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Robert Alyngton

First published Wed Jul 25, 2001; substantive revision Tue Aug 1, 2006

Robert Alyngton was one of the most important authors of the generation after John Wyclif. He was deeply influenced by Walter Burley's logico-ontological system and Wyclif's metaphysics. (His major extant work, a commentary on the Categories, heavily depends on Burley's last commentary on the Categories and Wyclif's De ente praedicamentali.) Yet he was able to develop new logical and semantic theories as well as the general strategy adopted by the Oxford Realists, as he methodically substituted reference to external objective realities for reference to linguistic and/or mental activities.

1. Life and Works

Not a great deal is known of Robert Alyngton's life. Most of the information about him comes from Emden 1957-59. From 1379 until 1386, he was fellow of Queens College (the same Oxonian college where Wyclif started his theological studies in 1363 and Johannes Sharpe taught in the 1390s); he became Magister Artium and, by 1393, doctor of theology. He was chancellor of the University in 1393 and 1395. In 1382 he preached Wyclif's religious and political ideas in Hampshire (McHardy 1987). He was rector of Long Whatton, Leicestershire, where he died by September 1398.

According to Emden 1957-59 and Ashworth & Spade 1992, Alyngton was of considerable repute as a logician. Among his extant works, the following can be mentioned (the most complete list of his writings is found in Bale 1557-59 [pp. 519-20]):

2. Being and Categories

Like Burley, Alyngton affirms that (i) the division into categories is first of all a division of things existing outside the mind, and only secondarily of the mental concepts and spoken or written terms which signify them, and (ii) things belonging to one categorial field are really distinct from those belonging to another — for instance, substances are really distinct from quantities, qualities, and relations, quantities are really distinct from substances, qualities, and relations, and so on (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, Conti pp. 251, 252-53).

As far as the problem of the relationship of the ten categories to being is concerned, Alyngton does not follow Burley but Wyclif, since he hypostatises the notion of being and considers equivocity, analogy, and univocity not only as semantic relations between terms and things, but also as real relations between extrametal objects (In Cat., cap. de aequivocis, ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393, fols. 69v-70r). According to the common interpretation of the opening passage of the Categories, equivocal terms are correlated with more than one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing different natures, whereas univocal terms are correlated with only one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing one and the same nature. Within Alyngton's system, what differentiates analogy from univocity is the way in which a certain nature (or property) is shared by a set of things: analogous things share it according to different degrees (secundum magis et minus, or secundum prius et posterius), univocal things share it all in the same manner and to the same degree (In Cat., cap. de numero et sufficientia praedicamentorum, pp. 255-256). Alyngton admits four main types of equivocity: by chance, deliberate, analogical, and generic. Equivocals by chance are those things to which it just happens that they have the same name, but with different meanings and/or reasons for imposing the name. Those things are deliberate equivocals which have distinct natures but the same name, and are subordinated to different but correlated concepts. Those things are analogical which share the nature signified by their common name in various degrees and/or ways. Generic equivocals are those things which share the same generic nature in the same way, but have distinct specific natures of different absolute value (In Cat., cap. de aequivocis, fol. 70r). According to this account, being is a sort of basic component of the metaphysical structure of each reality, which posses it in accordance with its own nature, value, and position in the hierarchy of created beings.

3. Universals and Predication

Alyngton recognizes three main kinds of universals:

  1. ante rem or ideal universals — that is, the ideas in God, the archetypes of all that is;
  2. in re or formal universals — that is, the common natures shared by individual things; and
  3. post rem or intentional universals — that is, mental signs of the formal universals.

The ideas in God are the causes of formal universals, and formal universals are the causes of intentional universals. Furthermore, like Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton holds that formal universals actually exist (in actu) outside our minds, and not potentially only (in potentia) as moderate realists thought (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 279) — even if, unlike Burley (the Doctor Planus et Perspicuus), he maintains they are really identical with their individuals, for otherwise it would be impossible to explain, against the Nominalists, why and how individual substances show different and more or less close kinds of similarity among themselves (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 267-68).

According to Alyngton, who depends here on Avicenna and Wyclif, formal universals are common natures in virtue of which the individuals that share them are exactly what they are — as the human species is the form by which every man formally is a man. Qua natures, they are prior, and so indifferent, to any division into universals and individuals. Universality (universalitas or communicabilitas) is as it were their inseparable property, but not a constitutive mark of the nature itself (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 101v). As a consequence, formal universals can be conceived of in two different manners: as first intentions or as second intentions. In the former case, they are natures of a certain kind and are identical with their individuals (for example, man is the same thing as Socrates). In the latter case, they are properly universals (that is, something that can exist in many things and can be shared by them), and are distinct from their individuals considered qua individuals, because of opposite constitutive principles (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 268). Therefore, universals are really (realiter) identical to, but formally (formaliter) distinct from their individuals. In fact, universals are formal causes in relation to their individuals, and individuals are material causes in relation to their universals. Thus three different kinds of entities can be qualified as formal universals:

  1. the common natures instantiated by individuals — which are things of first intention;
  2. the form itself of universality, which belongs to a certain common nature when seen in its relation to the individuals — which is a thing of second intention; and
  3. the thinkability proper to the common nature, by which it is a possible object of our mind — that is, the real principle that connects formal universals with mental universals (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 277).

Alyngton accepts the traditional realistic account of the relationship between formal universals and individuals, and, like Wyclif, improves it by defining its logical structure more accurately. Alyngton thought that a universal of the category of substance could directly receive only the predications of substantial forms more common than itself. On the other hand, accidental forms inhering in substantial individuals could be predicated only indirectly (essentialiter) of the substantial form itself that those individuals instantiate, predicated indirectly through and in virtue of the individuals of that substantial form. So his description of the logical structure of the relationship between universals and individuals demanded a redefinition of predication. Alyngton was probably the first to ameliorate Wyclif's theory of predication by dividing predication into formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and remote inherence (inhaerentia remota) or predication by essence (praedicatio secundum essentiam). Remote inherence is grounded in a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some but not all metaphysical constituents, and does not demand that the form signified by the predicate term be directly present in the entity signified by the subject term. On the other hand, such a direct presence is needed by formal predication. "Man is an animal" and "Socrates is white" are instances of formal predication; "(What is) singular is (what is) common" (singulare est commune) and "Humanity is running" (humanitas est currens) are instances of remote inherence, as according to Alyngton it is possible to attribute the property of being running to the form of humanity if at least one man is running. However, he makes sure to use as a predicate term a substantival adjective in its neuter form, because only in this way can it be made apparent that the form signified by the predicate term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it, through its individuals (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 288-90).

4. The Theory of Substance

These remarks on the relations between forms and substances bring us to che core of Alyngton's ontology: the doctrine of substance, developed in the fifth chapter of his commentary on the Categories. Alyngton's treatment can be divided into two main parts. (i) The first attempts to clarify what characterizes substance, and therefore what falls by itself into that category; (ii) the second is concerned with the distinction between primary (or individual) and secondary (or universal) substances.

Alyngton lists seven opinions about the nature and mode of being of substance, the last of which he supports.

  1. According to the first one, proper to grammarians, substance is what the term ‘substance’ refers to when utilized in a broad sense, that is, the quiddity (quidditas) or essence (essentia) of anything. In this case, substance is not a category, since the items which fulfil this description do not share any common nature (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 263).
  2. The second opinion is that of Avicenna, who affirms that any entity which does not inhere in something else is a substance (cf. Liber de philosophia prima, tr. 8, cap. 4, S. Van Riet ed., 2 vols., Louvain-Leiden: Peeters-Brill, 1977-80, vol. 2, pp. 403-404). According to this view, God, substantial differences, and negative truths can be said to be substances, even though only in an analogical way (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 263-264).
  3. A third meaning of the term ‘substance’ can be drawn from the use (of that term) proper to common people and theologians: everything which plays the role of foundation (fundamentum) in relation to something else is a substance. In this sense, the surface is the foundation (and therefore the substance) of the whiteness (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  4. The fourth opinion seems to be the same as the anonymous one discussed and partially criticized by Burley in his last commentary on the Categories (A.D. 1337, cap. de substantia, ed. Venetiis 1509, fol. 22rb-va). Substance would be (i) a positive being, which (ii) does not inhere in something else, and (iii) is naturally apt to play the role of subject in relation to absolute accidents (that is, quantities and qualities). According to this view, matter, form, the composite made up of matter and form, and the angelic intelligences are substances, whereas substantial differences and negative truths are not, since the former do not satisfy the third requisite, nor the latter the first one (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  5. The fifth opinion is that of Boethius (cf. In Categorias Aristotelis libri quattuor, PL, vol. 64, 184A-B), according to whom substance is (i) a positive being, which (ii) does not inhere in something else, and (iii) is a compound of matter and form (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).
  6. The sixth opinion is that of Burley (cf. Expositio super Praedicamenta Aristotelis, cap. de substantia, fol. 24ra.), to whom Alyngton refers by the expression ‘moderni logici’. According to Burley, (i) not being in a subject, (ii) having an essence, (iii) autonomy and independent existence, and (iv) the capacity of underlying accidental forms are the main aspect of substances. This means that primary substances alone are substances properly speaking, while matter and form, and substantial differences are not (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 265).
  7. The last opinion is that of Wyclif (cf. De ente praedicamentali, cap. 5, pp. 36-39), quoted extensively and almost verbatim. Alyngton claims that it is superior to the preceding ones (septima est expositio metaphysica et altior ad intelligendum quam praenominatae). According to this view, the constitutive principle of the substance is not the capacity of underlying absolute accidents, but it is the capacity of underlying potency and act, which are its inner foundations — the capacity of underlying accidents being only a derivative property (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 267).

Wyclif's position about the nature of substance implies that the distinction between potency and act is, from the point of view of metaphysics, the most fundamental distinction, of which that between form and matter is but one example. As (i) prime matter is pure potentiality, while form is act, and (ii) the distinction between potency and act is wider than that between matter and form, the latter is a particular case of the former. In fact, according to Wyclif, the distinction between potency and act runs though the whole of creation, since it applies also to any kinds of spiritual creatures, whereas the distinction between matter and form is found only in the corporeal creatures. On the contrary, Alyngton seems to interpret the distinction between potency and act as a particular case of the distinction between matter and form, since he constantly explains the meaning of the opposition potency-act in terms of the opposition between matter and form in a crucial passage that he quotes from Wyclif's De ente praedicamentali (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 267 [= Wyclif, De ente praedicamentali, cap. 5, pp. 38-39]). The result is a sort of universal hylemorphism, since in this way matter and form serve as principles in the order of being as well as in the order of becoming. All the more so because Alyngton seems to accept the thesis that (angelic) intelligences are not pure forms existing by themselves, but formal principles necessarily joined to the matter of the heavens in such a way as to make up living beings (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 264).

A second consequence of this approach to the problem of the nature of substance is that, within his system, primary substances alone are substances properly speaking. This conclusion is confirmed by his analysis of the distinctive mark (proprium) of substance: while remaining numerically one and the same, being capable of admitting contrary properties, the modification taking place through a change in the subject itself of the motion at issue. Alyngton appears to think that this description is satisfied only by primary (that is, individual) substances (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 104v). Secondary substances therefore are per se in the category of substance only insofar as they are constitutive parts of primary substances. Thus, secondary substances belong to the category of substance by virtue of the individual substances that instantiate them, since they are not formally substances. In fact, unlike primary substances, secondary substances are forms, and consequently incomplete entities with an imperfect and dependent mode of existence. They require composite substances in order to properly exist. No form as such, not even the substantial ones, is formally a substance, since no form as such has (i) the capacity of underlying potency and act, and (ii) matter and form as its inner constituent. Secondary substances are related to primary substances as formal principles of the latter. It is in this way that humanity and (say) Socrates are linked together. For this reason no secondary substances as such are totally identical with primary substances (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 280; see also pp. 281 and 282-283). As a consequence, while ‘man is animal’ (‘homo est animal’) is a sentence to which a formal predication corresponds in the world, a predication by essence matches ‘humanity is animality’ (‘humanitas est animalitas’). Any (individual) man is an animal because of the form of humanity present in him qua its essential constituent, albeit the form of humanity as such is not the principle of animality. Therefore, humanity is not formally animality nor rationality, even though it is animality plus rationality (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 283-284; see also cap. de quantitate, fols. 106v-107r).

Primary substances are the substrate of existence of any other kinds of categorial being, as nothing exists in addition to primary substances but secondary substances and accidents, which both are forms present in individual substances. Like Aristotle (Categories 5, 2b5-6), Alyngton can therefore affirm that primary substances are the necessary condition of existence for any other items of the world: nothing could exist, if primary substances stopped existing (In Cat., cap. de substantia, p. 286). This does not mean, however, that it would be possible to find in the world a primary substance (i) that would not belong to a certain species, and (ii) without any accident inhering in it. It means that, from the point of view of full existence, accidents and secondary substances always presuppose primary substances, as to be a primary substance is to be an autonomous singular existing item (hoc aliquid), whilst (i) to be a secondary substance is to be a quale quid, that is, an inner and essential determination (or form) of a primary substance, and (ii) to be an accident is to be an outer determination or aspect of a primary substance (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fol. 101v).

5. The Theory of Relations

Aristotle's treatment of relations in the Categories and in the Metaphysics is opaque and incomplete. Because of this fact, in Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages many authors tried to reformulate the doctrine of relatives. Alyngton's attempt is the most interesting among those of the Late Middle Ages, as he was the only one able to work out a concept of relation conceived of as an accidental form which is in both the relatives at once, even if in different ways (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 296). Consequently his notion of relation can be considered the ontological equivalent to our modern functions with two variables, or two-place predicates, whereas all other authors of the Middle Ages had thought of relations in terms of monadic functions.

According to Alyngton, whose account partially differs from those of Burley and Wyclif, in the act of relating one substance to another four distinct constitutive elements can be singled out:

  1. the relation itself — for instance, the form of paternity;
  2. the substrate of the relation, that is, the substance that denominatively receives the name of the relation — for instance, the (substance that is the) father;
  3. the object of the relation, that is, the substance the substrate of the relation is connected with — for instance, the (substance that is the) son; and
  4. the foundation (fundamentum) of the relation, that is, the absolute entity in virtue of which the relation inheres in the substrate and in the object (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 299).

The foundation is the main component, since it (i) joins the relation to the underlying substances, (ii) lets the relation link the substrate to the object, and (iii) transmits some of its properties to the relation. Unlike Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton affirms that not only qualities and quantities, but substances too can be the foundation of a relation (In Cat., cap. de relatione, p. 291).

On this basis, Alyngton can define relations of reason while eliminating from their description any reference to our mind and using objective criteria only, based on the framework of reality itself. In fact, he maintains that what characterizes relations of reason is the fulfillment of at least one of these conditions: (i) either the rrelation's subject of inherence or its object is not a substance; (ii) the object is not an actual entity; (iii) the foundation of the relation is not an absolute being — that is. a substance, a quantity, or a quality (In Cat., cap. de relatione, pp. 291-92, and 294-95).

6. The Semantics of Second Intentions

Not until the end of the fourteenth century did anyone claim extramental reality for second intentions, not even Walter Burley. According to him, second intentions are concepts that have a foundation in the extramental world, but are not "things" in the proper sense of the term. This account implied that the keystone of medieval realism, the principle of one-to-one correspondence between language and the world, has to suffer an exception, since no common nature matches second intention terms. It was just in order to do away with this exception that Alyngton (then followed by William Penbygull, Roger Whelpdale, and John Tarteys) hypostatized second intentions, heavily modifying the standard theory of the status of second intentions. In fact, Alyngton not only considers second intentions as objective, but clearly hypostatizes them, speaking of them in terms of real determinations joined to the modes of being of extramental things and directly inhering in them (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 268-69). As a consequence, he conceives of logic as an analysis of the general framework of reality, since according to him logic turns on structural forms (aimed at building up semantic contents), which are, as forms, independent of both such contents and of the mental acts by which they are learned. It is through these forms that the network connecting the basic constituents of the world (individuals and universals, substances and accidents) is disclosed to us (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 278-79). The strategy that supports this choice is evident: as in the case of relations of reason, Alyngton is trying to substitute references to external reality for references to mental activity. In other words, he seeks to reduce epistemology to ontology. From a logical point of view, this means that the same interpretative pattern is employed in order to account for both the semantic power of proper names and common terms (that is, those expressions that refer to a class of individuals), and first and second intentions. Like proper names, common terms also primarily signify and label a unique object — that is, a common nature. But unlike the object signified by a proper name, the reality of the common nature is distributed among many individuals as their main metaphysical constituent, since it determines the typical features of the individuals themselves. By associating common terms with such objects as their main referent, Alyngton thinks he can explain the fact that a common term can stand for and label many individuals at once. Only in this way does he believe we can grant the value of our knowledge, which otherwise lacks an adequate foundation (In Cat., cap. de substantia, fols. 101v-102v).

Still, this procedure, so strong and powerful, leads to a paradox when applied to terms of second intention by which we speak of singular objects considered as such — that is, terms (or expressions) like ‘first substance’ (substantia prima), ‘individual’ (individuum), and so on. In fact, according to Alyngton (and many other Realists of that period), a common term is always matched by a common nature really existing in the world. Therefore, as the term ‘individual’ appears to be common, since it can stand for a multiplicity of things, it should signify an extramental common nature shared by them. As a consequence, we would have to admit the existence of an individual common nature, that is a (self-contradictory) entity present in all the individuals as the cause of their being individuals. Alyngton, who would not give up the principle of the one-to-one relation between philosophical language and the world, could remove this paradox only by classifying this kind of term among atomic (discreti) terms — that is, terms or nominal syntagms, like ‘Socrates’ or ‘this man’ (hic homo), that refer to individuals and not to sets of individuals. According to Alyngton, there are three main kinds of atomic terms:

  1. personal pronouns, which identify a singular definite referent by means of an ostensive definition (a demonstratione);
  2. proper names; and
  3. range-narrowed expressions (a limitatione intellectus) — that is, expressions, like ‘this man’, that identify a singular referent as a member of a given (manifested) set of individuals. Also expressions like ‘first substance’ and ‘individual’ belong to this third type, since they presuppose a general concept (substance and being, in the example), the range of which is narrowed to a unique object among substances and beings by an act of our intellect — to one object that is not common (In Cat., cap. de substantia, pp. 270-71).

The rule that terms can be listed as common ones if and only if they signify a common nature is safe, but at the cost of a counterintuitive categorization of their semantic power. In fact, according to Alyngton's account, saying that Socrates and Plato are first substances simply means that (i) each one is what he is, and that (ii) what each one is is a non-universal substance. This is a solution that entails that to be an individual is not a positive state of affairs, but a negative one, and therefore connects Alyngton's ontology with Henry of Ghent's theory of individuation.


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Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Wyclif, John