SEP's Value for Research, Education, the Profession, and the Public
Researchers benefit from the SEP's up-to-date content, in-depth coverage, extensive bibliographies, and links to other current web resources. The value of being current and responsive to research cannot be overstated --- consider, for example, that the entry on voluntary euthanasia was updated within a few weeks after the Netherlands changed its laws, enabling those researching the topic to have current facts, references, and expert analysis.
At an average of 12,000 words, SEP entries are significantly longer than those found in other encyclopedias of philosophy (which typically range from 1,000-3,000 words). Our model has encouraged authors to produce entries of such substance and depth that they can be considered research products in their own right. Most SEP entries develop a broad and insightful perspective on a topic and thereby help to make the problems and concepts clearer to everyone. Our authors also frequently add items to their bibliography very shortly after significant new publications appear in print, allowing other researchers to easily identify the latest work. Every SEP entry contains an ‘Other Internet Resources’ section where our authors place links to the best web sites (in their judgement) on their topic. Thus, we provide human assessment of online resources that is not provided by ordinary search engines, and that is backed by a level of expertise that is rare in other web portals.
The collaboration within the SEP's extensive network of respected subject editors and authors promotes inclusiveness with respect to philosophical subjects and schools of thought. For example, the SEP covers subjects from aesthetics to philosophy of physics, has appointed subject editors for African and African-American Philosophy, Feminist Philosophy, Judaic Philosophy, Chinese Philosophy, and Islamic and Arabic Philosophy. (For a complete list of the subject areas and subject editors, see
The SEP helps to promote interdisciplinary research since it contains articles that are relevant to many different disciplines in the humanities and sciences: entries in aesthetics are relevant to art history; entries on ancient philosophy are relevant to the classics; entries on post-modern philosophy are relevant to literary criticism; entries on ethics to the humanities in general; biographical entries on prominent philosophers relate to the history of ideas and cultural studies; entries in philosophy of language are relevant to linguistics; etc. The SEP is not just for philosophers.
We have evidence that the SEP is being read by researchers in other academic fields. In an April 2002 survey of our readership, 38% of our readers said they specialized in mathematics, computer science, or the natural sciences. In a recent search on `quantum mechanics' in Google, the SEP entry on the topic ranked 4th out of 1.5 million matches, and was the highest ranked site not created by scientists. This high ranking in the top 0.0003% of sites returned cannot be accounted for solely by the links to the SEP that are maintained by philosophers. This reveals the extent of academic and public interest in the perspective of a central humanistic discipline on the sciences.
Our archives also have value for future research. They will allow users to research the history of philosophical ideas by tracing developments in key philosophical concepts and interpretations of key philosophical figures through changes in the corresponding entries. They will also become repositories of biographical information about the work of our more prominent authors.
Evidence for the value of the SEP for education is based on several sources. First, using data derived from our April 2002 survey, we discovered that 52% of over 1000 respondents were students (of all levels) and another 14% identified themselves as instructors.
These numbers indicate that both sides of the learning relationship between teachers and students are being served by the SEP. We found it interesting that 10% of the students who responded to our survey indicated that they were high-school students.
[Note: The survey was voluntary and reflects only a small proportion of total readership during the survey period. Respondents indicated their membership in the following groups: instructor, professional researcher, student, and other. Respondents falling into more than one category were allowed to indicate this. Because it may have been that response rates for students were higher than for instructors and researchers, it is not possible to draw firm conclusions about the composition of the SEP readership. However, we have no specific reasons for believing that one category of users responded at a different rate from the others, and the response rates obtained are consistent with other sources of information we have about the composition of our readership.]
Further evidence of the impact of the SEP on education can be found from the number of course syllabi that contain references to the SEP. A recent search on Google for “course syllabus ‘Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy’” produced 840 matches --- inspection of the first 20 reveals that 70% of these are indeed course syllabi. Survey respondents frequently mentioned that they put links to the encyclopedia on their syllabi and course lecture notes, and that they recommend SEP articles to graduate and undergraduate students, especially those in the initial stages of writing a paper. The instructors' comments also indicate that the SEP contributes to improving the quality of undergraduate education. Several instructors reported using SEP articles to brush up on topics they were teaching, and to help develop bibliographies for their students. In some cases instructors reported that they had been led to the SEP by their students.
A very important value that the SEP has for the profession is the way it raises the profession's profile at prestigious funding institutions. If you would like evidence of this, you may contact Michael Kelly, Executive Director of the APA, who will tell you about conversations he had about the SEP's profile at the NEH with the Director of the National Endowment for the Humanities (NEH) and others at some recent meetings of the American Council of Learned Societies. This profile has resulted from our excellent history of competing successfully for grants:
- The National Endowment for the Humanities awarded $131,400 for the years 1998-2000 (#PA-23167-98);
- The National Science Foundation awarded $528,900 for the years 2000-2003 (#IIS-9981549);
- The National Endowment for the Humanitieis awarded $300,828 for the years 2003-2005 (#PA-50133-03); and
- The Andrew W. Mellon Foundation awarded the SEP a $43,000 Officers Grant from February 2002 -- August 2002.
It is also important to mention that the SEP received seed money from the American Philosophical Association (APA) and the Canadian Philosophical Association (CPA), and they, along with the Australasian Association of Philosophy and the European Society for Analytic Philosophy, are strongly supportive of the SEP.
Letters from Professional Organizations in Support of SEP Grant Proposals
- American Philosophical Association
- Canadian Philosophical Association
- Australasian Association of Philosophy
- European Association of Analytic Philosophy
The SEP brings philosophy to a wider audience than just those in academia. 25% of readers in our survey identified themselves as neither students, instructors, nor researchers. In the light of the fact that many SEP entries are being downloaded tens of thousands of times each year, our reference work is finding a significant public readership. (The entry on Nietzsche was downloaded 164,000 times in the 2002-2003 academic year and the entry on voluntary euthanasia was downloaded 61,500 times during that same period.) To our knowledge, no other refereed and scholarly resource in philosophy has this kind of readership, and so the SEP may be philosophy's most visible public face.
To illustrate with a concrete example, the author of the SEP entry on holes, Professor Achille Varzi (Philosophy, Columbia University), was interviewed on CNN because the definition of ‘hole’ played a crucial role in the vote count in Florida during the 2000 presidential election. (Does a hole in a ballot have to be more like a hole in a colander, which goes all the way through the surface, or can it be more like a pothole or a hole in the ground, which only deforms the surface?) The CNN reporter sought an expert, and might have identified Varzi as such by querying Google --- the SEP entry on holes comes up as the first web page that isn't about black holes or the movie Holes. During the 2002-2003 academic year, 1.1 million accesses to the SEP were the result of a Google search.
Finally, there were approximately 280,000 accesses from the .gov domain during the previous academic year, and 54,000 from the .mil domain. The SEP's high visibility on the web ensures that policy-makers seeking a systematic treatment of philosophical issues of interest to the public, such as voluntary euthanasia or war, are likely to encounter the SEP entry on the topic.