The Problems With a Traditional Funding Model
The SEP project has reasons for continuing as a self-publishing academic project and for avoiding a long-term funding solution, possibly in alliance with an publisher, that is based on ongoing annual subscriptions that lock out non-subscribers. We note first that the only thing an alliance with a publisher would bring to the SEP project would be expertise on how to market and collect money; we have already developed the expertise needed to publish a dynamic reference work on the web.
Our reasons for avoiding a subscription-based funding model (or alliance with a publisher) are based on the severe problems that would occur if such a plan were implemented:
We consider each of these problems in turn.
Our best estimate is that an alliance with a commercial or academic publisher would at least double, if not triple, our costs, given the following new expenses which we would incur:
- We would have to start paying our authors and subject editors, since reference works published by commercial and academic presses standardly make such payments. Our authors and editors no doubt deserve payment for their efforts, but our working hypothesis has been that as long as the SEP remains free and highly visible, they will see their volunteer labor as being personally rewarding as well as a contribution to the public good.
- We would have to start paying our mirror sites. These sites provide faster world-wide access, offer extra layers of digital preservation, and offer uninterrupted 24/7 service on those rare occasions the Stanford server is down for maintenance.
- We would incur marketing, distribution, and income collection costs, and the costs of the extra personnel and managers needed to implement those processes.
- We would incur costs required to support the customer service demands of libraries paying annual subscriptions.
- An alliance with a publisher might force the project to move off-campus, and as a result, we would incur extra costs above and beyond the 6.5% overhead associated with running the project at Stanford, such as more expensive office space, backup systems (which CSLI now covers), repair (which the Stanford Bookstore does more cheaply than on the outside), and local IT/networking support (which is now provided at CSLI).
- Restricting access to subscribers only would obviously disenfranchise many deserving scholarly groups including students and faculty at smaller universities or colleges, independent scholars using an internet service provider at home, students and teachers at K-12 institutions, scholars and students in many parts of the world, indeed anyone at institutions too poor to pay the institutional subscription and any individuals too poor to pay personal subscriptions. Clearly, the SEP would cease to achieve its goal of bringing the best in philosophical scholarship to the wider public.
- The fact that search engines would be blocked from accessing SEP pages would mean that the SEP would disappear from the results returned by those search engines, dropping it to a level of invisibility comparable to the commercially-published Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy and further curtailing the ability of readers to find the SEP. 75% of the SEP's readership finds it by way of a web search.
- Even if there were some way of allowing search engines to index its restricted-access site, the effect of blocking non-subscribers from the SEP would result in a precipitous drop in the number of links to the SEP pages, and a corresponding drop in search-engine rankings. Google rankings are based upon the number of links from other websites, so the SEP's high rank is a function of the number of links that point to the SEP. Google may not remain the premier search engine, but the techniques it uses to identify relevant pages to a search will surely be incorporated and enhanced by any successors.
In addition to these consequences, there is the question as to whether this model can sustain itself. The overriding fact which confronts any attempt to fund the SEP with annual subscriptions (or indeed any other reference work in the humanities) is this: the commercial market (i.e., those with the ability to pay significant ongoing and increasing subscription costs) for philosophy (humanities) reference works is very small. To complicate matters in the case of the SEP, there is already one commercial online reference work in philosophy (Routledge) with a presence in that market.
In view of the small market, the subscription model would therefore have to resort to other income-producing mechanisms, such as advertisements and selling sponsored links in the entries. Of course, these other mechanisms will require personnel to market to advertisers and to develop contracts with sponsors. So there are costs involved here as well. Moreover, such income-producing mechanisms may compromise the academic appearance and integrity of the encyclopedia. Readers might start to wonder whether a book was listed in an entry because the author of the entry found it valuable or because someone paid the SEP to include it.
The above results all combine in pernicious ways, with the result being that a subscription-based funding model would lead the SEP project towards a situation where it loses it focus and character as a project developed, administered and maintained by academics. Not only would the SEP reach a tiny fraction of the audience it once reached, but it might be forced to scramble each year to make ends meet, distracting its central staff from the academic mission of enhancing the encyclopedia's content and technological underpinnings. By contrast, if its basic operations and growth were covered by an endowment, the SEP staff could focus their fund-raising efforts on innovative grant proposals (taking advantage of their location at the Center for the Study of Language and Information) to push the technological limits of humanities computing, providing benefits to scholars and other readers in the form of improved navigation interfaces which are sensitive both to meanings and to the conceptual structure of the entire encyclopedia.
Thus, the SEP will best accomplish its mission only if it offers completely open access to its content and retains its character as a self-publishing academic project run by people with the required technological skills.
John Perry, Faculty Sponsor
Edward N. Zalta, Principal Editor
Uri Nodelman, Senior Editor
Colin Allen, Associate Editor
Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford, CA 94305-4115