Scientific Explanation

First published Fri May 9, 2003; substantive revision Wed Sep 24, 2014

Issues concerning scientific explanation have been a focus of philosophical attention from Pre-Socratic times through the modern period. However, recent discussion really begins with the development of the Deductive-Nomological (DN) model. This model has had many advocates (including Popper 1935, 1959, Braithwaite 1953, Gardiner, 1959, Nagel 1961) but unquestionably the most detailed and influential statement is due to Carl Hempel (Hempel 1942, 1965, and Hempel & Oppenheim 1948). These papers and the reaction to them have structured subsequent discussion concerning scientific explanation to an extraordinary degree. After some general remarks by way of background and orientation (Section 1), this entry describes the DN model and its extensions, and then turns to some well-known objections (Section 2). It next describes a variety of subsequent attempts to develop alternative models of explanation, including Wesley Salmon's Statistical Relevance (Section 3) and Causal Mechanical (Section 4) models and the Unificationist models due to Michael Friedman and Philip Kitcher (Section 5). Section 6 provides a summary and discusses directions for future work.

1. Background and Introduction.

As will become apparent, “scientific explanation” is a topic that raises a number of interrelated issues. Some background orientation will be useful before turning to the details of competing models. A presupposition of most recent discussion has been that science sometimes provides explanations (rather than something that falls short of explanation—e.g., “mere description”) and that the task of a “theory” or “model” of scientific explanation is to characterize the structure of such explanations. It is thus assumed that there is (at some suitably abstract and general level of description) a single kind or form of explanation that is “scientific”. In fact, the notion of “scientific explanation” suggests at least two contrasts—first, a contrast between those “explanations” that are characteristic of “science” and those explanations that are not, and, second, a contrast between “explanation” and something else. However, with respect to the first contrast, the tendency in much of the recent philosophical literature has been to assume that there is a substantial continuity between the sorts of explanations found in science and at least some forms of explanation found in more ordinary non-scientific contexts, with the latter embodying in a more or less inchoate way features that are present in a more detailed, precise, rigorous etc. form in the former. It is further assumed that it is the task of a theory of explanation to capture what is common to both scientific and at least some more ordinary forms of explanation. These assumptions help to explain (what may otherwise strike the reader as curious) why, as this entry will illustrate, discussions of scientific explanation so often move back and forth between examples drawn from bona-fide science (e.g., explanations of the trajectories of the planets that appeal to Newtonian mechanics) and more homey examples involving the tipping over of inkwells.

With respect to the second contrast, most models of explanation assume that it is possible for a set of claims to be true, accurate, supported by evidence, and so on and yet unexplanatory (at least of anything that the typical explanation-seeker is likely to want explained). For example, all of the accounts of scientific explanation described below would agree that an account of the appearance of a particular species of bird of the sort found in a bird guidebook is, however accurate, not an explanation of anything of interest to biologists (e.g., the development, characteristic features, or behavior of that species). Instead, such an account is “merely descriptive”. However, different models of explanation provide different accounts of what the contrast between the explanatory and merely descriptive consists in.

A related point is that while most theorists of scientific explanation have proposed models that are intended to cover at least some cases of explanation that we would not think of as part of science, they have nonetheless assumed some implicit restriction on the kinds of explanation they have sought to reconstruct. It has often been noted that the word “explanation” is used in a wide variety of ways in ordinary English—we speak of explaining the meaning of a word, explaining the background to philosophical theories of explanation, explaining how to bake a pie, explaining why one made a certain decision (where this is to offer a justification) and so on. Although the various models discussed below have sometimes been criticized for their failure to capture all of these forms of “explanation” (see, e.g., Scriven, 1959), it is clear that they were never intended to do this. Instead, their intended explicandum is, very roughly, explanations of why things happen, where the “things” in question can be either particular events or something more general—e.g., regularities or repeatable patterns in nature. Paradigms of this sort of explanation include the explanation for the advance in the perihelion of mercury provided by General Relativity, the explanation of the extinction of the dinosaurs in terms of the impact of a large asteroid at the end of the Cretaceous period, the explanation provided by the police for why a traffic accident occurred (the driver was drinking and there was ice on the road), and the standard explanation provided in economics textbooks for why monopolies will, in comparison with firms in perfectly competitive markets, raise prices and reduce output.

Finally, a few words about the broader epistemological/methodological background to the models described below. Many philosophers think of concepts like “explanation”, “law”, “cause”, and “support for counterfactuals” as part of an interrelated family or circle of concepts that are “modal” in character . For familiar “empiricist” reasons, Hempel and many other early defenders of the DN model regarded these concepts as not well understood, at least prior to analysis. It was assumed that it would be “circular” to explain one concept from this family in terms of others from the same family and that they must instead be explicated in terms of other concepts from outside the modal family—concepts that more obviously satisfied (what were taken to be) empiricist standards of intelligibility and testability. For example, in Hempel's version of the DN model, the notion of a “law” plays a key role in explicating the concept of “explanation”, and his assumption is that laws are just regularities that meet certain further conditions that are also acceptable to empiricists. As we shall see, these empiricist standards (and an accompanying unwillingness to employ modal concepts as primitives) have continued to play a central role in the models of explanation developed subsequent to the DN model.

There are many interesting historical questions about the DN model that remain largely unexplored. Why did “scientific explanation” emerge when it did as a major topic for philosophical discussion? Why were the “logical empiricist”philosophers of science who defended the DN model so willing to accept the idea that science provides “explanations”, given the tendency of many earlier writers in the positivist tradition to think of “explanation” as a rather subjective or “metaphysical” matter and to contrast it unfavorably with “description”, which they regarded as a more legitimate goal for empirical science? And why was discussion, at least initially, organized around “explanation” rather than “causation”, since (as we shall observe) it is often the latter notion that seems to be of central interest in subsequent debates and since the former notion seems (to many contemporary sensibilities) somewhat vague and ill-defined? At least part of the answer to this last question seems to be that (again as explained in more detail below) Hempel and other defenders of the DN model inherited standard empiricist or Humean scruples about the notion of causation. They assumed that causal notions are only (scientifically or metaphysically) acceptable to the extent that it is possible to paraphrase or re-describe them in ways that satisfied empiricist criteria for meaningfulness and legitimacy. One obvious way of doing this was to take causal claims to be tantamount to claims about the obtaining of “regularities” (that is patterns of uniform association in nature). It is just this idea that is captured by the DN model (see below). Part of the initial appeal of the topic of “scientific explanation” was thus that it functioned as a more respectable surrogate for (or entry point into) the problematic topic of causation[1]. Another motivation was the interest of Hempel and other early defenders of the DN model in forms of explanation such as “functional explanation” (thought to be employed in such special sciences as biology and anthropology) that were not obviously causal. This also made it natural to frame discussion around a broad category of explanation rather than narrower notions of “causation” (cf. Hempel, 1965b).

Suggested Readings: Salmon (1989) is a superb critical survey of all the models of scientific explanation discussed in this entry. Pitt (1988) and Ruben (1993) are anthologies that contain a number of influential articles.

2. The DN Model

2.1 The Basic Idea

According to the Deductive-Nomological Model, a scientific explanation consists of two major “constituents”: an explanandum, a sentence “describing the phenomenon to be explained” and an explanans, “the class of those sentences which are adduced to account for the phenomenon” (Hempel and Oppenheim, 1948, reprinted in Hempel, 1965, p. 247). For the explanans to successfully explain the explanandum several conditions must be met. First, “the explanandum must be a logical consequence of the explanans” and “the sentences constituting the explanans must be true” (Hempel, 1965, p. 248). That is, the explanation should take the form of a sound deductive argument in which the explanandum follows as a conclusion from the premises in the explanans. This is the “deductive” component of the model. Second, the explanans must contain at least one “law of nature” and this must be an essential premise in the derivation in the sense that the derivation of the explanandum would not be valid if this premise were removed. This is the “nomological” component of the model—“nomological” being a philosophical term of art which, suppressing some niceties, means (roughly) “lawful”. In its most general formulation, the DN model is meant to apply both to the explanation of “general regularities” or “laws” such as (to use Hempel and Oppenheim's examples) why light conforms to the law of refraction and also to the explanation of particular events, conceived as occurring at a particular time and place, such as the bent appearance of the partially submerged oars of a rowboat on a particular occasion of viewing. As an additional illustration of a DN explanation of a particular event, consider a derivation of the position of Mars at some future time from Newton's laws of motion, the Newtonian inverse square law governing gravity, and information about the mass of the sun, the mass of Mars and the present position and velocity of each. In this derivation the various Newtonian laws figure as essential premises and they are used, in conjunction with appropriate information about initial conditions (the masses of Mars and the sun and so on), to derive the explanandum (the future position of Mars) via a deductively valid argument. The DN criteria are thus satisfied.

2.2 The Role of Laws in the DN Model

The notion of a sound deductive argument is (arguably) relatively clear (or at least something that can be regarded as antecedently understood from the point of view of characterizing scientific explanation). But what about the other major component of the DN model—that of a law of nature? The basic intuition that guides the DN model goes something like this: Within the class of true generalizations, we may distinguish between those that are only “accidentally true” and those that are “laws”. To use Hempel's examples, the generalization

  • (2.2.1) All members of the Greensbury School Board for 1964 are bald

is, if true, only accidentally so. In contrast,

  • (2.2.2) All gases expand when heated under constant pressure

is a law. Thus, according to the DN model, the latter generalization can be used, in conjunction with information that some particular sample of gas has been heated under constant pressure, to explain why it has expanded. By contrast, the former generalization (2.2.1) in conjunction with the information that a particular person $n$ is a member of the 1964 Greensbury school board, cannot be used to explain why $n$ is bald.

While this example may seem clear enough, what exactly is it that distinguishes true accidental generalizations from laws? This has been the subject of a great deal of philosophical discussion, most of which must be beyond the scope of this entry.[2] For reasons explained in Section 1, Hempel assumes that an adequate account must explain the notion of law in terms of notions that lie outside the modal family.[3] In his (1965) he considers a number of familiar proposals having this character[4] and finds them all wanting, remarking that the problem of characterizing the notion of law has proved “highly recalcitrant” (1965, p.338). It seems fair to say, however, that his underlying assumption is that, at bottom, laws are just exceptionless generalizations describing regularities that meet certain additional distinguishing conditions that he is not at present able to formulate.

In subsequent decades, there have been a number of other proposed criteria for lawhood. Although each proposal has its adherents, none has won general acceptance.[5] What implications does this have for the DN model? One possible assessment is that all the DN model really requires is that there be agreement in a substantial range of particular cases about which generalizations are laws. If such agreement exists; it matters little for the DN model if we are unable to formulate completely general criteria that distinguish between laws and accidentally true generalizations in all possible cases. For example, even without an adequate account of lawhood, we can surely agree that (2.2.2) is a law and (2.2.1) is not and this is all we need to conclude that (2.2.2) can figure in DN explanations while (2.2.1) cannot.

Unfortunately, however, matters are not always so straightforward. One important issue raised by the DN model concerns the explanatory status of the so-called special sciences—biology, psychology, economics and so on. These sciences are full of generalizations that appear to play an explanatory role and yet fail to satisfy many of the standard criteria for lawfulness. For example, although Mendel's law of segregation (M) (which states that in sexually reproducing organisms each of the two alternative forms (alleles) of a gene specifying a trait at a locus in a given organism has 0.5 probability of ending up in a gamete) is widely used in models in evolutionary biology, it has a number of exceptions, such as meiotic drive. A similar point holds for the principles of rational choice theory (such as the generalization that preferences are transitive) which figure centrally in economics. Other widely used generalizations in the special sciences have very narrow scope in comparison with paradigmatic laws, hold only over restricted spatio-temporal regions, and lack explicit theoretical integration.

There is considerable disagreement over whether such generalizations are laws. Some philosophers (e.g., Woodward, 2000) suggest that such generalizations satisfy too few of the standard criteria to count as laws but can nevertheless figure in explanations; if so, it apparently follows that we must abandon the DN requirement that all explanations must appeal to laws. Others (e. g., Mitchell, 1997), emphasizing different criteria for lawfulness, conclude instead that generalizations like (M) are laws and hence no threat to the requirement that explanations must invoke laws. In the absence of a more principled account of laws, it is hard to evaluate these competing claims and hence hard to assess the implications of the DN model for the special sciences. More generally, in the absence of a generally accepted account of lawhood, the rationale for the fundamental contrast between laws and non-laws which is at the heart of what the DN model requires is unclear: it is hard to assess the claim that all explanations must cite laws, without a clear account of what a law is and what it contributes to successful explanation. At the very least, providing such an account is an important item of unfinished business for advocates of the DN model.

2.3 Inductive Statistical Explanation

The DN model is meant to capture explanation via deduction from deterministic laws and this raises the obvious question of the explanatory status of statistical laws. Do such laws explain at all and if so, what do they explain, and under what conditions? In his (1965) Hempel distinguishes two varieties of statistical explanation. The first of these, deductive-statistical (DS) explanation, involves the deduction of “a narrower statistical uniformity” from a more general set of premises, at least one of which involves a more general statistical law. Since DS explanation involves deduction of the explanandum from a law, it conforms to the same general pattern as the DN explanation of regularities. However, in addition to DS explanation, Hempel also recognizes a distinctive sort of statistical explanation, which he calls inductive-statistical or IS explanation, involving the subsumption of individual events (like the recovery of a particular person from streptococcus infection) under (what he regards as) statistical laws (such as a law specifying the probability of recovery, given that penicillin has been taken).

While the explanandum of a DN or DS explanation can be deduced from the explanans, one cannot deduce that some particular individual, John Jones, has recovered from the above statistical law and the information that he has taken penicillin. At most what can be deduced from this information is that recovery is more or less probable. In IS explanation, the relation between explanans and explanandum is, in Hempel's words, “inductive,” rather than deductive—hence the name inductive-statistical explanation. The details of Hempel's account are complex, but the underlying idea is roughly this: an IS explanation will be good or successful to the extent that its explanans confers high probability on its explanandum outcome.

Thus if it is statistical law that the probability of recovery from streptococcus, given that one has taken penicillin, is high, and Jones has taken penicillin and recovered, this information can be used to provide an IS explanation of Jones' recovery. However if the probability of recovery is low (e.g. less than 0.5), given that Jones has taken penicillin, then, even if Jones recovers, we cannot use this information to provide an IS explanation of his recovery.

2.4 Motivation for the DN Model: Nomic Expectability and a Regularity Account of Causation

Why suppose that all (or even some) explanations have a DN or IS structure? There are two ideas which play a central motivating role in Hempel's (1965) discussion. The first connects the information provided by a DN argument with a certain conception of what it is to achieve understanding of why something happens—it appeals to an idea about the object or point of giving an explanation. Hempel writes

… a DN explanation answers the question “Why did the explanandum-phenomenon occur?” by showing that the phenomenon resulted from certain particular circumstances, specified in $C_1, C_2, \ldots, C_k$, in accordance with the laws $L_1, L_2, \ldots, L_r$. By pointing this out, the argument shows that, given the particular circumstances and the laws in question, the occurrence of the phenomenon was to be expected; and it is in this sense that the explanation enables us to understand why the phenomenon occurred. (1965, p. 337, italics in original)

One can think of IS explanation as involving a natural generalization of this idea. While an IS explanation does not show that the explanandum-phenomenon was to be expected with certainty, it does the next best thing: it shows that the explanandum-phenomenon is at least to be expected with high probability and in this way provides understanding. Stated more generally, both the DN and IS models, share the common idea that, as Salmon (1989) puts it, “the essence of scientific explanation can be described as nomic expectability—that is expectability on the basis of lawful connections” (1989, p. 57).

The second main motivation for the DN/IS model has to do with the role of causal claims in scientific explanation. There is considerable disagreement among philosophers about whether all explanations in science and in ordinary life are causal and also disagreement about what the distinction (if any) between causal and non-causal explanations consists in.[6] Nonetheless, virtually everyone, including Hempel, agrees that many scientific explanations cite information about causes. However, Hempel, along with most other early advocates of the DN model, is unwilling to take the notion of causation as primitive in the theory of explanation—that is, he was unwilling to simply say that $X$ figures in an explanation of $Y$ if and only if $X$ causes $Y$. Instead, adherents of the DN model have generally looked for an account of causation that satisfies the empiricist requirements described in Section 1. In particular, advocates of the DN model have generally accepted a broadly Humean or regularity theory of causation, according to which (very roughly) all causal claims imply the existence of some corresponding regularity (a “law”) linking cause to effect. This is then taken to show that all causal explanations “imply,” perhaps only “implicitly,” that such a law/regularity exists and hence that laws are “involved” in all such explanations, just as the DN model claims.

To illustrate of this line of argument, consider

  • (2.4.1) The impact of my knee on the desk caused the tipping over of the inkwell.

(2.4.1) is a so-called singular causal explanation, advanced by Michael Scriven (1962) as a counterexample to the claim that the DN model describes necessary conditions for successful explanation. According to Scriven, (2.4.1) explains the tipping over of the inkwell even though no law or generalization figures explicitly in (2.4.1) and (2.4.1) appears to consist of a single sentence, rather than a deductive argument. Hempel's response (1965, 360ff) is that the occurrence of “caused” in (2.4.1) should not be left unanalyzed or taken as explanatory just as it stands. Instead (2.4.1) should be understood as “implicitly” or “tacitly” claiming there is a “law” or regularity linking knee impacts to tipping over of inkwells. According to Hempel, it is the implicit claim that some such law holds that “distinguishes” (2.4.1) from “a mere sequential narrative” in which the spilling is said to follow the impact but without any claim of causal connection—a narrative that (Hempel thinks) would clearly not be explanatory. This linking law is the nomological premise in the DN argument that, according to Hempel, is “implicitly” asserted by (2.2.1).

There are two related but distinct ways of understanding this argument, both of which are suggested by portions of Hempel's discussion. According to the first, Hempel's claim is that the real underlying structure of (2.4.1) is something like:

  • (2.4.2) $(L)$ Whenever knees impact tables on which an inkwell sits and further conditions $K$ are met (where $K$ specifies that the impact is sufficiently forceful, etc.), the inkwell will tip over. (Reference to $K$ is necessary since the impact of knees on table with inkwells does not always result in tipping.)
  • $(I)$ My knee impacted a tables on which an inkwell sits and further conditions $K$ are met.
  • $(E)$ The inkwell tips over.

Hence, to the extent that it is explanatory, (2.4.1) “implicitly” satisfies the DN/IS requirements after all—it is a DN/IS argument (namely 2.4.2) in disguise.

There is a second interpretation of Hempel's argument that, unlike the first interpretation, does not require that we think of the full content of (2.4.2) as somehow already implicit in (2.4.1) Instead, (2.4.2) plays the role of an ideal against which (2.4.1) should be measured. (2.4.2) spells out what information a complete, fully adequate explanation for $E$ would need to contain—information that is present in (2.4.1) only in a partial or incomplete way. On this view of the matter, we think of (2.4.1) as an explanation-sketch (cf. Hempel, 1965b, 423ff) which conveys some of the information conveyed by (2.4.2) or points in the direction of the more complete explanation (2.4.2). Ideally, singular causal explanations like (2.4.1) should be replaced by explicit DN explanations like (2.4.2).

On either interpretation, however, the basic idea is that a proper explication of the role of causal claims in explanation leads via a Humean or regularity theory of causation, to the conclusion that, at least ideally, explanations should satisfy the DN/IS model. Let us call this line of argument the “hidden structure” argument in recognition of the role it assigns to a hidden (or at least non-explicit) DN structure that is claimed to be associated with (2.4.1).

This strategy will be examined in section 2.6, but let me first comment on a feature of the discussion so far that may seem puzzling. The boundaries of the category “scientific explanation” are far from clear, but while (2.4.1) is arguably an explanation, it is not what one usually thinks of as “science”—instead it is a claim from “ordinary life” or “common sense”. This raises the question of why adherents of the DN/IS model don't simply respond to the alleged counterexample (2.4.1) by denying that it is an instance of the category “scientific explanation”—that is, by claiming that the DN/IS model is not an attempt to reconstruct the structure of explanations like (2.4.1) but is rather only meant to apply to explanations that are properly regarded as “scientific”. The fact that this response is not often adopted by advocates of the DN model is an indication of the extent to which, as noted in section 1, it is implicitly assumed in most discussions of scientific explanation that there are important similarities or continuities in structure between explanations like (2.4.1) and explanations that are more obviously scientific and that these similarities that should be captured by some common account that applies to both. Indeed, it is a striking feature not just of Hempel (1965) but of many other treatments of scientific explanation that much of the discussion in fact focuses on “ordinary life” singular causal explanations similar to (2.4.1), the tacit assumption being that conclusions about the structure of such explanations have fairly direct implications for understanding explanation in science.

2.5. Explanatory Understanding and Nomic Expectability: Counterexamples to Sufficiency

As explained above, examples like (2.4.1) are potential counterexamples to the claim that the DN model provides necessary conditions for explanation. There are also a number of well-known counterexamples to the claim that the DN model provides sufficient conditions for successful scientific explanation. Here are two illustrations.

Explanatory Asymmetries. There are many cases in which a derivation of an explanandum $E$ from a law $L$ and initial conditions $I$ seems explanatory but a “backward” derivation of $I$ from $E$ and the same law $L$ does not seem explanatory, even though the latter, like the former, appears to meet the criteria for successful DN explanation. For example, one can derive the length $s$ of the shadow cast by a flagpole from the height $h$ of the pole and the angle θ of the sun above the horizon and laws about the rectilinear propagation of light. This derivation meets the DN criteria and seems explanatory. On the other hand, a derivation (2.5.1) of $h$ from $s$ and $\theta$ and the same laws also meets the DN criteria but does not seem explanatory. Examples like this suggest that at least some explanations possess directional or asymmetric features to which the DN model is insensitive.

Explanatory Irrelevancies. A derivation can satisfy the DN criteria and yet be a defective explanation because it contains irrelevancies besides those associated with the directional features of explanation. Consider an example due to Wesley Salmon (Salmon, 1971, p.34):

  • (2.5.2) $(L)$ All males who take birth control pills regularly fail to get pregnant
  • $(K)$ John Jones is a male who has been taking birth control pills regularly
  • $(E)$ John Jones fails to get pregnant

It is arguable that $(L)$ meets the criteria for lawfulness imposed by Hempel and many other writers. (If one wants to deny that $L$ is a law one needs some principled, generally accepted basis for this judgment and, as explained above, it is unclear what this basis is.) Moreover, (2.5.2) is certainly a sound deductive argument in which $L$ occurs as an essential premise. Nonetheless, most people judge that $(L)$ and $(K)$ are no explanation of $E$. There are many other similar illustrations. For example (Kyburg 1965), it is presumably a law (or at least an exceptionless, counterfactual supporting generalization) that all samples of table salt that have been hexed by being touched with the wand of a witch dissolve when placed in water. One may use this generalization as a premise in a DN derivation which has as its conclusion that some particular hexed sample of salt has dissolved in water. But again the hexing is irrelevant to the dissolving and such a derivation is no explanation.

One obvious diagnosis of the difficulties posed by examples like (2.5.1) and (2.5.2) focuses on the role of causation in explanation. According to this analysis, to explain an outcome we must cite its causes and (2.5.1) and (2.5.2) fail to do this. As Salmon (1989, p.47) puts it, “a flagpole of a certain height causes a shadow of a given length and thereby explains the length of the shadow”. By contrast, “the shadow does not cause the flagpole and consequently cannot explain its height”. Similarly, taking birth control pills does not cause Jones' failure to get pregnant and this is why (2.5.2) fails to be an acceptable explanation. On this analysis, what (2.5.1) and (2.5. 2) show is that a derivation can satisfy the DN criteria and yet fail to identify the causes of an explanandum—when this happens the derivation will fail to be explanatory.

As explained above, advocates of the DN model would not regard this diagnosis as very illuminating, unless accompanied by some account of causation that does not simply take this notion as primitive. (Salmon in fact provides such an account, which we will consider in Section 4.) We should note, however, that an apparent lesson of (2.5.1) and (2.5.2) is that the regularity account of causation favored by DN theorists is at best incomplete: the occurrence of $c$, $e$ and the existence of some regularity or law linking them (or $x$'s having property $P$ and $x$'s having property $Q$ and some law linking these) is not a sufficient condition for the truth of the claim that $c$ caused $e$ or $x$'s having $P$ is causally or explanatorily relevant to $x$'s having Q. More generally, if the counterexamples (2.5.1) and (2.5.2) are accepted, it follows that the DN model fails to state sufficient conditions for explanation. Explaining an outcome isn't just a matter of showing that it is nomically expectable.

There are two possible reactions one might have to this observation. One is that the idea that explanation is a matter of nomic expectability is correct as far as it goes, but that something more is required as well. According to this assessment, the DN/IS model does state a necessary condition for successful explanation and, moreover, a condition that is a non-redundant part of a set of conditions that are jointly sufficient for explanation. However, some other, independent feature, $X$ (which will account for the directional features of explanation and insure the kind of explanatory relevance that is apparently missing in the birth control example) must be added to the DN model to achieve a successful account of explanation. The idea is thus that Nomic Expectability $+\ X = $ Explanation. Something like this idea is endorsed, by the unificationist models of explanation developed by Friedman (1974) and Kitcher (1989), which are discussed in Section 5 below.

A second, more radical possible conclusion is that the DN account of the goal or rationale of explanation is mistaken in some much more fundamental way and that the DN model does not even state necessary conditions for successful explanation. As noted above, unless the hidden structure argument is accepted, this conclusion is strongly suggested by examples like (2.4.1) (“The impact of my knee caused the tipping over of the inkwell”) which appear to involve explanation without the explicit citing of a law or a deductive structure. To assess whether the DN/IS model provides necessary conditions for explanation, we thus must consider the hidden structure strategy in more detail.

2.6 The Hidden Structure Strategy

It might seem that the contention of the hidden structure strategy that singular causal explanations like (2.4.1) are implicit DN/IS explanations or sketches of such explanations is at best relevant to the question of whether the DNIS model provides an adequate reconstruction of this particular sort of explanation. In fact, however, Hempel's strategy of treating explanations as devices for conveying information, but in a “partial” or “incomplete” way, about underlying “ideal” explanations of a prima-facie quite different form that are at least partly epistemically hidden from those who use the original, non-ideal explanation has continued to be very popular in recent theorizing about scientific explanation. This strategy forms the basis, for example, for Peter Railton's (1978, 1981) contrast between an “ideal explanatory text” which contains all of the causal and nomological information relevant to some outcome of interest and the “non-ideal” explanations like (2.4.1)that we actually give. According to Railton, the latter provide “explanatory information” in virtue of conveying information about some limited portion or aspect of the ideal text and are explanatory in virtue of doing so. The hidden structure strategy also plays an important role in the unificationist account of explanation developed by Philip Kitcher (1989) who likewise insists we must “distinguish between what is said on an occasion in which explanatory information is given and the ideal underlying explanation” (Kitcher, 1989, p. 414.) Indeed, any account of explanation that, like Kitcher's unificationist model, insists that laws (or generalizations of considerable generality) and deductive structure are necessary conditions for successful explanation will need to appeal to something like hidden structure strategy since it is generally accepted that there are many apparent explanations that do not conform to such conditions in their overt structure.

Although the hidden structure strategy deserves more attention than it can receive here, several points seem clear. First, the notion of one explanation “conveying information about” another “underlying” explanation requires considerable spelling out. Depending on what “underlying” is understood to mean, it is arguable that there are many explanations underlying (2.4.1)—(i) the explanation (2.4.2), assuming that condition $K$ can be specified in a non-trivial way, (ii) an explanation at the level of classical physics that makes reference to laws governing inelastic collisions, the behavior of liquids when not confined to containers, and so on, and (iii) an explanation in which the behavior of the whole system is characterized in terms of some more fundamental physical theory (quantum mechanics, superstring theory etc.). Are all of these explanations implicit in (2.4.1) or does (2.4.1) convey partial information about all of them? In what sense of “implicit” or “conveys information about” could this possibly be true?

Railton (1981) suggests that an explanatory claim provides information about an underlying ideal text if the former reduces uncertainty about some of the properties of the text, in the sense of ruling in or out various possibilities concerning its structure. As Railton recognizes, this has proposal has many counterintuitive consequences. To use Railton's own example, “the relevant ideal text contains more than $10^2$ words in English”, if true, counts as an explanation for an episode of radioactive decay (1981, p. 246). Similarly, the claim that $X$ and $Y$ are correlated, will count as a partial explanation of $X$ and $Y$ on the plausible assumption that this claim conveys the information that one of three possibilities is likely to be true—either $X$ causes $Y$ or $Y$ causes $X$ or they have a common cause—and thus reduces uncertainty about the contents of the ideal underlying text. This contrasts with the widespread judgment that correlations in themselves are not explanatory. Indeed, on a view like Railton's, even the claim that some outcome has no causes or is governed by no laws counts as an “explanation” of that outcome, supposing that claim is true. In fact, such a claim is apparently maximally explanatory, since it conveys everything that there is to be said about the ideal explanatory text associated with that event. Examples like these suggest that not every claim that reduces uncertainty about the contents of an ideal explanatory text should be regarded as itself explanatory—such a view allows too much to count as an explanation.

Is it plausible to regard the text that contains all of the full details of causal and nomological information relevant to some outcome as at least an “ideal” against which various candidate explanations of that outcome are to be judged? Suppose we are presented with an explanation from economics or psychology that does not appeal to any generalization that we are prepared to count as a law but that underlying this “non-ideal” explanation is some incredibly complex set of facts described in terms of classical mechanics and electromagnetism, along with the relevant laws of these theories. If, as almost certainly will be the case, this underlying “explanation” is computationally intractable, and full of irrelevant detail (see section 4 below for more on what this might mean), one might wonder in what sense it is an ideal against which the original explanation should be measured. Will the economics explanation really be better according as to whether it conveys as much information as possible about these underlying details?

Finally, consider the connection between explanation and understanding. One ordinarily thinks of an explanation as something that provides understanding. Relatedly, part of the task of a theory of explanation is to identify those structural features of explanations (or the information they convey) in virtue of which they provide understanding. For example, as noted above, the DN model connects understanding with the provision of information about nomic expectability—the idea is that understanding why an outcome occurs is a matter of seeing that it was to be expected on the basis of a law. The problem this raises for the hidden structure strategy is that the information associated with the hidden structure alleged to underlie “non-ideal” explanations like (2.4.1) is typically unknown or epistemically inaccessible to those who use the explanation. It is hard to see how this structure or information can contribute to understanding if it is epistemically hidden in this way. For example, it seems plausible that many (if not almost all) users of (2.4.1) (both those who might offer it as an explanation and those recipients who take it to provide understanding) are unaware of the DN structure that underlies it—indeed it is plausible that many users lack the notion of a law of nature and of a deductively valid argument and hence any notion that there is any (unknown) DN argument underlying (2.4.1). If this is the case, how can the mere obtaining of this DN structure, independently of anyone's awareness of its existence, function so as to provide understanding when (2.4.1) is used? Instead, it seems that the features of (2.4.1) that endow it with explanatory import—that make it an explanation—must be features that can be known or grasped or recognized by those who use the explanation. A similar point will hold for many other candidate explanations that fail to conform to the DN requirements such as explanations from sciences like economics and psychology that seem to lack laws.

What can we conclude from this discussion of the hidden structure strategy? If the strategy fails, there will be a large number of apparent explanations that fail to satisfy the necessary conditions for explanation imposed by the DN/IS model. On the other hand, it is possible that there are ways of developing the hidden structure strategy that respond adequately to the difficulties described above. If so, the idea that the DN/IS requirements are at least necessary conditions for ideal explanation may be defensible after all, although the counterexamples to the sufficiency of the model noted in will remain.

Suggested Readings. The most authoritative and comprehensive statement of the DN and IS models is probably Hempel 1965b. This is reprinted in Hempel, 1965a, along with a number of other papers that touch on various aspects of the problem of scientific explanation. In addition to the references cited in this section, Salmon, 1989, pp. 46ff describes a number of well-known counterexamples to the DN/IS models and discusses their significance.

3. The SR Model

3.1 The Basic Idea

Much of the subsequent literature on explanation has been motivated by attempts to capture the features of causal or explanatory relevance that appear to be left out of examples like (2.5.1) and (2.5.2), typically within the empiricist constraints described above. Wesley Salmon's statistical relevance (or SR) model (Salmon, 1971) is a very influential attempt to capture these features in terms of the notion of statistical relevance or conditional dependence relationships. Given some class or population $A$, an attribute $C$ will be statistically relevant to another attribute $B$ if and only if $P(B \mid A.C) \ne P(B \mid A)$—that is, if and only if the probability of $B$ conditional on $A$ and $C$ is different from the probability of $B$ conditional on $A$ alone. The intuition underlying the SR model is that statistically relevant properties (or information about statistically relevant relationships) are explanatory and statistically irrelevant properties are not. In other words, the notion of a property making a difference for an explanandum is unpacked in terms of statistical relevance relationships.

To illustrate this idea, suppose that in the birth control pills example (2.5.2) the original population $T$ includes both genders. Then

\begin{align} P(\text{Pregnancy} &\mid T.\text{Male.Takes birth control pills}) \\ &= P(\text{Pregnancy} \mid T.\text{Male}) \\ &= 0 \end{align}

while

\begin{align} P(\text{Pregnancy} &\mid T.\text{Female}.\text{Takes birth control pills}) \\ &\ne P(\text{Pregnancy} \mid T.\text{Female}) \end{align}

assuming that not all women in the population take birth control pills. In other words, if you are a male in this population, taking birth control pills is statistically irrelevant to whether you become pregnant, while if you are a female it is relevant. In this way we can capture the idea that taking birth control pills is explanatorily irrelevant to pregnancy among males but not among females.

To characterize the SR model more precisely we need the notion of a homogenous partition. A homogenous partition of $A$ is a set of subclasses or cells $C_i$ of $A$ that are mutually exclusive and exhaustive, where $P(B \mid A.C_i) \ne P(B \mid A.C_j)$ for all $C_i \ne C_j$ and where no further statistically relevant partition of any of the cells $A, C_i$ can be made with respect to $B$—that is, there are no additional attributes $D_k$ in $A$ such that $P(B \mid A.C_i) \ne P(B \mid A.C_i.D_k)$.

On the SR model, an explanation of why some member $x$ of the class characterized by attribute $A$ has attribute $B$ consists of the following information:

  1. the prior probability of $B$ within $A$ : $P(B \mid A) = p$.
  2. A homogeneous partition of $A$ with respect to $B$, $(A. C_1, \ldots, A. C_n)$, together with the probability of $B$ within each cell of the partition: $P(B \mid A.C_i) = p_i$ and
  3. The cell of the partition to which $x$ belongs.

To employ one of Salmon's examples, suppose we want to construct an SR explanation of why $x$ who has a strep infection = $S$, recovers quickly = $Q$. Let $T (-T)$ according to whether $x$ is (is not) treated with penicillin, and $R (-R)$ = according to whether the subject has a penicillin-resistant strain. Assume for the sake of argument that no other factors are relevant to quick recovery. There are four possible combinations of these properties: $T.R$, $-T.R$, $T.-R$, $-T.-R$, but let us assume that

\begin{align} P&(Q \mid S.T.R) \\ &= P(Q \mid S.-T.R) \\ &= P(Q \mid S.-T.-R) \\ &≠ P(Q \mid S. T.-R). \end{align}

That is, the probability of quick recovery, given that one has strep, is the same for those who have the resistant strain regardless of whether or not they are treated and also the same for those who have not been treated. By contrast, the probability of recovery is different (presumably greater) among those with strep who have been treated and do not have the resistant strain.

In this case $[S. (T.R \vee -T.R \vee -R.-T)]$, $[S.T.-R]$ is a homogenous partition of $S$ with respect to $Q$. The SR explanation of $x$'s recovery will consist of a statement of the probability of quick recovery among all those with strep (this is (i) above), a statement of the probability of recovery in each of the two cells of the above partition ((ii) above), and the cell to which $x$ belongs, which is $S.T.R$ ((iii) above). Intuitively, the idea is that this information tells us about the relevance of each of the possible combinations of the properties $T$ and $R$ to quick recovery among those with strep and is explanatory for just this reason.

3.2 The SR Model and Low Probability Events

The SR model has a number of distinctive features that have generated substantial discussion. First, note that according to the SR model, and in contrast to the DN/IS model, an explanation is not an argument—either in the sense of a deductively valid argument in which the explanandum follows as a conclusion from the explanans or in the sense of an inductive argument in which the explanandum follows with high probability from the explanans, as in the case of IS explanation. Instead, an explanation is an assembly of information that is statistically relevant to an explanandum. Salmon argues (and takes the birth control example (2.6.2) to illustrate) that the criteria that a good argument must satisfy (e.g., criteria that insure deductive soundness or some inductive analogue) are simply different from those a good explanation must satisfy. Among other things, as Salmon puts it, “irrelevancies [are] harmless in arguments but fatal in explanations” (1989, p. 102). As explained above, in associating successful explanation with the provision of information about statistical relevance relationships, the SR model attempts to accommodate this observation.

A second, closely related point is that the SR model departs from the IS model in abandoning the idea that a statistical explanation of an outcome must provide information from which it follows the outcome occurred with high probability. As the reader may check, the statement of the SR model above imposes no such high probability requirement; instead, even very unlikely outcomes will be explained as long as the criteria for SR explanation are met. Suppose that, in the above example, the probability of quick recovery from strep, given treatment and the presence of a non-resistant strain, is rather low (e.g., 0.2). Nonetheless, if the criteria (i)–(iii) above—a homogeneous partition with correct probability values for each cell in the partition—are satisfied, we may use this information to explain why $x$, who had a non-resistant strain of strep and was treated, recovered quickly. Indeed, according to the SR model, we may explain why some $x$ which is $A$ is $B$, even if the conditional probability of $B$ given $A$ and the cell $C_i$ to which $x$ belongs $(p_i = P(B \mid A.C_i))$ is less than the prior probability $(p = P(B \mid A))$ of $B$ in $A$. For example, if the prior probability of quick recovery among all those with any form of strep is 0.5 and the probability of quick recovery of those with a resistant strain who are untreated is 0.1, we may nonetheless explain why $y$, who meets these last conditions $(-T.R)$, recovered quickly (assuming he did) by citing the cell to which he belongs (the fact that he had the resistant strain and was untreated), the probability of recovery given that he falls in this cell, and the other sort of information described above. More generally, what matters on the SR model is not whether the value of the probability of the explanandum-outcome is high or low (or even high or low in comparison with its prior probability) but rather whether the putative explanans cites all and only statistically relevant factors and whether the probabilities it invokes are correct. One consequence of this, which Salmon endorses while acknowledging that many will regard it as unintuitive, is that on the SR model, the same explanans $E$ may explain both an explanandum $M$ and explananda that are inconsistent with $M$, such as $-M$. For example, the same explanans will explain both why a subject with strep and certain other properties (e.g., $T$ and $-R$) recovers quickly, if he does, and also why he does not recover if he does not. By contrast, on the DN or IS models, if $E$ explains $M,E$ cannot also explain $-M$.

The intuition that, contrary to the IS model, the value that a candidate explanans assigns to an explanandum-outcome should not matter for the goodness of the explanation it provides can be motivated in the following way. Consider a genuinely indeterministic coin which is biased strongly $(p = 0.9)$ toward heads when tossed. Suppose that if it is not tossed the coin has probability of 0.5 of being in either the heads or tails position and that whether or not the coin is tossed is the only factor that is statistically relevant to whether it is heads or tails. According to the IS model, if the coin is tossed and comes up heads, we can explain this outcome by appealing to the fact that the coin was tossed (since under this condition the probability of heads is high) but if the coin is tossed and comes up tails we cannot explain this outcome, since its probability is low . The contrary intuition underlying the SR model is that we understand both outcomes equally well. The bias of the coin and the fact that the coin has been tossed are the only factors relevant to either outcome and those factors are common to both outcomes—once we have cited the toss (and specified the probability values for heads and tails on tossing), we left nothing out that influences either outcome. Similarly, Salmon argues, if it is really true that the partition in the example involving quick recovery from strep is objectively homogenous—if there are no other factors that are statistically relevant to quick recovery besides whether the subject has been treated and has a resistant strain—then once we have specified the probability of quick recovery under all combinations of these factors, and the combination of factors possessed by the subject whose recovery (or not, as the case may be) we want to explain, we have specified all information relevant to recovery and in this sense fully explained the outcome for the subject.[7]

3.3 What Do Statistical Theories Explain?

In assessing these claims, it will be useful to take a step back and ask just what it is that these competing models of statistical explanation (Hempel's IS model and Salmon's SR model) are intended to be reconstructions of. In the literature on this topic two classes of examples or applications figure prominently. First, there are examples drawn from quantum- mechanics (QM). Suppose, for example, a particle has a probability $p$ that is strictly between 0 and 1 of penetrating a potential barrier. Models of statistical explanation assume that if the particle does penetrate the barrier, QM explains this outcome—the IS and SR models are intended to capture the structure of such explanations. Second, there are examples drawn from biomedical (or epidemiological) and social scientific applications—recovery from strep or, to cite one of Salmon's extended illustrations (Salmon, 1971), the factors relevant to juvenile delinquency in teen-age boys.

This is, to say the least, a heterogeneous class of examples. In the case of QM, the usual understanding is that the various no-hidden variable results establish that any empirically adequate theory of quantum mechanical phenomena must be irreducibly indeterministic. It is thus plausible that when we use the Schrödinger equation to derive the probability that a particle with a certain kinetic energy will tunnel through a potential barrier of a certain shape, this representation satisfies the SR model's “objective homogeneity” condition—there are no additional omitted variables that would affect the probability of barrier penetration. By contrast, it seems quite unlikely that this homogeneity condition will be satisfied in most (indeed, in any) of the biomedical and sociological illustrations that have figured in the literature on statistical explanation. In the case of recovery from strep, for example, it is very plausible that there are many other factors besides the two mentioned above that affect the probability of recovery—these additional factors will include the state of the subject's immune system, various features of the subject's general level of health, the precise character of the strain of disease to which the subject is exposed (resistant versus non-resistant is almost certainly too coarse-grained a dichotomy) and so on. Similarly for episodes of juvenile delinquency. In these cases, in contrast to the cases from quantum mechanics, we lack a theory or body of results that delimits the factors that are potentially relevant to the probability of the outcome that interests us. Thus, in realistic examples of assemblages of statistically relevant factors from biomedicine and social science, the objective homogeneity condition is unlikely to be satisfied, or in any practical sense, satisfiable.

A related difference concerns the way in which statistical evidence figures in these two sorts of applications. Some quantum mechanical phenomena such as radioactive decay are irreducibly indeterministic. By contrast, in the biomedical and social scientific applications, while the relevant evidence is “statistical”, there is typically no corresponding assumption that the phenomena of interest are irreducibly indeterministic. This particularly clear in connection with the social scientific examples (such as risk factors for juvenile delinquency) that Salmon discusses. Here the relevant methodology involves so-called causal modeling or structural equation techniques. At least on the most straightforward way of applying such procedures, the equations that govern whether a particular individual becomes a juvenile delinquent are (if interpreted literally) deterministic. According to such approaches, the phenomena being modeled look as though they are indeterministic because some of the variables which are relevant to their behavior, the influence of which is summarized by a so-called error term, are unknown or unmeasured. Statistical information about the incidence of juvenile delinquency among individuals in various conditions plays the role of evidence that is used to estimate parameters (the coefficients) in the deterministic equations that are taken to describe the processes governing the onset of delinquency. A similar point holds for at least many biomedical examples.[8]

Several preliminary conclusions are suggested by these observations. First, it is far from obvious that we should try to construct a single, unified model of statistical explanation that applies to both quantum mechanics and macroscopic phenomena like delinquency or recovery from infection. Second, and relatedly, while explanation in QM satisfies the objective homogeneity condition, it is dubious that the sorts of “statistical explanations” found in the social and biomedical sciences do so. In other words, if an objective homogeneity condition is imposed on statistical explanation, it is not clear that there will be any examples of successful statistical explanation outside of quantum mechanics.

With these observations in mind, let us revisit the question of what is explained by statistical theories, whether quantum mechanical or macroscopic. As we have seen, both Hempel and Salmon, as well as most subsequent contributors to the literature on statistical explanation, have tended to assume that statistical theories that assign a probability to some outcome strictly between 0 and 1 should nonetheless be interpreted as explaining that outcome. Given this common starting point, Salmon is quite persuasive in arguing that it is arbitrary to hold, as Hempel does, that only individual outcomes with high probability can be explained. But why should we accept the starting point? Why not take Salmon's argument instead to be a reason for rejecting the idea that statistical theories explain individual outcomes, whether of high or low probability? If we take this view, we need not conclude that a theory like QM is unexplanatory. Instead, we may take the explananda of QM to be facts about the probabilities or expectation values of outcomes rather than individual outcomes themselves. On this view, the explananda that are explained by QM are a (proper) subset of those that can be derived from it—at least in this respect, the explanations provided by QM are like DS explanations in structure. Woodward (1989) argues that this construal allows us to say all that we might legitimately wish to say about the explanatory virtues of QM. If this is correct, there is no obvious need for a separate theory of statistical explanation of individual outcomes of the sort that Hempel and Salmon sought to devise (But see footnote 7).

In the case of juvenile delinquency and causal modeling techniques it is, if anything, even more intuitive that what is being explained is not, e.g. why some particular boy, Albert, became a juvenile delinquent, but rather something more general—e.g., why the expected incidence of delinquency is higher among certain subgroups than others. Again such explananda are deducible from the system of equations used to model juvenile delinquency. Taking this view of what is explained by statistical theories allows us to avoid various unintuitive consequences of Hempel's model (e.g., that high probability but not low probability outcomes are explained) and of Salmon's model (e.g., the same explanans $E$ explains both $M$ and $-M$. At the very least, those who have sought to construct models of statistical explanation of individual outcomes need to provide a more detailed elucidation of why such models are needed and of the features of scientific theorizing they are designed to capture.[9]

3.4 Causation and Statistical Relevance Relationships

As we have just seen, the SR model raises a number of interesting questions about the statistical explanation of individual outcomes—questions that are important independently of the details of the SR model itself. This section will abstract away from such questions and focus instead on the root motivation for the SR model. We may take this to consist of two ideas: (i) explanations must cite causal relationships and (ii) causal relationships are captured by statistical relevance relationships. Even if (i) is accepted, a fundamental problem with the SR model is that (ii) is false—as a substantial body of work[10] has made clear, casual relationships are greatly underdetermined by statistical relevance relationships. Consider another example from Salmon (1971): a system in which atmospheric pressure $A$ is a common cause of the occurrence of a storm $S$ and the reading of a barometer $B$ with no causal relationship between $B$ and $S$. Salmon claims that in such a system $B$ and $S$ will be correlated but that $B$ is statistically irrelevant to $S$ given $A$—i.e. $P(S \mid| A.B) = P(S \mid A)$. By contrast, (Salmon claims) $A$ remains relevant to $S$ given $B$—i.e., $P(S \mid A.B) \ne P(S \mid B)$. Similarly, $S$ is irrelevant to $B$ given $A$ but $A$ remains relevant $B$ given $S$. In this way, Salmon's SR model attempts to capture the idea that $A$ is explanatorily (and causally) relevant to $S$ while $B$ is not and that $A$ is explanatorily and causally relevant to $B$ while $S$ is not.

These contentions about the connection between causal claims and statistical relevance relations are consequences of a more general principle called the Causal Markov condition which has been extensively discussed in the recent literature on causation.[11] A set of variables standing in a causal relationship and an associated probability distribution over those variables satisfy the Causal Markov condition if and only if conditional on its direct causes every variable is independent of every other variable except possibly for its effects. Two relevant points have emerged from discussion of this condition. The first, which was in effect noted by Salmon himself in work subsequent to his (1971), is that there are circumstances in which the Causal Markov condition fails and hence in which causal claims do not imply the screening off relationships described above. This can happen, for example, if the variables to which the condition is applied are characterized in an insufficiently fine-grained way.[12] The second and more fundamental observation is that, depending on the details of the case, many different sets of causal relationships may be compatible with the same statistical relevance relationships, even assuming that the Causal Markov condition is satisfied. For example, a structure in which $B$ causes $A$ which in turn causes $S$ will, if we assume the Causal Markov condition (that is, make assumptions like Salmon's connecting causation and statistical relevance relationships), lead to exactly the same statistical relevance relationships as in the example in which $A$ is a common cause of $B$ and $S$. Similarly if $S$ causes $A$ which in turn causes $B$. In structures with more variables, this underdetermination of causal relationships by statistical relevance relationships may be far more extreme. Thus a list of statistical relevance relationships, which is what the SR model provides, need not tell us which causal relationships are operative. To the extent that explanation has to do with the identification of the causal relationships on which an explanandum-outcome depends, the SR model fails to fully capture these.

Selected Readings. Salmon, 1971a provides a detailed statement and defense of the SR model. This essay, as well as papers by Jeffrey (1969) and Greeno (1970) which defend views broadly similar to the SR model, are collected in Salmon, 1971b. Additional discussion of the model as well as a more recent characterization of “objective homogeneity” can be found in Salmon, 1984. Cartwright, 1979 contains some influential criticisms of the SR model. Theorems specifying the precise extent of the underdetermination of causal claims by evidence about statistical relevance relationships can be found in Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines, 1993, 2000, chapter 4.

4. The Causal Mechanical Model

4.1 The Basic Idea

In more recent work (especially, Salmon, 1984) Salmon abandoned the attempt to characterize explanation or causal relationships in purely statistical terms. Instead, he developed a new account which he called the Causal Mechanical (CM) model of explanation—an account which is similar in both content and spirit to so-called process theories of causation of the sort defended by philosophers like Philip Dowe (2000). We may think of the CM model as an attempt to capture the “something more” involved in causal and explanatory relationships over and above facts about statistical relevance, again while attempting to remain within a broadly Humean framework.

The CM model employs several central ideas. A causal process is a physical process, like the movement of a baseball through space, that is characterized by the ability to transmit a mark in a continuous way. (“Continuous” generally, although perhaps not always, means “spatio-temporally continuous”.) Intuitively, a mark is some local modification to the structure of a process—for example, a scuff on the surface of a baseball or a dent an automobile fender. A process is capable of transmitting a mark if, once the mark is introduced at one spatio-temporal location, it will persist to other spatio-temporal locations even in the absence of any further interaction. In this sense the baseball will transmit the scuff mark from one location to another. Similarly, a moving automobile is a causal process because a mark in the form of a dent in a fender will be transmitted by this process from one spatio-temporal location to another. Causal processes contrast with pseudo-processes which lack the ability to transmit marks. An example is the shadow of a moving physical object. The intuitive idea is that, if we try to mark the shadow by modifying its shape at one point (for example, by altering a light source or introducing a second occluding object), this modification will not persist unless we continually intervene to maintain it as the shadow occupies successive spatio-temporal positions. In other words, the modification will not be transmitted by the structure of the shadow itself, as it would in the case of a genuine causal process.

We should note for future reference that, as characterized by Salmon, the ability to transmit a mark is clearly a counterfactual notion, in several senses. To begin with, a process may be a causal process even if it does not in fact transmit any mark, as long as it is true that if it were appropriately marked, it would transmit the mark. Moreover, the notion of marking itself involves a counterfactual contrast—a contrast between how a process behaves when marked and how it would behave if left unmarked. Although Salmon, like Hempel, has always been suspicious of counterfactuals, his view at the time that he first introduced the CM model was that the counterfactuals involved in the characterization of mark transmission were relatively unproblematic, in part because they seemed experimentally testable in a fairly direct way. Nonetheless the reliance of the CM model, as originally formulated, on counterfactuals shows that it does not completely satisfy the Humean strictures described above. In subsequent work, described in Section 4.4 below, Salmon attempted to construct a version of the CM model that completely avoids reliance on counterfactuals.

The other major element in Salmon's model is the notion of a causal interaction. A casual interaction involves a spatio-temporal intersection between two causal processes which modifies the structure of both—each process comes to have features it would not have had in the absence of the interaction. A collision between two cars that dents both is a paradigmatic causal interaction.

According to the CM model, an explanation of some event $E$ will trace the causal processes and interactions leading up to $E$ (Salmon calls this the etiological aspect of the explanation), or at least some portion of these, as well as describing the processes and interactions that make up the event itself (the constitutive aspect of explanation). In this way, the explanation shows how $E$ “fit[s] into a causal nexus”(1984, p.9).

The suggestion that explanation involves “fitting” an explanandum into a causal nexus does not give us any very precise characterization of what the relationship between $E$ and other causal processes and interactions must be if information about the latter is to explain $E$. Nonetheless, it seems clear enough how the intuitive idea is meant to apply to specific examples. Suppose that a cue ball, set in motion by the impact of a cue stick, strikes a stationary eight ball with the result that the eight ball is put in motion and the cue ball changes direction. The impact of the stick also transmits some blue chalk to the cue ball which is then transferred to the eight ball on impact. The cue stick, the cue ball, and the eight ball are causal processes, as is shown by the transmission of the chalk mark, and the collision of the cue stick with the cue ball and the collision of the cue and eight balls are causal interactions. Salmon's idea is that citing such facts about processes and interactions explains the motion of the balls after the collision; by contrast, if one of these balls casts a shadow that moves across the other, this will be causally and explanatorily irrelevant to its subsequent motion since the shadow is a pseudo-process.

4.2 The CM Model and Explanatory Relevance

As the cue ball example illustrates, the CM model takes as its paradigms of causal interaction examples such as collisions in which there is “action by contact” and no spatio-temporal gaps in the transmission of causal influence. There is little doubt that explanations in which there are no such gaps (no “action at a distance”) often strike us as particularly satisfying.[13] However, as Christopher Hitchcock shows in an illuminating paper (Hitchcock, 1995), even here the CM model leaves out something important. Consider the usual elementary textbook “scientific explanation” of the motion of the balls in the above example following their collision. This explanation proceeds by deriving that motion from information about their masses and velocity before the collision, the assumption that the collision is perfectly elastic, and the law of the conservation of linear momentum. We usually think of the information conveyed by this derivation as showing that it is the mass and velocity of the balls, rather than, say, their color or the presence of the blue chalk mark, that is explanatorily relevant to their subsequent motion. However, it is hard to see what in the CM model allows us to pick out the linear momentum of the balls, as opposed to these other features, as explanatorily relevant. Part of the difficulty is that to express such relatively fine-grained judgments of explanatory relevance (that it is linear momentum rather than chalk marks that matters) we need to talk about relationships between properties or magnitudes and it is not clear how to express such judgments in terms of facts about causal processes and interactions. Both the linear momentum and the chalk mark communicated to the cue ball by the cue stick are marks transmitted by the spatio-temporally continuous causal process consisting of the motion of the cue ball. Both marks are then transmitted via an interaction to the eight ball. There appears to be nothing in Salmon's notion of mark transmission or the notion of a causal process that allows one to distinguish between the explanatorily relevant momentum and the explanatorily irrelevant blue chalk mark.

Ironically, as Hitchcock goes on to note, a similar observation may be made about the birth control pills example (2.5.2) originally devised by Salmon to illustrate the failure of the DN model to capture the notion of explanatory relevance. Spatio-temporally continuous causal processes that transmit marks as well as causal interactions are at work when male Mr. Jones ingests birth control pills—the pills dissolve, components enter his bloodstream, are metabolized or processed in some way, and so on. Similarly, spatio-temporally continuous causal processes (albeit different processes) are at work when female Ms. Jones takes birth control pills. However, the pills are irrelevant to Mr. Jones non-pregnancy, and relevant to Ms. Jones' non-pregnancy. Again, it looks as though the relevance or irrelevance of the birth control pills to Mr. or Ms. Jones' failure to become pregnant cannot be captured just by asking whether the processes leading up to these outcomes are causal processes in Salmon's sense. A similar point holds for the hexed salt example (2.6.3)—there are a spatio-temporally continuous causal processes running from the witch's wand that touches the salt sample to the individual Na and Cl ions formed when the salt dissolves but this is not sufficient for the hexing to be causally (or explanatorily) relevant to the dissolving.

A more general way of putting the problem revealed by these examples is that those features of a process $P$ in virtue of which it qualifies as a causal process (ability to transmit mark $M$) may not be the features of $P$ that are causally or explanatorily relevant to the outcome $E$ that we want to explain ($M$ may be irrelevant to $E$ with some other property $R$ of $P$ being the property which is causally relevant to $E$). So while mark transmission may well be a criterion that correctly distinguishes between causal processes and pseudo-processes, it does not, as it stands, provide the resources for distinguishing those features or properties of a causal process that are causally or explanatorily relevant to an outcome and those features that are irrelevant.

4.3 The CM Model and Complex Systems

A second set of worries has to do with the application of the CM model to systems which depart in various respects from simple physical paradigms such as the collision described above. There are a number of examples of such systems. First, there are theories like Newtonian gravitational theory which involve “action at a distance” in a physically interesting sense. Second, there are a number of examples from the literature on causation that do not involve physically interesting forms of action at a distance but which arguably involve causal interactions without intervening spatio-temporally continuous processes or transfer of energy and momentum from cause to effect. These include cases of causation by omission and causation by “double prevention” or “disconnection.”[14] In all these cases, a literal application of the CM model seems to yield the judgment that no explanation has been provided—that Newtonian gravitational theory is unexplanatory and so on. Many philosophers have been reluctant to accept this assessment.

Yet another class of examples that raise problems for the CM model involves putative explanations of the behavior of complex or “higher level” systems—explanations that do not explicitly cite spatio-temporally continuous causal processes involving transfer of energy and momentum, even though we may think that such processes are at work at a more “underlying” level. Most explanations in disciplines like biology, psychology and economics fall under this description, as do a number of straightforwardly physical explanations.

As an illustration, suppose that a mole of gas is confined to a container of volume $V_1$, at pressure $P_1$, and temperature $T_1$. The gas is then allowed to expand isothermally into a larger container of volume $V_2$. One standard way of explaining the behavior of the gas—its rate of diffusion and its subsequent equilibrium pressure $P_2$—appeals to the generalizations of phenomenological thermodynamics—e.g., the ideal gas law, Graham's law of diffusion, and so on. Salmon appears to regard putative explanations based on at least the first of these generalizations as not explanatory because they do not trace continuous causal processes—he thinks of the individual molecules as causal processes but not the gas as a whole.[15] However, it is plainly impossible to trace the causal processes and interactions represented by each of the $6 \times 10^{23}$ molecules making up the gas and the successive interactions (collisions) it undergoes with every other molecule. The usual statistical mechanical treatment, which Salmon presumably would regard as explanatory, does not attempt to do this. Instead, it makes certain general assumptions about the distribution of molecular velocities and the forces involved in molecular collisions and then uses these, in conjunction with the laws of mechanics, to derive and solve a differential equation (the Boltzmann transport equation) describing the overall behavior of the gas. This treatment abstracts radically from the details of the causal processes involving particular individual molecules and instead focuses on identifying higher level variables that aggregate over many individual causal processes and that figure in general patterns that govern the behavior of the gas.

This example raises a number of questions. Just what does the CM model require in the case of complex systems in which we cannot trace individual causal processes, at least at a fine-grained level? How exactly does the causal mechanical model avoid the (disastrous) conclusion that any successful explanation of the behavior of the gas must trace the trajectories of individual molecules? Does the statistical mechanical explanation described above successfully trace causal processes and interactions or specify a causal mechanism in the sense demanded by the CM model, and if so, what exactly does tracing causal processes and interactions involve or amount to in connection with such a system? As matters now stand both the CM model and the process theories of causation that are its more recent descendants are incomplete.

There is another aspect of this example that is worthy of comment. Even if, per impossible, an account that traced individual molecular trajectories were to be produced, there are important respects in which it would not provide the sort of explanation of the macroscopic behavior of the gas that we are likely to be looking for—and not just because such an account would be far too complex to be followed by a human mind. There are a very large number of different possible trajectories of the individual molecules in addition to the trajectories actually taken that would produce the macroscopic outcome—the final pressure $P_2$—that we want to explain. This information is certainly explanatorily relevant to the macroscopic behavior of the gas and we would like our account of explanation to accommodate this fact. Very roughly, given the laws governing molecular collisions, one can show that almost all (i.e., all except a set of measure zero) of the possible initial positions and momenta consistent with the initial macroscopic state of the gas, as characterized by $P_1$, $T_1$, and $V_1$, will lead to molecular trajectories such that the gas will evolve to the macroscopic outcome in which the gas diffuses to an equilibrium state of uniform density through the chamber at pressure $P_2$. Similarly, there is a large range of different microstates of the gas compatible with each of the various other possible values for the temperature of the gas and each of these states will lead to a different final pressure $P_{2^*}$. If we just trace the causal processes (in the form of actual molecular trajectories) that lead to $P_2$, as the CM model requires, we will fail to represent or capture this information about the full range of conditions under which $P_2$ and alternatives to it will occur.

A similar point holds for explanations of the behavior of other sorts of complex systems, such as those studied in biology and economics. Consider the standard explanation, in terms of an upward shift of the supply curve, with an unchanged demand curve, for the increase in the price of oranges following a freeze. Underlying the behavior of this market are individual spatio-temporally continuous causal processes and interactions in Salmon's sense—there are a myriad of individual transactions in which money in some form is exchanged for physical goods, all of which involve transfers of matter or energy, there is exchange of information about intentions or commitments to buy or sell at various prices, all of which must take place in some physical medium and involve transfers of energy, and so on. However, it also seems plain that producing a full description of these processes (supposing for the sake of argument that it was possible to do this) will produce little or no insight into why these systems behave as they do. Again, this is not just because any such “explanation” will overwhelm our information processing abilities. It is also the case that a great deal of the information contained in such a description will be irrelevant to the behavior we are trying to explain, for the same reason that a detailed description of the individual molecular trajectories will contain information that is irrelevant to the behavior of the gas. For example, while the detailed description of the individual causal processes involved in the operation of the market for oranges presumably will describe whether individual consumers purchase oranges by cash, check, or credit card, whether information about the freeze is communicated by telephone or email, and so on, all of this is to a first approximation irrelevant to the equilibrium price—given the supply and demand curves, the equilibrium price will be the same as long as there is a market in which consumers are able to purchase oranges by some means, information about the freeze and about prices is available to buyers and sellers in some form, and so on.[16] Moreover, those factors that are explanatorily relevant to the equilibrium price, such as the shape of the demand and supply curves, are not in any obvious sense themselves connected by spatio-temporally continuous processes to the price (it is unclear what this claim even means), although as emphasized above, the unknown processes underlying the attainment of equilibrium are presumably spatio-temporally continuous.

Again the issue is how an account like Salmon's can capture this feature of successful explanation of the behavior of complex systems—how the account guides us to find the “right” level of description of the phenomena we are trying to explain. In fact, as the above examples illustrate, the requirements that Salmon imposes on causal processes-and in particular the requirement of spatio-temporal continuity—often seem to lead us away from the right level of description. The level at which the spatio-temporal continuity constraint is most obviously respected (the level at which, e.g., we describe a particular consumer as exchanging cash for oranges or a grower as making an agreement via telephone with a retailer to sell at a certain price) seems to be the wrong level for achieving understanding.

4.4 More Recent Developments

In more recent work (e.g., Salmon, 1994), prompted in part by a desire to avoid certain counterexamples advanced by Philip Kitcher (Kitcher, 1989) to his characterization of mark transmission, Salmon attempted to fashion a theory of causal explanation that completely avoids any appeal to counterfactuals. In this new theory which is influenced by the conserved process theory of causation of Dowe (Dowe, 2000), Salmon defined a causal process as a process that transmits a non-zero amount of a conserved quantity at each moment in its history. Conserved quantities are quantities so characterized in physics—linear momentum, angular momentum, charge, and so on. A causal interaction is an intersection of world lines associated with causal processes involving exchange of a conserved quantity. Finally, a process transmits a conserved quantity from $A$ to $B$ if it possesses that quantity at every stage without any interactions that involve an exchange of that quantity in the half-open interval $(A, B]$.

One may doubt that this new theory really avoids reliance on counterfactuals, but an even more fundamental difficulty is that it still does not adequately deal with the problem of causal or explanatory relevance described above. That is, we still face the problem that the feature that makes a process causal (transmission of some conserved quantity or other) may tell us little about which features of the process are causally or explanatorily relevant to the outcome we want to explain. For example, a moving billiard ball will transmit many conserved quantities (linear momentum, angular momentum, charge etc.) and many of these may be exchanged during a collision with another ball. What is it that entitles us to single out the linear momentum of the balls, rather than these other conserved quantities as the property that is causally relevant to their subsequent motion? In cases in which there appear to be no conservation laws governing the explanatorily relevant property (i.e., cases in which the explanatorily relevant variables are not conserved quantities) this difficulty seems even more acute. Properties like “having ingested birth control pills,” “being pregnant”, or “being a sample of hexed salt” do not themselves figure in conservation laws. While one may say that both birth control pills and hexed salt are causal processes because both consist, at some underlying level, of processes that unambiguously involve the transmission of conserved quantities like mass and charge, this observation does not by itself tell us what, if anything, about these underlying processes is relevant to pregnancy or dissolution in water.

In a still more recent paper (Salmon, 1997), Salmon conceded this point. He agreed that the notion of a causal process cannot by itself capture the notion of causal and explanatory relevance. He suggested, however, that this notion can be adequately captured by appealing to the notion of a causal process and information about statistical relevance relationships (that is, information about conditional and unconditional (in)dependence relationships), with the latter capturing the element of causal or explanatory dependence that was missing from his previous account:

I would now say that (1) statistical relevance relations, in the absence of information about connecting causal processes, lack explanatory import and that (2) connecting causal processes, in the absence of statistical relevance relations, also lack explanatory import. (1997, p.476)

This suggestion is not developed in any detail in Salmon's paper, and it is not easy to see how it can be made to work. We noted above that statistical relevance relationships often greatly underdetermine the causal relationships among a set of variables. What reason is there to suppose that appealing to the notion of a causal process, in Salmon's sense, will always or even usually remove this indeterminacy? We also noted that the notion of a causal process cannot capture fine grained notions of relevance between properties, that there can be causal relevance between properties instances of which (at least at the level of description at which they are characterized) are not linked by spatio-temporally continuous or transference of conserved quantities, and that properties can be so linked without being causally relevant (recall the chalk mark that is transmitted from one billiard ball to another). As long as it is possible (and why should it not be?) for different causal claims to imply the same facts about statistical relevance relationships and for these claims to differ in ways that cannot be fully cashed out in terms of Salmon's notions of causal processes and interactions, this new proposal will fail as well.

Selected Readings: Salmon, 1984 provides a detailed statement of the Causal Mechanical model, as originally formulated. Salmon, 1994 and 1997 provide a restatement of the model and respond to criticisms. For discussion and criticism of the CM model, see Kitcher, 1989, especially pp. 461ff, Woodward, 1989 and Hitchcock, 1995.

5. A Unificationist Account of Explanation.

5.1 The Basic Idea

The basic idea of the unificationist account is that scientific explanation is a matter of providing a unified account of a range of different phenomena. This idea is unquestionably intuitively appealing. Successful unification may exhibit connections or relationships between phenomena previously thought to be unrelated and this seems to be something that we expect good explanations to do. Moreover, theory unification has clearly played an important role in science. Paradigmatic examples include Newton's unification of terrestrial and celestial theories of motion and Maxwell's unification of electricity and magnetism. The key question, however, is whether our intuitive notion (or notions) of unification can be made more precise in a way that allows us to recover the features that we think that good explanations should possess.

Michael Friedman (1974) is an important early attempt to do this. Friedman's formulation of the unificationist idea was subsequently shown to suffer from various technical problems (Kitcher, 1976) and subsequent development of the unificationist treatment of explanation has been most associated closely with Philip Kitcher (especially Kitcher, 1989).

Let us begin by introducing some of Kitcher's technical vocabulary. A schematic sentence is a sentence in which some of the nonlogical vocabulary has been replaced by dummy letters. To use Kitcher's examples, the sentence “Organisms homozygous for the sickling allele develop sickle cell anemia” is associated with a number of schematic sentences including “Organisms homozygous for $A$ develop $P$” and “For all $X$ if $X$ is $O$ and $A$ then $X$ is $P$”. Filling instructions are directions that specify how to fill in the dummy letters in schematic sentences. For example, filling instructions might tell us to replace $A$ with the name of an allele and $P$ with the name of a phenotypic trait in the first of the above schematic sentences. Schematic arguments are sequences of schematic sentences. Classifications describe which sentences in schematic arguments are premises and conclusions and what rules of inference are used. An argument pattern is an ordered triple consisting of a schematic argument, a set of sets of filling instructions, one for each term of the schematic argument, and a classification of the schematic argument. The more restrictions an argument pattern imposes on the arguments that instantiate it, the more stringent it is said to be.

Roughly speaking, Kitcher's guiding idea is that explanation is a matter of deriving descriptions of many different phenomena by using as few and as stringent argument patterns as possible over and over again-the fewer the patterns used, the more stringent they are, and the greater the range of different conclusions derived, the more unified our explanations. Kitcher summarizes this view as follows:

Science advances our understanding of nature by showing us how to derive descriptions of many phenomena, using the same pattern of derivation again and again, and in demonstrating this, it teaches us how to reduce the number of facts we have to accept as ultimate. (p.423).

Kitcher does not propose a completely general theory of how the various considerations he describes—number of conclusions, number of patterns and stringency of patterns—are to be traded off against one another, but does suggest that it often will be clear enough what these considerations imply about the evaluation of particular candidate explanations. His basic strategy is to attempt to show that the derivations we regard as good or acceptable explanations are instances of patterns that taken together score better according to the criteria just described than the patterns instantiated by the derivations we regard as defective explanations. Following Kitcher, let us define the explanatory store $E(K)$ as the set of argument patterns that maximally unifies $K$, the set of beliefs accepted at a particular time in science. Showing that a particular derivation is a good or acceptable explanation is then a matter of showing that it belongs to the explanatory store.

5.2 Illustrations of the Unificationist Model

As an illustration, consider Kitcher's treatment of the problem of explanatory asymmetries (recall Section 2.5). Our present explanatory practices—call these $P$—are committed to the idea that derivations of a flagpole's height from the length of its shadow are not explanatory. Kitcher compares $P$ with an alternative systemization in which such derivations are regarded as explanatory. According to Kitcher, $P$ includes the use of a single “origin and development” (OD) pattern of explanation, according to which the dimensions of objects-artifacts, mountains, stars, organisms etc. are traced to “the conditions under which the object originated and the modifications it has subsequently undergone” (1989, p. 485). Now consider the consequences of adding to $P$ an additional pattern $S$ (the shadow pattern) which permits the derivation of the dimensions of objects from facts about their shadows. Since the OD pattern already permits the derivation of all facts about the dimensions of objects, the addition of the shadow pattern $S$ to $P$ will increase the number of argument patterns in $P$ and will not allow us to derive any new conclusions. On the other hand, if we were to drop OD from $P$ and replace it with the shadow pattern, we would have no net change in the number of patterns in $P$, but would be able to derive far fewer conclusions than we would with OD, since many objects do not have shadows (or enough shadows) from which to derive all of their dimensions. Thus OD belongs to the explanatory store, and the shadow pattern does not.

Kitcher's treatment of other familiar problem cases is similar. For example, he notes that we believe that an explanation of why some sample of salt dissolves in water that appeals to the fact that the salt is hexed and the generalization $(H)$ that all hexed salt dissolves in water is defective, at least in comparison with the standard explanation that appeals just to the generalization that $(D)$ all salt dissolves in water. He suggests that the “basis for this belief” is that the derivation that appeals to $(H)$ instantiates an argument pattern that belongs to a totality of patterns that is less unifying than the totality containing the derivation that appeals to $(D)$. In particular, an explanatory store containing $(H)$ but not $(D)$ will have a more restricted consequence set than a store containing $(D)$ but not $(H)$, since the latter but not the former allows for the derivation of facts about the dissolving of unhexed salt in water. And the addition of $(H)$ to an explanatory store containing $(D)$ will increase the number of patterns without any compensating gain in what can be derived.

Kitcher acknowledges that there is nothing in the unificationist account per se that requires that all explanation be deductive: “there is no bar in principle to the use of non-deductive arguments in the systemization of our beliefs”. Nonetheless, “the task of comparing the unifying power of different systemizations looks even more formidable if nondeductive arguments are considered” and in part for this reason Kitcher endorses the view that “in a certain sense, all explanation is deductive” (p.448).

What is the role of causation on this account? Kitcher claims that “the ‘because’ of causation is always derivative from the ‘because’ of explanation.” (1989, p.477). That is, our causal judgments simply reflect the explanatory relationships that fall out of our (or our intellectual ancestors') attempts to construct unified theories of nature. There is no independent causal order over and above this which our explanations must capture. Like many other philosophers, Kitcher takes very seriously, even if in the end he perhaps does not fully endorse, standard empiricist or Humean worries about the epistemic accessibility and intelligibility of causal claims. Taking causal, counterfactual or other notions belonging to the same family as primitive in the theory of explanation is problematic. Kitcher believes that it is a virtue of his theory that it does not do this. Instead, Kitcher proposes to begin with the notion of explanatory unification, characterized in terms of constraints on deductive systemizations, where these constraints can be specified in a quite general way that is independent of causal or counterfactual notions, and then show how the causal claims we accept derive from our efforts at unification.

5.3 The Illustrations Criticized

As remarked at the beginning of this section, the idea that explanation is connected in some way to unification is intuitively appealing. Nonetheless Kitcher's particular way of cashing out this connection seems problematic. Consider Kitcher's treatment of the flagpole example. This depends heavily on the contingent truth that some objects do not cast enough shadows to recover all of their dimensions. But it seems to be part not just of common sense, but of currently accepted physical theory that it would be inappropriate to appeal to facts about the shadows cast by objects to explain their dimensions even in a world in which all objects cast enough shadows that all their dimensions could be recovered. It is unclear how Kitcher's account can recover this judgment.

The matter becomes clearer if we turn our attention to a variant example in which, unlike the shadow example, there are clearly just as many backwards derivations from effects to causes as there are derivations from causes to effects. Consider, following Barnes (1992), a time-symmetric theory like Newtonian mechanics, applied to a closed system like the solar system. Call derivations of the state of motion of planets at some future time $t$ from information about their present positions (at time $t_0$), masses, and velocities, the forces incident on them at $t_0$, and the laws of mechanics predictive. Now contrast such derivations with retrodictive derivations in which the present motions of the planets are derived from information about their future velocities and positions at $t$, the forces operative at $t$, and so on. It looks as though there will be just as many retrodictive derivations as predictive derivations, and each will require premises of exactly the same general sort—information about positions, velocities, masses etc. and the same laws. Thus the pattern or patterns instantiated by the retrodictive derivations look(s) exactly as unified as the pattern or patterns associated with the predictive derivations. However, we ordinarily think of the predictive derivations and not the retrodictive derivations as explanatory and the present state of the planets as the cause of their future state and not vice-versa. It is again far from obvious how considerations having to do with unification could generate such an explanatory asymmetry.

One possible response to this second example is to bite the bullet and to argue that from the point of view of fundamental physics, there really is no difference in the explanatory import of the retrodictive and predictive derivations, and that it is a virtue, not a defect, of the unificationist approach that it reproduces this judgment. Whatever might be said in favor of this response, it is not Kitcher's. His claim is that our ordinary judgments about causal asymmetries can be derived from the unificationist account. The example just described casts doubt on this claim. More generally, it casts doubt on Kitcher's contention that one can begin with the notion of explanatory unification, understood in a way that does not presuppose causal notions, and use it to derive the content of causal judgments.

5.4 The Heterogeneity of Unification

This conclusion is reinforced by a more general consideration: unification, as it figures in science is a quite heterogeneous notion, covering many different sorts of achievements.[17] Some kinds of unification consist in the creation of a common classificatory scheme or descriptive vocabulary where no satisfactory scheme previously existed, as when early investigators like Linnaeus constructed comprehensive and principled systems of biological classification. Another kind of unification involves the creation of a common mathematical framework or formalism which can be applied to many different sorts of phenomena, as when the systems of equations devised by Lagrange and Hamilton were first developed in connection with mechanics and then applied to domains like electromagnetism and thermodynamics. Still other cases involve what might be described as genuine physical unification, where phenomena previously regarded as having quite different causes or explanations are shown to be the result of a common set of mechanisms or causal relationships. Newton's demonstration that the orbits of the planets and the behavior of terrestrial objects falling freely near the surface of the earth are due to the same force of gravity and conform to the same laws of motion was a physical unification in this sense.

Of these three kinds of activities only the third—physical unification—seems to have much intuitively to do with explanation, at least if we think of explanation as involving the citing of causal relationships. In particular, depending on the details of the case, the kind of unification associated with adoption of a classificatory scheme may tell us little about causal relationships. Moreover, as historical studies have made clear, a similar point holds for formal or mathematical unification: the fact that we can construct a common mathematical framework for dealing with a range of different phenomena does not by any means automatically insure that we have identified some set of common causal factors responsible for those phenomena—i.e., that we have produced a unified physical explanation of them. For example, the mere fact that we can describe both the behavior of a system of gravitating masses and the operation of an electric circuit by means of Lagrange's equations does not mean that we have achieved a common explanation of the behavior of both or that we have “unified” gravitation and electricity in any physically interesting sense.

These considerations raise the following question: Is Kitcher's account of unification sufficiently discriminating or nuanced to distinguish those unifications having to do with explanation from other sorts of unification? The worry is that it is not. The conception of unification underlying Kitcher's account seems to be at bottom one of descriptive economy or information compression—deriving as much from as few patterns of inference as possible. Many cases of classificatory and purely formal unification involving a common mathematical framework seem to fit this characterization. Consider schemes for biological classification and schemes for the classification of geological and astronomical objects like rocks and stars. If I know that individuals belong to a certain classificatory category (e. g. $X$s are mammals or polar bears), I can use this information to derive a great many of their other properties ($X$s have backbones, hearts, their young are born alive etc.) and this is a pattern of inference that can be used repeatedly for many different sorts of $X$s. But despite the willingness of some philosophers to regard such derivations as explanatory, it is common scientific practice to regard such schemes as “merely descriptive” and as telling us little or nothing about the causes or mechanisms that explain why $X$s have backbones or hearts.[18]

Another illustration of the same general point is provided by the numerous statistical procedures (factor analysis, cluster analysis, multidimensional scaling techniques) that allow one to summarize or represent large bodies of statistical information in an economical, unified way and to derive more specific statistical facts from a much smaller set of assumptions by repeated use of the same pattern of argument. For example, knowing the “loading” of each of $n$ intelligence tests on a single common factor $g$, one can derive a much larger number $(n(n-1)/2)$ of conclusions about pairwise correlations among these tests. Again, however, it is doubtful that by itself this “unification” tells us anything about the causes of performance on these tests.

5.5 The Winner-Take-All Conception of Explanatory Unification

Another fundamental difficulty with the unificationist account derives from its reliance on what might be called a “winner take all” conception of unification. On the one hand, it seems that any plausible version of that account must yield the conclusion that generalizations and theories can sometimes be explanatory with respect to some set of phenomena even though more unifying explanations of those phenomena are known[19]. For example, Galileo's law can be used to explain facts about the behavior of falling bodies even though it furnishes a less unifying explanation than the laws of Newtonian mechanics and gravitational theory, the latter are in turn explanatory even though the explanations they provide are less unified than those provided by General Relativity, the theories of Coulomb and Ampere are explanatory even though the explanations they provide are less unified than the explanations provided by Maxwell's theory, and so on. If we reject this idea, we must adopt the conclusion that in any domain only the most unified theory that is known is explanatory at all; everything else is non-explanatory. Call this the winner-take-all conception of explanatory unification.

The winner-take-all conception gives up on the apparently very natural idea, which one would think that the unificationist would wish to endorse, that an explanation can provide less unification than some alternative, and hence be less deep or less good, but still qualify as somewhat explanatory. However, Kitcher's treatment of the problems of explanatory irrelevance and explanatory asymmetry seems to require just this conception. Why is it that we cannot appeal to the fact that this particular sample of salt has been hexed to explain why it dissolves? According to Kitcher, any explanatory store containing a generalization about the dissolving of hexed salt will be “less unified” than a competing explanatory store according to which the dissolving of the salt is explained by appeal to the generalization that all salt dissolves in water. Similarly, the reason why we cannot explain the height of a flagpole in terms of the length of its shadow is that explanations of lengths of objects in terms of facts about shadows do not belong to the “set of explanations” which “collectively provides the best systemization of our beliefs” (1989, p. 430). This analysis clearly requires the winner-take-all idea that an explanation $T_1$ that is less satisfactory from the point of view of unification than some competing alternative $T_2$ is unexplanatory, rather than merely less explanatory than $T_2$. If Kitcher were to reject the winner take all idea and hold instead that even if $T_2$ is more unified than $T_1$, it does not automatically follow that $T_1$ is unexplanatory, then his solution to the problems of explanatory irrelevance and asymmetry would no longer be available: his conclusion should be that an “explanation” of Mr. Jones' failure to get pregnant in terms of his ingestion of birth control pills is genuinely explanatory, although less so than the alternative explanation that invokes his gender, and similarly for a derivation of the height of a flagpole from the length of its shadow.

Intuitively, the problem is that we need a theory of explanation that captures several different possibilities. On the one hand, there are generalizations and associated putative explanations (like the generalization relating barometric pressure to the occurrence of storms and the generalization relating the hexing of salt to its dissolution in water) that are not explanatory at all; they fall below the threshold of explanatoriness. On the other hand, above this threshold there is something more like a continuum: a generalization can be explanatory but provide less deep or good explanations than some alternative. What we have just seen is that the unificationist account has difficulty simultaneously capturing both of these possibilities. Either there is no threshold (every derivation is explanatory to some extent and it is just that some derivations belong to systemizations that are less unifying and hence less explanatory than others) or else there is no continuum (only the most unifying systemizations are explanatory).

5.6 The Epistemology of Unification

Recall that, according to Kitcher, causal knowledge derives from our efforts at unification. However, as Kitcher also recognizes, it is highly implausible that most individuals deliberately and self-consciously go through the process of comparing competing deductive systemizations with respect to number and stringency of patterns and number of conclusions in order to determine which is most unifying. His response to this observation is to hold that most people acquire causal knowledge by absorbing the “lore” of their communities, where this lore does reflect previous systematic efforts at unification. He writes that “our everyday causal knowledge is based on our early absorption of the theoretical picture of the world bequeathed to us by our scientific tradition” (1989, p. 469)

How exactly is this suggestion supposed to work? While it is surely true that individual human beings acquire a substantial amount of causal knowledge by cultural transmission, it is also obvious that not all causal knowledge is acquired in this way. Some causal knowledge that individuals acquire involves learning from experience. Moreover, unless we are willing to make extremely implausible assumptions about the innateness of a large number of specific causal beliefs, the stock of socially transmitted causal knowledge must itself have been initially acquired in a way in which learning from experience played an important role. The question that then arises is how this process of learning from experience is supposed to work on a view like Kitcher's about the source of our causal knowledge. If, as Kitcher claims, “the idea that any one individual justifies the causal judgments that he/she makes by recognizing the patterns of argument that best unify his/her beliefs is clearly absurd” (1989, p. 436), just what is it that is going on at the individual level when people learn form experience? One possibility is that although individuals do not knowingly go through the process of comparing the degree of unification achieved by alternative systemizations when they acquire new causal knowledge by learning from experience, they go through this process tacitly or unconsciously, perhaps because of some general disposition of the mind to seek unification. However, Kitcher does not seem to endorse this idea and it does not fit very well with his emphasis on the social transmission of causal information. Moreover, it looks as though even unconscious unification requires very sophisticated cognitive abilities (construction and comparison of different deductive systemizations etc.) that it is implausible to attribute to many causal learners, such as small children.

One natural interpretation of the passages quoted above and others in Kitcher (1989) is this: a social process of comparing alternative systemizations of beliefs and drawing out their deductive consequences occurs at the community level, with groups of people making arguments to one another about which overall deductive systemizations best unify the beliefs of the community as a whole. Particular causal beliefs are justified at the community level by being shown to be part of the best overall systemization of the beliefs of the community, and are then passed on from the common community stock to individuals via a process of social transmission.

An obvious problem with this picture is that the community-wide process of justification must still be carried out in some fashion by individual actors. If, as appears to be the case, there are many societies which possess a substantial amount of causal and explanatory knowledge but in which no one possesses an explicit or clearly articulated concept of a deductively valid argument or is very skilled at drawing out the deductive consequences of beliefs or possesses explicit versions of Kitcher's concepts of number and stringency of argument patterns, how exactly are community beliefs that reflect the operation of these notions supposed to form? If, as Kitcher concedes, it is psychologically unrealistic to assume that individual human beings deliberately and self-consciously go through the process of comparing alternative systemizations when they acquire causal beliefs through experience, why is it any more realistic to suppose that this process somehow occurs through the interactions of individual actors at the community level[20]?

There is a second, related difficulty. Assume, for the sake of argument, that it is desirable to have a unified belief system in Kitcher's sense—whether because unification is connected to explanation and the latter is intrinsically valuable or because unification is connected to other goals (e.g., confirmation) that are desirable. It is still not obvious why it would be valuable to have a set of beliefs that are a smallish proper subset of the beliefs that comprise such a unified system, which is what most people seem to have, given Kitcher's views about the transmission of causal knowledge. Recall Kitcher's basic picture: when I acquire the belief that, say, whether salt is hexed is causally irrelevant to whether it dissolves and that whether it is placed in water is causally relevant, I acquire a fragment of the community's overall systemization $S$. But adding a fragment of $S$ or even a number of fragments of $S$ to my belief store may not result in my having a belief system that is unified, or that facilitates whatever epistemic goals are associated with unification. Of course if I end up adding all or most of $S$ to my belief store, I will have at that point a set of beliefs that is unified and that brings with it all of the benefits of unification. But, as Kitcher agrees, it is unrealistic to suppose that most people possess anything like the full systemization $S$ that best unifies all of the beliefs in their community. This seems to be true, for example, of our own epistemic community, in which knowledge—especially scientific knowledge—is highly dispersed among a small group of experts and in which no single person's mind (and still less the typical member's mind) contains or operates in accordance with the systemization that best unifies the beliefs of the entire community. More generally, it seems unlikely that the different portions $B_i$ of the community systemization $S$ that various individuals $i$ acquire by means of cultural transmission will be in each case highly unified systemizations. In short, it is a major problem with the cultural transmission story that it is hard to see how unification could be cognitively or practically valuable unless it characterizes the belief systems of individuals and not just the community. However, taking the sort of unification that Kitcher associates with causal and explanatory knowledge to characterize individual belief systems seems prima-facie psychologically unrealistic. This is not to say that there is no way of making sense of the acquisition of causal knowledge on the unificationist picture, but a great deal more needs to be said about how this works.

Selected Readings: The most detailed statement of Kitcher's position can be found in Kitcher, 1989. Salmon, 1989, pp. 94ff. contains a critical discussion of Friedman's version of the unificationist account of explanation but ends by advocating a “rapprochement” between unificationist approaches and Salmon's own causal mechanical model. Woodward, 2003, contains additional criticisms of Kitcher's version of unificationism.

6. Pragmatic Theories of Explanation

6.1 Introduction

Despite their many differences, the accounts of Hempel (focusing now on just the DN rather than the IS model), Salmon, Kitcher and others discussed above largely share a common overall conception of what the project of constructing a theory of explanation should involve and (to a considerable extent) what criteria such a theory should satisfy if it is to be successful. Lets us say that a theory of explanation contains “pragmatic” elements if (i) those elements require irreducible reference to facts about the interests, beliefs or other features of the psychology of those providing or receiving the explanation and/or (ii) irreducible reference to the “context” in which the explanation occurs. (For what this means, see below.) Although the writers discussed above agree that pragmatic elements play some role in the activity of giving and receiving explanations, they assume that there is a non-pragmatic core to the notion of explanation which it is the central task of a theory of explanation to capture. That is, it is assumed that this core notion can be specified in a way that does not require reference to features of the psychology of explainers or their audiences that and it can be characterized in terms of features that are non-contextual in the sense that they are sufficiently general, abstract and“structural”that we can view them as holding across a range of explanations with different contents and across a range of different contexts. Often, but not always, it is claimed that many aspects of these features can be captured formally, via relationships like deductive entailment or statistical relevance. In addition, these writers see the goal of a theory of explanation, as capturing the notion of a correct explanation, as in “the (or an) explanation of the photoelectric effect is such and such” as opposed to the notion of an explanation's being considered explanatory by a particular audience or not, a matter which presumably depends on such considerations as whether the audience understands the terms in which the explanation is framed. Finally, as noted in the Introduction to this entry, writers in this tradition have not had as their goal capturing all of various ways in which the word “explanation” is used in ordinary English. They have instead focused on a much more restricted class of examples in which what is of interest is (something like) explaining “why” some outcome or general phenomenon occurred, as opposed to explaining, e.g., the meaning of a word or how to solve a differential equation. The motivation for this restriction is simply the judgment that an interesting and non-trivial theory is more likely to emerge if it is restricted in scope in this way. For ease of reference, let us call this the “traditional” conception of the task of a theory of explanation.

Some or all of these assumptions and goals are rejected in pragmatic or as they are sometimes also called “contextual” accounts of explanation. Early contributors to this approach include Michael Scriven (e.g.,1962) and Sylvan Bromberger (e.g., 1966), with more systematic statements, due to van Fraassen (1980) and Achinstein (1983) appearing in the 1980s. Since it is not always clear just what the points of disagreement are between pragmatic and traditional accounts, some orienting remarks about this will be useful before turning to details. Defenders of pragmatic approaches to explanation typically stress the point that whether provision of a certain body of information to some audience produces understanding or a sense of intelligibility or is appropriate or illuminating for that audience depends on the background knowledge and interests of the audience members and on other factors having to do with the local context. For example, an explanation of the deflection of starlight by the sun that appeals to the field equations of General Relativity may be highly illuminating to a trained physicist but unintelligible to layperson because of his background. Factors of this sort are grouped together as “pragmatic” and their influence is taken to illustrate at least one way in which pragmatic considerations enter into the notion of explanation.

Taken in itself the observation just described seem completely uncontroversial and not in conflict with approaches to explanation that are usually viewed as paradigmatically traditional. Indeed,as remarked above writers like Hempel and Salmon explicitly agree that explanation has a pragmatic dimension in the sense just described—in fact, Hempel invokes the role of pragmatic factors at a number of points to address prima-facie counterexamples to the DN model[21]. This suggests that, often at least[22], what is distinctive about pragmatic approaches to explanation is not just the bare idea that explanation has a “pragmatic dimension” but rather the further and much stronger claim that that the traditional project of constructing a model of explanation pursued by Hempel and others has so far been unsuccessful ( and perhaps is bound to be unsuccessful) and that this is so because pragmatic or contextual factors play a central and ineliminable role in explanation in a way that resists incorporation into models of the traditional sort. On this view, much of what is distinctive about pragmatic accounts (including the accounts of van Fraassen and Achinstein discussed below) is their opposition to traditional accounts and their diagnosis of why accounts fail—they fail because they omit pragmatic or contextual elements. It will be important to keep this point in mind in what follows because there is a certain tendency among advocates of pragmatic theories to argue as though the superiority of their approach is established simply by the observation that explanation has a pragmatic dimension; instead it seems more appropriate to think that the real issue is whether traditional approaches are inadequate in principle because of their neglect of the pragmatic dimension of explanation.

A second issue concerns an important ambiguity in the notion of “pragmatic”. On one natural understanding of this notion, a pragmatic consideration is one that has to do with utility or usefulness in the service of some goal connected to human interests, where these interests are in some relevant sense “practical”. Call this notion “pragmatic1”. On this construal, Hempel's DN model might be correctly characterized as a pragmatic1 theory (or as containing pragmatic1 elements) since it links explanatory information closely to the provision of information that is useful for purposes of prediction and prediction certainly qualifies as a pragmatic goal. For similar reasons, Woodward's (2003) theory of explanation might also be counted as a pragmatic1 theory since it connects explanation with the provision of information that is useful for manipulation and control—unquestionably useful goals. As these examples suggest, models of explanation that aspire to traditional goals can be pragmatic1 theories.

In the context of theories of explanation, however, the label “pragmatic” is usually intended to suggest a somewhat different set of associations. In particular, “pragmatic” is typically used to characterize considerations having to do with facts about the psychology (interests, beliefs etc.) of those involved in providing or receiving explanations and/or to characterize considerations involving the local context, often with the suggestion that both sets of considerations may vary in complex and idiosyncratic ways that resist incorporation into the sort of general theory sort sought by traditional models.[23] Call this set of associations“pragmatic2”. Neither Hempel's nor Woodward's theory is pragmatic2 . In particular, as the example of the DN model illustrates, the fact that a theory is pragmatic1 in the sense that it appeals to facts about goals generally shared by human beings (such as prediction) to help to motivate a model of explanation does not preclude attempting to construct models of explanation satisfying traditional goals and does not require commitment to the idea that explanation must be understood as a pragmatic2 notion. We need to be careful to distinguish these two different ways of thinking about the “pragmatic” dimension of explanation.

Finally, as emphasized above, a concern with the pragmatics of explanation, naturally connects with an interest in the “psychology” of explanation, and this in turn suggests the relevance of empirical studies of sorts of information that various subjects (ordinary folks, scientists) find explanatory, treat as providing “understanding”, the distinctions subjects make among explanations and so on. Although there is a growing literature in this area, the most prominent philosophical advocates of pragmatic approaches to explanation have so far tended not to make use of it. In this connection, it is worth pointing out that this psychological literature goes well beyond the truisms found in philosophical discussion about different people finding different sorts of information explanatory depending on their interests. In particular, psychologists have been very interested in exploring general features or structural patterns present in information that various subjects find explanatory. For example, Lombrozo (2010) finds evidence that subjects prefer explanations that appeal to relationships that are relatively stable (in the sense of continuing to hold across changing circumstances[24]) and Lien and Cheng (2000) present evidence that in cases in which the explanandum $E$ has a single candidate cause $C$, subjects prefer levels of explanation/causal description that maximize $\Delta p = \text{Pr}(E \mid C) - \text{Pr}(E \mid \text{not-}C)$.

Notice that in both cases these are relationships or patterns of the sort that traditional accounts of explanation attempt to capture. As these examples bring out, there is no necessary incompatibility between the project of trying to formulate an account of explanation that satisfies traditional goals and an interest in the psychology of explanation. It may be that subjects find certain sorts of information explanatory or understanding-producing because certain structural features of the sort that traditional accounts attempt to characterize are present in that information—indeed this is what the Lombrozo and Lien and Cheng papers suggest.

In the same vein, we also should distinguish the general project of investigating the empirical psychology of explanation (which can be pursued with a variety of different commitments about best to theorize about explanation) from the more specific claim that the characterization of what it is for an explanatory relationship to hold between explanans and explanandum must be given in “psychologistic” terms in the sense that this requires irreducible reference to psychological facts about particular audiences such as the vagaries of what they happen to be interested in. In general, whether there are robust regularities connecting structural or objective features in bodies of information with whether that information is judged as explanatory by various subjects ought to be regarded as an empirical question and not as something that can settled from the armchair. It might be true that there are no such regularities and that what people find explanatory or productive of understanding varies enormously, depending on their interests and on other psychological factors, but this is something that needs to be shown, not assumed at the outset of investigation.

6.2 Constructive Empiricism and the Pragmatic Theory of Explanation

One of the most influential recent pragmatic accounts of explanation is associated with constructive empiricism. This is the thesis, defended by Bas van Fraassen in his 1980 book, The Scientific Image, that the aim of science (or at least “pure” science) is the construction of theories that are “empirically adequate” (that is, that yield a true or correct description of observables) and not, as scientific realists suppose, theories that aim to tell literally true stories about unobservables. Relatedly, “acceptance” of a theory involves only the belief that it is empirically adequate ( van Fraassen, 1980, p. 12). van Fraassen's account of explanation, which is laid out in several articles and, most fully, in Chapter Six of his (1980) is meant to fit with this overall conception of science: it is a conception according to which explanation per se is not an epistemic aim of “pure” science (empirical adequacy is the only such aim), but rather a “pragmatic” virtue, having to do with the “application” of science. (Note that to the extent that the application of science is taken to be a “pragmatic” (i.e., pragmatic1) matter and the idea that explanation is pragmatic in this respect is used to motivate the adoption of a pragmatic (i.e., pragmatic2) theory of explanation, we have a transition between the two notions of “pragmatic” distinguished above.) Because explanation is a merely pragmatic virtue, a concern with explanation is not something that can require scientists to move beyond belief in the empirical adequacy of their theories to belief in the literal truth of claims about unobservable entities.

According to van Fraassen, explanations are answers to questions and getting clear about the logic of questions is central to constructing a theory of explanation. Questions can take many different forms, but when the question of interest is a “why” question, explanatory queries will typically take the following form: a query about why some explanandum $P_k$ rather than any one of the members of a contrast $X$ (a set of possible alternatives to $P_k$) obtained. In addition, some “relevance relation” $R$ is assumed by the question. An answer $A$ to this question will take the form “$P_k$ in contrast to (the rest of) $X$ because $A$, where $A$ bears the relevance relation $R$ to $[P_k, X]$”. To use van Fraassen's example, consider “Why is this conductor warped?” Depending on the context, the intended contrast might have to with, e.g., why this particular conductor is warped in contrast to some other conductor that is unwarped or alternatively, it might have to do with why this particular conductor is warped now when it was previously unwarped. The relevance relation $R$ similarly depends on the context and the information which the questioner is interested in obtaining. For example, $R$ might involve causal information (the question might be a request for what caused the warping) but it also might have to do with information about function, if the context was one in which it is assumed that the shape of the conductor plays some functional role in a power station which the questioner wants to know about. Thus “context” enters into the explanation both by playing a role in specifying the contrast class $X$ and the relevance relation $R$. van Fraassen describes various rules for the “evaluation” of answers. For example, $P_k$ and $A$ must be true, the other members of the contrast class must not be true, $A$ must “favor” (raise the conditional probability of) $P_k$ against alternatives, and $A$ must compare favorably with other answers to the same question, a condition which itself has several aspects including, for example, whether $A$ favors the topic more than these other answers and whether $A$ is screened off by other answers. However, he also makes it clear (as the example above suggests) that a variety of different relevance relations may be appropriate depending on context and that the evaluation of answers also depends on context. Moreover, he explicitly denies that there is anything distinctive about the category of scientific explanation that has to do with its structure or form—instead, a scientific explanation is simply an explanation that makes use of information that is (or at least that is treated as) grounded in a “scientific” theory.

Van Fraassen sums up his view of explanation (and gestures at his grounds for rejecting objectivist approaches) as follows

The discussion of explanation went wrong at the very beginning when explanation was conceived of as a relation like description: a relation between a theory and a fact. Really, it is a three-term relation between theory, fact, and context. No wonder that no single relation between theory and fact ever managed to fit more than a few examples! Being an explanation is essentially relative for an explanation is an answer… it is evaluated vis-à-vis a question, which is a request for information. But exactly… what is requested differs from context to context. (1980, p. 156)

Van Fraassen begins his chapter on explanation with a brief story that provides a good point of entry into how he intends his account to work. Recall from section 2.5 that a well-known counterexample to the DN model involves the claim that one can explain the length $S$ of the shadow cast by a flagpole in terms of the height $H$ of the flagpole but that (supposedly) one cannot explain $H$ in terms of $S$, despite the fact that one can construct a DN derivation from $S$ to $H$. This is commonly taken to show that the DN model has left out some factor having to do with the directional or asymmetric features of explanation—e.g., perhaps an asymmetry in the relation between cause and effect that ought to incorporated into one's model of explanation. In van Fraassen's story, a straightforward causal explanation of the usual sort of $S$ in terms of $H$ (although the object in question is a tower rather than a flagpole) is first offered. Then a second explanation, according to which the height of the tower is “explained” by the fact that it was designed to cast a shadow of a certain length is advanced. Presumably the moral we are to draw is that as the context and perhaps the relevance relation $R$ are varied, both

\[ H \text{ explains } S \]

and

\[ S \text{ explains } H \]

are acceptable (legitimate, appropriate etc.) explanations. Moreover, since these variations in context and relevance relation turn on variations in what is of interest to the explainer and his audience, we are further encouraged to conclude that explanatory asymmetries have their source in psychological facts about people's interests and background beliefs, rather than in, say, some asymmetry that exits in nature independently of these. Pragmatists about explanation think that a similar conclusion holds for other features of the explanatory relevance relation that philosophers have tried to characterize in terms of traditional models of explanation.

One obvious response to this claim, made by several critics (e.g. Kitcher and Salmon, 1987, p. 317), is that the example does not really involve a case in which, depending on context, $H$ causally explains $S$ and $S$ causally explains $H$. Instead, although $H$ does causally explain in $S$, it is (something like) the desire for a shadow of length $S$ (rather than $S$ itself) that explains (or at least causally explains) the height (or the choice of height) for the tower. Or, if one prefers, in the latter case we are given something like a functional explanation (but not a causal explanation) for the height of the tower, in the sense that we are told what the intended function of that choice of height is. On either of these diagnoses, this will not be a case in which whether $H$ provides a causal explanation of $S$ or whether instead $S$ provides a causal explanation of $H$ shifts depending on factors having to do with the interests of the speaker or audience or other contextual factors. If so, the story about the tower does not show that the asymmetry present in the flagpole example must be accounted for in terms of pragmatic factors. It may be accounted for in some other way. In fact, although discussion must be beyond the scope of this essay, a number of possible candidates for such a non-pragmatic account of causal asymmetries have been proposed, both in philosophy and outside of it (for example, in the machine learning literature). These candidates include asymmetries in causal connectability of the sort described in Hausman (1998), statistical asymmetries of various sorts (e.g., Spirtes, Glymour, and Scheines, 2000) and asymmetries in informational dependence (e.g., Janzing, 2012) . All of these proposals may be wrong but it is hard to see how they are shown to be wrong just by the sorts of observations advanced by van Fraassen in the tower and shadow story. Instead showing they are wrong would require detailed critiques of the proposal themselves[25].

A much more general criticism has been advanced against van Fraassen's version of a pragmatic theory by Salmon and Kitcher (1987). Basically, their complaint is that the relevance relation $R$ in van Fraassen's account is completely unconstrained, with the (what they regard as the obviously unacceptable) consequence that for any pair of true propositions $P$ and $A$, answer $A$ is relevant to $P$ via some relevance relation and thus “explains” $P$. For example, according to Salmon and Kitcher, we might define a relationship of “astral influence” $R^*$, meeting van Fraassen's criteria for being a relevance relation, such that the time $t$ of a person's death is explained in terms of $R^*$ and the position of various heavenly bodies at $t$. Here it may seem that van Fraassen has a ready response. As noted above, on van Fraassen's view, background knowledge and, in the case of scientific explanation, current scientific knowledge, helps to determine which are the acceptable relevance relations and acceptable answers to the questions posed in requests for explanation—such knowledge and the expectations that go along with it are part of the relevant context when one asks for an explanation of time of death. Obviously, astral influence is not an acceptable or legitimate relevance relation according to modern science—hence appeal to such a relation is not countenanced as explanatory by van Fraassen's theory. More generally it might be argued that available scientific knowledge will provide constraints on the relevance relations and answers that exclude the “anything goes” worry raised by Salmon and Kitcher—at least insofar as the context is one in which a “scientific explanation” is sought.

While this response may seem plausible enough as far as it goes, it does bring out the extent to which much of the work of distinguishing the explanatory from the non-explanatory in Van Fraassen's account comes from a very general appeal to what is accepted as legitimate background information in current science. Put differently, this raises the worry that once one moves beyond van Fraassen's formal machinery concerning questions and answers (which van Fraassen himself acknowledges is relatively unconstraining), one is left with an account according to which a scientific explanation is simply any explanation employing claims from current science and a currently scientifically approved relevance relation. Even if otherwise unexceptionable, this proposal is, if not exactly trivial, at least rather deflationary—it provides much less than many have hoped for from a theory of explanation. In particular, in cases (of which there are many examples) in which there is an ongoing argument or dispute in some area of science not about whether some proposed theory or model is true but rather about whether it explains some phenomenon, it is not easy to see how the proposal even purports to provide guidance. On the other hand, the obvious rejoinder that might be made on van Fraassen's behalf is that no more ambitious treatment that would satisfy the expectations associated with more traditional accounts of explanation (including a demarcation of candidate explanations into those that are “correct” and “incorrect”) is possible—a theory like van Fraassen's is as good as it gets. If there is no defensible theory of explanation embodying a non-trivially constraining relevance relation, it cannot be a good criticism of van Fraassen's theory that he fails to provide this[26].

So at least from van Fraassen's perspective, traditional models are in no better position than his own in providing such guidance.

A final point that is suggested by van Fraassen's theory is this. In considering pragmatic theories, it matters a great deal exactly where the “pragmatic” elements are claimed to enter into the account of explanation. One point at which such considerations seem clearly to enter is in the selection or characterization of what an audience wants explained. This is reflected in van Fraassen's theory in the choice of a $P_k$ and an associated contrast class $X$. Obviously, whether we are looking for an explanation of why, say, this particular conductor is now bent when it was previously straight or whether instead we want to know why this conductor is bent while some other conductor is straight is a matter that depends on our interests. However, this particular sort of “interest relativity” (and associated phenomena having to do with the role of contrastive focus in the characterization of explananda, which really just serve to specify more exactly which particular explananda we want explained) seems something that can be readily acknowledged by traditional theories[27]. After all, it is not a threat to the DN or other models with similar traditional aspirations that one audience may be interested in an explanation of the photoelectric effect but not the deflection of starlight by the sun and another audience may have the opposite interests. What would be a threat to the DN and similar models would be an argument that once some explanandum $E$ is fully specified, whether explanans $M$ explains $E$ (that is, whether there is an explanatory relation between $M$ and $E$) is itself “interest-relative”. It is natural to interpret van Fraassen as making this latter claim, both in connection with explanatory asymmetries and more generally.

6.3 Explaining as an Illocutionary Act

Another very influential pragmatic account of explanation focuses on the act of explaining and treats this as an illocutionary act, in the sense in which that notion is used in speech act theory. The most systematic statement of this approach is due to Peter Achinstein (see especially, Achinstein, 1983). Like many other pragmatic theorists, Achinstein is interested in capturing a very broad notion of explanation, which includes not just causal explanations (and not just answers to why-questions), but such notions as explaining the meaning of word, the rules of chess, the function of some biological structure and so on. His account is much too complex to describe in full detail; all that can be attempted here is a very rough sketch,

Achinstein's point of departure is what is involved in someone's explaining something to another. According to Achinstein, in such episodes the intention of the person doing the explaining is crucial: in particular in explaining the explainer must have the intention to render something (roughly, a certain type of indirect question $q$ corresponding to the something explained) “understandable”. An explanation (understood as the product of an explaining act) is then defined as ordered pair, “one of whose members is an act type explaining $q$ [as above]… and whose other member is a proposition that provides an answer to the question $q$.” (2010, p. xi).For example, Newton's explanation of why the tides occur is represented by the ordered pair: (The tides occur because of the gravitational pull of the moon: explaining why the tides occur). Achinstein distinguishes between “correct” and “good” explanations. “A correct explanation is one in which the propositional member of the ordered pair is true” (2010, xi). A correct explanation may nonetheless not be a good one because, e.g., it is inappropriate in various ways to the abilities and interests of the audience to which it is directed. The notion of a good explanation is further characterized in terms of a set of instructions for explanation construction, where these instructions are sensitive to the interests, beliefs and so on of the audience. Such instructions might specify, e.g., that a causal explanation rather than some other kind of explanation is sought or that the explanation sought must make reference to micro-entities. A very important feature of Achinstein“pragmatic”s position is that there is no single universal set of instructions that is appropriate for all audiences and contexts, either in science or elsewhere. Thus traditional accounts that purport to provide such instructions are (in this respect) mistaken. Achinstein writes

Now let me offer a conjecture. Suppose, following in the footsteps of Hempel and Salmon, you formulate a set of objective, nonpragmatic criteria that you think all scientific explanations must satisfy to be evaluated highly. These criteria will be universal in the sense that they are not to vary from one explanation to the next, but are to be ones applicable to all scientific explanations. They are also universal in the sense that they are not to incorporate specific empirical assumptions or presuppositions that might be made by scientists in one field or context but not another. So they might include the use of laws, causal factors, and quantitative hypotheses, the satisfaction of some criterion of unification or simplicity, and so forth. My conjecture is that whatever set of objective, nonpragmatic, universal criteria you propose you will be able to find or construct counterexamples to it, but as a set of necessary conditions and as a set of sufficient conditions. (2010, p. 137)

Achinstein illustrates this claim with reference to Rutherford's 1911 explanation of alpha particle scattering. Rutherford's explanation appealed to assumptions about atomic structure—in particular, that the positive charge of an atom is concentrated in its nucleus whose volume is small in comparison with the total volume to the atom—to derive a quantitative expression for the magnitude of scattering at various angles. According to Achinstein, other competing explanations (e.g., an explanation which just gave the quantitative expression governing scattering but did not connect this to claims about atomic structure) can satisfy the various traditional criteria for explanatory goodness found in the philosophy of science literature (such explanations may have a DN structure, describe causes, be unifying etc.) but will nonetheless be less good than Rutherford's. Rutherford's explanation is good (or as good as it is) because it provides an explanation “at the subatomic level of matter in a way that physicists at the time were interested in explaining scattering” (2010, p. 136, italics in original). In other words, to explain the respects in which Rutherford's explanation is good (or better than competitors) we must make irreducible reference to the interests of physicists at the time. In this sense, Achinstein's account of “good explanation” is, as he says, “strongly pragmatic”. His “conjecture” nicely captures much (although perhaps not all)of what is at issue between pragmatic and traditional, not purely non-pragmatic accounts of explanation. The central issue is whether one can capture the respects in which Rutherford's explanation is better than alternatives in terms of an explanatory relation that can be specified independently of the interests of (and perhaps other psychological facts concerning) particular audiences and also independently of irreducibly “contextual” facts (such as the claim that in this case a good explanation requires reference to the subatomic level,but there is nothing more general to be said, independently of facts about people's interests, about why explanations at this level are preferable). A convincing argument for the second alternative would presumably need (at least) to examine the existing traditional accounts and show they are unsuccessful. This is a project Achinstein undertakes in his (1983)—unsurprisingly, judgments about whether he makes the case for the failure of objectivist accounts differ.

6.4 Concluding Reflections on Pragmatic Theories

So far we have been treating “pragmatic” and “traditional” accounts as diametrically opposed possibilities. This corresponds to how these accounts are usually presented, both by their defenders and detractors. However, it is worthwhile (and, provides additional insight into both approaches), to consider the possibility that some of the ideas associated with each might be combined, thus enlarging the space of possible approaches to explanation. First, we might distinguish the claim that explanation has irreducibly “contextual” elements from the claim that these contextual elements must be understood in terms of facts about the psychology (interests etc.) of the parties to the explanation. An alternative possibility is that explanation is indeed irreducibly contextual, but that these contextual elements should be understood non-psychologically—roughly in terms of the role of particular empirical facts in explanation, where the relevance of these facts resists capture by means of the resources employed in the DN and other traditional models (that is, it resists capture in terms of relationships, like deductive entailment, statistical relevance and so on.) A possible illustration is provided by Achinstein's own example of the explanation of the scattering of alpha particles in terms of facts about nuclear structure. As noted above, Achinstein himself thinks that in this case the goodness of the explanation is context-dependent because it depends on psychological facts: in particular, the goodness of the explanation reflects the fact that physicists are particularly “interested” in explanations appealing to nuclear structure. An alternative possibility is that the explanation has irreducibly “contextual”elements in the sense that there is something about the empirical details of this particular case that makes facts about nuclear structure explanatorily relevant to scattering but where this relevance cannot be fully captured in terms of terms of the abstract, structural features (Achinstein's “objective”, nonpragmatic, universal criteria) on which traditional models of explanation focus. Thus this possibility involves a non-psychological notion of “contextual” that contrasts with the idea that the explanatory relation can be specified in a “content-independent” way. To spell out this notion of content-independence consider the DN model. This model is content-independent in the sense that it claims that as long as a certain abstract structural relationship holds between explanans $(C_i, L_i)$ and explanandum $E$, it does not matter what specifically one fills in for $C_i$, $L_i$, and $E$—the resulting structure is an explanation. A contextualist about explanation in the non-psychological sense would claim instead that for whatever content-independent candidate for the explanatory relation that we specify (whether that specification is in terms of deductive or probabilistic relationships or anything else similarly formal and abstract or with similar aspirations to universality) there will be examples instantiating this structure that are explanatory and examples that are not explanatory—in this sense that the particular content that we fill in for the candidate explains matter to whether we have an explanation.

An additional analogy may help to flesh out this idea. John Norton (e.g., forthcoming) has advocated in a series of papers what he calls a “material theory of induction”. His view is that the reliability of various inductive inferences is dependent on associated specific empirical (“material”) assumptions in a way that precludes the formulation of any universal logic of induction—there is no universal form of an inductive argument that ensures reliability, regardless of the particular content of that goes into that argument. However, it is not part of Norton's view that inductive support is somehow a subjective matter or relative to the interests etc. of particular audiences—it is empirical facts of a non-psychological sort (except of course when the evidential relations of interest concern psychological hypotheses) that undergird evidential relationships. We might say that on his view inductive inference is “contextual” in the sense that it is not content-independent but that it is also does not require a psychologistic characterization.

The possibility under consideration is that a similar claim might be true for explanation. Perhaps it is true, for example, that in order to capture the respects in which Rutherford's explanation is a good one, one needs to invoke, in addition to general relatively content—independent requirements about unification, derivability from laws and so on, constraints having to do with more specific “local” material facts about atomic structure, in the sense that nothing will count as an explanation of alpha scattering that does not invoke such facts and that other explanations with the same form not invoking atomic structure will not count as explanatory. But perhaps these additional constraints have to do with facts about what the world is like rather than, as Achinstein suggests, facts about what physicists of the time were most interested in. A view of this sort might capture (or concede) some of the claims made by pragmatic approaches about the role of contextual elements in explanation but would avoid some of the subjective or psychologistic tendencies in such approaches. It would be “contextual” in the sense that Norton's material theory of induction is contextual.

A closely related thought is that if one is inclined to incorporate contextual elements into the theory of explanation, there remains a range of possibilities about how they might be combined with more universalistic elements. As suggested above, rather than thinking of these two sets of elements as simply standing in opposition to each other, it may be better to think in terms of the two working together in a synergistic way. As an illustration consider the notion of unification. It may be that we cannot provide an adequate characterization of this notion and its role in explanation in purely formal, completely content-independent terms—e.g. in such terms as deriving many conclusions from a few basic assumptions or replacing theories with many free parameters with theories that have only a few such parameters. Nonetheless it may be true that once local material or empirical constraints are used to restrict the class of candidate theories to be compared with respect to the unification they achieve, something like counting basic assumptions or number of free parameters (or more plausibly something in the same spirit but more sophisticated) furnishes useful information about degree of unification achieved. Again the analogy with theories of inductive reasoning is suggestive. It is certainly not the case that all attempts to provide formal or general theories in this area are misguided or doomed to failure—the various treatments of statistical inference and machine learning are obvious counterexamples to this suggestion. On the other hand, the successful theories in this area are not completely universal or content-independent; instead, in many cases they yield results that seem sensible or normatively correct in a certain range of applications or when certain empirical background conditions are satisfied but not in other situations. In other words, such theories are both sensitive to context and contain elements that look objective and structural. Perhaps something like this will turn out to be true of “explanation”.

Selected Readings. van Fraassen (1980), especially Chapter Six and Achinstein (1983) are classic statements of pragmatic approaches to explanation. These pragmatic accounts are discussed and criticized in Salmon (1989). van Fraassen's account is also discussed in Kitcher and Salmon (1987). De Regt and Dieks (2005) is a recent defense of what the authors describe as a “contextual” account of scientific understanding and which engages with some of the themes in the “pragmatics of explanation” literature.

7. Conclusions, Open Issues, and Future Directions

What can we conclude from this recounting of some of the more prominent recent attempts to construct models of scientific explanation? What important issues remain open and what are the most promising directions for future work? Of course, any effort at stock-taking will reflect a particular point of view, but with this caveat in mind, several observations seem plausible, even if not completely uncontroversial.

7.1 The Role of Causation

The first concerns the role of causal information in scientific explanation. It is a plausible, although by no means inevitable, judgement.[28] that many of the difficulties faced by the models described above derive from their reliance on what appear to be inadequate treatments of causation and causal relevance. The problems of explanatory asymmetries and explanatory irrelevance described in section 2.5 seem to show that the holding of a law (understood as a regularity) between $C$ and $E$ is not sufficient for $C$ to cause $E$; hence not a sufficient condition for $C$ to figure in an explanation of $E$. If the argument of section 3.3 is correct, the fundamental problem with the SR model is that statistical relevance information is insufficient to fully capture causal information in the sense that different causal structures can be consistent with the same information about statistical relevance relationships. Similarly, the CM model faces the difficulty that information about causal processes and interactions is also insufficient to fully capture causal relevance relations and that there is a range of cases in which causal relationships hold between $C$ and $E$ (and hence in which $C$ figures in an explanation of $E$) although there is no connecting causal process between $C$ and $E$. Finally, a fundamental problem with unificationist models is that the content of our causal judgments does not seem to fall out of our efforts at unification, at least when unification is understood along the lines advocated by Kitcher. For example, as discussed above, considerations having to do with unification do not by themselves explain why it is appropriate to explain effects in terms of their causes rather than vice-versa.

At the very least these observations suggest that progress in connection with “scientific explanation” may require more attention to the notion of causation and a more thorough-going integration of discussions of explanation with the burgeoning literature on causation, both within and outside of philosophy.[29] Counterfactual accounts of causation may be promising in this connection (cf. Woodward, 2003).

Does this mean that a focus on causation should entirely replace the project of developing models of explanation or that philosophers should stop talking about explanation and instead talk just about causation? Despite the centrality of causation in explanation, it is arguable that completely subsuming the latter into the former loses connections with some important issues. For one thing, causal claims themselves seem to vary greatly in the extent to which they are explanatorily deep or illuminating. Causal claims found in Newtonian mechanics seem deeper or more satisfying from the point of view of explanation than causal claims of “the rock broke the window” variety. It is usually supposed that such differences are connected to other features—for example to how general, stable, coherent with background knowledge a causal claim is. However, as we have noted, not all kinds of generality, stability etc. seem explanatorily relevant (or connected to explanatory goodness). So even if one focuses only on causal explanation, there remains the important project of trying to understand better what sorts of distinctions among causal claims matter for goodness in explanation. To the extent this is so, the kinds of concerns that have animated traditional treatments of explanation don't seem to be entirely subsumable into standard accounts of causation.

There is also the important question of whether all legitimate forms of why- explanation are causal. For example, some writers (e.g. Nerlich, 1979) contend that there is a variety of physical explanation which is “geometrical” rather than causal, in the sense that it consists in explaining phenomena by appealing to the structure of spacetime rather than to facts about forces or energy/momentum transfer. (Nerlich takes causal explanations in physics to have to do with the latter.) According to Nerlich, explaining the trajectory followed by a free particle by noting that it is following a geodesic in spacetime is an illustration of a geometrical rather than a causal explanation. A really satisfying theory of explanation should provide some principled answer to the question of whether all why explanation must be causal (and according to what notion of causal this is so or not so), rather than just assuming an affirmative (or negative) answer to this question. Again, to the extent that there are non-causal forms of explanation, explanation will remain a topic that is at least somewhat independent of causation.

7.2 Explanation and Other Epistemic Goals

Noretta Koertge (1992) noted that although the literature on explanation is immense, comparatively little attention has been paid, in the construction of the various competing models of explanation, to the question of what they are to be used for or what their larger point or purpose is (other than capturing “our” notion of explanation). Relatedly, writers on explanation have not always paid adequate attention to how explanation itself is connected to or interacts with (or is distinct from) other goals of inquiry—for example, what the connection is between explanatory goodness and other frequently proposed goals for inquiry such as evidential support, prediction, control of nature, simplicity, and so on. One result is that it is sometimes unclear how to assess the significance of our intuitive judgments about the goodness of various explanations or to determine what turns on our giving one judgment rather than another. For example, as we have noted, most people judge intuitively that one cannot explain the height of a pole by appealing to the length of its shadow.

However, a determined defender of the DN model (e.g. Hempel, 1965, pp 353–4) may well ask why we should be so impressed by such intuitive judgments. Perhaps our pre-analytic assessment is confused or mistaken in some way or perhaps it reflects merely pragmatic considerations that should have no place in the theory of explanation. One way to respond to this skepticism would be to provide a non-question-begging account of what of importance would be lost or left out if we failed to distinguish between explanations of shadow lengths in terms of pole heights and “explanations” running in the opposite direction. (Note that to the extent that we are interested merely in prediction, the two inferences appear to be on a par. “Non-question-begging” means that we don't just say that the height causes the shadow and not vice-versa, but that we provide some further explication of what this difference consists in and why the difference matters.) One possible answer would appeal to the epistemic goal of having information relevant to manipulation and control; one may manipulate the length of the shadow by, among other things, manipulating the height of the pole but not conversely. This difference is real regardless of one's intuitions about explanation in the two cases[30].

Regardless of what one thinks about this particular answer, the more general point is that one way forward in assessing competing models of explanation is to focus less (or not just) on whether they capture our intuitive judgments and more on the issue of whether and why the kinds of information they require is valuable (and attainable), and how this information relates to other goals we value in inquiry.

As another illustration, consider the CM model. Underlying this model is presumably some judgment to the effect that tracing causal processes and their interactions is a worthy goal of inquiry. Now of course one might try to defend this judgment simply by claiming that the identification of causes is an important goal and that causal process theories yield the correct account of cause. But a more illuminating and less question-begging way of proceeding would be to ask how this goal relates to other epistemic values. For example, what is the connection between the goal of identifying causal processes and constructing unified theories? Or between identifying causal processes and the discovery of information that is relevant to prediction or to manipulation and control? Are these the same goals? Independent but complementary goals? Competing goals in the sense that satisfaction of one may make it harder to satisfy the other? Obviously, one may ask similar questions about the goal of unification.

The need for treatments of explanation that relate this notion more adequately to other concepts and goals is particularly salient in connection with the role of laws in explanation, which is another item on the agenda for future work in this area. The account of laws that is currently regarded as the most promising by many philosophers is the Mill-Ramsey-Lewis (MRL) theory. According to this theory, laws are those generalizations which figure as axioms or theorems in the deductive systemization of our empirical knowledge that achieves the best combination of simplicity and strength (where strength has to do with the range of empirical truths that are deducible)[31]. It is natural to connect this conception of laws with unificationist approaches to explanation: if laws are generalizations that play a central role in the achievement of simple (and presumably unified) deductive systemizations, then by appealing to laws in explanation, we achieve explanatory unification—this makes it intelligible why it is desirable that explanations invoke laws[32]. If an account along these lines could be made to work we would have a sort of integrated story about laws and explanation that is largely lacking in the DN account—a story about what laws are that is directly connected to an idea about the point of explanation. Of course there remain real problems (some of which are discussed above) with the unificationist account of explanation and, for that matter, with the MRL theory of laws[33], but the integrated account that would result from putting the two together nonetheless might be taken to illustrate the sort of thing we should be aiming at.

7.3 A Single Model of Explanation?

Yet another general issue concerns the extent to which it is possible to construct a single model of explanation that fits all areas of science. It is uncontroversial that explanatory practice—what is accepted as an explanation, how explanatory goals interact with others, what sort of explanatory information is thought to be achievable, discoverable, testable etc.—varies in significant ways across different disciplines. Nonetheless, all of the models of explanation surveyed above are “universalist” in aspiration—they claim that a single, “one size” model of explanation fits all areas of inquiry in so far as these have a legitimate claim to explain. Although the extreme position that explanation in biology or history has nothing interesting in common with explanation in physics seems unappealing (and in any case has attracted little support), it seems reasonable to expect that more effort will be devoted in the future to developing models of explanation that are more sensitive to disciplinary differences. Ideally, such models would reveal commonalities across disciplines but they should also enable us to see why explanatory practice varies as it does across different disciplines and the significance of such variation. For example, as noted above, biologists, in contrast to physicists, often describe their explanatory goals as the discovery of mechanisms rather than the discovery of laws. Although it is conceivable that this difference is purely terminological, it is also worth exploring the possibility that there is a distinctive story to be told about what a mechanism is, as this notion is understood by biologists, and how information about mechanisms contributes to explanation.

A closely related point is that at least some of the models described above impose requirements on explanation that may be satisfiable in some domains of inquiry but are either unachievable (in any practically interesting sense) in other domains or, to the extent that they may be achievable, bear no discernible relationship to generally accepted goals of inquiry in those domains. For example, we noted above that many scientists and philosophers hold that there are few if any laws to be discovered in biology and the social and behavioral sciences. If so, models of explanation that assign a central role to laws may not be very illuminating regarding how explanation works in these disciplines. As another example, even if we suppose that the partition into objectively homogeneous reference classes recommended by the SR model is an achievable goal in connection with certain quantum mechanical phenomena, it may be that (as suggested above) it is simply not a goal that can be achieved in a non-trivial way in economics and sociology, disciplines in which causal inference from statistics also figures prominently. In such disciplines, it may be that additional statistically relevant partitions of any population or subpopulation of interest will virtually always be possible, so that the activity of finding such partitions is limited only by the costs of gathering additional information. A similar assessment may hold for most applications of the CM model to the social sciences.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Theories of Explanation”, by G. Randolph Mayes (CSU/Sacramento), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (edited by J. Fieser)

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