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John Wyclif

First published Tue Sep 18, 2001; substantive revision Fri Sep 30, 2005

John Wyclif (ca. 1330-84) was one of the most important and authoritative thinkers of the Middle Ages. His activity is set in the very crucial period of late Scholasticism, when the new ideas and doctrines there propounded accelerated the transition to the modern way of thought. On the one hand, he led a movement of opposition to the medieval Church and to some of its dogmas and institutions, and was a forerunner of the Reformation; on the other, he was also the most prominent English philosopher of the second half of the 14th century. His logical and ontological theories are, at the same time, the final result of the preceding realistic tradition of thought and the starting-point of the new forms of realism at the end of the Middle Ages, since many authors active during the last decades of the 14th and/or the first decades of the 15th centuries (Robert Alyngton, William Penbygull, Johannes Sharpe, William Milverley, Roger Whelpdale, John Tarteys, and Paul of Venice), were heavily influenced by his metaphysics and largely used his logical apparatus. However, his philosophical system, rigorous in its general design, contains unclear and aporetic points that his followers attempted to remove. So, although an influential thinker, Wyclif pointed to the strategy the Realists at the end of the Middle Ages were to adopt, rather than fully developed it.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

John Wyclif was born near Richmond (Yorkshire) before 1330 and ordained in 1351. He spent the greater part of his life in the schools at Oxford: he was fellow of Merton in 1356, master of arts at Balliol in 1360, and doctor of divinity in 1372. He definitely left Oxford in 1381 for Lutterworth (Leicestershire), where he died on 31 December, 1384. It was not until 1374 (when he went on a diplomatic mission to Bruges) that Wyclif entered the royal service, but his connection with John of Gaunt, Duke of Lancaster, probably dates back to 1371. His ideas on lordship and church wealth, expressed in De civili dominio (On Civil Dominion), caused in 1377 his first official condemnation by the Pope (Gregory XI), who censured nineteen articles. As has been pointed out (Leff 1967), in 1377-78 Wyclif made a swift progression from unqualified fundamentalism to a heretical view of the Church and its Sacraments. He clearly claimed the supremacy of the king over the priesthood (see for instance his De ecclesia [On the Church], between early 1378 and early 1379), and the simultaneous presence in the Eucharist of the substance of the bread and the body of Christ (De eucharistia [On the Eucharist], and De apostasia [On Apostasy], both ca. 1380). His theses would influence Jan Hus and Jerome of Prague in the 15th century. So long as he limited his attack to abuses and the wealth of the Church, he could rely on the support of a (more or less extended) part of the clergy and aristocracy, but once he dismissed the traditional doctrine of transubstantiation, his (unorthodox) theses could not be defended any more. Thus in 1382 Archbishop Courtenay had twenty-four propositions that were attributed to Wyclif condemned by a council of theologians, and could force Wyclif's followers at Oxford University to retract their views or flee. The Council of Constance (1414-18) condemned Wyclif's writings and ordered his books burned and his body removed from consecrated ground. This last order, confirmed by Pope Martin V, was carried out in 1428.

The most complete biographical study of Wyclif is still the monograph of Workman 1926, but the best analysis of his intellectual development and of the philosophical and theological context of his ideas is Robson 1961.

1.2 Works

Wyclif produced a very large body of work, both in Latin and English, a great portion of which has been edited by the Wyclif Society between the end of the 19th and the beginning of the 20th centuries, even though some of his most important books are still unpublished — for instance, his treatises on time (De tempore) and on divine ideas (De ideis). W. R. Thomson 1983 wrote a full bibliography of Wyclif's Latin writings, among which the following can be mentioned: De logica (On Logic — ca. 1360); Continuatio logicae (Continuation of [the Treatise on] Logic — date of composition: about 1360-63 according to Thomson 1983, but between 1371 and 1374 according to Mueller 1985); De ente in communi (On Universal Being — ca. 1365); De ente primo in communi (On Primary Being — ca. 1365); De actibus animae (On the Acts of Soul – ca. 1365); Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (Amending Errors about Universals — between 1366 and 1368); De ente praedicamentali (On Categorial Being — ca. 1369); De intelleccione Dei (On the Intellection of God – ca. 1370); De volucione Dei (On the Volition of God – ca. 1370); Tractatus de universalibus (Treatise on Universals — ca. 1368-69 according to Thomson 1983, but between 1373 and 1374 according to Mueller 1985); De materia et forma (On matter and form — between late 1370 and early 1372 according to Thomson 1983, but about 1374-75 according to Mueller 1985). Many of these treatises were later arranged as a Summa, called Summa de ente (Summa on Being), in two books, containing seven and six treatises respectively. (On the genesis, nature, structure, and tasks of this work see Robson 1961, pp. 115-40.)

2. Logic

2.1 Some preliminary remarks

Late medieval Nominalists, like Ockham and his followers, drew a distinction between things as they exist in the extra-mental world and the schemata by means of which we think of and talk about them. While the world consists only of two genera of individuals, substances and qualities, the concepts by which they are grasped and expressed are universal and of ten different types. Nor do the relations through which we connect our notions in a proposition analytically correspond to the real links that join individuals in a state of affairs. Thus, our conceptual forms do not coincide with the elements and structures of reality, and our knowledge does not reproduce its objects but merely regards them.

Wyclif maintained that such an approach to philosophical questions was misleading and deleterious. Many times in his works he expressed the deepest hostility to such a tendency. He thought that only on the basis of a close isomorphism between language and the world could the signifying power of terms and statements, the possibility of definitions, and finally the validity and universality of our knowledge be explained and ensured. So the nucleus of his metaphysics lies in his trust in the scheme object-label as the general interpretative key of every logico-epistemological problem. He firmly believed that language was an ordered collection of signs, each referring to one of the constitutive elements of reality, and that true (linguistic) propositions were like pictures of those elements' inner structures or/and mutual relationships. From this point of view, universals are conceived of as the real essences common to many individual things, which are necessary conditions for our language to be significant. Wyclif thought that by associating common terms with such universal realities the fact could be accounted for that each common term can stand for many things at once and can label all of them in the same way.

This conviction explains the main characteristic of his philosophical style, to which all his contributions can be traced back: a strong propensity towards hypostatisation. Wyclif methodically replaces logical and epistemological rules with ontological criteria and references. He thought of logic as turning on structural forms, independent of both their semantic contents and the mental acts by which they are grasped. It is through these forms that the network connecting the basic constituents of the world (individuals and universals, substances and accidents, concrete properties, like being-white, and abstract forms, like whiteness) is disclosed to us. His peculiar analysis of predication and his own formulation of the Scotistic formal distinction are logically necessary requirements of this philosophical approach. They are two absolute novelties in late medieval philosophy, and certainly the most important of Wyclif's contributions to the thought of his times.

Wyclif's last formulation of the theory of difference and his theory of universals and predication are linked together, and rest upon a sort of componential analysis where things substitute for lexemes and ontological properties for semantic features. Within Wyclif's world, difference (or distinction) is defined in terms of partial identity, and is the main kind of transcendental relation holding among the world's objects, since in virtue of its metaphysical composition everything is at the same time partially identical to and different from any other. When the objects at issue are categorial items, and among what differentiates them is their own individual being, the objects differ essentially. If the objects share the same individual being and what differentiates them is (at least) one of their concrete metaphysical components (or features), then the objects differ really, whereas if what differentiates them is one of their abstract metaphysical components, then they differ formally. Formal distinction is therefore the tool by means of which the dialectic of one-many internal to the world's objects is regulated. It explains why one and the same thing is at the same time an atomic state of affairs and how many different beings can constitute just one thing.

2.2 The formal distinction

Wyclif explains the notion of formal distinction (or difference) in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (chap. 4, p. 38) and in the later Tractatus de universalibus. (On Wyclif's formulation of the formal distinction see Spade 1985, pp. xx-xxxi, and Conti 1997, pp. 158-63.) The two versions differ from each other on some important points, and are both unsatisfactory, since Wyclif's definitions of the different types of distinction are rather ambiguous.

In the Tractatus de universalibus (chap. 4, pp. 90-92), Wyclif lists three main kinds of differences (or distinctions):

  1. real-and-essential;
  2. real-but-not-essential; and
  3. formal (or notional).

He does not define the real-and-essential difference, but identifies it through a rough account of its three sub-types. The things that differ really-and-essentially are those that differ from each other either (i) in genus, like man and quantity, or (ii) in species, like man and donkey, or (iii) in number, like two human beings.

The real-but-not-essential difference is more subtle than the first kind, since it holds between things that are the same single essence but really differ from each other nevertheless — like memory, reason, and will, which are one and the same soul, and the three Persons of the Holy Trinity, who are the one and same God.

The third main kind of difference is the formal one. It is described as the difference by which things differ from each other even though they are constitutive elements of the same single essence or supposit. According to Wyclif, this is the case for:

  1. the concrete accidents inhering in the same substance, since they coincide in the same particular subject but differ from each other because of their own natures;
  2. the matter and substantial form of the same individual substance;
  3. what is more common in relation to what is less common, like (a) the divine nature and the three Persons, (b) the world and this world; and, (c) among the categorial items belonging to the same category, a superior item and one of its inferiors.

This account of the various kinds of distinctions is more detailed than that of the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi, but not more clear. What is the difference, for instance, between the definition of the real-but-not-essential distinction and the definition of the formal distinction? What feature do all the kinds of formal distinction agree in? Some points are obvious, however:

  1. The real-and-essential distinction matches the traditional real difference.
  2. The real-but-not-essential distinction and the first sub-type of the formal distinction (that is, the distinction that holds between two or more concrete accidents belonging to the same individual substance) are two slightly different versions of the Scotistic formal distinction as defined in Scotus' Lectura (book I, d. 2, p. 2, qq. 1-4, ed. Vaticana, vol. xvi, p. 216) and Ordinatio (book I, d. 2, p. 2, qq. 1-4, ed. Vaticana, vol. ii, pp. 356-57; book II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 6, ed. Vaticana, vol. vii, pp. 483-84).
  3. The third sub-type of the formal distinction is a reformulation of the Scotistic formal distinction as described in Scotus' Reportata Parisiensia (book I, d. 33, qq. 2-3, and d. 34, q. 1, ed. Vivès, vol. xxii, pp. 402-8, 410).

The main apparent dissimilarities between the analyses proposed in the Tractatus de universalibus and in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi are the following:

  1. There are three main kinds of differences instead of two.
  2. Notwithstanding the presence of the qualification ‘real’, the real-but-not-essential difference in the Tractatus de universalibus is closer to the formal difference than is the corresponding kind of difference in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi, since in the former the term ‘essence’ has the technical meaning of real entity with a given nature, and so is equivalent to ‘thing’.
  3. The difference between the matter and the substantial form of the same individual substance is seen as a sub-type of real difference in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi and as a sub-type of formal distinction in the Tractatus de universalibus.

2.3 The analysis of predication

Wyclif presents his opinion on universals as intermediate between those ones of St. Thomas (and Giles of Rome) and Walter Burley. Like Giles, whom he quotes by name, Wyclif recognizes three main kinds of universals:

  1. ante rem, or ideal universals; that is, the ideas in God, archetypes of all that there is;
  2. in re, or formal universals; that is, the common natures shared by individual things; and
  3. post rem, or intentional universals; that is, mental signs by which we refer to the universals in re.

The ideas in God are the causes of the formal universals, and the formal universals are the causes of the intentional universals. On the other hand, like Burley, Wyclif holds that formal universals exist in actu outside our minds, not in potentia as moderate Realists thought — even though, unlike Burley, he maintains they are really identical with their own individuals. So Wyclif accepts the traditional realistic account of the relationship between universals and individuals, but translates it into the terms of his own system. According to him, universals and individuals are really the same, but formally distinct, since they share the same empirical reality (that of individuals) but, considered as universals and individuals, they have opposite constituent principles. On the logical side, this means that, notwithstandig real identity, not all that is predicated of individuals can be directly predicated of universals or vice versa, though an indirect predication is always possible. Hence Wyclif's description of the logical structure of the relationship between universals and individuals demanded the introduction of a new kind of predication, unknown to Aristotle, to cover cases, admitted by the theory, of indirect inherence of an accidental form in a substantial universal and of one second intention in another.

Therefore Wyclif distinguished three main types of predication, which he conceived as a real relation that holds between metaphysical entities. (On Wyclif's theory of predication, see Spade 1985, pp. xxxi-xli, and Conti 1997, pp. 150-58.)

In the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (chap. 2), the three main types of predication are the following: formal predication, essential predication, and causal predication. In the Tractatus de universalibus (chap. 1, pp. 28-37), causal predication has been replaced by habitudinal predication — a kind of predication that Wyclif had already recognized in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi, but whose position within the main division of types of predication was not clear. In the Tractatus de universalibus, formal predication, essential predication, and habitudinal predication are described as three non-exclusive ways of predicating, each more general than the preceding. We speak of causal predication when the form designated by the predicate term is not present in the entity signified by the subject term, but is something caused by that entity. No instances of this kind of predication are given by Wyclif. Formal predication, essential predication, and habitudinal predication are defined in almost the same way in the Purgans errores circa universalia and in the Tractatus de universalibus.

Formal predication is that in which the form designated by the predicate term is directly present in the entity signified by the subject term. This happens whenever an item in the categorial line is predicated of something inferior, or an accident is predicated of its subject of inherence. In fact, in both cases, the subject term and the predicate term refer to the same reality in virtue of the form connoted by the predicate term itself.

To speak of essential predication, it is sufficient that the same empirical reality is both the real subject and the predicate, even though the formal principle connoted by the predicate term differs from that connoted by the subject term. ‘God is man’ and ‘The universal is particular’ are instances of this kind of predication. In fact, the same empirical reality (or essence) that is a universal is also an individual, but the forms connoted by the subject term and by the predicate term differ from each other.

Finally we speak of habitudinal predication when the form connoted by the predicate term does not inhere, either directly or indirectly, in the essence designated by the subject, but simply implies a relation to it, so that the same predicate may be at different times truly or falsely spoken of its subject without there being any change in the subject itself. According to Wyclif, we use such a kind of predication mainly when we want to express theological truths, like: God is known and loved by many creatures, and brings about, as efficient, exemplar, and final cause, many good effects. It is evident that habitudinal predication does not require any kind of identity between the entity signified by the subject term and the entity signified by the predicate term, but formal predication and essential predication do. So the ontological presuppositions of the most general type of predication, implied by the other types, are completely different from those of the other two.

The final result of Wyclif's revolution is therefore a not fully developed system of intensional logic, which he superimposes on the standard extensional system inherited from Aristotle. As a result, the copula of the philosophical propositions that are dealt with cannot be extensionally interpreted, since it does not properly mean that a given object is a member of a certain set or that a given set is included in another; rather it means degrees of identity. Only in virtue of renouncing any extensional approach to the matter were Wyclif's followers able to give a logically satisfactory solution of the problem of the relationship between universals and individuals, which had always been the most difficult issue for medieval Realists.

2.4 The theory of supposition

The relationship between thought and reality was a focal point of Wyclif's reflection. On the one hand, Wyclif believed that thought was linguistically constrained by its own constitution; on the other hand, he considered thought to be related to reality in its element and structure. Hence he deemed language, thought, and external reality to be of the same logical coherence. The theory of supposition was intended to provide an account of the different roles that words (or phrases) can have in relation to language, thought and external reality when they appear as terms in propositions.

In his treatise on logic, Wyclif defines supposition as the signification of one categorematic extreme of a proposition (subject or predicate) in relation to the other extreme (De Logica, chap. 12, vol. 1, p. 39). This definition, which is drawn from Burley's De suppositionibus, is quite different from the standard definition of supposition, as it seems to equate signification and supposition. On the contrary, according to the most common view, which went back to Peter of Spain's Summulae logicales, significatio and suppositio of terms were clearly distinct functions, inasmuch as the latter presupposed the former, since (i) signification consisted in the relation of a linguistic sign to the thing signified apart from any propositional context, and (ii) a word capable of standing for something else or for itself in a proposition had first to have signification. Thus, in a realist context, supposition serves to tell us which things are involved in the truth-conditions of a given proposition: whether it be expressions, real universals, or individuals.

Wyclif's account of the divisions of suppositio is similar to that proposed by Walter Burley in his De puritate artis logicae tractatus longior. At the very beginning, Wyclif divides supposition into (i) improper (impropria), in which a term stands for something different from its primary significatum by special custom (ex usu loquendi), and (ii) proper (propria), in which a term stands for something by the virtue of the expression (ibidem). In turn, proper supposition is divided into (i) material (materialis), when the term stand for itself or its sound (as it occurs in “‘I’ is a pronoun” or “‘Iohannes’ is trisyllabic”), and (ii) formal (formalis), when the term stands for what it signifies (ibidem). Formal supposition is twofold: simple (simplex) and personal (personalis). Like William of Sherwood and Peter of Spain, Wyclif affirms that the supposition is simple when the term stands for a real universal only (solum assertive supponit pro re universali ad extra), as it occurs in ‘Man can be predicated of every man’ (homo predicatur de omni homine), and personal when it stands for one or more individuals (pro uno singulari vel pro multis). In the first case, the supposition is personal and singular (suppositio personalis singularis), as it occurs in ‘this man is’ (hic homo est); in the second one, it is personal and common (suppositio personalis communis), as it occurs in (i) ‘these (men) are’ (isti suntsuppositio personalis communis distincta), or in (ii) ‘every man is’ (omnis homo estsuppositio personalis communis universalis confusa distributiva), or in (iii) ‘both of them are one of the two’ (uterque istorum est alter istorumsuppositio personalis communis universalis confusa tantum), where the expression ‘one of the two’ has supposition merely confused, since none of the two can be both of them (quia non est dare aliquem istorum qui est uterque istorum — cf. ibid., p. 40). Finally, Wyclif divides simple supposition into equal (equa) and unequal (inequa). There is simple equal supposition when a term stands for the common nature that it signifies, as it occurs in ‘man is a species’ (homo est species); there is simple unequal supposition when a term stands for a less common nature than that which it signifies, as it occurs in ‘substance is a species’ (substancia est species — cf. ibidem).

Wyclif takes a resolutely realist stand, as its own formulation and division of supposition (where simple supposition is described as that possessed by a term in relation to a universal outside the mind), and his discussion of the sophism I promise you a coin that I do not promise make evident (Logicae continuatio, tr. 3, chap. 3, vol. 2, pp. 55-72; cf. also Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, pp. 133-35). Like Burley before him, in his Logicae continuatio Wyclif defends the claim that what is explicitly promised in such a promise, ‘I promise you one or other of these coins I have in my hands’ (promitto tibi alterum illorum denariorum in altera manuum mearum), is the universal-coin, and not a singular one, even if I can fulfil the promise only by giving any singular coin, since a universal cannot be given or possessed except by a singular (Logicae continuatio, tr. 3, chap. 3, p. 62). Thanks to his distinction between simple and personal supposition, Wyclif is able to explain from a semantic point of view the difference between promising a coin in general and promising a particular coin: in the first case the term ‘coin’ (denarius) has simple supposition, and therefore the proposition is true if and only if what is said is true of the universal-coin; on the contrary, if the term ‘coin’ has personal supposition (more precisely, personal and singular supposition), the proposition is true if and only if what is said is true of a particular coin. According to him, by promising a singular, a universal is promised secundarie and confuse, and conversely (ibid., p. 64). So, given two coins in my hands, the coin A and the coin B, the proposition ‘I promise you one or other of these coins’ is true, even though, when asked whether I promised the coin A, my answer is ‘No’, and so too when asked whether I promised the coin B. In fact, according to Wyclif, what I promised is the universal-coin, since the phrase ‘one or other of these coins’ has simple supposition and therefore stands for a universal, however restricted in its instantiations to one or other of the two coins in my hands (ibid., p. 67).

This does not mean that the universal-coin is a sort of third coin over and above the two coins in my hands. Wyclif had already rejected this mistaken conclusion in the previous chapter of the Logicae continuatio. He argues that to add the universal-man as a third man to Socrates and Plato, given that there are only these two individual men in the world, exhibits a fallacy of equivocation. When a number is added to a term of first intention (like ‘man’), the presence of this numerical term modifies the kind of supposition from simple to personal; but one can refer to a universal only with a term with simple supposition. As a consequence the universal cannot be counted with its individuals – and in fact any universal is really identical to each one of its individuals, and so it cannot differ in number from each of them (ibid., chap. 2, p. 48).

3. Metaphysics

3.1 Being and analogy

The point of departure for Wyclif's metaphysics is the notion of being, since it occupies the central place in his ontology. After Duns Scotus, the real issue for metaphysics was the relationship between being and, on the other side, God and creatures, as Scotus' theory of the univocity of the concept of being was an absolute novelty, full of important consequences for the development of later medieval philosophy. Wyclif takes many aspects from Scotus' explanation, but strongly stresses the ontological implications of the doctrine. Wyclif, like Scotus, claims that the notion of being is the most general one, a notion entailed by all others, but he also states that an extra-mental reality corresponds to the concept of being-in-general (ens in communi). This extra-mental reality is predicated of everything (God and creatures, substances and accidents, universal and individual essences) according to different degrees, since God is in the proper sense of the term and any other entity is (something real) only insofar as it shares the being of God (De ente in communi, chap. 1, pp. 1-2; chap. 2, p. 29; De ente praedicamentali, chap. 1, p. 13; chap. 4, p. 30; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 4, p. 89; chap. 7, p. 130; chap. 12, p. 279; De materia et forma, chap. 6, p. 213).

If being is a reality, it is then clear that it is impossible to affirm its univocity. The Doctor Subtilis thought of being as simply a concept, and therefore could describe it as univocal in a broad sense (one name — one concept — many natures). Wyclif, on the contrary, is convinced that the being-in-general is an extra-mental reality, so he works out his theory at a different level than does Scotus: no more at the intensional level (the meaning connected with the univocal sign, or univocum univocans), but at the extensional one (the thing signified by the mental sign, considered as shared by different entities according to different degrees). For that reason, he cannot use Aristotelian univocation, which hides these differences in sharing. Thus he denies the univocity of being and prefers to use one of the traditional notions of analogy (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 3, pp. 25, 27), since the being of God is the measure of the being of other things, which are drawn up on a scale with the separated spiritual substances at the top and prime matter at the bottom. Therefore he qualifies being as an ambiguous genus (ibidem, p. 29), borrowing an expression already used by Grosseteste in his commentary on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. The analogy of being does not entail a multiplicity of correlated meanings, however, as in Thomas Aquinas. Since Wyclif hypostatizes the notion of being and considers equivocity, analogy, and univocity as real relations between things, not as semantic relations between terms and things, his analogy is partially equivalent to the standard Aristotelian univocity, since what differentiates analogy from univocity is the way a certain nature (or property) is shared by a set of things: analogous things (analoga) share it according to different degrees (secundum magis et minus, or secundum prius et posterius), while univocal things (univoca) share it all in the same manner and at the same degree. This is the true sense of his distinction between ambiguous genera, like being and accident (accidens), and logical genera, like substance (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 4, pp. 30, 32). Hence, according to this account, being in general is the basic component of the metaphysical structure of each reality, which posses it in accordance with its own nature, value, and position in the hierarchy of created beings.

Unfortunately, this theory is weak in an important point, since Wyclif does not clarify the relation between being-in-general and God. On the one hand, being is a creature, the first of all the creatures; on the other hand, God should share it, as being-in-general is the most common reality, predicated of all, and according to him to-be-predicated-of something means to-be-shared-by it. As a consequence, a creature would be in some respect superordinated to God — a theological puzzle that Wyclif failed to acknowledge.

3.2 Being and truth

According to Wyclif, the constitutive property of each kind of being is the capacity to be the object of a complex act of signifying (De ente in communi, chap. 3, p. 36; De ente primo in communi, chap. 1, p. 70). This choice implies a revolution in the standard medieval theory of transcendentals, since Wyclif actually replaces being (ens) with true (verum). According to the common belief, among the transcendentals (being, thing, one, something, true, good) being was the primitive notion, from which all the others stemmed by adding a specific connotation in relation to something else, or by adding some new determination. So true (verum) was nothing but being (ens) itself considered in relation to an intellect, no matter whether divine or human. In Wyclif's view, on the contrary, being is no longer the main transcendental and its notion is not the first and simplest; rather there is something more basic to which being can be reduced: truth (veritas or verum). According to the English philosopher, only what can be signified by a complex expression is a being, and whatever is the proper object of an act of signifying is a truth. Truth is therefore the true name of being itself (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, p. 139). Thus everything that is is a truth, and every truth is something not simple but complex. Absolute simplicity is unknown within Wyclif's metaphysical world. From the semantic point of view, this means the collapsing of the fundamental distinction in the common Aristotelian theory of meaning, the one between simple signs (like nouns) and compound signs (like propositions). From the ontological point of view, this entails the uniqueness in type of what is signified by every class of categorematic expressions (Logica, chap. 5, p. 14). Within Wyclif's world, it is the same (kind of) object that both concrete terms and propositions refer to, as individual substances have to be regarded as (atomic) states of affairs. According to him, from the metaphysical point of view a singular man is nothing but a real proposition (propositio realis), where actual existence in time as an individual plays the role of the subject, the common nature (i.e., human nature) plays the role of the predicate, and the singular essence (i.e., that by means of which this individual is a man) plays the role of the copula (ibid., pp. 14-15).

Despite appearances, Wyclif's opinion on this subject is not just a new formulation of the theory of the complexe significabile. According to the supporters of the complexe significabile theory, the same things that are signified by simple concrete terms are signified by complex expressions (or propositions). In Wyclif's thought, on the contrary, there are no simple things in the world that correspond to simple concrete terms; rather, simple concrete terms designate real propositions, that is, (atomic) states of affairs. Wyclif's real proposition is everything that is, as everything save God is composed at least of potency and act (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, pp. 38-39), and therefore can be conceived of and signified both in a complex (complexe) and in a non-complex manner (incomplexe) (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 2, pp. 55-56; chap. 3, pp. 70, 74, and 84; chap. 6, pp. 118-19). When we conceive of a thing in a complex manner, we think of that thing considered according to its metaphysical structure, and so according to its many levels of being and kinds of essence. As a consequence, Wyclif's metaphysical world, like his physical world, consists of atomic objects, that is, single essences belonging to the ten different types or categories. But these metaphysical atoms are not simple but rather composite, because they are reducible to something else, belonging to a different rank of reality and unable to exist by itself: being and essence, potency and act, matter and form, abstract genera, species and differences. For that reason, everything one can speak about or think of is both a thing and an atomic state of affairs, while every true sentence expresses a molecular state of affairs, that is, the union (if the sentence is affirmative) or the separation (if the sentence is negative) of two (or more) atomic objects (on Wyclif's theory of proposition see Cesalli 2005).

3.3 Being and essence

Among the many kinds of beings Wyclif lists, the most important set is that consisting of categorial beings. They are characterized by the double fact of having a nature and of being the constitutive elements of finite corporeal beings or atomic states of affairs. These categorial items, conceived of as instances of a certain kind of being, are called by Wyclif ‘essences’ (essentiae). An essence therefore is a being that has a well defined nature, even if the name ’essence’ does not make this nature known (De ente primo in communi, chap. 3, pp. 88-89; De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, p. 43; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, pp. 128-29; De materia et forma, chap. 4, pp. 185-86). So the term ‘essence’ (essentia) is less general than ‘being’ (ens), but more general than ‘quiddity’ (quidditas), since (i) every essence is a being, and not every being is an essence, and (ii) every quiddity is an essence, and not every essence is a quiddity, as individual things are essences but are not quiddities (see Kenny 1985, pp. 21 ff.; and Conti 1993, pp. 171-81).

According to Wyclif, being is the stuff that the ten categories modulate according to their own nature, so that everything is immediately something that is (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 4, p. 30; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, p. 130); therefore, he maintains no real distinction between essence and being. The essences of creatures do not precede their beings, not even causally, since every thing is (identical with) its essence. The being of a thing is brought into existence by God at the same instant as its essence, since essence without being and being without essence would be two self-contradictory states of affairs. In fact, essence without being would imply that an individual could be something of a given type without being real in any way, and being without essence would imply that there could be the existence of a thing without the thing itself (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 6, pp. 122-23). As a consequence, the pars destruens of his theory of being and essence is a strong refutation of the twin opinions of St. Thomas and Giles of Rome. Although Wyclif does not name either the Dominican master or the Augustinian one, it is nevertheless clear from the context that their conceptions are the object of his criticisms (ibid., pp. 120-22).

On the other hand, it is evident that while from the extensional point of view the being and essence of creatures are equipollent, since every being is an essence and vice versa, from the intensional point of view there is a difference, because the being of a thing logically presupposes its essence and not vice versa (De materia et forma, chap. 4, pp. 184-85). Moreover, in Wyclif's opinion, every creature has two different kinds of essence and four levels of being. Indeed, he clearly distinguishes between singular essence and universal essence (essentia quidditativa speciei vel generis) — that is, the traditional forma partis and forma totius. The singular essence is the form that in union with the matter brings about the substantial composite. The universal essence is the type that the former instantiates; it is present in the singular substance as a constitutive part of its nature, and it discloses the inner metaphysical structure of the substantial composite (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 6, pp. 116-18). Furthermore, he speaks of four-fold level of reality (esse):

  1. First, the eternal mental being (esse ideale) that every creature has in God, as an object of His mind.
  2. Second, the potential being everything has in its causes, both universal (genus, species) and particular. This is closely connected with the nature of the individual substance on which the finite corporeal being is founded, and is independent of its actual existence. It is called ‘esse essentiae’ or ‘esse in genere’.
  3. Third, the actual existence in time as an earthly object.
  4. Fourth, the accidental being (modus essendi accidentalis substantiae) caused in a substance by the inhering in it of its appropriate accidental forms (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, pp. 126-28).

Thus the identity between essence and being cannot be complete. Consequently Wyclif speaks of a formal difference (distinctio or differentia formalis) — which he also calls a ‘difference of reason’ (distinctio rationis) — between essence and being. More precisely, he holds that:

  1. The esse ideale is formally distinct from the singular essence;
  2. The actual existence is formally distinct from the universal essence; and
  3. The singular essence is formally distinct from the actual existence.

In this way, Wyclif establishes a close connection between singular essence and essential being, on the one hand, and a real identity between universal and individual (that is, between universal essence and singular essence), on the other hand. Essential being is the level of being that matches singular essence, while actual existence is in a certain way accidental to the singular essence, as the latter is nothing else but the universal essence considered as informing matter.

4. Theology

4.1 Divine ideas

Wyclif's world is ultimately grounded on divine essence. Thus there is a close connection between any kind of truth and the divine ideas (cf. Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 15, pp. 371-74; De materia et forma, chap. 2, pp. 170-76). Divine ideas play a threefold role in relation to God and creatures: they are (i) the specific essences of individual things themselves, considered according to their intelligible being in the mind of God; (ii) God's principles of cognition of creatures; and (iii) the eternal models of creatures. If we also take into account that in his opinion (iv) divine ideas are really the same as the divine essence and formally distinct from it, and (v) this distinction originates from their being efficient (con)causes in relation to the different kinds of creatures, we can easily realize why Wyclif's position on this matter leads to heretical consequences from the point of view of the catholic theology: (i) metaphysical and theological necessitarianism; (ii) restriction of divine omnipotence; (iii) negation of the process of transubstantiation in the Eucharist. In fact, Wyclif defines ideas as the divine nature in action, since they are the means by which God creates all that is outside Himself. In this way, any distinction between the ideas as pure rationes and the ideas as exemplaria, stated by St. Thomas in his Summa theologiae (I, q. 15), is abolished. Furthermore, ideas are the constitutive principles of divine nature, essentially identical with it. Thus divine ideas become as necessary as the divine nature itself. On the other side, ideas are the first of the four levels of being proper to creatures. Because of the necessary links between (i) the divine essence and the eternal mental being that every creature has in God, and (ii) this first level of being of creatures and the remaining three, for God to think of creatures is already to create them. But God cannot help thinking of creatures, since to think of Himself is to think of his constitutive principles, that is, the ideas of creatures. Therefore God cannot help creating. Indeed, He could not help creating just this universe. As a consequence, everything which is is necessary, and a necessary object of God's volition: the three spheres of possible, existent, and necessary totally coincide. As a matter of fact, Wyclif, having defined necessary truths as those truths which cannot not be the case, (i) distinguishes between absolutely necessary truths and conditionally (or relatively - secundum quid) necessary truths, and (ii) tries to show how relative necessity is consistent with supreme contingence (Logicae continuatio, tr. 1, chap. 11, vol. 1, pp. 156-65). He thought that such distinctions enabled him to maintain simultaneously the necessity of all that happens and human freedom (cf. Tractatus de universalibus, ch. 14, pp. 333-47); and many times he affirms that it would be heretical to say that all things happen by absolute necessity; but his attempt failed in achieving its goal.

According to him, absolutely necessary truths are such truths as (i) those of theology (like the real proposition that God exists), that are per se necessary and do not depend on something else; (ii) those of geometry, that neither can, nor ever could, nor ever will be able to be otherwise, even though they depend on something else (est ab alio sed non potuit non esse); and (iii) the past and present truths (like the real proposition that I have existed – me fuisse), that cannot be, but might have been otherwise (per accidens necessarium, quia est necessarium quod potuit non esse). On the contrary, relative necessity applies to those events that must follow certain conditions in order to be or happen – so that any contingent truth is relatively necessary if considered in relation to its conditions (Logicae continuatio, tr. 1, chap. 11, p. 157). In its turn, relative necessity is divided into antecedent, consequent, and concomitant. (i) A certain truth is an antecedent relative necessity when its existence causes the existence of another contingent truth (antecedens ut causa contingentis, inferens posterius naturaliter). An instance of such a necessity is the necessity of volition, as where my unconstrained will or the unconstrained will of God is the cause which necessitates something else (ibid., p, 158). (ii) A certain truth is a consequent relative necessity when its existence is caused by an antecedent (relative) necessity. And finally, (iii) a certain truth is a concomitant relative necessity when it merely accompanies another true event (ibid., p. 157). These features proper to the relative necessity are not opposites, and the same truth may be necessary in all the three ways (ibid., pp. 157-58). Wyclif insists that all three kinds of relative necessity are contingent truths in themselves (ibid., p. 158), yet he was unable to show how this is possible. He thought he had an explanation, but he was mistaken. In his Tractatus de universalibus (where he uses all these distinctions in order to try to solve the problem of the relationship between divine power and human freedom), he openly maintains that in relation to the foreknowledge of God every effect is necessary to come about (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 14, p. 333), and the Aristotelian principle that everything which is, when it is, necessarily is (the well known formulation of the diachronic contingence), applies also to what will be and has been (ibid., p. 334). Taking into account that God himself cannot begin or cease actually to know or will something, and thus He cannot change from knowing that p to knowing that not-p (where p is a given truth), nor from volition to non-volition or vice versa (ibid., p. 335; cf. also De volucione Dei, chap. 3, p. 149), the logical result is that in Wyclif's world nothing may happen purely contingently. It is true that Wyclif insists that even if God can never change from volition to non-volition, the fact that God wills p is in itself contingent, if p is not a theological truth (De volucione Dei, chap. 7, p. 192), but, like Bradwardine, he maintains that God's antecedent will is naturally prior to what He foresees. Given that God is immutable, and hence that the divine power is not affected by the passage of time, and divine ideas, within Wyclif's system, are as necessary as the divine essence itself, the logical consequence is that, despite Wyclif's claims of the contrary, the whole history of the world is determined from eternity. As a matter of fact, Wyclif's conditional (or relative) necessity is as necessary as his absolute necessity: given God, the world's entire history follows.

4.2 Divine omnipotence

This doctrine of divine ideas and the connected theory of being had a significant result also for the notion of divine omnipotence. In the Middle Ages, one of the most important features of divine omnipotence was the capacity of annihilating, which was viewed as the necessary counterpart of the divine capacity of creating. Wyclif denies the thesis of an opposition between creation and annihilation, and openly denies that God can annihilate creatures. He argues that nothing is contrary to creation, since the act of creating is peculiar to God, and nothing is opposite or contrary to God. In fact, absolute non-being (the only "thing" that could be considered opposite to God) is something self-contradictory, and therefore logically impossible. Accordingly, there cannot be any action opposite to creation. The only possible kind of non-being admitted by Wyclif is corruption (corruptio), that is, the natural destruction of the actual existence in time of an object in the world (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 13, pp. 302-3).

On the other hand, according to Wyclif, annihilation, if possible, would be equivalent to the total destruction of all of a creature's levels of being (ibid., p. 307), and thus would imply the following absurdities:

  1. God could not annihilate any creature without destroying the whole world at once, since universal-being is the basic constitutive element of the second level of being (the esse essentiae or esse in genere) of each creature (ibid., pp. 307-8).
  2. Since annihilation would be nothing but an accident, and more precisely an action, it would be really different from both the acting subject (i.e. God) and the object of the action (i.e., the thing that would be annihilated). But any accident requires a substrate of inherence. In this case, it cannot be God. Thus, it must be the object of annihilation. Yet, because of its particular nature, if there is annihilation, its substrate of inherence cannot be, and therefore the annihilation itself cannot be, since no accident can exist without any substrate of inherence — an apparently self-contradictory state of affairs (ibid., pp. 310-11).
  3. God could not annihilate any creature without annihilating Himself at the same time, because the first and most basic level of being of every creature is rooted in the divine essence itself (ibid., pp. 313-14).

The image of God Wyclif draws here is not the Christian image of the Lord of the universe, who freely creates by an act of His will and has absolute power and control over everything, but a variation of the Neoplatonic notion of the One. Wyclif's God is simply the supreme principle of the universe from which everything necessarily flows. Within Wyclif's system, creation is a form of emanation, as each creature is necessarily connected with the divine essence itself by means of its esse ideale. God has been deprived of the power of revocation (ibid., pp. 304-5), and the only action He can, or rather has to, perform is creation. Because of the necessary links between (i) the divine essence and the eternal mental being that every creature has in God and (ii) this first level of being of creatures and the remaining three, in God to think of creatures is already to create them. But God cannot help thinking of creatures, since to think of Himself is to think of His constitutive principles, that is, of the ideas of creatures. Therefore, God cannot help creating. Indeed, He could not help creating just this universe.

Wyclif's rejection of the possibility of annihilation and the subsequent new notion of divine onnipotence shed light on his theory of universals, as they help us to appreciate the difference between his thesis of the identity between universals and individuals and the analogous thesis of moderate Realists. For these latter, this identiy meant that the individuals are in potentia universal; for Wyclif it means that the individuals are the universals qua existing in actu — that is, the individuals are the outcome of a process of production that is inscribed into the nature of general essences themselves, and through which general essences change from an incomplete type of subsistence as forms to a full existence as individuals. This position is consistent with (i) his theory of substance, where the main and basic composition of every substance, both individual and universal, is not the hylemorphic one, but the composition of potency and act (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, pp. 38-39), and (ii) a Neoplatonic reading of Aristotelian metaphysics, where universal substances, and not individual ones as the Stagirite had taught, are the main and fundamental kind of being (on Wyclif's doctrine of the divine omnipotence see A. D. Conti, “Annihilatio e divina onnipotenza nel Tractatus de universalibus di John Wyclif,” in MT. Fumagalli Beonio Brocchieri & S. Simoneta 2003, pp.71-85.

4.3 The Eucharist

Wyclif's heretical theses concerning the Eucharist are the logical consequence of the application of this philosophical apparatus to the problem of the real presence of the body of Christ in the consecrated host. According to Catholic doctrine, after consecration the body of Christ is really present in the host instead of the substance of the host itself, while the accidents of the host are the same as before. St. Thomas's explanation of this process, called ‘transubstantiation’, was that the substance of the bread (and wine) was changed into the body (and blood) of Christ, whereas its quantity, through which the substance of the bread received physical extension and the other accidental forms, was now the entity that kept the other accidental forms physically in being. Duns Scotus and Ockham, on the contrary, had claimed that after consecration the substance of the bread (and wine) was annihilated by God, while the accidents of the bread (and wine) remained the same as before because of an intervention of divine omnipotence.

Wyclif rejects both solutions as well as the Catholic formulation of the dogma, since he could not accept the ideas of the destruction of a substance by God and of the existence of the accidents of a given singular substance without and apart from that singular substance itself — two evident absurdities within the metaphyisical framework of his system of thought. As a consequence, Wyclif affirms the simultaneous presence in the Eucharist of the body of Crhist and of the substance of the bread (and wine), which continues to exist even after the consecration. According to him, transubstantiation is therefore a twofold process, natural and supernatural. There is natural transubstantiation when a substitution of one substantial form for another takes place, but the subject-matter remains the same. This is the case with water that becomes wine. There is supernatural transubstantiation when a miraculous transformation of the substantial entity at issue takes place. This was the case, for instance, with the incarnation of the second person of the Trinity, who is God and became man (De apostasia, p. 170). The Eucharist implies this second kind of transubstantiation, since the Eucharist, like Christ, has a dual nature: earthly and divine. According to its earthly nature the Eucharist is bread (and wine), but according to its divine nature it is the body of Christ, which is present in the host spiritually or habitudinnaly, since it is in virtue and by means of faith only that it could be received (De apostasia, pp. 180 and 210; De eucharistia, pp. 17, 19, 51-52, and 230; for a description of the habitudinal presence, see the definition of the habitudinal predication above, Section 2.3 – on the links between his realism and his eucharistic doctrine see P. J. J. M. Bakker, “Réalisme et rémanence. La doctrine eucharistique de Jean Wyclif,” in MT. Fumagalli Beonio Brocchieri & S. Simoneta 2003, pp. 87-112; see also Kenny 1985, pp. 68-90).

5. Religious and Political Thought

5.1 The Bible and the Church

Wyclif conceives Sacred Scripture as a direct emanation from God himself, and therefore as a timeless, unchanging, and archetypal truth independent of the present world and of the concrete material text by means of which it is manifested. As a consequence, in his De veritate Sacrae Scripturae (On the Truth of Sacred Scripture — between late 1377 and the end of 1378) he tries to show that, despite appearences, the Bible is free from error and contradictions. The exegetic principle he adopts is the following: since the authority of Scripture is greater than our capacity of understanding, therefore if some error and/or inconsistencies are found in the Bible, there is something wrong with our interpretation. The Bible contains the whole truth and nothing but the truth, so that nothing can be added to it or subtracted from it. Every part of it has to be taken absolutely and without qualification (De veritate Sacrae Scripturae, vol. 1, pp. 1-2, 395, 399; vol. 2, pp. 99, 181-84).

In attributing inerrancy to the Bible, Wyclif was following the traditional attitude towards it, but the way he viewed the book detached him from Catholic tradition, as he thought that his own metaphysical system was the necessary interpretative key for the correct understanding of Biblical truth. In fact, in the Trialogus (Trialogue — between late 1382 and early 1383), where Wyclif gives us the conditions for achieving the true meaning of the Bible, they are the following:

  1. knowledge of the nature and ontological status of universals;
  2. knowledge of the peculiar nature of accidents as dependent in existence on their substantial substrates;
  3. knowledge of past and future states of affairs (praeteritiones and futuritiones) as real in the present as past and future truths, not as things (res) that have been real in the past and will be real in the future (a thesis of his already claimed in the De ente praedicamentali, chap. 1, pp. 2 and 5; Purgans errores circa veritates in communi, chap. 1, pp. 1-2; chap. 3, pp. 10-11);
  4. knowledge of the eternal existence of creatures in God at the level of intelligible being really identical with the divine essence itself;
  5. knowledge of the perpetual existence of material essences (Trialogus, book 3, chap. 31, pp. 242-43).

Only on the basis of this logical and metaphyisical machinery is it possible to grasp the five different levels of reality of the Bible, which is at the same time:

  1. the book of life mentioned in the Apocalypse;
  2. the ideal being proper to the truths written in the book of life;
  3. the truths that are to be believed as they are written in the book of life;
  4. the truths that are to believed as they are written in the natural books that are men's souls;
  5. all the artificial signs of the truth (De veritate Sacrae Scripturae, vol. 1, p. 109).

This same approach, when applied to the Church, led Wyclif to fight against it in its contemporary state. (On Wyclif's ecclesiology see Leff 1967, pp. 516-46.) The starting point of Wyclif's reflection on the Church is the distinction between the heavenly and the earthly cities that St. Augustine draws in his De civitate Dei. In St. Augustine such a division is metaphorical, but Wyclif made it literal. So he claims that the Holy Catholic Church is the mystical and indivisible community of the saved, eternally bound together by the grace of predestination, while the foreknown, i.e. the damned, are eternally excluded from it (De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 11). This community of the elect is really distinct from the various particular earthly churches (ibid., p. 381). It is timeless and outside space, and therefore is not a physical entity; its being, like the actual being of any other universal, is wherever any of its members is (De ecclesia, p. 99). All its members always remain in grace, even if temporally in mortal sin (ibid., p. 409), as conversely the damned remain in mortal sin, even if temporally in grace (ibid., p. 139). The true Church is presently divided into three parts: the triumphant Church in heaven; the sleeping Church in purgatory; and the militant Church on earth (ibid., p. 8). But the militant Church on earth cannot be identified with the visible church and its hierarchy. Even more, since we cannot know who are the elect, there is no reason for consenting to recognize and obey the authority of the visible church (see De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 409; De ecclesia, pp. 71-2). Authority and dominion rely on God's law manifested by Sacred Scripture. As a consequence, obedience to any member of the hierarchy is to be subordinated to his fidelity to the precepts of the Bible (De civili dominio, vol. 2, p. 243; De potestate papae [On the Power of the Pope — ca. 1379], p. 149; De ecclesia, p. 465). Faithfulness to the true Church can entail the necessity of rebelling against the visible church and its members, when their requests are in conflict with the teaching of Christ (De civili dominio, vol. 1, pp. 384, 392).

In conclusion, since the visible church cannot help the believers gain salvation, which is fixed from eternity, and its authority depends on its fidelity to divine revelation, it cannot perform any of the functions traditionally attributed to it, and it therefore has no reason for its own existence. To be ordained a priest offers no certainty of divine approval and authority (De ecclesia, p. 577). Orthodoxy can only result from the application of right reason to the faith of the Bible (De veritate Sacrae Scripturae, vol. 1, p. 249). The Pope, bishops, abbots, and priests are expected to prove their really belonging to the Holy Catholic Church through their exemplary behavior; they should be poor and free from worldly concerns, and they should spend their time preaching and praying (De ecclesia, pp. 41, 89, 129). In particular, the Pope should not interfere in worldly matters, but should be an example of holiness. Believers are always allowed to doubt the clergy's legitimacy, which can be evaluated only on the basis of its consistency with the Evangelic rules (ibid., pp. 43, 456). Unworthy priests forfeit their right to exercise authority and to hold property, and lay lords might deprive them of their benefices (De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 353; vol. 3, pp. 326, 413; De ecclesia, p. 257).

5.2 Dominion

As Leff remarked (Leff 1967, p. 546), the importance of Wyclif's teaching on dominion and grace has been exaggerated. His doctrine depends on Richard Fitzralph's theory, according to which the original lordship is independent of natural and civil circumstances (on Fitzralph's conception see Robson 1961, pp. 70-96), and is only a particular application of Wyclif's general view on election and damnation. In fact, the three main theses of the first book of his De civili dominio are the following:

  1. a man in sin has no right to dominion;
  2. a man who is in a state of grace possesses all the goods of the world;
  3. as a consequence, there can be no dominion without grace as its formal cause (De civili dominio, vol. 1, p 1).

Wyclif defines dominion as the right to exercise authority and, indirectly, to hold property. According to him, there are three kinds of possession: natural, civil, and evangelical. Natural possession is the simple possession of goods without any legal title. Civil possession is the possession of goods on the basis of some civil law. Evangelical possession requires, beyond civil possession, a state of grace in the legal owner. Thus God alone can confer evangelical possession (ibid., p. 45). On the other hand, a man in a state of grace is lord of the visible universe, but on the condition that he shares his lordship with all the other men who are in a state of grace, as all men in a state of grace have the same rights. This ultimately means that all the goods of God should be in common, just as they were before the Fall. Private property was introduced as a result of sin. From this point of view it is also evident that Aristotle's criticisms against Plato are unsound, since Platonic communism is correct in essence (ibid., pp. 96 ff.). The purpose of civil law is to preserve the necessities of life (ibid., pp. 128-29). The best form of government is monarchy. Kings must be obeyed and have taxes paid to them, even if they become tyrants, since they are God's vicars that He alone can depose — so that only secular lordship is justified in the world (ibid., p. 201).


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