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Abraham Ibn Daud

First published Sat Aug 26, 2006

Abraham ibn Daud (c.1110-1180) can be regarded as a pioneer in Jewish philosophy. His philosophical treatise ha-Emunah ha-Ramah (The Exalted Faith, c. 1160) constitutes the first systematic attempt to integrate Aristotelianism into Jewish thought. However, only a few decades later Moses Maimonides, the medieval Jewish philosopher par excellence, wrote his philosophical magnum opus, Moreh Nevukhim (The Guide of the Perplexed), a work that has much in common with Ibn Daud's book. As a result, ha-Emunah ha-Ramah was soon superseded and Ibn Daud was doomed to remain in Maimonides' shadow. This article will survey Ibn Daud's major ideas and examine his contribution to medieval Jewish philosophy.

1. Introduction

In the introduction to ha-Emunah ha-Ramah (henceforth: ER) Abraham Ibn Daud states that he decided to write his book in order to solve the problem of free will. Scripture fails to provide an unequivocal answer to this problem, since biblical verses on this issue seem to contradict one another. Ibn Daud is convinced that philosophy can help to distinguish between the verses that should be understood literally and those that are in need of interpretation. In his view, the problem in his day is that those who have begun to study philosophy are unable to keep the lamps of philosophy and religion burning simultaneously “for if the lamp of philosophy is kindled, the lamp of religion goes out” (ER W 2; S 3b-4b).[1] This is why certain people believe that it is better to steer well clear of the study of philosophy. The consequence thereof is that many Jews are at a loss when it comes to solving religious problems, such as the problem of free will. According to Ibn Daud, this is because they fail to investigate the principles of religion with the help of philosophy and to search for the harmony between the two modes of knowledge. His book intends to remedy this situation by showing beginning students of philosophy how to establish such harmony.

Ibn Daud thus reveals himself to be a staunch advocate of the study of philosophy and the use of reason to achieve the correct interpretation of problematical biblical passages. In his view, the fact that man is endowed with reason obliges him to use his intellect. Throughout his treatise, he strives to demonstrate how reason and Scripture are not at variance with each other and that “true philosophy” is contained in Scripture.

2. Biography

The exact date of Ibn Daud's birth is unknown. It is commonly assumed that he was born c. 1110 in one of the major centers of Muslim Spain, perhaps Cordoba. He himself asserts that he received his education from his maternal uncle, an uncle who is known to have been active as both a teacher and a communal leader in Cordoba, where he died in 1126. Although no further data are available, it is evident from his works that this education must have been a combination of “Greek wisdom” and traditional Jewish learning. Greek wisdom in the cultural setting of Andalusia refers to the study of classical science and philosophy as taught by Muslim scholars and philosophers. Indeed, his writings testify to a thorough familiarity with Greek philosophy and science as read by the Muslim philosophers al-Farabi and Ibn Sina, as well as with rabbinic literature, Hebrew poetry, and Jewish philosophy. He also appears to have had some knowledge of the New Testament and Christian and Muslim polemical literature. Later in life, Ibn Daud moved to Toledo, presumably as a result of the Almohad invasion of Andalusia (1147), an event that led many Jews to flee from Southern Spain. In any event it is in Toledo that he wrote his two major works in defense of Judaism (circa 1160/61): the philosophical treatise ER and the historical Sefer ha-Qabbalah (cf. below section 3). Ibn Daud is reported to have died a martyr's death in Toledo c. 1180. The earliest reference to this was made by the Toledan philosophic author Judah ben Solomon ha-Kohen in his encyclopedia Midrash ha-Hokhmah (first half of the 13th century).

It has not yet been established with any certainty whether Abraham ibn Daud is one and the same person as the twelfth-century Arabic-Latin translator Avendauth, also known as “Avendeut philosophus israelita”, who collaborated with Dominicus Gundissalinus in Toledo. However, the fact that three of Ibn Daud's major sources relate to the translation activities of Avendauth and Gundissalinus seems to suggest that they are indeed the same person.

3. Major Works

Ibn Daud's two major works are Sefer ha-Qabbalah (The Book of Tradition) and Ha-Emunah ha-Ramah. Both books were written around the same time (c. 1160). They are closely related in the sense that they endeavor to defend rabbinic Judaism; the former with the help of history and the latter with the help of philosophy.

In Sefer ha-Qabbalah, which has become a classic in Hebrew literature, Abraham ibn Daud provides a survey of Jewish and general history and attempts to demonstrate the continuity of rabbinic Judaism. Moreover, this work also conveys a (hidden) message of messianic redemption in the near future. Two other chronicles are appended to this work: one on the history of the kings of Israel during the Second Temple period, and the other on the history of Rome, which are similarly polemical in nature.

His philosophical book was written in Arabic and entitled al-‘Aqîdah al-rafî‘ah (The Exalted Faith). The Arabic original is no longer extant. Towards the end of the fourteenth century, the work was translated into Hebrew twice: the first time under the title Ha-Emunah ha-Ramah by Solomon ben Lavi (c. 1391-92), possibly at the instigation of the philosopher Hasdai Crescas, and a little later under the title Ha-Emunah Nissa’ah by Samuel ibn Motot. This second translation is based on the first, but is less accurate.

Ibn Daud is also reported to have written a book on astronomy, the contents of which are unknown. The same applies to an anti-Karaite polemical work, which he mentions himself.

In the introduction to ER, Ibn Daud mentions two earlier Jewish philosophers: Saadya (often described as the first Jewish philosopher, first half of the 10th century, Baghdad) and the philosopher-poet Solomon ibn Gabirol (11th century, Spain). However, he dismisses their writings claiming that they are inadequate with respect to his goal, namely the study of philosophy in order to examine the principles of religion. This statement reflects Ibn Daud's awareness of introducing a new trend to Jewish philosophy. Saadya's Sefer ha-Emunot we-ha-De‘ot (Book of Opinions and Beliefs) provides a rationalistic interpretation of Judaism, but is influenced by the thought of the Muslim kalâm-theologians, which was considered outdated in Ibn Daud's day, whereas Ibn Gabirol's Meqor Hayyim (known in Latin as Fons Vitae) is a neo-Platonist work, which makes no reference at all to Jewish sources. Indeed, Ibn Daud's book constitutes a novelty in that it is the first attempt to systematically introduce the Aristotelianism of the Muslim philosophers Alfarabi (870-950) and Ibn Sina (980-1037) into Jewish philosophy. His philosophical terminology and syllogistic reasoning are derived from the works of these authors. His “technical” approach has led Husik to observe that “Ibn Daud leaves upon us the impression of a precise thinker, cold and analytical. He exhibits no grace of style, eloquence of diction or depths of enthusiasm and emotion” (Husik 2002: 198). This judgment of his style may be too harsh. Undoubtedly his book must have made some demands on it readers, but it is only fair to note that Ibn Daud attempts to liven up the monotony of his logical arguments at regular intervals by using analogies and quotes from poems.

4. Structure and Sources of ER

4.1 Structure

Ibn Daud's book consists of an introduction and three parts of unequal length. In the introduction, Ibn Daud states that the problem of free will, which prompted him to write his book, can only be solved after the preparatory philosophical study of a variety of issues in the field of physics and metaphysics. In what may be called a “table of contents”, he specifies the various topics to be discussed in his book in his introduction; topics with which the beginning student must become familiar. The first part (Weil 1852, 4–43) deals with the basic principles of (Aristotelian) physics and metaphysics. It opens with a logical section that treats substance and the categories (I.1). This is followed by discussions on matter, form and the elements (I.2), motion and infinity (I.3-5), the soul (I.6-7) and the heavenly spheres (I.8). According to Ibn Daud, this constitutes the minimum requirements for an investigation of the Jewish religion. The “principles of religion” provide the subject matter for the second part (Weil 1852, 44–98). Here Ibn Daud is concerned with God's existence and unity (II.1-2), divine attributes (II.3), cosmology and the heavenly intelligences (II.4), prophecy and the defense of Mosaic Law (II.5), and, finally, the problem of free will (II.6). The third and final part (Weil 1852, 98–104), deals with ethics. In this work, Ibn Daud thus offers a comprehensive survey of the contemporary philosophical debate. Due to the variety of topics covered, the book has been characterized as a compendium or a “philosophical encyclopedia in miniature” (Arfa 1954, 2)

In accordance with Ibn Daud's concern for the harmony between revelation and reason, biblical exegesis occupies a prominent place in the ER. Up to the section on prophecy (II.5), the discussion of each and every philosophical topic is followed by a section in which Ibn Daud provides biblical verses that are intended to point to or demonstrate the truths of the philosophical teachings in the preceding philosophical account. In this way Ibn Daud endeavors step by step to prove that “true philosophy” does not contradict revelation. From the chapter on prophecy onwards, however, biblical passages are not provided in a separate section, but are instead interwoven into the philosophical discussion; indeed they lie at the heart of it.

4.2 Sources

The “true philosophy” that Ibn Daud expounds is the form of Aristotelianism, which was articulated by the Muslim philosophers Alfarabi and especially Ibn Sina. Ibn Daud refers to Alfarabi's commentary on Aristotle's Topics and seems to have been familiar with his commentary on the Categories as well. In general, Ibn Daud was influenced by Alfarabi's thought as presented in as-Siyâsaât al-madaniyya (The Political Regime). Even more important for Ibn Daud's system was Ibn Sina's thought. Many of the demonstrations in the ER are based on works by this author, in particular his encyclopedic works Kitâb al-Shifâ’ and Kitâb an-Najât. Most influential was Ibn Sina's psychology, as well as his views on the secondary causes and of the origin of evil. Ibn Daud also drew on the work of the critic of these philosophers, al-Ghazali (1058-1111) who summarized their teachings in Maqâtsid al-Falâsifa (The intentions of the Philosophers). Another source of inspiration was the Muslim theologian and polemist Ibn Hazm, whose anti-Jewish polemic inspired Ibn Daud's Biblical exegesis. As for his Jewish predecessors, Ibn Daud built on Saadya's Emunot and was certainly familiar with Judah Halevi, although he does not explicitly mention him by name (cf. section 5.7 below). Occasionally, one also comes across views that he shares with Bahya ibn Paquda, Ibn Zaddiq, or Abraham ibn Ezra.

5. Main Themes in ER

5.1 Substance, Accident, and Natural Philosophy

Ibn Daud's Aristotelian orientation is immediately evident in his analysis of the notions of substance and accident, with which his book opens. Everything that is, is either substance or accident. Criticizing the neo-Platonic approach of Solomon ibn Gabirol, who held that substance and accident are relative terms, so that the selfsame thing can be a substance in one respect and an accident in another, he insists that substance and accident are absolute terms and that a thing is either a substance or an accident, but not both. The fact that certain substances derive their existence from a cause, and that they can be ordered hierarchically, does not detract from their substantiality: ontologically all substances are alike. This initial inquiry into the ontological constitution of existing things and the correct understanding of “substance” as that which constitutes the essence of a thing (and is thus more worthy of the term “being” than is accident) is crucial to Ibn Daud. Besides forming the point of departure for a systematic discussion of various kinds of substances, corporeal and incorporeal, it allows him to prove that the soul is a substance, not an accident. Moreover, the distinction between corporeal and incorporeal substances introduces the reader to the existence of celestial intelligences; the incorporeal simple substances that play a central role in his thought.

Ibn Daud's discussion of substance and accidents includes a survey of the Aristotelian categories, which is largely based on the accounts of the Muslim philosophers. After this initial exposition, the categories are not given much further attention in the rest of the book. For our purposes, however, it is important to note that this overview of the categories is the first systematic presentation of the subject or, for that matter, of any other logical work by Aristotle, in Jewish philosophy.

The introduction on substance and accident leads Ibn Daud to a discussion of the question of the sense in which form and matter, the two constituents of physical beings, are substances, which allows Ibn Daud to introduce the notions of potentiality and actuality. He then proceeds to deal with other basic principles of Aristotelian philosophy, such as motion and infinity. I will not go into detail here, since Ibn Daud's exposition does not actually provide any important new insights. Instead his aim is to introduce the beginning student to Aristotelian physics and metaphysics. However, it is worth noting that, while earlier Jewish philosophers, such as Ibn Zaddiq, had dealt with substance and accident and other such principles, Ibn Daud is the first to do so coherently and comprehensively from an Aristotelian viewpoint. His proofs for the theses that every motion requires a motion and that the existence of an infinite series in actuality is impossible are two cases in point. The same can be said of his expositions on the soul.

5.2 Soul

The soul is an important and central issue in the ER, related as it is to Ibn Daud's treatment of the aforementioned key-concepts of Aristotelian natural philosophy on the one hand, and to his discussions of cosmology, prophecy and ethics on the other. About one fifth of the book is devoted to an investigation of the soul, its nature and faculties, its relation to the body and its afterlife (ER W 20-41; S 54b-116b). Ibn Daud infers the existence of something like the soul from the fact that different natural bodies are characterized by various actions, which can only be explained by positing the existence of an immaterial principle that is added to their corporeality and from which these actions derive. Following Aristotle, Ibn Daud defines the soul as the perfection of a natural organic body that possesses life potentially. Elaborating on the distinction between soul and accident, he maintains that the soul is a substance (in the sense of form), refuting the view of the “physicians” that it is a mixture, thereby dismissing all other theories according to which the soul is an accident. In contradistinction to earlier Jewish philosophers of neo-Platonic orientation, Ibn Daud emphasizes the unity of the soul.

A key idea in Ibn Daud's detailed description of the various functions of the vegetative, animal and rational faculties is the notion that there is a hierarchy of soul-faculties, in which the lower ones serve the higher. The speculative faculty of the human soul occupies the highest position in this hierarchy. Thanks to this faculty, which is directed towards the incorporeal world, man can perfect his knowledge and apprehend the incorporeal beings that are called angels in Scripture. It thus constitutes the link between man, angels and God. This faculty is served by the practical faculty, which is directed to the corporeal world, and governs man's conduct. Although the soul is dependent on the body during the first stages of the acquisition of knowledge when the intellect passes from potentiality to actuality, it can exist separate from the body when it has attained the stage of acquired intellect. The rational soul is, therefore, immortal. According to Ibn Daud,

… the ultimate purpose of the creation of bodies in the physical world was that from the world of generation and corruption immaterial immortal substances would be purified. Such a substance is the human soul that is perfected by true knowledge and correct action (ER W 23-24; S 65b-66b).

The importance of Ibn Daud's psychology does not lie so much in its contents (that are largely based on Ibn Sina's psychology), but primarily in its detailed treatment and in the manner in which he employs and adapts Ibn Sina's theories so as to accommodate his own purposes.

5.3 God and Divine Attributes

Ibn Daud deviates significantly from his predecessors since he does not deduce the existence of God from creation. In fact, as we shall later see, Ibn Daud has little to say on the issue of creation. Instead, his two proofs are based on Aristotle's theory of motion, which presents a novelty in medieval Jewish thought. The first proof makes use of two theses that were proven in the sections on motion and infinity respectively: firstly, there is no motion without a mover, and secondly, the existence of an infinite series in actuality is impossible. On the basis of these premises, Ibn Daud establishes the existence of a first unmoved mover. Unlike Aristotle, however, he does not base the incorporeality and infinity of this first mover on the eternity of motion; an Aristotelian doctrine that he prefers to leave unmentioned. The second proof is based on the distinction between necessary and possible (or contingent) existents. The latter class of existents derives their existence from a cause. Since an infinite regress of causes is impossible, the series of contingent beings must end with the existence of an uncaused being who is called the Necessary Being and whose essence suffices for its existence. Evidently Ibn Daud considered the second to be a better proof than the first given that it yields a first principle of being, instead of merely a first principle of motion. The contrast with earlier Jewish philosophers also comes to the fore in Ibn Daud's designations of God, such as “the first unmoved mover”, “the necessary being” or “the first cause” rather than “the Creator”. These appellations are wholly in line with his stated aim of guiding the reader to a philosophical conception of God. However, at the same time, it is evident that he identifies this first principle with the God of the Bible, an equation for which he does not provide any arguments.

This God is absolutely one, both in the sense of unique (God is externally one) and in the sense of simple (God is internally one). God's unity implies that he cannot have essential or accidental attributes since that would imply plurality in the divine essence. Therefore, the attributes that are often ascribed to God, such as that he is one, existent, true, mighty etc. etc. should be interpreted either negatively, or as relations. According to Ibn Daud, “the truest predicates or attributes of God are the negations […] and although they remove many doubts, they do not convey anything” (ER W 51.9-12; S 131b15-131b3). To remedy this, Ibn Daud interprets the negations as negations of something, namely of similarity, that is, as expressions of incomparability. For example, with regard to the predication of unity to God, he argues that since among all essences nothing can be found that is like God, “we know His unity in such a way that we know that His unity is not like that of any other thing that is called ‘one’” (ER W 52.25-27; S 133b1-3). As for attributes understood as relations, Ibn Daud explains:

Like someone can be described, for example, in that he is the son of a certain man, and the father of a second and the uncle of a third, the maternal uncle of a fourth, the friend of a fifth and the enemy of a sixth […] this [kind of predication] is not impossible. Indeed multiple relations do not imply multiplicity in the essence of what is described by them. And in this way we can describe the Creator with many attributes since they are relations between Him and the other existents (ER W 54.29-35; S 136b8-14).

5.4 Cosmogony and Intelligences

To explain how the plurality of the sub-lunar world can proceed from this absolutely one God, Ibn Daud presents the theory of “intermediaries”, as he found it in the works of the Muslim philosophers. This theory holds that there are secondary substances (or: heavenly intelligences) that serve as intermediaries between God and the lower world. His first step is to prove the existence of the Active Intellect, the lowest in the series of heavenly intelligences. His proof is based on the premise that the human intellect passes from potentiality into actuality, which can only be due to an agent that possesses the end of motion (that is, knowledge) in actuality. Ibn Daud then proceeds to prove the existence of other incorporeal substances, for which he likewise bases himself on the Aristotelian theory of motion, an approach that is new to Jewish philosophy. Taking the circularity of the motions of the heavenly bodies as a point of departure, he argues that the souls of the spheres in their motions pass from potentiality into actuality just as the human soul does. This motion must be caused by the intellects of the spheres that are objects of desire for their souls. The existence of heavenly incorporeal substances thus having been established, Ibn Daud goes on to describe how the lower proceeds from the higher, according to “the philosophers”. In their view, a first intelligence emanates from the One, which is similarly incorporeal, but not simple, as it has a cause, which involves composition in this entity. In a three-fold act of cognition, this intelligence produces a triad of heavenly intellect, sphere-soul and heavenly body, and this process is repeated until the sphere of the moon to which the active intellect belongs. From the various motions of the spheres, matter and forms emanate on the sub-lunar world. The details of this process are not pertinent to our current purposes. It is more relevant to note that Ibn Daud criticizes the emanation-theory of the philosophers by claiming that there are no demonstrative proofs for it. In his view, they invented their theory to solve the problem of how many can come forth from one, yet, at the same time, it seems to raise more questions than it actually solves. As he puts it: “They escaped from one defamation but fell into others” (ER W 67; S 159b).

Ibn Daud's own position, however, is far from clear. There is no doubt that he accepts the notion of a hierarchical causal chain of heavenly souls and intelligences that have an influence on the heavenly world. However, he leaves his reader in the dark as to how they proceed from God, claiming that the human intellect is too limited to grasp this and that the philosophers err when they assume that the intellect can know everything. More generally, he does never address the issue of emanation versus creation. Although he equates the God of the philosophers with the Biblical Creator, he offers no arguments in favour of creation. All that we hear is that “grand things”, such as the Ten Commandments, come directly from God. However, he fails to explain how this should be reconciled with the theory of emanation, according to which only one thing proceeds from God directly and other things indirectly. Likewise, Ibn Daud tells us in one passage that matter does not proceed from God directly; whereas in another he bluntly states that matter is God's creation without offering any argumentation for this last statement.

Ibn Daud identifies the intelligences, which are also referred to as elevated, simple, separate or incorporeal substances, with the angels in Scripture that are intermediaries between God and man. Indeed, it is precisely their function as secondary causes that turn them into an indispensable element in his thought. Firstly, he uses the angels to avoid the unworthy notion that God should occupy himself with the particulars of the terrestrial world, which would imply plurality in divine knowledge. According to Ibn Daud, the angels are entrusted with this task. Secondly, Ibn Daud expounds the notion that the angels are intermediaries for the interpretation of certain biblical texts that seem to imply a change of will in God, which is tantamount to plurality in his essence. His solution is that such verses refer not to God, but to various classes of intermediaries instead. By this interpretation, which is the outcome of philosophical reasoning, Ibn Daud sought to counter the charges of anthropomorphism that were made by the Muslim theologian Ibn Hazm.

5.5 Prophecy

Prophecy is another important issue in Ibn Daud's thought, as it is the prophet who is the link between the heavenly world and man. He is the person who—thanks to his specific knowledge—must guide man towards intellectual and moral perfection. Ibn Daud's account of prophecy immediately follows his discussion of the intelligences, since it is the Active Intellect that plays a crucial role in the explanation of prophecy. This account has a twofold aim: firstly, to provide a rational explanation of the phenomenon of prophecy and, secondly, to defend the eternal validity of Mosaic Law against Christian and Muslim claims to the contrary. Ibn Daud is, however, not entirely consistent with regard to the first objective. He begins his exposition by following the Muslim philosophers in arguing that prophecy is a natural process that is related to dreams. Basing himself on his psychology, he explains how in certain circumstances someone can receive the overflow of the Active Intellect on his imaginative faculty and intellect by which he becomes a prophet. This goal can be pursued by people with a pure soul through study and association with good people. It would thus seem that anybody who meets certain requirements will automatically become a prophet. However, in a manner reminiscent of Judah Halevi, Ibn Daud then adds that the occurrence of this phenomenon is bound to certain conditions of place, time and nation. Clearly these stipulations are an attempt to safeguard the special character of biblical prophecy, but at the same time they impinge on the universalistic character of his psychological explanation of prophecy.

The defense of the eternal validity of Mosaic Law is directed against Christians, whose major claim was that the Law of Moses was replaced by the New Testament, as well as against Muslims, who believed that the Law received by Moses was falsified throughout the course of time. We do not need review his polemics here or his use of Islamic theological arguments to prove that Moses is the only prophet who meets the requirements of classifying as a “true prophet”. What is of interest for our purpose is that Ibn Daud structures his arguments in a syllogistic framework, so as to adapt this polemical chapter to the overall philosophical outlook of the rest of the work.

As to the place of this chapter in Ibn Daud's book, Amira Eran has suggested that the chapter on prophecy originally formed an independent unit, which was later integrated into the ER (Eran 1998: 263ff.).

5.6 Free Will

The topics that have been discussed thus far are all considered by Ibn Daud to be necessary steps towards the solution of the problem of the freedom of the human will. Towards the end of the book, he finally addresses the issue within the context of a cluster of related problems, such as God's knowledge, the nature of evil, causality and providence. Ibn Daud's theory of physical evil is to a large extent based on Ibn Sina's approach. It is impossible that God should be the agent of evil. The evil that is found in nature is due to matter. In fact, it is a privation, just as darkness is the privation of light. As such it is not-being and cannot be brought about by an agent. Moreover, what an individual considers to be evil can be a benefit for mankind as a whole. In line with Ibn Daud's conception of man as a microcosm, evil in man is likewise to be ascribed to his matter and to the absence of knowledge. However, man is able to free himself from matter by means of knowledge, that is, by the actualization of his potential intellect with the help of the intelligences so as to be able to discriminate between good and evil. Another remedy for the resistance of evil lies in the Torah. Man's choice to fight his evil inclination is neither necessary, nor impossible, but possible. To explain this, Ibn Daud states that God provided certain created things with possibility. However, the “possible” can be divided into two kinds, the first being the “possible” that is due to ignorance, for example that the people of Spain do not know whether the king of Babylon died today or whether he is alive. To them the matter is possible because of their ignorance of what happens far away whereas in itself the matter is not possible: one of the alternatives must necessarily be true (ER W 11-16; S 205b11-14). With respect to the second kind of the “possible” Ibn Daud says that it is “possible”

because God made it as “possible” and created it as something that admits of two contrary attributes, either this or that, just as it happened to be —as regards this [kind of possible] one cannot deny that God knows it as possible. And if someone would object by saying “does God not know the end of the matter?” we reply that this is not ignorance (ER W 86.21-25; S 206a5-9).

Moreover, Ibn Daud makes use of a fourfold division of causes that he found in Halevi: besides necessary causes that God knows as necessary, there are natural and incidental causes that are entrusted to secondary causes. The fourth category consists of free causes or “causes due to choice”, thanks to which man is free to choose between good and evil. In other words, God has no foreknowledge as regards human action. This rather drastic conclusion is quite unusual in Jewish philosophy; prior to Ibn Daud no Jewish philosopher was prepared to limit God's knowledge to save the notion of free will. In Ibn Daud's view, however, this position does not involve ignorance in God.

Once man has made a choice with respect to moral conduct, the angels assist him in carrying out his choice. Moreover, the providence exercised by the angels is commensurate with man's own efforts. In this way, the biblical verses that seem to convey that human action is determined by God are to be explained: the “hardening” of Pharaoh's heart (Ex. 7:3) means that the intelligences helped him to persist in carrying out his own bad choices.

Ibn Daud's approach to the question of free will is not without serious difficulties. Firstly, his conception of evil as privation and as associated with matter conflicts with his initial conception of matter as a substance. Secondly, on the one hand, Ibn Daud argues that it is the intellect that chooses between good and evil, yet he also claims that the choice is a matter of man's heart, without explaining how these two notions relate. Finally, he has nothing to say on the possibility of “repentance”, which seems to imply that man is determined as it were by his own first choice.

Unsatisfactory as Ibn Daud's solution may be, he has nonetheless succeeded in removing the contradiction between biblical verses on the issue and thus in establishing harmony between philosophy and religion. It was important for him to demonstrate this harmony with respect to all the topics that led up to the question under consideration, but it is essential with respect to free will, because here philosophical speculation and religious practice intertwine. For Ibn Daud, there is no point in leading a religious life when man is not free to choose. This issue of free will therefore marks the transition from philosophical speculation to practical philosophy, which is the subject of the last part of ER.

5.7 Ethics and Religious Practice

Ibn Daud has developed a philosophic conception of God who is absolutely one and acts through intermediaries. From this God only good can proceed, whereas evil is to be attributed to matter and to man's own bad choices. Once it has been established that man indeed has free choice with regard to moral conduct and that evil does not come from God, there is no impediment for man to opt for the good life. In his practical philosophy Ibn Daud expounds his view of the best life. His point of departure is a description of the ethics of the philosophers, which is a combination of Platonic psychology with corresponding virtues to the concupiscent, vital and rational soul and the Aristotelian conception of virtue as the proper mean between two extremes, a model that he borrows from Muslim philosophers.

He deviates, however, from the Platonic scheme by positing justice instead of wisdom as the supreme cardinal virtue. Wisdom appears as the virtue belonging to the theoretical intellect, but thanks to justice, which in Ibn Daud's interpretation is a mean that gives everything its due, man is able to attain bliss. Man can attain bliss, the highest goal to which practical philosophy leads us, through moral perfection, which consists in perfecting his character, and in leading a good family and social life. Justice is the highest virtue for it effects harmony between the various faculties of the soul in the individual and forms the basis for man's social life. Not only is it a philosophical virtue, but it is also a divine commandment, as can be derived from Micah 6:8. Justice indeed appears to be a key-notion in Ibn Daud's ethics, for it also provides the basis for man's relation with God, and thus, the rationale for fulfilling the commandments of the Torah. Ibn Daud's reasoning is as follows: once it has been established that only good proceeds from God, it is a matter of justice that man requites his benefactor by serving God. The choice to serve God is consequent upon true knowledge of God, for such knowledge automatically produces love in man, and love in turn requires action, that is, divine worship which is achieved by accepting the commandments of the Torah.

Love and knowledge thus appear to be interrelated for one cannot love what one does not know. Intellectual love of God has fear of God, in the sense of awe, as a corollary and automatically leads man to divine worship. The Torah is the most perfect guide for leading a good moral and religious life, for it contains commandments that help man to constantly direct his actions towards God, as well as commandments that teach moral and social virtues. Moreover, it includes the so-called revelational commandments that call for obedience. Even though no rational explanation can be found for them, man must accept them once reason has established that they belong to a true revelation, which has been brought by a true and morally perfect prophet.

This emphasis on religious practice in the last part of ER is consistent with Ibn Daud's statement in his introduction that the goal of study is practical philosophy (ER W 4. S 8b). While the bulk of the book is concerned with philosophical speculation, by the end of it practical philosophy comes to occupy center stage. This shift from philosophical speculation to religious praxis gains extra significance against the background of Judah Halevi's attack on the philosophical worldview in Kuzari I.1. According to Halevi, for the philosophers the highest good is conjunction with the Active Intellect. Once man has attained this degree, it does not matter which religion or which kind of divine worship he adopts. Although Ibn Daud does not mention Halevi by name, it is clear that he was familiar with and used his work. In fact, his work can be seen as a direct response to Halevi. Whereas Halevi regards philosophy as a threat to religion, for Ibn Daud it is indispensable for it, since the study of philosophy induces man to accept religious commandments, including those whose rationale is obscure. Therefore, despite the extensive theoretical discussions, ER as a whole can be seen as a work of practical philosophy. Moreover, one may argue that it is a defense of philosophy as much as it is a defense of religion.

6. Abraham Ibn Daud and Maimonides

If Ibn Daud can be regarded as the pioneer of medieval Jewish Aristotelianism, the question arises whether Maimonides, who, through his Guide and his prestige turned it into the dominant current in medieval Jewish rationalism, was familiar with the thought of his predecessor. Husik goes as far as to state: “we feel tempted to say that if not for Ibn Daud there would have been no Maimonides” (Husik 2002: 198). However, Maimonides makes no explicit mention of Ibn Daud in any of his works. Yet he seems to allude to him in Guide I.71, when he refers to one of the earlier Jewish Andalusian thinkers whose doctrine is approximately the same as that of his own book, a description that fits Ibn Daud far better than any other of Maimonides' Jewish predecessors. In spite of the absence of a specific mention of Ibn Daud, it is highly probable that Maimonides was familiar with Ibn Daud's work, as the large number of similarities between the two works suggests.[2] To a large extent, these points of overlap are due to their authors' common use of theories from Islamic sources, such as the demonstrations for the existence of God. Other parallels, however, cannot be attributed to these sources, such as parallels in Biblical exegesis, in particular verses that relate to the doctrine of angels, their interpretation of the term elohim and of the terms tselem and demut in Gen. 1:26.[3]

Other shared characteristics concern the general framework and the intended audience: both works seek to guide Jews who are confused in their traditional belief as a result of the study of philosophy. Moreover, in some passages, Maimonides seems to implicitly criticize or correct Ibn Daud, for example, in his doctrine of attributes where Maimonides explicitly rejects the view that attributes that are understood as relations can be ascribed to God (cf. section 5.3 above). Maimonides says that at first sight this kind of predication may seem permissible, but more exact speculation proves that it is incorrect, since there is no true relation between God and what is other than God (Guide I.52, transl. Pines p. 120). In general, one is tempted to assume that Ibn Daud's work served as a model for Maimonides from which he drew inspiration on the one hand and which he found to be in need of improvement on the other. One aspect of Ibn Daud's work that Maimonides will certainly have disapproved of is Ibn Daud's extensive use of Ibn Sina's philosophy.

7. Conclusion

Abraham ibn Daud's importance lies in the fact that he was the first to present a coherent systematic interpretation of Judaism in light of the new challenge, namely Muslim Aristotelianism. The sustained use of Aristotelian doctrines and logical reasoning clearly distinguishes ER from the writings of earlier Jewish philosophers. Moreover, the manner in which he incorporates his Muslim (and to a lesser extent) Jewish sources in a carefully structured system in order to solve a religious problem is noteworthy. His thought develops along the following lines: substance – form – motion and transition from potentiality into actuality – soul – God – intelligences – prophet – freedom of the will – correspondence between correct knowledge and correct conduct – perfection.

Nonetheless, it should be noted that Ibn Daud's thought contains a number of “loose ends”; the promised harmony between religion and philosophy is certainly not always achieved. Cases in point are his ambiguous position with regard to the origin and status of matter and the way in which he skirts around the issue of creation versus emanation. The inconsistencies and undetermined issues in ER are partly the result of the influence of neo-Platonism. The Aristotelianism of the Muslim peripatetics still contains an appreciable number of neo-Platonic notions that have made an impact on Ibn Daud. Arfa's evaluation of Ibn Daud's philosophic activity “at the point where it has rejected neo-Platonism but has not yet freed itself of many of its fundamental doctrines and thought habits, and on the other hand has espoused Aristotelianism but has not yet assimilated the full meaning of its world outlook” hits the nail right on the head (Arfa 1954: 4). For another part, the flaws in Ibn Daud's thought are due to his conception of philosophical knowledge as the foundation on which religion should be built. For all the importance he attaches to the use of philosophical speculation, his bias is religious, which is why he prefers to remain vague about or to omit Aristotelian doctrines like the eternity of motion. When harmony between religion and philosophy seems to be impossible, Ibn Daud shrinks from accepting the consequences of Aristotle's doctrines and instead chooses to seek refuge in the limitations of the human intellect, claiming that the philosophers tend to overreach themselves. The weaknesses in his thought notwithstanding, Ibn Daud's significance for the development of Jewish philosophy can hardly be underestimated.


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Abraham ibn Daud


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Avicebron (Ibn Gabirol) | faith | Halevi, Judah | Ibn Ezra, Abraham | Maimonides | Saadya [Saadiah]