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A Priori Justification and Knowledge

First published Sun Dec 9, 2007

Knowledge is generally thought to require justified true belief, even if justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge as Edmund Gettier famously argued (1967 ). In Gettier cases the person, in some sense, is lucky to believe what is true on the basis of his evidence. For example, you see poodles in a field that have been bred and clipped to look just like sheep, and on the basis of what you see you form the belief that there are sheep in the field. Luckily there are—hiding out of sight behind some boulders! You have a justified true belief that is not knowledge. In lottery cases if you hold a losing ticket you have a justified true belief that it will lose, the justification resting on your knowledge that it is very likely that any given ticket will lose, but many think you do not know that your ticket will lose. So having a justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge, but it does seem necessary.

A priori knowledge is knowledge that rests on a priori justification. A priori justification is a type of epistemic justification that is, in some sense, independent of experience. There are a variety of views about whether a priori justification can be defeated by other evidence, especially by empirical evidence, and a variety of views about whether a priori justification, or knowledge, must be only of necessary, or analytic, propositions, or at least of ones believed to be necessary or analytic. Necessary propositions are ones that cannot be false, ones that are true in all possible worlds, such as “all brothers are male.” Contingent propositions are ones that are not necessary. An analytic proposition is a proposition expressed by a sentence whose logical form guarantees its truth. In some cases the logical form of a sentence is obvious, as in “All murders are murders,” which has the form “All A's are A's.” In other cases the form is not so obvious, as in “Murder is wrong.” But the logical form may become apparent once we replace relevant words and phrases by their synonyms, e.g., by replacing “murder” by “wrongful killing” to get, “Wrongful killing is wrong.” Any proposition that is true in virtue of the logical form of the sentence that expresses it is analytic, regardless of whether that form is immediately apparent or only apparent when relevant words and phrases are replaced by their synonyms. Any proposition that is not analytic is synthetic. More later on whether synthetic propositions can be necessary and whether analytic ones can be contingent.

A priori justification seems to rest on rational intuitions, or insights, but there are a variety of views about the nature of these intuitions or insights. There are different explanations of how these intuitions provide justification, if they do, with many thinking that the explanation of how they justify what have been called synthetic a priori propositions must differ from the explanation of how they justify analytic propositions. There are also many objections to the idea that rational intuitions provide any sort of justification. Finally, rationalists think that there can be a priori knowledge of the world while empiricists deny this.

1. The nature of a priori justification and knowledge

We seem to know some things a priori, or at least to be justified in believing them. Standard examples of propositions known a priori include: a bachelor is an unmarried male; 2 + 3 = 5; if you know something, then what you believe is true; if A is greater than B, and B is greater than C, then A is greater than C; no object can be red and green all over at the same time; the shortest distance between two points is a straight line; no object can be wholly in two different places at the same time; it is wrong to torture infants to death just for the fun of it; and it is unjust to punish an innocent person.

For the sake of argument, assume that we know that all of the following claims are true: some bachelors are unhappy; there are five apples in the bag; I have hands; my middle finger is longer than my ring finger, and it is longer than my little finger; the tomato I'm holding is red all over; the shortest route by car from Detroit to Chicago is along I-94; I was in California in mid-March, not Detroit; torture produces unreliable testimony; and people who are punished unjustly become resentful. The basis of the knowledge of these claims is different from the basis for knowing that bachelors are unmarried males, 2 + 3 = 5, etc. The basis for knowing that bachelors are unmarried, etc., is also different from the basis for knowing that I now have a pain in my left knee, that I ate cereal for breakfast this morning, and that there was a massacre at Virginia Tech on April 16, 2007. The basis of a priori knowledge is not perception, introspection, memory, or testimony (cf. Casullo 2003, 29-30; BonJour, 1998, 7). If there were such things as telepathy and clairvoyance, they also would not be the basis of a priori knowledge (Casullo 2003, 149; BonJour 1998, 7-8). A priori knowledge and justification seem to be based on reason alone, or are based solely on understanding the proposition being considered.

Like perception, introspection, memory, and testimony, a priori justification is fallible. One might be justified in believing something a priori, e.g., that every event has a cause, or even that unmarried adult males are bachelors, that is actually false. Many physicists think that some subatomic events occur at random and so have no cause, and Gilbert Harman has cited studies by Winograd and Flores that show that, “Speakers do not consider the Pope a bachelor” (Harman 1999, 140; 2001, 662 and n. 8). Consideration of philosophical paradoxes can also make the point that a priori justification is fallible. We seem to be a priori justified in believing that if you take one grain of sand from a heap of sand, you are still left with a heap, and that if you only have one, or no, grains of sand, you do not have a heap of sand. But we know that one of these propositions must be false, for the first leads to the denial of the second. So a priori justification must be fallible (cf. Bealer 1998, 202).

Besides being fallible, it seems that a priori justification is defeasible, that is, all-things-considered a priori justification can be defeated by further evidence. For instance, it seems possible for a person to be, all things considered, a priori justified in believing, say, that justified true belief (JTB) is knowledge before, but not after, becoming aware of Gettier-type counterexamples. And if that is possible, why couldn't all-things-considered a priori justification be defeated by empirical, not just a priori, considerations? If you are, all things considered, a priori justified in believing that necessarily, all P's are Q's then why couldn't your observing a P that is not a Q defeat that justification? Some would contend that something like this has actually happened, for they will say that Kant was, all things considered, a priori justified in believing that every event has a cause but, because of developments in sub-atomic physics, we are not, and that the Greeks were, all things considered, a priori justified in accepting Euclidean geometry but we are not because of developments in cosmology.

Why would anyone think that these appearances are misleading? In particular, why would they think that no one can be, all things considered, a priori justified in believing something at one time and then have that justification defeated at a later time by empirical evidence? Well, the answer stems from the nature of the a priori. Kant said that a priori knowledge is “knowledge that is absolutely independent of all experience” (Kant 1787, 43). That understanding seems too narrow because, if it were correct, all a priori knowledge would have to rest on innate ideas, that is, ideas people are born with but do not acquire through experience. A more plausible suggestion is that a priori knowledge and justification must be independent of experience beyond that needed to acquire the concepts required to understand the proposition at issue.

Let's switch the focus to a priori justification alone, since it is a component of a priori knowledge, and ask why anyone would think it indefeasible by experience, that is, why anyone would think that empirical considerations could not defeat some instances of all-things-considered a priori justification. Philip Kitcher thinks that if there is such a thing as all-things-considered a priori justification, then “a person is entitled to ignore empirical information about the type of world she inhabits” (1983, 30; see, also, 24, 80-87) and Hilary Putnam thinks that if there is that sort of justification, then there are “truths which it is always rational to believe” (Putnam 1983, 90). But if a person is entitled to ignore empirical information, or it is always rational for her to believe something no matter what the empirical evidence is, provided she is, all things considered, a priori justified in believing that thing, then all-things-considered a priori justification is indefeasible by experience.

But why think that all-things-considered a priori justification implies either that a person who has that sort of justification is entitled to ignore empirical information or that it is always rational for her to believe what she does no matter what the empirical evidence is? A priori justification must be “independent of experience,” which implies that it must be independent of empirical evidence. But there is an interpretation of that sort of independence that does not imply that the person is entitled to ignore empirical information or that her justification will remain no matter what the empirical evidence is. Suppose being justified independent of experience simply means that experiential sources do not provide the justification, that the justification is provided solely by some non-experiential source. That does not imply that the experiential evidence could not defeat that non-experiential justification. In other circumstances, it may. As Laurence BonJour says, for a priori justification “… it is enough if it is capable of warranting belief where experience is silent” (BonJour 1998, 121). That does not imply that the justification will remain where experience is not silent. It allows that experience might defeat that a priori justification.

Consider the following analogy. Suppose people were born only with a sense of touch and a sonar sense like bats possess. Each would allow them to detect the presence of objects in their vicinity. Someone might truly say that an all-things-considered justified belief based on sonar evidence alone is a case of justification independent of touch because the sense of touch did not provide any of the justification for that belief. Of course, that does not imply that the “sonar” justification of such a belief is indefeasible by touch. On occasion, the evidence provided by touch that some object is nearby might override the sonar evidence that no object is nearby. Something similar follows with respect to a priori justification, that is, justification that must be independent of experience. It can be independent of experience without being incapable of being defeated by experience because it is possible for the justification on some occasion to rest solely on non-experiential evidence, even if on other occasions that same sort of evidence can be defeated by experiential evidence.

Some will say that insofar as a priori justification can be defeated by experience it is not wholly independent of experience. Still, we might say that it is not derived from experience in the way that empirical claims are. So there might be three categories of justified propositions: (1) those whose justification is wholly independent of experience, (2) those whose justification does not rest on, but can be defeated by, experience, and (3) those whose justification rests, or depends on, experience. “A priori justification” might be applied to categories (1) and (2).

While a justification's being independent of, or not derived from, experience does not imply that it is infallible or indefeasible either experientially, or non-experientially, what is it for the justification to rest solely on a non-experiential source? Casullo says that there are negative and positive accounts of “justified independent of experience” based on how the source of such justification is characterized (BonJour says the same at 1998, 7). Sometimes what is meant by “experience” is given enumeratively by a list; beliefs based on experience are those that rest on any of the five senses, introspection, memory, testimony (Casullo 2003: 30, 149), and our kinesthetic sense of the position and movements of our bodies (cf. BonJour lists all these sources at 1998, 7). So beliefs justified independent of experience will be beliefs justified by some source not on the list.

Casullo (2003, 149) raises several problems for this negative account of what it is for a belief to be justified independent of experience. It leaves unexplained why certain sources are excluded from the list and others put on it and, similarly, whether to put possible new sources like clairvoyance and telepathy on the list or to leave them off. Casullo considers four different types of positive accounts of experience (2003, 150-58) and criticizes them all. In the end (2003, 159), he suggests that we take “experience” to be a natural kind term like “water,” “aluminum,” and “horse” and discover empirically what its essence is. Then we will have a basis for distinguishing experiential from non-experiential (= a priori) justification.

But if “experience” is a natural kind term, then it is possible that its essence has nothing to do with the qualia we normally associate with vision, touch, smell, etc., but, instead, has to do with certain patterns of neural firings. But those visual, tactile, olfactory, etc., sensations are what is epistemically relevant; they are the bases of our justifications for certain introspective and perceptual beliefs. Though externalists about justification will disagree, from the standpoint of justification, it seems irrelevant what the difference between experiential and non-experiential sources of belief is if the nature of those different sources is not given in phenomenological terms. (More on reliabilism, a type of externalism, below.) But it is hard to see how the essence of “experience” will be given in phenomenological terms if “experience” is a natural kind term.

If the conclusions of the above discussion are correct, it is possible for a false belief to be a priori justified, and a priori justification can be defeated by empirical evidence. A priori justification is justification that is independent of experience but that does not imply that the person is justified independent of all experience, nor does it mean that she is justified, all things considered, no matter what experience she has. Negatively, it means that she is justified but not on the basis of perception, introspection, memory, testimony, proprioception, and the like (to handle telepathy, clairvoyance, etc., should they exist). It is harder to say positively what it means, but on one standard interpretation non-inferential a priori justification is justification based solely on understanding the proposition at issue. Inferential a priori justification will involve non-inferential a priori justification of the premises and “seeing” how the conclusion follows from, or is supported by, those premises. This “seeing,” in turn, might rest solely on a person's understanding what it is for one proposition to imply, or follow from, another.

Of course, to be justified in believing anything, say, that there are five apples in the bag, you must understand the proposition at issue. But more than just understanding the proposition is needed to be justified in believing that there are five apples in the bag while no more is needed to be justified in believing that 2 + 3 = 5 and that all bachelors are unmarried.

2. What sorts of propositions can be a priori justified and known?

Some have thought that only certain sorts of propositions can be a priori justified, in particular, that only necessary ones can be so justified. But insofar as a person can be a priori justified in believing a false proposition, a priori justification need not be of necessary truths. It need not be of truths at all.

Further, not all necessary truths are a priori justifiable, that is, it is not true that necessarily, if some proposition is necessary, it can be justified a priori. It has often been pointed out that “Water is H2O” is a necessary truth, but it can only be justified empirically, that is, a posteriori. Many philosophers think a similar remark applies to “The morning star is the evening star,” a statement of identity that is a necessary truth that can only be known empirically.

Even if a person can be a priori justified in believing what is not a necessary truth, perhaps a person can be a priori justified in believing, and know, only what he believes is necessarily true. But that must be mistaken, too, for we can imagine some young person, or mathematician, who lacks the concept of necessity and who is still a priori justified in believing, and knows, that 2 + 3 = 5, bachelors are unmarried, etc. (cf. Casullo, 2003, 15-16; BonJour 1998, 114, n. 23). And there are what Casullo calls “modal skeptics” who understand as well as anyone what “possibility” and “necessity” mean but deny that any propositions actually have those properties (Casullo 2003,16). Surely they can be a priori justified in believing 2 + 3 = 5 even if not necessarily, 2 + 3 = 5.

A final proposal might be that a priori knowledge, though not justification, requires that the proposition known be necessarily true, even if the person does not believe that it is necessarily true. The false propositions that we imagined someone could be a priori justified in believing are not counterexamples to this proposal because, being false, they are not known, and so not known a priori.

Saul Kripke argues that a person could have a priori knowledge of a contingent proposition. In particular, he thinks a person could know a priori that S, the standard meter stick in Paris, is one meter long at t0 if he fixed the reference of “one meter” by the definite description, “the length of S at t0,” even though that proposition is contingent (in other possible worlds, at t0 S is longer or shorter than a meter) (Kripke, 1972, 274-75). Let's grant that a person can know a priori that if he has fixed the reference in the described way, then S is one meter long at t0. Still, he cannot know, or even be justified in believing, a priori that he did fix the reference in that way. He can only know by introspection that he intended to fix the reference of “one meter long” by what he did at t0, and S must have existed then for him to succeed in fixing the reference (if he were only hallucinating S he might be trying to fix the reference of “one meter,” but he could not succeed). So to know that he has fixed the reference of “one meter,” our subject must know certain things by introspection and others (namely, the existence of the S) by observation. So he can only know the consequent of the conditional we have granted that he knows a priori by introducing a premise that he only can know a posteriori. Hence, his knowledge of that consequent, which is that S is one meter long at t0, is also a posteriori, contrary to what Kripke claims. It does not matter that, “he knows automatically, without further investigation, that S is one meter long” (Kripke, 1972, 275). That is not sufficient for him to know a priori (that is, independent of experience) that S is one meter long (BonJour, 1998, 12-13 offers a similar argument).

While “the standard meter stick in Paris is one meter long” is not knowable a priori, the conditional cited in the previous paragraph is both knowable a priori and contingent. The proposition, “If Jones fixed the reference of ‘one meter’ by ‘the length of S at t0’, then S is one meter long at t0,” is not necessary because there is a possible world where Jones fixes the reference that way but the particular stick that was named ‘S’ in our world is not, in the other world, one meter long. Nevertheless, the contingent conditional can be known a priori because the truth of both its antecedent and consequent are assessed in the same world.

Gareth Evans discussed another sort of conditional sentence that also seems to express contingent a priori truths. Consider the proposition, “If actually p, then p” and the particular instantiation of it, “If the post is actually red, then it is red.” What “actually” does here is to index the proposition about the post's being red to some particular world, call it W1. So the relevant proposition says: necessarily, if the post is red in W1, then it is red. To determine whether this conditional is necessarily true, we have to consider whether it is true in every possible world. But surely it is not. There is some possible world, say, W100 where “the post is red in W1” is true, but it is false that the post is red because in W100 it is, say, green. So the proposition, “If the post is actually red, it is red,” is not necessary, but it is still true. Further, it can be known a priori because the truth of that contingent proposition depends solely on how things are in the actual world, and, of course, if the post is red in W1 (the actual world), it is red. The consequent of this conditional is true since its truth is determined by how things are in the actual world, W1. Once we see this we can know a priori that the proposition is true, even though it is in fact contingent, not necessary. Further, we can know that the contingent proposition is true solely on the basis of understanding that proposition (cf. Evans 1979: 83-85 for this entire paragraph).

To summarize, a priori knowledge does not require that what is known be a necessary truth, or even just be believed to be a necessary truth. Further, a person can be a priori justified in believing, though, of course, not know, what is false, and empirical evidence can defeat a priori justification, and hence, knowledge. As a start, what seems crucial to a priori justification is that it is based solely on understanding the proposition at issue.

Putting aside contingent propositions that are knowable a priori, this has led people to think that a priori knowledge can only be of analytic propositions, that is, of propositions that can be reduced to logical truths by the substitution of synonyms for appropriate words or phrases in the sentences that express those propositions. (There are other accounts of analyticity, but it will not be necessary to consider them here.) Still ignoring the contingent a priori, for similar reasons, people have been led to think that a priori justification can only be of propositions that appear to be analytic, even if they turn out not to be. By “appear to be analytic,” I mean they appear to be true in virtue of the meanings of the terms involved, as is the case with “bachelors are unmarried males.”

However, it seems that a person could be a priori justified in believing a proposition like “every event has a cause” which, unlike “every effect has a cause,” does not even appear to be analytic. While “effect” might be defined as “the result of a cause,” “event” is not defined in terms of “cause.” An event is a change in some thing or state of affairs. So “every effect has a cause” can be reduced to “every result of a cause has a cause” by the substitution of synonyms, but no such reduction is possible for “every event has a cause.” It seems that we can be a priori justified in believing that no object can be red and green all over at the same time, that no object can be wholly in two different places at the same time, that happiness is an intrinsic good, that it is always wrong to torture an innocent child just for the fun of it, etc., even though these statements are not, and do not even appear to be, analytic. There can be a priori justification of false propositions that do not even appear to be analytic.

3. Explaining how a priori justification is possible

So how can we explain a priori justification if not in terms of apparent analyticity or necessity? Perhaps there are two ways belief in a proposition can be justified a priori. First, a person might have an intuition that a proposition like “bachelors are unmarried” is true based on understanding the concepts involved and, second, she might have an intuition that, say, happiness is an intrinsic good, or that no object can be in two wholly different places at the same time, based on her inability to think of counterexamples to those claims. In each case, a rational intuition, or insight, would be the evidence on which the justification rests, but the intuitions would be based on different things.

What is a rational intuition or insight? Laurence BonJour thinks it is an immediate, non-inferential grasp, apprehension, or “seeing” that some proposition is necessarily true (BonJour 1998, 106). He goes on to argue that a proposition's appearing to be necessarily true is the foundation of a priori justification, for he wants to allow that such justification is both fallible and defeasible. So for BonJour, it is apparent rational insights that are the evidence on which a priori justification rests, not rational insights themselves (1998, 112-13 and secs. 4.5, 4.6). More recently, and in response to comments by Paul Boghossian (2001), BonJour has said that these appearances are not propositional (BonJour 2001, 677-78; BonJour 2005, 100). So in this respect they are unlike beliefs and more like perceptual sensations.

He contrasts his views with those of Alvin Plantinga and compares them to the views of Panyot Butchvarov (BonJour 1998, 108-109, notes 12 and 13). Plantinga also thinks that some sort of “seeing” is the basis of a priori justification. But he analyzes that “seeing” in terms of immediately believing, and being convinced, that a proposition is necessary, where that conviction is accompanied by an indescribable mental state that we all know by considering propositions such as “bachelors are unmarried” (Plantinga 1993, 105-06). Butchvarov says that if you have a priori knowledge of some proposition, then you will find it unthinkable that the proposition is false. BonJour notes that if finding the falsity of a proposition unthinkable amounts to its appearing impossible that it be false, then Butchvarov's position is just like his. But there is another more psychological reading of “find its falsity unthinkable” that would imply that I a priori know that I now exist, because I find the falsity of that proposition unthinkable, even though I know it is contingent and so it does not appear necessary to me. I might find the falsity of “There is no golden sphere a mile in diameter” unthinkable, and I can't imagine a hybrid of a dog and an elephant, but on BonJour's understanding, none of those things appear necessary because none appears impossible (cf. BonJour 2001, 693).

George Bealer characterizes a rational intuition as an intellectual seeming that some proposition is necessarily, or possibly, true (Bealer 1998, 207-08). He contrasts intuitions with “judgments, guesses, and hunches” (1998, 210-11), common sense, belief, and even the inclination to believe (1998, 208-09). There are propositions such as 643 × 721 = 463,603 that we may believe, because we have done the calculations, that do not seem to be true, that is, of which we have no intuition that they are true (Weatherson 2003, 3). On the other hand, in cases involving paradoxes that we have unraveled, one or more of the propositions that constitute the paradox can still seem true, even if we do not believe it.

Monte Hall was the host for a game show called The Price is Right. Contestants were given the chance to choose one of three doors knowing that a big prize was hidden behind one of them but items of considerably less value behind the other two. After the contestant chose a door, Monte Hall would sometimes open one of the doors and show the contestant that the big prize was not behind it. He would then give the contestant the opportunity to switch doors and pick the unopened door that had not been his original choice, or stick with his original choice. It seems that the chance of picking the winning door by switching is 50-50, but it can be shown that it is more (two-thirds). Even after seeing the proof, or hearing reliable testimony that there is such a proof, it can still seem that the chances are 50-50. That seeming is intellectual, not perceptual, and so is a rational intuition, though not a belief since we might believe, on the basis of the proof or reliable testimony, that the chances of winning the big prize are greater if we switch from our original choice of doors. Something similar might be said about not having even the inclination to believe the chances are 50-50: it might seem true even if I am not inclined to believe it.

Ernest Sosa says something similar to Bealer about the Sorites paradox involving heaps (1998, 258-59). It seems obvious that if you remove one grain of sand from a heap, you still have a heap left and that when there are no grains of sand, or only just one left, you do not have a heap. He speculates that if he were driven by argument to disbelieve one of the two claims that appear obviously true, it would still appear true to him. At one point Sosa thought that intuitions are a certain type of inclination to believe (1996, 153-54), but he later allowed that intuitions may not be dispositions, and so may not be inclinations to believe (1998, 259).

The argument that intuitions provide evidence in simple cases, such as “all bachelors are unmarried” or “2 + 3 = 5,” is that concept possession guarantees reliability and that these sorts of intuition are based on concept possession. You cannot have the concept of “bachelor” and not be disposed to withhold application of the term to people you take to be married or female. You cannot have the concept of “knowledge” and not be disposed to withhold application of the term to guesses and what you take to be false beliefs. Insofar as rational intuitions are based on concept possession, you cannot be unreliable in applying the concept you possess to hypothetical situations, though this does not imply that you cannot make mistakes (because, say, pragmatic or contextual implications mislead you or because it is hard to distinguish one concept from another, as with jealousy and envy). To possess a concept, you must be reliable, though not infallible, in your judgments involving application of that concept to hypothetical cases (cf. Goldman 2007, 14-16). (Peacocke (2000, esp., 284-85) addresses the question of the relationship between understanding and concept possession somewhat differently and thinks that there are different sorts of a priori justification whose justificatory force requires different explanations. More on different explanations below. Bealer's account of why rational intuitions justify is given in terms of possessing a concept determinately (cf.1998)).

One wonders whether reliability is either necessary or sufficient for justification in general, and so of a priori justification in particular. In so-called demon worlds a Cartesian evil demon makes you think all kinds of false things about an external world by producing perceptions in you that are just like the ones we now have. A similar thing happens in The Matrix, a film in which supercomputers produce perceptions like the ones we now have in people who are hooked up to the computers while floating in a pod. In both cases, the people are justified in believing what they do about their surroundings despite the fact that their beliefs are usually completely false and rest on an unreliable source (their perceptual experiences that are caused by the demon or the supercomputers). So reliability is not necessary for justification in general. It is also not sufficient, for you may be hard-wired to believe things without evidence that result from a reliable source that you have no reason to think is reliable (e.g., clairvoyance without a track record (BonJour, 1985, 41-43) or a thermometer secretly implanted in your brain that produces true beliefs in you about the surrounding temperature (Lehrer 1990, 163-64)).

So even if concept possession guarantees that judgments that stem from rational intuitions will likely be true, that does not entail that rational intuitions or insights provide justification. The reliability of a source of belief does not guarantee that the resultant belief is justified. Still, we could reflect on how concept possession guarantees reliability of judgments involving the application of concepts to hypothetical situations, and then know that these sorts of judgment are reliable. And known reliability does confer justification on beliefs that we know were reliably produced by the process or mechanism known to be reliable. So when it comes to what appear to be analytic propositions, we might say that we are justified in believing them because in principle we could reflect on how concept possession makes us reliable in applying the relevant terms. Alternatively, we might say that even though we are not in fact justified in believing them we are in a position to be so justified, for we would be justified if we just reflected on the implications of our concept possession.

Concept possession does not guarantee the reliability of judgments that stem from rational intuition, for some non-analytic propositions might appear true when they are not (e.g., every event has a cause) or fail to appear true when they are (e.g., that it is wrong to torture an innocent person for the fun of it). And this might happen frequently despite the person's possessing the concepts involved in the non-analytic proposition. However, as we've seen, when it comes to analytic propositions, possession of the concepts involved in them guarantees the reliability of the relevant judgments. No one can possess the concept of a bachelor and judge that an infant, a married man, or a female is a bachelor, or judge that an average everyday thirty-year-old man who has never been married is not a bachelor. Perhaps it is even true that no one who possesses the concept of bachelor can fail to judge that all bachelors are unmarried males. Reliability with respect to analytic propositions is a consequence of concept possession but not with respect to non-analytic ones.

So how do intuitions that are not based on the apparent analyticity of the proposition at issue provide justification for what have been called synthetic a priori propositions? They seem to be based on our inability to imagine counterexamples to those claims, say, to the claim that happiness is an intrinsic good, or on our inability to imagine how we could have sufficient evidence to reject the claim that every event has a cause. Why should these inabilities justify us in believing the relevant proposition even if intuitions that are produced in this case are phenomenologically indistinguishable from those produced when we consider propositions that at least appear to be analytic? Why shouldn't we conclude, instead, that we have a limited imagination, especially given the fact that we know that in the past propositions have turned out to be false that we were then unable to imagine false (cf. Harman 2003, 30)?

In the first place, analytic philosophers are justified in believing that they have good imaginations, for they are often able to imagine how a claim can be false that non-philosophers cannot. Second, an analytic philosopher may not only be unable herself to imagine how some claim can be false, she may also know that no one in the philosophical literature, or community, has presented an example showing that the claim is false. The best explanation of her failure, and the failure of her colleagues in the discipline, to find a counterexample may be that the claim at issue is a necessary truth. So on each of several particular cases, she is justified in believing that the best explanation of her failure to find a counterexample to some claim is that it is a necessary truth. At the same time, her failures are accompanied by a rational intuition that the proposition she is considering is true, or perhaps if she possesses the concept of necessity, that it is necessarily true. Thus she has inductive evidence over these several cases that her rational intuitions are reliable when, even after much reflection, she has been unable to find counterexamples to some claim. So she will have reason to believe that her intuitions in those circumstances provide evidence.

The justification they provide is defeasible, for she may discover that others whose imaginations are as good as hers have opposing intuitions, or have plausible counter arguments that support the denial of the claim that seems intuitively obvious to her. Then, all things considered, she may not be justified in believing what she believes on the basis of an intuition that results from her failure to imagine a counterexample. But, of course, perception is like this, too. I might seem to see a person on the quad wearing a blue coat while you sincerely report seeing nothing (Feldman 2006, 223). Or I might know that I am in a house of distorting mirrors and have a visual image of myself as looking very fat. While I am often justified in believing what I do on the basis of my perceptual sensations, I would not be in these special circumstances. This just means that perception, and intuition based on failures to imagine counterexamples, are defeasible sources of justification.

Even if the account I have given about why intuitions provide justification of propositions that do not appear to be analytic is correct, doesn't it make the justification a posteriori instead of a priori? It involves inference to the best explanation to explain why a person's failure, and the failure of others, to find counterexamples justifies her in believing that she is considering a necessary truth, and induction to justify her belief that her intuitions that accompany her failures to find counterexamples are reliable evidence that can be used to detect necessary truths. But knowledge of the relevant failures is introspective, or based on observation, and the induction is across observed cases. So the evidence that intuitions of this sort are reliable is empirical. So how does this show that intuitions that result from failures to find counterexamples provide a priori justification?

Recall the example of the person with both a sonar sense and a sense of touch. If the sonar sense is corroborated by the sense of touch, is it an independent source of evidence? One might say that once sonar sensations are “certified” by touch it is possible for a belief to be justified solely on the basis of sonar evidence, not at all on the basis of touch, and so, in a sense, the justification is independent of touch. Once certified, the sonar sense could even provide evidence for propositions about objects permanently out of reach and so evidence for propositions whose truth or falsity could not be determined by touch. Similarly, if the reliability of rational intuitions is “certified” by experience, the intuitions could be considered an independent source of evidence because after the “certification” intuitions alone could provide justification, and they might provide justification for propositions for which no direct experiential evidence is possible. Of course, if this were the case, a priori justification would not be independent of experience in the way that justification based on introspection is because introspection need not be “certified” by experience for it to provide justification. But justification based on rational intuitions would be independent of experience in a significant way.

BonJour argues that a priori justification that rests on rational intuitions, or insights, does not require what he calls a metajustification for those intuitions to provide justification, that is, does not require reasons, or an argument, to show that beliefs based on those intuitions are likely to be true. In this respect, it is like introspection and unlike perception, premonitions about the future, and clairvoyance (if it existed). BonJour seems to think that a principle such as the following is true: (J) if S has a rational intuition, or insight, that necessarily p, after (i) considering p with a reasonable degree of care (which includes a clear and careful understanding of p) (ii) having at least “an approximate understanding of the concept of logical or metaphysical necessity” (BonJour 1998, 127 and 114), and (iii) S is neither dogmatic nor biased regarding p (BonJour 1998, sec. 5.3, 133-37), then S's belief that p is likely to be true. Here is the problem in justifying (J). (J) itself must either be justified empirically or a priori, if justifiable at all. If justified a priori, then it must be justified on the basis of rational intuitions, or insights. But that sort of justification would be circular and so no real justification at all. BonJour argues that if (J) were justified empirically, and the justificatory force of rational insights required that (J) be justified, then the justification provided by rational insight, whether for analytic or so-called synthetic a priori propositions, would be empirical, not really a priori. In that case (J) would have been justified, but a priori justification would not have been vindicated; it would have been reduced to a type of empirical justification. The upshot of all this is that if the justificatory force of rational insights requires that a premise like (J) be justified, then there is no way to vindicate a priori justification. Any argument to do that would either be circular or pull the rug out from under a priori justification (cf. BonJour 1998, sec. 5.5 on the metajustification of rational insights, 142-47, and n. 11 at 146).

In light of the example where touch certifies the sonar sense, one wonders if an empirical justification of reliance on rational intuitions would turn justification based on those intuitions into a type of empirical justification. However, BonJour's response is that the justificatory force of rational insights does not require the justification of some premise like (J). Considerations regarding concept possession or the failure to find counterexamples to some claim might explain why we are justified in believing that rational insights have justificatory force. But it can be true that they have such force even if we lack reason to think so, that is, even if we lack a metajustification. Put another way, rational insights that satisfy the antecedent of (J) (or some principle like it) will provide justification for a person even if that person is not justified in accepting (J). So there is nothing wrong with a metajustification of rational insights to help us understand, and to explain, why they provide justification. It just cannot be that their justificatory force rests, or depends, on such a metajustification. All that is required for S's rational intuitions or insights to provide justification for S is that some principle like (J) be true; S need not be justified in believing that something like (J) is true for his rational insights to provide evidence. BonJour thinks that perception, and clairvoyance if it existed, differ in this regard because in these cases a metajustification is required for observations to justify beliefs that go beyond mere observation reports.

4. Objections to the justificatory force of rational intuitions

There are many objections to the view that rational intuitions provide evidence and are the foundation of a priori justification. One worry is that although in principle intuitions might provide a priori justification, actual disagreement in intuitions defeats any such justification. Empirical researchers at least seem to have found that undergraduate students from different cultures have different intuitions in cases involving questions about whether justified true belief is knowledge, whether reliably produced belief is necessary or sufficient for justification, and whether people in various circumstances act freely or do not (cf. Weinberg, Nichols, and Stich, 2001).

A worry about these experiments is that the judgments the students make are not based on intuitions when “intuition” is used in a sense relevant to epistemology and a priori justification (cf. Bealer 1998, 213). Perhaps “intuition” is being used in a broader sense to mean “whatever seems obvious to a person on reflection, where that seeming obvious is not based on inference” or “a spontaneous judgment about truth or falsity of a proposition” (Weinberg 2003, n. 3). It seems obvious to most that if you drop a stone, it will fall, that the earth is round, and that they are awake and not dreaming. But none of these claims are based on intuition in the relevant sense, for none are based solely on understanding what the relevant propositions mean, nor on the inability to conceive of how they might be false. Insofar as one holds (with Bealer and BonJour) that to have a rational intuition something must seem necessarily, or possibly true, none of these claims would qualify as a rational intuition.

Still, assume that the students' judgments in the cases they are presented are based on intuitions in the relevant sense. Perhaps even then they have no, or little, justificatory force because they do not understand the concepts involved as well as philosophers who have thought long and hard about them. Perhaps what seems true to them is affected by what is contextually implied, not by what the relevant terms mean. Perhaps they have only a fuzzy grasp of the concepts involved. The real concern arises when there are conflicting intuitions among philosophers all of whom have thought long and hard about the concepts involved. In that case, what a person should ultimately believe will depend on the arguments, and replies, that philosophers have in favor of their own analysis of some concept, and against the analyses and intuitions of their opponents. But even here the justification of premises, and of conclusions based on inferences from those premises, will rest on intuitions about those premises, and of what follows from them.

Another sort of criticism focuses on the use of intuitions in philosophy. It says that the terms philosophy is interested in, such as “knowledge,” “causality,” “personal identity,” “morally responsible,” “justice,” and the like are all natural kind terms and so are like “water,” “acid,” “aluminum,” etc. To find the essence of water, acid, etc., we must look for it through empirical investigation. At most, appeal to our intuitions can help us understand our “folk” concepts, to understand what we ordinarily mean by these terms, or as a starting point to focus some scientific inquiry. But what we really need to discover empirically is the essential nature of the phenomena to which the terms refer. So even if rational intuitions can provide the ground for a priori justification of some propositions, they cannot provide that ground for propositions of interest in philosophy. Empirical investigation is needed to answer the questions of interest to philosophy (cf. Kornblith 1998, 2005, 2006; Kitcher, 1983, 82-85 uses “Acids contain oxygen” in an argument that concludes we cannot have any a priori knowledge. But insofar as “acid” is a natural kind term, at most the argument shows that we cannot have any a priori knowledge of propositions expressed by sentences containing natural kind terms.)

The problem with this empirical approach to philosophy is that the terms that philosophy is interested in do not seem to be natural kind terms (Feldman 1999, 176-80). While we can imagine a liquid that is clear, odorless, colorless, and potable, but not water (and vice versa), we cannot imagine a non-accidentally justified true belief that is not knowledge (or vice versa). So while there is room to discover empirically what the essence of water is, since that essence is not given by the relevant common, macroscopic properties of water, there is no such room to discover empirically the essence of knowledge since that essence just is being a non-accidentally justified true belief. Put more directly, the properties commonly associated with water help fix the reference of “water,” but the properties relevant to knowledge are part of the essence of knowledge. Similar remarks apply to other terms, and the associated concepts, that traditionally have interested philosophers.

Another approach that discounts the justificatory force of intuitions, at least in epistemology, is pragmatic. It tells us to determine first what goals we want epistemic principles to serve and then to discover empirically which epistemic principles, if adhered to, will best serve those goals (cf. Weinberg 2006). One problem with this approach is that intuitions must be relied upon to rule out certain goals as not being epistemically relevant. How else could we rule out, say, the goal of making people happy through the beliefs they adopt as being epistemically relevant? Another problem is that we will have to presuppose some epistemic principles to determine whether we are justified in believing that acceptance of certain first-level epistemic principles will further the relevant goals. But what will justify us in accepting those presupposed, second-level principles? On this pragmatic approach, the answer must be that it depends on whether we are justified in believing that accepting these presupposed second-level principles furthers relevant epistemic goals. But then we must presuppose third-level epistemic principles to determine whether we are justified in accepting the second-level presupposed principles. It looks as though we are going to have to be justified in believing an infinite hierarchy of principles to be justified in accepting first-level epistemic principles, and, perhaps, even to be justified in accepting what those first-level principles endorse.

The fourth sort of objection to the justificatory force of rational intuitions appeals to their fallibility. If we know that our intuitions are sometimes mistaken, then how do we know that they are not mistaken on any given occasion? If we do not have reason to think that they are not mistaken on a given occasion, then we are not justified on the basis of intuition in believing what we do on that occasion. Given the known fallibility of intuitions, we are never justified in believing some proposition on their basis alone. We always must also have a justified belief that they are not unreliable on the particular occasion.

This argument can be generalized to apply to any putative source of justification that is known to be fallible. We know that perception is fallible so that for us to be justified in believing anything on its basis we must have a justified belief that it is not unreliable on the particular occasion. But if we are justified in believing that it is not unreliable on the basis of a source that is known to be fallible, then we will have to have another justified belief that that source is not unreliable. And this will go on to infinity if at every stage justification derives from a source known to be fallible. So justification, on this view, must rest ultimately on some infallible source, or no source at all, or on an infinity of considerations that provide justification. None of these alternatives seems plausible. So the argument against the justificatory force of rational intuitions under consideration, when generalized in its application, leads to universal skepticism.

A fifth sort of objection claims that a source of justification must be capable of being calibrated to determine whether it is accurate (Cummins 1998, 116-18). What we see through telescopes justifies us in believing that the moon has mountains because we have looked through telescopes at distant mountains on earth and then traveled to see that the telescopes presented an accurate picture of the mountains. But what can intuitions be checked against to determine that they are accurate? Other intuitions? But that is like checking a crystal ball against itself.

One reply says that propositions like 2 + 3 = 5 that are a priori justified can be checked by observing with our senses that when two objects are added to three more objects there are five objects total. That might lead some to think that such agreement, and disagreement, between a priori justification and perceptual justification would allow one to “calibrate” a priori justification. Can arithmetic propositions also be disconfirmed by experience? Does adding two quarts of water to three quarts of carbon tetrachloride and getting less than five quarts of liquid disconfirm “2 +3 = 5”? No, because “add” in the mathematical statement does not mean “physically combine.” Applied to this case, it means if you count the number of quarts of water, count the number of quarts of carbon tetrachloride and add those two numbers together, you should get the same number as you would if you just counted all the quarts of liquid, namely, five. However, holding everything the same as in the first count, if we did carefully count and found the sum of the first count (2 + 3) was often different from the total of the second count (5), we might think that these results would disconfirm the mathematical claim that 2 + 3 = 5. Why not if observations can disconfirm that every event has a cause or disconfirm Euclidean geometry?

BonJour has argued that many errors involving apparent rational insight can be corrected internally by further reflection or by appealing to coherence (BonJour 1998, 116-19). Others have replied that neither perception, nor memory (Goldman 2007, 5) can be checked either, except against themselves, but that does not prevent these sources from providing justification in certain circumstances. In reply to this sort of response, people have said that at least different types of perception can be checked against each other, say, vision against touch (Weatherson 2003, 4). Of course, all the forms of perception could be unreliable even if they, in a sense, corroborated each other. The critics of intuition add that while we can distinguish circumstances where, say, vision is unreliable (say, where the lighting conditions, or the person's eyesight, is bad; when we are in a desert where illusions often occur; when we are hallucinating, etc.) from circumstances where it is not, nothing similar can be done when it is a matter of intuitions. However, the latter does not seem to be true. I can tell when I do not have a very firm grasp of some concept (say, of poignancy), and sometimes I know that someone has thought about some concept as long and as hard as I have, has intuitions opposed to mine, and I cannot explain his intuitions away. In those circumstances, intuitions do not provide a priori evidence, or at most, weak evidence. Someone might respond that we might know under what circumstances intuitions are unreliable, but we do not know under what circumstances they are reliable. But the same might be said of perception. True, sometimes we can check one sense modality against another. But suppose we could check a ouija board against a crystal ball, and they always agreed. That would not give us reason to believe that either is a reliable source of truth. So how can agreement between, say, vision and touch show that either is reliable?

Another criticism of the view that intuitions are evidence is that they are only evidence of what I mean by some term, not of what the term means (McKinsey 1987, esp. 7 makes this point but does not offer it as a criticism). Some people have the intuition that you lie if you intend to deceive your fisherman father by telling him that you caught a big, big fish that you threw back, even if it was in fact a really big one, provided you thought it was not (say, you thought it was little because you were looking at your brother's line that had a little fish on it, and thought that it was yours because your lines had become crossed, though you did not realize it). Others have the intuition that it is not a lie because you did not say something false, only something you believed to be false. So some people mean by “a lie” something you tell someone that you believe is false, with the intention of deceiving them. Others mean by “a lie” a falsehood that you tell someone with the intention of deceiving them. These people speak two different idiolects, and their intuitions only support hypotheses about what each individual means by “a lie” (Lycan 2006, 164-65). What “a lie” means in English cannot be determined without empirical investigation into what most people who speak English mean by “a lie.” So my intuitions are not evidence of what a term means but only of what I mean by a term. But then the objection is that intuitions are only a reflection of what each person's personal psychological concepts are, which isn't of much philosophical interest (cf. Goldman 2007, esp. 14-17).

One response to this criticism is to concede that all I can get from consulting my intuitions is what I mean by the relevant term. It then proposes that we engage in some social science research to determine if there is a shared concept, which would be the case if there were substantial agreement across the relevant concepts of many individuals (Goldman 2007 offers this response at 17).

A different response is that philosophy is not concerned with what a term means in, say, English, with whether there is, in fact, agreement across many individuals who speak English. Philosophers are interested in what a rational person would come to mean by a term once she has considered her intuitions, the intuitions of others, and the arguments to discount certain intuitions, to accept others, and to accept some theory that best explains the surviving intuitions. The idea is that the theory about the meaning of, for example, “knowledge” that results is what everyone should mean by that term, which is not necessarily what most people do mean by it, nor what any particular person means by it before doing philosophy. One important use of intuitions in philosophy serves a normative purpose (to determine what should be meant by a term), and that investigation need not involve empirical inquiry because it does not depend on what most people do mean by the term.

The final objection is that rational intuitions have some, but very little, epistemic weight. A few hypothetical examples can be enough for a person to reject his initial intuition. For instance, most people initially have the intuition that it would be wrong to push a heavy man in front of a runaway trolley to stop it even if that is the only way to save five innocent people trapped on the tracks from being run over and killed by the trolley. But they often change their minds if several cases involving runaway trolleys are presented that lead up to the one involving the heavy man. If you ask them whether it would be all right to turn a runaway trolley down a spur where two innocent workmen will be killed as a way of preventing the trolley from running over five innocent people on the track it is on, most will say it is permissible to turn down the spur. If you then ask them if it would be permissible to run an empty trolley into a runaway trolley with two innocent people on it, in order to knock that trolley off the tracks so it will not run over the five, most will answer it is even if the two will be killed by the impact. Next, if you again assume that none are on the runaway trolley headed for the five, but two are on the trolley that you can run into the empty runaway trolley to knock it off the tracks, most will say that it is permissible to run the one trolley into the other even if the two will be killed. Having considered all these variations on the trolley case, many will now say that it is permissible to run a heavy man (say, on rollerskates!) into the trolley headed for the five to knock it off the tracks. After all, if it is morally permissible to run a trolley with two on it into the runaway trolley to knock it off the tracks so that five won't be killed, even though the two will be killed, why isn't it morally permissible to push a heavy man not on a trolley into the same sort of runaway trolley to stop it from running over the five? So people can be brought by considering a series of hypothetical cases to reject a firm intuition they previously held (see Unger, 1996, 88-91 for a similar multi-option trolley case). It is much harder to get people to give up what they believe they have perceived, and rarely will merely hypothetical cases do the trick.

According to the view that intuitions don't have much evidentiary force, while Gettier examples provide some reason to reject the view that justified true belief (JTB) is knowledge, perhaps, all things considered, we should accept the JTB account because it is simpler and systematizes many of our intuitions about knowledge (Weatherson 2003, esp. 1-2; 6-11). Others are not willing to accept the JTB account of knowledge just because of its simplicity and scope, but they are willing to reject certain intuitions in favor of a non-JTB theory that is itself simple and general (cf., William Lycan, 2006, 158 and 162-63 where he holds that a person who sees a barn on a street containing many very realistic barn facades knows it's a barn, assuming that the person does not know that there are many barn facades nearby, because Lycan's simple and systematic theory implies that the person knows.) If intuitions can be given up because some simple and systematic theory implies they are mistaken, then intuitions do not have the same justificatory force as perceptions. If a scientific theory plus auxiliary hypotheses really imply that bumblebees cannot fly, but we see them flying, we should reject that theory, or at least one of those hypotheses. But on the theory of a priori disconfirmation under consideration, we need not give up the JTB theory of knowledge just because of Gettier examples.

It is obviously a hard question about what should weigh more heavily, intuitions or theoretical considerations, when a person must determine what, all things considered, she should accept. To settle the issue, some argument is needed for treating intuitions either like, or different from, perceptions when it comes to their ability, or inability, to disconfirm theories.

5. Rationalism vs. empiricism

Rationalists have typically thought that we can be a priori justified, and even know, things about the world, and empiricists have denied this. Now if the world includes abstract entities like numbers and propositions, then some rationalists, and even some empiricists, will hold that we can know a priori things about the existence and nature of these entities (though the empiricists might have a different view about what it is to be an abstract entity). However, rationalists like BonJour (1998) will insist that we can also know a priori things about the natural world. For instance, we can know a priori that no object can be red and green all over at the same time and in the same respects, that no object can be wholly in two distinct places at the same time, and (perhaps) that backward causation is impossible. They will claim that this is knowledge of the nature of reality and will be true of any object, or event, that exists.

One might grant this claim and at the same time point out that it does not give us knowledge of the existence of things, events, and states of affairs but only knowledge of what they must be like if they exist. We only know that there are objects and events in space and time by experiencing them, even if we can know a priori certain things about the distribution of colors on their surfaces, how many places they can be in at any given time, and whether a later event can cause an earlier one.

6. Concluding Reflections

It seems that ultimately a priori justification must rest on the justification that rational intuition, or insight, provides. In deductive arguments they provide the justification for the belief that the conclusion follows from the premises, and sometimes for the premises themselves. In inductive arguments, or arguments involving inference to the best explanation, rational intuitions must ultimately provide justification for those ampliative principles themselves. When it comes to the philosophical analysis of concepts, intuitions provide the data of which the proffered analysis, if justified, is the best explanation. Some maintain that to be justified in accepting the proffered analysis it, too, should be intuitively obvious, even if not immediately. Though empiricists will disagree, others will embrace BonJour's claim that philosophy must be a priori “if it has any intellectual standing at all” (BonJour, 1998, 106).

Empirical approaches to philosophy seem unable to do away with appeal to intuitions as the grounds for believing some conclusion follows from the premises, to support ampliative inferences that go beyond observations to more general claims, or to discover the essence of concepts that non-natural kind terms express. Pragmatic approaches to philosophy seem to require reliance on intuitions to determine relevant epistemic goals and to stop a threatening regress. In the past it was widely held that a priori knowledge could only be of necessary or analytic truths, and that all necessary truths were capable of being known a priori. Similar things were thought of a priori justification. In light of developments in the last half of the 20th century, all of these claims about the relation between a priori knowledge and justification on the one hand, and necessity and analyticity on the other, seem false. Further, a priori justification is fallible, and both it and a priori knowledge are defeasible, both by a priori and empirical evidence. Kant seems right in arguing that not only analytic propositions can be justified, and known, a priori, though many reject his account of how synthetic a priori knowledge is possible as obscure and unconvincing. Perhaps philosophers were mistaken in thinking that if there is an explanation of how a priori justification, and knowledge, are possible it must be of just one type. Maybe at least two different accounts must be given, one in terms of concept possession; the other, in terms of the inability to find counterexamples.


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analytic/synthetic distinction | natural kinds | rationalism vs. empiricism | reasoning: defeasible | reliabilism | truth: necessary vs. contingent