Open Letter to General Readers

Dear Reader,

As a reader of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP), you are interested in high-quality discussions of values, politics, ideas, science, and religion/faith, all of which concern the human condition. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP) offers entries on such topics as democracy, voluntary-euthanasia, affirmative action, animal consciousness, civil rights, and many other topics fundamental to our place in the world. Because you are familiar with the SEP we know that you are the kind of individual who values access to academically rigorous information on the world wide web. Yet, many times when you track down promising leads in academic journals or reference works, you find yourself at a publisher's website being asked to pay $30 or more to download a single article, or to pay hundreds of dollars a year for an individual subscription.

The SEP has so far managed to avoid charging such fees and subscriptions because of generous public funding from the National Endowment for the Humanities and the National Science Foundation. But we cannot rely on public largesse forever, so in conjunction with research librarians worldwide, we have developed an alternative plan to continue serving our highly-regarded encyclopedia entries without instituting subscriptions or per-item charges.

The SEP is thus entering a crucial fundraising phase and needs your help to secure its future. In order to stay free and preserve open access to the SEP we are establishing a permanent operating fund. This fund will be used to cover the annual costs of administering and supporting the volunteer efforts of over 950 professional philosophers who donate their time and labor to collaboratively write, referee, and maintain the encyclopedia.

Our April 2002 survey indicates that a majority of SEP readers are not professional philosophers. Thus, our authors and editors are not just volunteering their labor for the benefit of the profession, but also for the benefit for the public at large and professionals in non-philosophy disciplines. We are therefore asking everyone to play their part in preserving open access to the unique resource that is the SEP. In addition to our fundraising efforts through the libraries and academic institutions, we need readers like you to make a one-time donation to help us reach our fundraising goal.

Together we can build an permanent operating fund for the SEP and ensure that you will never be faced with a bill for reading philosophy reference articles of the highest quality. Below we have included more details of our plan, but if you are already convinced, please jump straight to the section on what you can do.

Our Plan to Preserve Free and Open Access

Open access is important in part because information should be free and members of the public should be able to access high-quality academic scholarship on topics of importance. In addition, open access is crucial to the success of the SEP. By being free, numerous members of the general public can read the SEP and create links to it on their own web pages. This in turn leads to our high page rank in Google and other search engines. And that means that SEP entries on topics of importance to the general public will have high visibility on the web.

To illustrate with a concrete example, the author of the SEP entry on holes, Professor Achille Varzi (Philosophy, Columbia University), was interviewed on CNN because the definition of ‘hole’ played a crucial role in the vote count in Florida during the 2000 presidential election. (Does a hole in a ballot have to be more like a hole in a colander, which goes all the way through the surface, or can it be more like a pothole or a hole in the ground, which only deforms the surface?) The CNN reporter sought an expert, and might have identified Varzi as such by querying Google — the SEP entry on holes comes up as the first web page that addresses the general concept of holes (as opposed to the movie "Holes" or black holes). During the 2002-2003 academic year, 1.1 million accesses to the SEP were the result of a Google search.

Most publications attempting to maintain the highest of academic standards cost money and require subscriptions. The costs of print and web publications are overwhelming academic libraries, and though this is primarily due to content pricing by commercial publishers for scientific publications, there are also significant costs both for content from academic/non-profit publishers and for material in the humanities. There are few models for keeping web publications free and accessible to everyone.

The SEP has operated on federal grant money since 1998. But this forces us to apply for new grants every 2 years, and it is by no means certain that we will continue to be awarded such grants. The long-term funding plan we have developed is a new model for funding a humanities publication. It involves a partnership between Stanford University and large library organizations, to raise an endowment for the SEP. (Though endowment models are not new, the kinds of institutional arrangements we've developed between Stanford and the library organizations for the long-term support of the SEP are new and distinctive.) While the library organizations try to raise $3 million from libraries at institutions with philosophy departments, we here at Stanford will try to raise just over $1 million from private sources.

Our Value to the Public

The SEP brings philosophy to a wider audience than just those in academia. 25% of readers in an April 2002 survey identified themselves as neither students, instructors, nor researchers. In the light of the fact that many SEP entries are being downloaded tens of thousands of times each year, our reference work is finding a significant public readership. (The entry on Nietzsche was downloaded 164,000 times in the 2002-2003 academic year and the entry on voluntary euthanasia was downloaded 61,500 times during that same period.) To our knowledge, no other refereed and scholarly resource in philosophy has this kind of readership, and so the SEP may be philosophy's most visible public face.

Our general readership also includes many people involved in education as students, teachers, and parents. 52% of our survey respondents were students (of all levels) and another 14% identified themselves as instructors. These numbers indicate that both sides of the learning relationship between teachers and students are being served by the SEP. We found it interesting that 10% of the students who responded to our survey indicated that they were high-school students.

The SEP's value to the public can also judged by the fact that it promotes public appreciation of a wide range of topics in the humanities. The SEP contains articles that are relevant to many different disciplines in the humanities: entries in aesthetics are relevant to art history; entries on ancient philosophy are relevant to the classics; entries on post-modern philosophy are relevant to literary criticism; entries on ethics to the humanities in general; biographical entries on prominent philosophers relate to the history of ideas and cultural studies; entries in philosophy of language are relevant to linguistics; etc. The SEP is not just for philosophers; anyone interested in a humanist perspective will find the SEP valuable.

Here are comments made by a few of the readers who responded to our survey:

What You Can Do

Here are steps you can take to help us to meet our fundraising goals:

  1. Please consider making a generous donation to the SEP. [Note: Your gift will be processed by the Stanford University Office of Development but put into a special account that is reserved for the exclusive use of the Stanford Encyclopedia ofPhilosophy.] All donations are fully tax-deductible.
  2. Talk up the SEP with friends, family, and colleagues who might find it useful and interesting and might thereby be motivated to support us as well.
  3. Encourage your local library or library system to support us. Tell the librarians that you value the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy as a free resource.

It will be an outstanding and enduring legacy of those who contribute to the SEP to help in providing people around the world with a free resource by which they could satisfy their intellectual curiosity from an authoritative source on philosophical questions of all kinds and, in particular, those concerning the human condition.

Thanks very much for your efforts in support of the SEP. We anticipate a successful fund-raising drive.


John Perry, Faculty Sponsor
Edward N. Zalta, Principal Editor
Uri Nodelman, Senior Editor
Colin Allen, Associate Editor

Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford University
Stanford, CA 94305-4115