., 1982.
*Quantum Theory and the Schism in Physics*, London: Hutchinson. - Redhead, M., 1987.
*Incompleteness, Nonlocality, and Realism*, Oxford: Clarendon. - Shimony A., 1990. “Desiderata for modified quantum dynamics,” in
*PSA 1990*, Volume 2, A. Fine, M. Forbes and L.Wessels (eds), East Lansing, MI: Philosophy of Science Association. - Schrödinger, E., 1935a. “Discussion of probability relations
between separated systems”.
*Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society*, 31: 555-562. - Schrödinger, E., 1935b. “
*Die Gegenwärtige Situation in der Quantenmechanik*”.*Die Naturwissenschaften*, 23: 807-812; 824-828; 844-849. - von Neumann, J., 1955.
*Mathematical Foundations of Quantum Mechanics*, trans. Robert T. Geyer, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Wheeler, J.A., and Zurek, W.H., 1983.
*Quantum Theory and Measurement*, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2007 by

Henry Krips