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The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

First published Thu Aug 14, 2003; substantive revision Fri Aug 15, 2008

“Analytic” sentences, such as “Ophthalmologists are doctors,” are those whose truth seems to be knowable by knowing the meanings of the constituent words alone, unlike the more usual “synthetic” ones, such as “Ophthalmologists are ill-humored,” whose truth is knowable by both knowing the meaning of the words and something about the world. Beginning with Frege, many philosophers hoped to show that knowledge of logic and mathematics and other apparently a priori domains, such as much of philosophy and the foundations of science, could be shown to be analytic by careful “conceptual analysis.” This project encountered a number of problems that have seemed so intractable as to lead some philosophers, particularly Quine, to doubt the reality of the distinction. There have been a number of interesting reactions to this scepticism, both in philosophy and in linguistics, but it has yet to be shown that the distinction will ever be able to ground the a priori in the way that philosophers had hoped.

1. The Intuitive Distinction

Compare the following two sets of sentences:

(1) Some doctors that specialize on eyes are ill-humored.
(2) Some ophthalmologists are ill-humored.
(3) Many bachelors are ophthalmologists.
(4) People who run damage their bodies.
(5) If Holmes killed Sikes, then Watson must be dead.


(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.
(7) All ophthalmologists are doctors.
(8) All bachelors are unmarried.
(9) People who run move their bodies.
(10) If Holmes killed Sikes, then Sikes is dead.

Most competent English speakers who know the meanings of all the constituent words would find an obvious difference between the two sets: whereas they might wonder about the truth or falsity of those of set I, they would find themselves pretty quickly incapable of doubting those of II. Unlike the former, these latter seem to be known automatically, “just by virtue of knowing just what the words mean,” as many might spontaneously put it. Indeed, a denial of any of them would seem to be in some important way unintelligible, very like a contradiction in terms. Although there is, as we shall see, a great deal of dispute about these italicized ways of drawing the distinction, and even about whether it is real, philosophers standardly refer to sentences of the first class as “synthetic,” those of the second as (at least apparently) “analytic.” Many philosophers have hoped that the apparent necessity and a priori status of the claims of logic, mathematics and much of philosophy would prove to be due to these claims being analytic, i.e., explaining why such claims seemed to be true “in all possible worlds,” and knowable to be so “independently of experience.” This view has led them to regard philosophy as consisting in large part in the “analysis” of the meanings of the relevant claims, words and concepts (hence “analytic” philosophy, although the term has long ceased to have any such specific commitment, and refers now more generally to philosophy done in the associated closely reasoned style).

1.1 Kant

Although there are anticipations of the notion of the analytic in Locke and Hume in their talk of “relations of ideas,” the specific terms “analytic” and “synthetic” themselves were introduced by Kant (1781/1998) at the beginning of his Critique of Pure Reason, where he wrote:

In all judgments in which the relation of a subject to the predicate is thought (if I only consider affirmative judgments, since the application to negative ones is easy) this relation is possible in two different ways. Either the predicate B belongs to the subject A as something that is (covertly) contained in this concept A; or B lies entirely outside the concept A, though to be sure it stands in connection with it. In the first case, I call the judgment analytic, in the second synthetic. (A:6-7)

He provided as an example of an analytic judgment, “All bodies are extended”: in thinking of a body we can't help but also think of something extended in space; that would seem to be just part of what is meant by “body.” He contrasted this with “All bodies are heavy,” where the predicate (“is heavy”) “is something entirely different from that which I think in the mere concept of body in general” (A7), and we must put together, or “synthesize,” the different concepts, body and heavy (sometimes such concepts are called “ampliative,” “amplifying” a concept beyond what is “contained” in it).

Kant tried to spell out his “containment” metaphor for the analytic in two ways. To see that any of set II is true, he wrote, “I need only to analyze the concept, i.e., become conscious of the manifold that I always think in it, in order to encounter this predicate therein” (A7). But then, picking up a suggestion of Leibniz , he went on to claim:

I merely draw out the predicate in accordance with the principle of contradiction, and can thereby at the same time become conscious of the necessity of the judgment. (A7)

As Katz (1988) recently emphasized, this second definition is significantly different from the “containment” idea, since now, in its appeal to the powerful method of proof by contradiction, the analytic would include all of the (potentially infinite) deductive consequences of a particular claim, most of which could not be plausibly regarded as “contained” in the concept expressed in the claim. For starters, “Bachelors are unmarried or the moon is blue” is a logical consequence of “Bachelors are unmarried”—its denial contradicts the latter (a denial of a disjunction is a denial of each disjunct)—but clearly nothing about the color of the moon is remotely “contained in” the concept bachelor. To avoid such consequences, Katz (e.g., 1972, 1988) goes on to try to develop a serious theory based upon only the initial containment idea, as, along different lines, does Pietroski (2005).

One reason Kant may not have noticed the differences between his different characterizations of the analytic was that his conception of “logic” seems to have been confined to Aristotelian syllogistic, and so didn't include the full resources of modern logic, where the differences between the two characterizations become more glaring (see MacFarlane 2002). Indeed, he demarcates the category of the analytic chiefly in order to contrast it with what he regards as the more important category of the synthetic, which he famously thinks is not confined, as one might initially suppose, merely to the empirical. While some trivial a priori claims might be analytic, for Kant the seriously interesting ones were synthetic. He argues that even so elementary an example in arithmetic as “7+5=12,” is synthetic, since the concept of “12” is not contained in the concepts of “7,” “5,” or “+,”: appreciating the truth of the proposition would seem to require some kind of active synthesis of the mind uniting the different constituent thoughts. And so we arrive at the category of the “synthetic a priori,” whose very possibility became a major concern of his work. He tries to show that the activity of “synthesis” was the source of the important cases of a priori knowledge, not only in arithmetic, but also in geometry, the foundations of physics, ethics, and philosophy generally, a view that set the stage for much of the philosophical discussions of the subsequent century (see Coffa 1991:pt I).

Apart from geometry, Kant, himself, didn't focus much on the case of mathematics. But, as mathematics in the 19th C. began reaching new heights of sophistication, worries were increasingly raised about its foundations as well. It was specifically in response to this latter problem that Gottlob Frege (1884/1980) tried to improve upon Kant's formulations of the analytic, and presented what is widely regarded as the next significant discussion of the topic.

1.2 Frege

Frege (1884/1950:§§5,88) and others noted a number of problems with Kant's “containment” metaphor. In the first place, as Kant himself probably would have agreed, the criterion would need to be freed of “psychologistic” suggestions, or claims about merely the accidental thought processes of thinkers, as opposed to claims about truth and justification that are presumably at issue with the analytic. In particular, mere associations are not always matters of meaning: someone might regularly associate bachelors with being harried, but this wouldn't therefore seriously be a part of the meaning of “bachelor” (“an unharried bachelor” is not contradictory). But, secondly, although the denial of a genuinely analytic claim may well be a “contradiction,” it isn't clear what makes it so: there is no explicit contradiction in the thought of a married bachelor, in the way that there is in the thought of a bachelor who is not a bachelor. “Married bachelor” has at least the same explicit logical form as “harried bachelor.”. Rejecting “a married bachelor” as contradictory would seem to have no justification other than the claim that “All bachelors are married” is analytic, and so cannot serve to justify or explain that claim.

Even were Kant to have solved these problems, it isn't clear how his notion of “containment” would cover all the cases of what seem to many to be as “analytic” as any of set II. Thus, consider:

II. (cont.)
(11) If Bob is married to Sue, then Sue is married to Bob.
(12) Anyone who's an ancestor of an ancestor of Bob is an ancestor of Bob.
(13) If x is bigger than y, and y is bigger than z, then x is bigger than z.
(14) If something is red, then it's colored.

The symmetry of the marriage relation, or the transitivity of “ancestor” and “bigger than” are not obviously “contained in” the corresponding thoughts in the way that the idea of extension is plausibly “contained in” the notion of body, or male in the notion of bachelor. (14) has seemed particularly troublesome: what else besides “colored” could be included in the analysis? Red is colored and what else? It is hard to see what else to “add”—except red itself! (See §3.4 below for further discussion.)

Frege attempted to remedy the situation by completely rethinking the foundations of logic, developing what we now think of as modern symbolic logic . He defined a perfectly precise “formal” language, i.e., a language characterized by the “form” –standardly, the shape– of its expressions, and he carefully set out an account of the syntax and semantics of what are called the “logical constants,” such as “and”, “or”, “not”, “all” and “some”, showing how to capture a very wide class of valid inferences. Just how these constants are selected is a matter of some dispute (see Logical Constants), but intuitively, the constants can be thought of as those parts of language that don't “point” or “function referentially”, aiming to refer to something in the world, in the way that ordinary nouns, verbs and adjectives seem to do: “dogs” refers to dogs, “clever” to clever and/or clever things, and even “Zeus” aims to refer to a Greek god; but words like “or” and “all” don't seem to function referentially at all: it doesn't seem to make sense to think of there being “or”s in the world, along with the dogs and their properties.

This distinction between referring expressions and logical constants allows us to define a logical truth as a sentence that is true no matter what referring expressions occur in it. Consequently,

(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.

counts as a (strict) logical truth: no matter what referring expressions we put in for “doctor”, “eyes” and “specialize on” in (6), the sentence will remain true. For example, substituting “cats” for “doctors”, “mice” for “eyes” and “chase” for “specialize on”, we get:

(15) All cats that chase mice are cats.

(Note that we idealize to non-ambiguity, all occurrences of the same spelt words having the same reference.) But what about the others of set II? Substituting “cats” for “doctors” and “mice” for “ophthalmologists” in

(7) All ophthalmologists are doctors.

we get:

(16) All mice are cats.

which is patently false, as would similar such substitutions render the rest of the examples of II. So how are we to capture these apparent analyticities?

Here Frege appealed to the notion of definition, or—presuming that definitions preserve “meaning” (see §4.2 below)—synonymy: the non-logical analytic truths are those that can be converted to (strict) logical truths by substitution of definitions for defined terms, or synonyms for synonyms. Since “mice” is not synonymous with “ophthalmologist”, (16) is not a substitution of the required sort. We need, instead, a substitution of the definition of “ophthalmologist”, i.e., “doctor that specializes on eyes”, which would convert (7) into our earlier purely logical truth:

(6) All doctors that specialize on eyes are doctors.

Of course, these notions of definition, meaning and synonymy would themselves need to clarified, But this wasn't thought to be particularly urgent until Quine raised serious questions about them much later (see §3.6ff below).

Frege was mostly interested in formalizing arithmetic, and so considered the logical forms of a relative minority of natural language sentences in a deliberately spare formalism. Work on the logical (or syntactic) structure of the full range of sentences of natural language has blossomed since then, initially in the work of Russell (1905), in his famous theory of definite descriptions, where the criterion is applied to whole phrases in context, but then especially in the work of Chomsky and other “generative” linguists (see §4.3 below). Whether Frege's criterion of analyticity will work for the rest of II and other analyticities depends upon the details of those proposals (see, e.g., Katz 1972, Montague 1974, Hornstein 1984 and Pietroski 2005).

2. High Hopes

Why should philosophy be interested in what would seem to be a purely linguistic notion? Because, especially in the first half of the Twentieth Century, many philosophers thought it could perform crucial epistemological work, providing an account, first, of our apparently a priori knowledge of mathematics, and then—with a little help from British empiricism—of our understanding of claims about the spatio-temporal world as well. Indeed, “conceptual analysis” soon came to constitute the very way particularly Anglophone philosophers characterized their work. Many additionally thought it would perform the metaphysical work of explaining the truth and necessity of mathematics, showing not only how it is we could know about these topics independently of experience, but how they could be true in all possible worlds. This latter ambition was sometimes not distinguished from the former one, although it is no longer shared by most philosophers still interested in the analytic (see Devitt 1996 for discussion, and Glock 2003:ch 3 for an interesting attempt to resuscitate the metaphysical work). In this entry we will focus primarily on the epistemological project.

2.1 Mathematics

The problem of accounting for mathematical knowledge is arguably one of the oldest and hardest problems in Western philosophy. It is easy enough to understand: ordinarily we acquire knowledge about the world by our senses. If we are interested in, for example, whether it's raining outside, how many birds are on the beach, or whether fish sleep, we look and see, or turn to others who do. It is a widespread view that Western sciences owe their tremendous successes precisely to relying on just such “empirical” (experiential, experimental) methods. However, it is also a patent fact about all these sciences, and even our ordinary ways of counting birds and fish, that they depend on mathematics; and mathematics does not seem to be known on the basis of experience. Mathematicians don't do experiments in the way that chemists, biologists or other “natural scientists” do. They seem simply to think, at most with pencil and paper as an aid to memory. In any case, they don't try to justify their claims by reference to experiments: “Twice two is four” is not justified by observing that pairs of pairs tend in all cases observed so far to be quadruples.

But how could mere processes of thought issue in any knowledge about the independently existing external world? The belief that it could would seem to involve some kind of mysticism; and, indeed, many “naturalistic” philosophers have felt that the appeals of “Rationalist” philosophers like Plato, Descartes, Leibniz and, more recently, Katz (1988, 1990), Bealer (1987) and Bonjour (1998), to some special faculty of “rational intuition,” seem no better off than appeals to “revelation” to establish theology.

Here's where the analytic seemed to many to offer a more promising alternative. Perhaps all the truths of arithmetic could be shown to be analytic by Frege's criterion, i.e., by showing that they could all be converted into logical truths by substitution of synonyms for synonyms. Of course, the relevant synonyms were not quite as obvious as “ophthalmologist” and “eye doctor”; one needed to engage in a rigorous process of “logical analysis” of the meanings of such words as “number”, “plus”, “exponent”, “limit”, “integral”, etc. But this is what Frege set out to do, and in his train, Russell and the young Ludwig Wittgenstein, launching the program of logicism, often with great insight and at least some success (see §5 below).

2.2 Science

But why stop at arithmetic? If logical analysis could illuminate the foundations of mathematics by showing how it could all be derived from logic by substitution of synonyms, perhaps it could also illuminate the foundations of the rest of our knowledge by showing how its claims could similarly be derived from logic and experience. Such was the hope and program of Logical Positivism, championed by, e.g., Moritz Schlick, A.J. Ayer and, especially, Rudolf Carnap. Of course, such a proposal did presume that all of our concepts were “derived” either from logic or experience, but this seemed in keeping with the then prevailing presumptions of empiricism, which, they assumed, had been vindicated by the immense success of the empirical sciences.

How were our concepts of, e.g., space, time, causation, or material objects analytically related to experience? For the Positivists, the answer seemed obvious: by tests. Taking a page from the American philosopher, C.S. Pierce, they proposed various versions of their Verifiability Theory of Meaning, according to which the meaning (or “cognitive significance”) of any sentence was the conditions of its empirical (dis)confirmation. Thus, to say that there was an electric current of a certain magnitude in a wire was to say that, if one were to attach the terminals of an ammeter to the ends of the wire, the needle would point to that very magnitude, a claim that would be disconfirmed if it didn't. Closer to “experience”: to say that there was a cat on a mat was just to say that certain patterns of sensation (certain familiar visual, tactile and aural appearances) were to be expected under certain circumstances. After all, it seemed to them, as it seemed to Locke, Berkeley and Hume centuries earlier, that all our concepts are derived from sensory experiences, and, if so, then all our concepts must involve some or other kind of construction from those experiences. For the Positivists, these earlier empiricists had erred only in thinking that the mechanism of construction was mere association. But association can't even account for the structure of a judgment, such as “Salt comes in shakers,” which is not merely the excitation of its constituent ideas, along the lines of “salt” exciting “pepper,” but involves combining the nouns “salt” and “shakers” with the predicate “x comes in y” in a very particular way (see Kant 1781/1998:A111-2 and Frege 1892/1966). That is, our thoughts and claims about the world have some kind of logical structure, of a sort that seems to begin to be revealed by Frege's proposals. Equipped with Frege's logic, it was possible to provide a more plausible formulation of conceptual empiricism: our claims about the empirical world were to be analyzed into the (dis)confirming experiences out of which they must somehow have been logically constructed.

The project of providing “analyses” of concepts in this way of especially problematic ones like those concerning, for example, material objects, knowledge, perception, causation, freedom, the self, was pursued by Positivists and other “analytic” philosophers for a considerable period (see Carnap 1928/67 for some rigorous examples, Ayer 1934/52 for more accessible ones). With regard to material object claims, the program came to be known as “phenomenalism”; with regard to the theoretical claims of science, as “operationalism” ; and with regard to the claims about people's mental lives, as “analytical behaviorism” (the relevant experiential basis of mental claims in general being taken to be observations of others' behavior). But, although these programs became extremely influential, and some form of the verifiability criterion was often (and sometimes still is) invoked in physics and psychology to constrain theoretical speculation, they seldom, if ever, met with any serious success. No sooner was an analysis, say, of “material object” or “expectation,” proposed than serious counterexamples were raised and the analysis revised, only to be faced with still further counterexamples. Despite what seemed its initial plausibility, philosophers came to suspect that the criterion, and with it the very notion of analyticity itself, rested on some fundamental mistakes.

3. Problems with the Distinction

3.1 The Status of the Primitives

An issue that Frege's criterion didn't address is the status of the basic sentences of logic themselves. Are the logical truths themselves a priori because they, too, are “analytic”? But what makes them so? Is it that anyone who understands their wording just must see that they are true? If so, how are we to make sense of disputes about the laws of logic, of the sort that are raised, for example, by mathematical intuitionists, who deny the Law of Excluded Middle, or, more recently, by “para-consistent” logicians, who argue for the toleration even of contradictions to avoid certain paradoxes (see Williamson 2006 for discussion)? Moreover, given that the infinitude of logical truths needs to be “generated” by rules of inference, wouldn't that be a reason for regarding them as “synthetic” in Kant's sense (see Frege 1884/1980:§88, Katz 1988:58-9 and MacFarlane 2002)? Most worrisome is a challenge raised by Quine 1956/76:§II): how does claiming logical truths to be analytic differ from merely claiming them to be obviously and universally correct, i.e., widely and firmly held beliefs, indistinguishable in kind from banalities like “The earth has existed for many years” or “There have been black dogs”?

A further problem arises for the non-logical vocabulary. The sentences reporting our experiences seemed to have some kind of analytic connection with those experiences –a normal sighted person failing to apply “looks red” in clear cases arguably fails to understand the words. But there was a serious question about just what “experience” should be taken to be: was it the sort of encounter with ordinary middle-sized objects such as tables and chairs, the weather and bodily actions, in terms of which most people would readily describe their perceptual experience? Or was it some sort of “un-conceptualized” play of sense impressions that it would take something like the training of an articulate impressionist artist to describe? This latter suggestion seemed to involve a “myth of the given” (Sellars 1956), or the dubious assumption that there was something given in our experience that was entirely un-interpreted by our understanding. This was a claim about which serious doubts were raised by psychologists (e.g., Bruner 1957) and philosophers of science (e.g., Hanson 1958 and Kuhn 1962). Considered closely, ordinary “observations” can be seen to be shot through with conceptual presuppositions: even so guarded a report as “It smells to me like tarragon” arguably involves the conceptualized memory of the smell of tarragon, and what one's earlier experiences were like. If so, and if there were consequently no privileged set of sentences reporting experience in an unbiased way, then the rug would seem to have been pulled from under some of the main presumptions and motivations for the Positivist program: what would be the significance of “analyzing” the meaning of a claim into merely what a particular theorist had (arbitrarily?) decided to regard as primitive?

Recent developments in psychology, however, suggest that human minds may well contain sensory and motor “modules” whose primitives would be epistemically distinctive, even if they do involve some limited degree of conceptual interpretation (see Modularity of Mind and Fodor 1983, 1984). And so the analytical Positivist program might be recast in terms of the reduction of all concepts to these sensorimotor primitives, a project that is sometimes implicit in cognitive psychology and artificial intelligence.

3.2 The Paradox of Analysis

Another problem with the entire program was raised by Langford (1942): why should analyses be of any conceivable interest? After all, if analysis consists in providing the definition of an expression, then it should be merely providing a synonym for it, and this should be wholly uninformative, as un-informative as the claim that unmarried males are unmarried. But the proposed reductions of, say, material object statements to sensory ones were often fairly complex, had to be studied and learned, and so hardly seemed uninformative. So how could they count as seriously analytic? This is “the paradox of analysis,” which can be seen as dormant in Frege's own move from his (1884) focus on definitions to his more controversial (1892) doctrine of sense, where two senses are distinct if and only if someone can think a thought containing the one but not other, as in the case of the senses of “the morning star” and “the evening star.” If definitions preserve sense, then, whenever one thought the defined concept, one would be thinking also the definition. But few of Frege's definitions, much less those of the Positivists, seemed remotely to have this character (see Bealer 1982, Dummett 1991 and Horty 1993, 2007 for discussion).

A related problem, discussed by Bealer (1998), is the possible proliferation of candidate analyses. The concept of a circle can be can be analyzed as the concept of a set of co-planar points equidistant from a given point and as a closed figure of constant curvature. Not only do both of these analyses seem informative, the equivalence between them would need to be shown by some serious geometry, which, especially since the advent of non-Euclidean geometries and Einstein's theories of relativity, could no longer be assumed to be justified merely on the basis of logic and definitions.

These problems, so far, can be regarded as relatively technical, for which further technical moves within the program might be made. For example, one might make further distinctions within the theory of sense between an expression's content and the specific “linguistic vehicle” for its expression, as in Fodor (1990a) and Horty (1993, 2007); and maybe distinguish between the truth-conditional content of an expression and its idiosyncratic role, or “character,” in a language system, along the lines of a distinction Kaplan (1989) introduced to deal with indexical and demonstrative expressions (such as “I,” “now” and “that”; see Demonstratives, Narrow Mental Content and White 1982). Perhaps analyses could be regarded as providing a particular “vehicle,” having a specific “character,” that could account for why one could entertain a certain concept without entertaining its analysis.

However, the problems with the program seemed to many philosophers to be deeper than merely technical. By far, the most telling and influential of the criticisms both of the program, and then of analyticity in general, were those of the American philosopher, W.V. Quine, who began as a great champion of the program (see esp. his 1934), and whose subsequent objections therefore carry special weight. The reader is well-advised to consult especially his (1956/76) for as rich and deep a discussion of the issues as one might find. The next two sections abbreviate some of that discussion.

3.3 Problems with Logicism

Although the pursuit of the logicist program gave rise to a great many insights into the nature of mathematical concepts, not long after its inception it began encountering substantial difficulties. For Frege, the most calamitous came early on in a letter from Russell, in which Russell pointed out that one of Frege's crucial axioms for arithmetic was actually inconsistent. His intuitively quite plausible “Basic Law V” (sometimes called “the unrestricted Comprehension Axiom”) had committed him to the existence of a set for every predicate. But what, asked Russell, of the predicate “x is not a member of itself”? If there were a set for that predicate, that set itself would be a member of itself if and only if it wasn't; consequently, there could be no such set. Frege's Basic Law V couldn't be true (but see Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic and recent discussion of Frege's program in §5 below).

What was especially upsetting about “Russell's paradox” was that there seemed to be no intuitively satisfactory way to repair set theory in a way that could lay claim to being as obvious and merely a matter of logic or meaning in the way that Positivists had hoped to show it to be. Various proposals were made, but all of them were tailored precisely to avoid the paradox, and seemed to have little independent appeal. Certainly none of them appeared to be analytic. As Quine (1956/76, §V) observed, in the actual practice of choosing axioms for set theory, we are left “making deliberate choices and setting them forth unaccompanied by any attempt at justification other than in terms of their elegance and convenience,” appeals to the meanings of terms be hanged (although see Boolos 1971).

3.4 Convention?

Perhaps, however, these “deliberate choices” could themselves be seen as affording a basis for analytic claims. For aren't matters of meaning in the end really matters about the deliberate or implicit conventions with which words are used? Someone, for example, could invest a particular word, say, “schmuncle,” with a specific meaning merely by stipulating that it mean, say, unmarried uncle. Wouldn't that afford a basis for claiming then that “A schmuncle is an uncle” is analytic, or “true by virtue of the (stipulated) meanings of the words alone”? Carnap (1947) proposed setting out the “meaning postulates” of a scientific language in just this way. This had the further advantage of allowing terms to be “implicitly defined” by their roles in such postulates, which might be a theory's laws or axioms. This strategy seems especially appropriate for defining logical constants, as well as dealing with cases like (11)-(14) above, e.g. “Red is a color,” where mere “containment” seemed not to suffice. So perhaps what philosophical analysis is doing is revealing the tacit conventions of ordinary language, an approach particularly favored by Ayer (1934/52).

Quine (1956, §§IV-V) goes on to address the complex role(s) of convention in mathematics and science. Drawing on his earlier discussion (1936/76) of the conventionality of logic, he argues that logic could not be established by such conventions, since

the logical truths, being infinite in number, must be given by general conventions rather than singly; and logic is needed then in the meta-theory, in order to apply the general conventions to individual cases (1956:p.115).

This is certainly an argument that ought to give the proponents of the conventionality of logic pause: how could one hope to set out the general conventions for “all” or “if…then…” without using the notions of “all” and “if…then…”? (A complex issue remains about whether conventional rules might not be “implicit” in a practice, and so implicitly definable it terms of it; see Lewis (1969), Boghossian (1997), Horwich (2000), Hale and Wright (2000) and §4.1 below for discussion). Turning to set theory and then the rest of science, Quine goes on to argue that, although stipulative definition, what he calls “legislative postulation,”

contributes truths which become integral to the corpus of truths, the artificiality of their origin does not linger as a localized quality, but suffuses the corpus. (1956:pp. 119-20)

This certainly seems to accord with scientific practice. Even if Newton, say, had himself explicitly set out “F=ma” as a stipulated definition of “F”, this wouldn't really settle the interesting philosophical question of whether “F=ma”, is justified by its being analytic, or “true by meaning alone,” since our taking his stipulation seriously would depend upon our acceptance of his theory as a whole, in particular upon “the elegance and convenience” it brought to the rest of our physical theory of the world (see Harman 1996:p399 for a nice discussion of how “something that is true by stipulative definition can turn out to be false”). As Quine goes on to observe:

[S]urely the justification of any theoretical hypothesis can, at the time of hypothesis, consist in no more than the elegance and convenience which the hypothesis brings to the containing bodies of laws and data. How then are we to delimit the category of legislative postulation, short of including under it every new act of scientific hypothesis? (1956:p.121)

Carnap's legislated “meaning postulates” should therefore be regarded as just an arbitrary selection of sentences a theory presents as true, a selection perhaps useful for purposes of exposition, but no more significant than the selection of certain towns in Ohio as “starting points” for a journey (1953/80:35). Invoking his famous holistic metaphor of the “web of belief,” Quine concludes:

the lore of our fathers is a fabric of sentences [which] develops and changes, through more or less arbitrary and deliberate revisions and additions of our own, more or less directly occasioned by the continuing stimulation of our sense organs. It is a pale grey lore, black with fact and white with convention. But I have found no substantial reasons for concluding that there are any quite black threads in it, or any white ones. (1956:p.132)

3.5 Problems with Verificationism

These last passages express a tremendously influential view of Quine's that led several generations of philosophers to despair not only of the analytic-synthetic distinction, but of the category of a priori knowledge entirely. The view has come to be called “confirmation holism,” and Quine had expressed it more shortly a few years earlier, in his widely read article, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1953, ch. 2):

our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually, but only as a corporate body. (1953/80, p. 41)

Indeed, the “two dogmas” that the article discusses are (i) the belief in the intelligibility of the distinction itself, and (ii), what Quine regards as the flip side of the same coin, the belief that “each statement, taken in isolation from its fellows, can admit of confirmation or infirmation at all” (p. 41), i.e., the very (version of the) Verifiability Theory of Meaning we have seen the Positivists enlisted in their effort to “analyze” the claims of science and commonsense. (Ironically enough, Quine, himself, continued to adhere to a verifiability conception of meaning, his confirmation holism leading him merely to embrace a meaning holism and his notorious “thesis of the indeterminacy of translation” see his 1986:p155 and the next section).

Quine bases his “confirmation holism” upon observations of Duhem (1914/54), who drew attention to the myriad ways in which theories are supported by evidence, and the fact that an hypothesis is not (dis)confirmed merely by some specific experiment considered in isolation from an immense amount of surrounding theory. Thus, to take our earlier example, applying an ammeter to a copper wire will be a good test that there's a current in the wire, only if the device is in working order, the wire is composed of normal copper, there aren't any other forces at work that might disturb the measurement—and, especially, only if the background laws of physics that have informed the design of the measurement are in fact sufficiently correct. A failure in the ammeter to register a current could, after all, be due to a failure of any of these other conditions, which is, of course, why experimenters spend so much time and money constructing experiments to “control” for them. Moreover, with a small change in our theories, or just in our understanding of the conditions for measurement, we might change the tests on which we rely, but often without changing the meaning of the sentences whose truth we might be trying to test (which, as Putnam 1965/75 pointed out, is precisely what practicing scientists regularly do).

What is novel—and highly controversial—about Quine's understanding of these commonplace observations is his extension of them to claims presumed by most people (e.g., by Duhem himself) to be outside its scope, viz., the whole of mathematics and even logic! It is this extension that seems to undermine the traditional a priori status of these latter domains, since it appears to open the possibility of a revision of logic or mathematics in the interest of the plausibility of the overall resulting theory—containing both the empirical claims and those of logic and mathematics. Perhaps this wouldn't be so bad should the revisability of logic and mathematics permit their ultimately admitting of a justification that didn't involve experience. But this is ruled out by Quine's insistence that scientific theories (with their logic and mathematics) are confirmed “only” as “corporate bodies.” (It's not clear what entitles Quine to this crucial “only,” but his doctrine has been read as standardly including it; see Rey 1998 for discussion). Certainly, though, as an observation about the revisability of claims of logic and meaning, Quine's claim seems right. As Putnam (1968/75) argued, enlarging on Quine's theme, it could out to be rational to revise even elementary logic in view of the surprising results of quantum mechanics, and it is not hard to imagine discovering that a homely purported analytic truth, such as “cats are animals,” could be given up in light of discovering that the little things are really cleverly disguised robots controlled from Mars (Putnam 1962; see Katz 1990:pp216ff for a reply).

3.6 Quine on Meaning in Linguistics

Quine's discussion of the role of convention in science seems right; but how about the role of meaning in ordinary natural language? Is it really true that in the “pale grey lore” of all the sentences we accept, there aren't some that are “white” somehow “by virtue of the very meanings of their words”? What about our examples in our earlier set II? What about sentences that merely link patent synonyms, as in “Lawyers are attorneys,” or “A fortnight is a period of fourteen days”? As Grice and Strawson (1956) and Putnam (1962) pointed out, it is unlikely that so intuitively plausible a distinction should turn out to have no basis at all in fact. Quine addresses this issue, first, in his (1953/80, chs. 1 and 3), and then in a much larger way in chapter 2 of his (1960) and many subsequent writings.

Quine (1953) pressed his objection to analyticity further to the very ideas of synonymy and the linguistic meaning of an expression, on which, we saw, Frege's criterion of analyticity crucially relied. His objection is that he sees no way to make any serious explanatory sense of them. In his (1953) he explores plausible explanations in terms of “definition,” “intension,” “possibility,” and “contradiction,”, plausibly pointing out that each of these notions stand in precisely as much need of explanation as synonymy itself (recall our observation in §1.2 above regarding the lack of overt contradiction in “married bachelor”). They form what seems to be a (viciously?) small “closed curve in space” (p. 30). Although many have wondered whether this is a particularly fatal flaw in any of these notions –circularities notoriously abound among many fundamental notions– it led Quine to be sceptical of the lot of them.

Quine (1960) further supported his case by sketching a full-fledged theory of language that does without any theory of determinate meaning. Indeed, a consequence of his theory is that translation (i.e., the identification of two expressions from different languages as having the same meaning) is “indeterminate”; there is “no fact of the matter” about whether two expressions do or do not have the same meaning (see Indeterminacy of Translation). And it's a consequence of this view that there are pretty much no facts of the matter about people's mental lives at all! For, if there is no fact of the matter about whether two people mean the same thing by their words, then there is no fact of the matter about whether they ever have mental states with the same content; and consequently no fact of the matter about what anyone ever thinks. Quine himself took this consequence in stride –he was, after all, a behaviorist– regarding it as “of a piece” with Brentano's thesis of the irreducibility of the intentional; it's just that for him, unlike for Brentano, it simply showed the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (1960, p. 221). Needless to say, many subsequent philosophers have not been happy with this view, and have wondered where Quine's argument has gone wrong.

3.7 Explaining Away the Appearance of the Analytic

One reservation many have had about Quine's argument is about how to explain the appearance of the analytic. Most people, for example, would distinguish our original two sets of sentences (§1), by saying that sentences of the second set, such as “All ophthalmologists are eye doctors,” could be known to be true just by knowing the meanings of the constituent words. Moreover, they might agree about an indefinite number of further examples, e.g., that pediatricians are doctors for children, grandfathers are parents of parents, that sauntering is a kind of movement, pain a mental state, and food, stuff that people eat. As Grice and Strawson (1956) and Putnam (1962) stressed, it's implausible to suppose that there's nothing people are getting at in these judgments.

Here, once again, Quine invoked his metaphor of the web of belief, claiming that sentences are more or less revisable, depending upon how “peripheral” or “central” their position is in the web. The appearance of sentences being “analytic” is simply due to their being, like the laws of logic and mathematics, comparatively central, and so are given up, if ever, only under extreme pressure from the peripheral forces of experience. But no sentence is absolutely immune from revision; all sentences are thereby empirical, and none is actually analytic.

There are a number of problems with this explanation. In the first place, centrality and the appearance of analyticity don't seem to be so closely related. As Quine (1960) himself noted, there are are plenty of central, unrevisable beliefs that don't seem analytic (e.g. The earth has existed for more than five years,, Some people have eyes, Mass-energy is conserved), and many standard examples of what seems analytic aren't seriously central: “Bachelors are unmarried” and “Aunts are sisters” are notoriously trivial, and could easily be revised if someone really cared.

Secondly, it's not mere unrevisability that seems distinctive of the analytic, but rather a certain sort of unintelligibility: for all the unrevisability of “Some people have eyes,” it's perfectly possible to imagine it to be false. What's peculiar about the analytic is that denials of it often seem unintelligible: we can't seriously imagine a married bachelor. Indeed, far from unrevisability explaining analyticity, it would seem to be analyticity that explains unrevisability: the only reason one balks at denying bachelors are unmarried is that that's just what “bachelor” means!

It is important to note here a crucial change that Quine (and earlier Positivists) casually introduced into the characterization of the a priori, and consequently into much of the now common understanding of the analytic. Where Kant and others had traditionally assumed that the a priori concerned beliefs “justifiable independently of experience,” Quine and many other philosophers of the time came to regard it as consisting of beliefs “unrevisable in the light of experience.” And, we have seen, a similar status is accorded the at least apparently analytic. However, this would imply that someone's taking something to be analytic or a priori would have to regard herself as being infallible about it, forever unwilling to revise it in light of further evidence or argument. But this is a further claim that many defenders of the traditional notions need not embrace. A claim might be in fact analytic and justifiable independently of experience, but nevertheless perfectly revisable in the light of it. Experience, after all, might mislead us, as it (perhaps) misled Putnam when he suggested revising logic in light of difficulties in quantum mechanics, or suggested revising “cats are animals,” were we to discover the things were robots. Just what claims are genuinely analytic might not be available at the introspective or behavioral surface of our lives, in merely our dispositions to assent or dissent from sentences, as Quine (1960) supposes. Those dispositions might be hidden more deeply in our psychology, and our access to them as fallible as our access to any other such facts about ourselves. The genuinely analytic may be a matter of reflective philosophical analysis or abstract linguistic theory (see Bonjour 1998, Rey 1998, Field 2000 and §4.3 below for further discussion).

In his important commentary on Quine's discussion, Hilary Putnam (1962/75) tried to rescue what he thought were theoretically innocuous examples of analytic truths by appeal to what he called “one-criterion” concepts, or concepts like, e.g., [bachelor], [widow], [ophthalmologist], where there seems to be only one “way to tell” whether they apply. However, as Fodor (1998) pointed out, so stated, this latter account won't suffice either, since the notion of “criterion” seems no better off than “analytic.” Moreover, if there were just one way to tell what's what, there would seem, trivially, to be indefinite numbers of different ways –for example, just ask someone who knows the one way; or ask someone who knows someone who knows; or…, etc., and so now we would be faced with saying which of these ways is genuinely “criterial,” which would seem to leave us with the same problem we faced in saying which way is “analytic.”

Fodor (1998) tries to improve on Putnam's proposal by suggesting that a criterion that appears to be analytic is the one on which all the other criteria depend, but which does not depend upon them. Thus, telling that someone is a bachelor by checking out his gender and marriage status doesn't depend upon telling by asking his friends, but telling by asking his friends does depend upon telling by his gender and marriage status; and so we have an explanation of why “bachelors are unmarried males” seems analytic, but, says Fodor, without it's actually being so (perhaps somewhat surprisingly, given his general “asymmetric dependence” theory of content, see his 1990 and cf. Horwich 1998).

However, such asymmetric dependencies among criteria alone will not “explain (away)” either the reality or the appearance of the analytic, since there would appear to be asymmetric dependencies of the proposed sort in non-analytic cases. Natural kinds are dramatic cases in point (see Putnam 1962, 1970/75, 1975). At some stage in history probably the only way anyone could tell whether something was a case of polio was to see whether there was a certain constellation of standard symptoms; other ways (including asking others) asymmetrically depended upon that way. But this wouldn't make “All polio cases exhibit the standard symptoms” remotely analytic—after all, the standard symptoms for many diseases can be misleading. For everyone might also have thought that, with further research, there could in principle come to be better ways to tell (which is, of course, precisely what happened).

Indeed, these cases of “deep” natural kinds contrast dramatically with cases of more superficial kinds like “bachelor,” whose nature is pretty much exhausted by the linguistics of the matter. Again, unlike the case of polio and its symptoms, the reason that gender and marriage status are the best way to tell whether someone is a bachelor is that that's just what “bachelor” means. Indeed, should a doctor propose revising the test for polio in the light of better theory –perhaps reversing the dependency of certain tests– this would not even appear to involve a change in the meaning. Should, however, a feminist propose, in the light of better politics, revising the use of “bachelor” to include women, this obviously would. If the appearance of the analytic is to be explained away, it needs to account for such differences in our understanding of different words (see Rey 2005 for further discussion).

4. Post-Quinean Strategies

There has been a wide variety of responses to Quine's attack. Some, for example, Davidson (1980), Stich (1983) and Dennett (1987), seem simply to accept it and try to account for our practice of meaning ascription within its “non-factual” bounds. Since they follow Quine in at least claiming to forswear the analytic, we will not consider their views further here. Others, who might be (loosely) called “neo-Cartesians,” reject Quine's attack as simply so much prejudice of the empiricism and naturalism which they take to be his own uncritical dogmas (§4.1 in what follows). Still others hope simply to find a way to break out of the “intentional circle,” and provide an account of at least what it means for one thing (a state of the brain, for example) to mean (or “carry the information about”) another external phenomenon in the world (§4.2). Perhaps the most trenchant reaction has been that of empirically oriented linguists and philosophers, who look to a specific explanatory role the analytic may play in an account of thought and talk (§4.3). This role is currently being explored in considerable detail in the now various areas of research inspired by the revolutionary linguistic theories of Chomsky (§4.4).

4.1 Neo-Cartesianism

The most unsympathetic response to Quine's challenges has been essentially to stare him down and insist upon an inner faculty of “intuition” whereby the truth of certain claims is simply “grasped” directly through, as Bonjour (1998) puts it:

an act of rational insight or rational intuition … [that] is seemingly (a) direct or immediate, nondiscursive, and yet also (b) intellectual or reason-governed … [It] depends upon nothing beyond an understanding of the propositional content itself…. (p. 102)

Bealer (1987, 1999) defends similar proposals. Neither Bonjour nor Bealer are in fact particularly concerned to defend the analytic by such claims, but their recourse to mere understanding of propositional content is certainly what many defenders of the analytic have had in mind. Katz (1998:pp44-5), for example, made the very same appeal to intuitions explicitly on behalf of the analytic claims supported by his semantic theory (although he could also be interpreted as sometimes having adopted the more sophisticated strategy of §4.3 below). Somewhat more modestly, Peacocke (1992, 2005) claims that possession of certain logical concepts requires that a person find certain inferences “primitively compelling,” or compelling not by reason of some inference or in any way that takes “their correctness…as answerable to anything else” (p. 6). In a similar vein, Boghossian (1997) appeals to rational inferential practices that might implicitly define at least the logical connectives (see Harman 1996 and Horwich 2000 for discussion).

Perhaps the most modest reply along these lines emerges from a suggestion of David Lewis (1972/80), who proposes to implicitly define common, e.g., psychological terms by “platitudes”:

Include only platitudes that are common knowledge among us –everyone knows them, everyone know that everyone else knows them, and so son. For the meanings of our words are common knowledge, and I am going to claim that names of mental states derive their meaning from these platitudes. (1972/80:p212)

He later (1994:p416) amends this suggestion to allow for the “folk theory” that may tacitly underlie our ordinary use of, e.g., mental terms. Enlarging on this idea, Frank Jackson (1998) emphasizes the role of intuitions about possible cases, as well as the need sometimes to massage such intuitions so as to arrive at “the hypothesis that best makes sense of [folk] responses” (p36; see also pp34-5 and Slote 1966).

The Quinian reply to all these approaches as they stand is pretty straightforward, and, in a way, expresses what many regard as the real heart of his challenge to all proponents of the analytic: how in the end are we to distinguish such claims of “rational insight,” “primitive compulsion,” inferential practice or folk belief from merely some deeply held empirical conviction, indeed, from mere dogma? Isn't the history of thought littered with what have turned out to be deeply mistaken claims, inferences and platitudes that people at the time have found “rationally” and/or “primitively compelling,” say, with regard to God, sin, biology, sexuality, or even patterns of reasoning themselves? Consider, for example, the resistance Kahneman, Slovic and Tversky (1982) observed people display to correction of the fallacies they commit in a surprising range of ordinary thought; or in a more disturbing vein, how the gifted mathematician, John Nash, claimed that his delusional ideas “about supernatural beings came to me the same way that my mathematical ideas did” (Nasar 1998, p11). Introspected episodes, primitive compulsions, intuitions about possibilities, or even tacit folk theories alone are not going to distinguish the analytic, since these all may be due as much to people's empirical theories as to any special knowledge of meaning (see Devitt 2005, 2007 for vigorous critiques of neo-Cartesian approaches along such Quinean lines). Moreover, as Williamson (2006) has stressed, merely the fact that reasonable people often disagree about the rules of logic is reason to suppose that finding some set of rules compelling is not essential to possessing the logical concepts the rules involve. Jackson (1998:29-30) may be quite right to stress the need for some account of meaning in order to distinguish theories of some phenomenon that can be said to be still about that very phenomenon (so-called “reductionist” theories, as the case of theories of water) from those that in effect deny its existence (so-called “eliminativist,” theories, as in the case of standard explanations of devils and witches). Quine (1960, pp264-6) himself might not care. But, for those who do, there needs to be some more principled recourse than merely to beliefs or intuitions. (We'll consider other strategies in §§4.2 and 4.3 below).

A particularly vivid way to feel the force of Quine's challenge is afforded by a recent case that came before the Ontario Supreme Court concerning whether laws that confined marriage to heterosexual couples violated the equal protection clause of the constitution (see Halpern et al. 2001). The question was regarded as turning in part on the meaning of the word “marriage”, and each party to the dispute solicited affidavits from philosophers, one of whom claimed that the meaning of the word was tied to heterosexuality, the other that it wasn't. Putting aside the complex socio-political issues, Quine's challenge can be regarded as a reasonably sceptical request to know precisely what the argument is about, and how any serious theory of the world might settle it. It certainly wouldn't be sufficient merely to claim that marriage is/isn't necessarily heterosexual on the basis of “platitudes,” much less on “an act of rational insight [into] the propositional content itself”; or because speakers found the inference from marriage to heterosexuality “primitively compelling” and couldn't imagine gay people getting married! (In this connection see also the data of “experimental philosophy” in §4.4 below.)

4.2 Externalist Theories of Meaning

Externalist theories try to meet at least part of Quine's challenge by considering how matters of meaning need not rely on connections among thoughts or beliefs, in the way that the tradition had encouraged philosophers to suppose, but as involving relations between words and the phenomena in the world that they pick out. This suggestion gradually emerged in the work of Putnam (1962/75, 1965/75 and 1975), Kripke (1972/80) and Burge (1979, 1986), but it takes the form of positive theories in, e.g., the work of Dretske (1981, 1988) and Fodor (1987, 1990b, 1992), who base meaning in various forms of natural co-variation between states of the mind/brain and external phenomena (see indicator semantics); and in the work of Millikan (1984), Papineau (1987) and Neander (1995), who look to mechanisms of natural selection (see teleosemantics). If these theories were to succeed in providing a genuine explanation of intentionality (a success that is by no means undisputed; see Loewer 1996 and Rey 2005), they would go some way towards saving at least intentional psychology from Quine's challenge.

Although these strategies may well save intentionality and meaning, they do so, of course, only by forsaking the high hopes we noted in §2 philosophers harbored for the analytic. For externalists are typically committed to counting expressions as “synonymous” if they happen to be linked in the right way to the same external phenomena, even if a thinker doesn't realize that they are! Consequently, by at least the Fregean criterion, they would seem to be committed to counting as “analytic” many patently empirical sentences as “Water is H2O,” “Salt is NaCl” or “Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens,” since in each of these cases, something co-varies with the expression on one side of the identity if and only if it co-varies with the expression on the other (similar problems arise for teleosemantics). But this might not faze an externalist like Fodor (1998), who is concerned only to save intentional psychology, and might otherwise share Quine's scepticism about philosophers' appeals to the analytic and a priori.

Of course, an externalist could just allow that some analytic truths, e.g., “water is H20,” are in fact “external” and subject to empirical (dis)confirmation. Such a view would actually comport well with an older philosophical tradition less interested in the meanings of our words and concepts, and more interested in the “essences” of the worldly phenomena they pick out. Locke (1690/1975:II, 31, vi), for example, posited “real” essences of things rather along the lines resuscitated by Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1972/80), the real essences being the conditions in the world independent of our thought that make something the thing it is, as being H2O makes something water, or, to take the striking examples of diseases noted by Putnam (1962), being a the activation of a certain virus makes something polio. But, again, such an external view would still dash the hopes of philosophers looking to the analytic to explain a priori knowledge (see Bealer 1987 and Jackson 1998 for strategies to assimilate such empirical cases to nevertheless a priori analysis).

An interesting possibility raised by an Externalist theory is that the beliefs that are responsible for a person's competence with a term or concept might turn actually out to be false. Putnam (1975), for example, suggested that part of the competence conditions with a term might involve both some kind of external relation to the term's referent, and stereotypical beliefs, e.g., that lemons are yellow, tigers striped, water a liquid, even though it's perfectly possible for there to be exceptions to such claims. It may be essential to knowing the meaning of a term at least that such claims are regularly believed by users of it. On this account, then, a claim might turn out to be analytic and false! A competent user perhaps needs at least to “feel the pull” of certain claims, such as that tigers are striped, which she might ultimately nevertheless recognize to be mistaken (in Peacocke's 1992 phrase, they might feel a “primitive compulsion” in this regard—even if it turned out to be a compulsion they need to learn to resist!). Rather than understanding “analytic” to mean “known to be true by virtue of meaning,” one might understand it merely as “justified by virtue of meaning,”a prima facie justification that simply could be overridden by other, global theoretical considerations.

4.3 Explanatory Strategies

A promising strategy for replying to Quine's challenge that might begin to provide what the neo-Cartesian wants can be found in recent proposals of Michael Devitt (1996,2002) and, independently, of Paul Horwich (1998, 2005). In a way analogous to Fodor's claims about asymmetric dependence that we just noted, they emphasize how the meaning properties of a term are the ones that play a basic explanatory role with regard to the use of a term generally, the ones in virtue ultimately of which a term is used with that meaning. For example, the use of “red” to refer to the color of blood, roses, stop signs, etc,. is arguably explained by its use to refer to certain colors in good light, but not vice versa: the latter use is “basic” to all the other uses. Similarly, uses of “and” explanatorily depend upon its basic use in inferences to and from the sentences it conjoins. Devitt and Horwich differ about the proper locus of such a strategy. Horwich thinks of it mainly with regard to the use of terms in natural language, and only marginally allows what Devitt (2002) argues is required, that it be applied primarily to terms in a “language of thought.”

There are two potential drawbacks to these strategies. The first is that they still risk Quinean scepticism about meaning and the analytic. For, if Quine (1960) is right about the psychology of language use, then there are no sufficiently local explanatorily basic facts on which all other uses of a term depend. In particular, those uses of a term involved in the expression of belief, either in thought or talk, will likely be explained by the same processes of confirmation that Quine argued were dependent on the character of one's belief system as a whole, and not upon some local feature of that system in the way that an “analytic” claim would have to be (cf. Gibbard 2008). Of course, Quine might be wrong about this psychology. But, to put it lightly, the verdict on that issue is not quite in (see Fodor 1983, 2000 for a perhaps surprising endorsement of Quine's view, and the next section for some qualified alternatives to it).

In any case, a second drawback of this strategy is that it risks rendering matters of meaning far less “transparent” and introspectively accessible than Cartesians have standardly supposed. For, as the worry about our psychology being Quinean makes vivid, there is little reason to suppose that what is explanatorily basic about one's use of a term in thought or talk is a matter that is available to introspection or common knowledge. As in the case of “marriage” mentioned earlier, but certainly with respect to other philosophically problematic notions, just which properties, if any, are explanatorily basic may not be an issue that is at all easy to determine. At best, if the strategy is to save meaning and the analytic from Quinean scepticism, it is probably best pursued along the Chomskyan lines to which we now turn.

4.4 Chomskyan Strategies in Linguistics

Beginning in the 1950s, Chomsky (1965, 1968/2006) began to revolutionize linguistics by presenting substantial reasons for supposing that its proper subject matter was not people's superficial linguistic behavior, or “performance,” but rather the generative rules that constituted their underlying linguistic “competence.” This opened up the possibility of a response to Quine's scepticism within his own naturalistic and at least methodologically empiricist framework, empirically refuting the behaviorist theory of language on which his account had often explicitly relied (as in his 1960; see Chomsky 1959 for the refutation).

The data that concerned Chomsky, himself, have always largely concerned syntactic properties of natural language, but he sometimes construes them broadly to include at least some “analytic” examples, as when he writes, “it seems reasonable to suppose that semantic relations between words like persuade, intend, believe, can be expressed in purely linguistic terms (namely: if I persuade you to go, then you intend to go)…” (Chomsky 1977/98:142). Along these lines (and in arguments that could be sustained independently of the appeals to intuition we considered in §4.1), Katz (1972) drew attention to related semantic data, such as subjects' agreements about, e.g., synonymy, redundancy, antonomy, and implication, and develops a theory systematically relating syntactic and semantic structure to account for them (see Pietroski 2005 for more recent and cautious suggestions along related lines). Since, as we have seen (§3.7), the explanations offered by Quine, Putnam and Fodor in terms of centrality and/or preferred ways of telling seem simply empirically inadequate, perhaps the best explanation of these phenomena are to be had in a theory of the human language faculty.

It might be thought that appeals to such data beg the question against Quine, since, as Quine (1967) pointed out, so much as asking subjects to say whether two expressions are synonymous, antonomous, or implicative is simply transferring the burden of determining what is being discussed from the theorist to the informant. Imagine, again, a person being asked whether marriage entails heterosexuality as a matter of “the meaning of the word.” One can sympathize with someone being at a loss as to what to say. In any case, what is the possible significance of people's answers? The same question can be raised here as before: How do we distinguish a genuine analytic report from merely an expression of a firmly held belief?

The Chomskyan actually has the seed of an interesting reply. For part of Chomsky's view has to do with the modularity of the natural language faculty: whether a sentence is grammatical or not depends not on its relation to our thought and communicative projects, but entirely on its conformity with the internal principles of that specific faculty. It is easy for us to produce in our behavior strings of words that may communicate information effectively, but which may violate those principles. An ungrammatical sentence like “Bill is the man I wanna take a walk” might suffice on occasion for thought and communication (of “Bill is the man who I want to take a walk,”), but it's a striking fact that speakers of English—even four-year old ones!—nevertheless find it problematic (see Crain and Lillo-Martin 1999). The existence of the language faculty as a separate faculty may simply be an odd, but psychologically real fact about us, and it may thereby supply a real basis for commitments about not only what is or isn't grammatical, but about what is or isn't a matter of natural language meaning. On this view, if one were to deny an analytic truth, one would simply be violating a principle of one's natural language, which, on Chomskyan views, it's perfectly possible to do: people often speak in a way that appears to violate patent analyticities (“Ann is his real mother, despite Zoe being his biological one,” “Carl's still really a bachelor, even though he's been married for years”), and scientists regularly do so with their introduction of technical ways of talking, as in the case of “Water is H2O” (which Chomskyans claim is not a sentence in a natural language!). Indeed, at least in some cases one might combine a Chomskyan view with an Externalist one, and allow that some of the meaning-constitutive rules for a term can turn out to be false (§4.2 above).

The burden of such a reply lies, however, in actually producing a linguistic theory that sustains a principled class of sentences that could be isolated in this way and that, per the suggestion of (§4.3), might play the basic explanatory role of meaning. This is something that, as yet, it is by no means obvious that it can do. As we saw, Fodor (1983, 2000) argues on behalf of Quine's claim about the confirmation holism of belief fixation generally, and, more specifically, Fodor et al. (1975) raised doubts about whether any kind of “semantic decomposition” is psychologically real, and Fodor (1970, 1998) has contested some of the most prized examples of analyticities, such as (10) in set II above, linking killing to death (but see Pietroski 2002 for a reply). Moreover, many linguists (e.g., Jackendoff 1992, Pustejovsky 1995) proceed somewhat insouciantly to include under issues of “meaning” and “conceptual structure” issues that are patently matters of just ordinary belief and sometimes mere phenomenology. For example, Jackendoff and others have called attention to the heavy use of spatial metaphors in many grammatical constructions. But such facts don't entail that the concepts of the domains to which these metaphors are applied –say, the structure of the mind, social relations, or mathematics– are, themselves, somehow intrinsically spatial, or really thought by anyone to be. People's conceptions of these domains may often be spatialized. However, conceptions –ordinary beliefs, metaphors, associations– are one thing; people's concepts quite another: two mathematicians, after all, can have the thought that there is no largest prime, even if one of them thinks of numbers spatially and the other purely algebraically.

In considering Chomskyan theories of the analytic, it is important to bear in mind that, while the theory may be as methdologically empiricist as any theory ought to be, the theory itself explicitly rejects empiricist conceptions of meaning and mind themselves. Chomsky is famous for having resuscitated Rationalist doctrines of “innate ideas,” according to which many ideas have their origins not in experience, but in our innate endowment. And there's certainly no commitment in semantic programs like those of Katz, Jackendoff or Pustejovsky to anything like the “reduction” of all concepts to the sensorimotor primitives eyed by the Positivists. Of course, just how we come by the meaning of whatever primitive concepts their theories do endorse, is a question they would seriously have to confront, cf. Fodor (1990b, 1998).

Recently, some philosophers have offered some empirical evidence that might be taken to undermine these efforts to empirically ground the analytic, casting doubt on just how robust the data for the analytic might be. The movement of “experimental philosophy” has pointed to evidence of considerable malleability of subject's “intuitions” with regard to the standard kinds of thought experiments on which defenses of analytic claims typically rely. Thus, Weinberg, Nichols and Stich (2001) found significant cultural differences between responses of Asians and Western students regarding whether someone counted as having knowledge in a standard “Gettier” example of accidental justified true belief; and Knobe (2003) found that non-philosopher's judgments about whether an action is intentional depended on the (particularly negative) moral qualities of the action, and not, as is presumed by most philosophers, on whether the action was merely intended by the agent. Questions, of course, could be raised about these experimental results (How well did the subjects understand the project of assessing intuitions? Did the experiments sufficiently control for the multitudinous “pragmatic” effects endemic to polling procedures? To what extent are the target terms merely polysemous, allowing for different uses in different contexts?). However, the results do serve to show how the determination of meaning and analytic truths can be regarded as a more difficult empirical question than philosophers have traditionally supposed (see Bishop and Trout 2005 and Alexander and Weinberg 2007 for extensive discussion).

5. Conclusion

Suppose linguistics were to succeed in delineating a class of analytic sentences grounded in a special language faculty. Would such sentences serve the purposes for which we noted earlier (§2) philosophers had enlisted them?

Perhaps some of them would. An empirical grounding of the analytic might provide us with an understanding of what constitutes a person's competence with a concept. Given that Quinean scepticism about the analytic is a source of his scepticism about the determinacy of cognitive states (see §3.6 above), such a grounding may be crucial for a realistic psychology. Moreover, setting out the constitutive conditions for possessing a concept might be of some interest to philosophers generally, since many of the crucial questions they ask concern the proper understanding of ordinary notions such as material object, person, action, freedom, god, the good, or the beautiful. Suppose, further, that a domain, such as perhaps ethics or aesthetics, are “response dependent,” constituted by our conceptual responses; suppose, that is, that what determines the nature of, say, the good, the funny, or the beautiful are simply the principles underlying people's competence with their concepts of them. If so, then it might not be implausible to claim that successful conceptual analysis had provided us with a priori knowledge of that domain.

But, of course, many philosophers have wanted more than these essentially psychological gains. They have hoped that analytic claims might provide a basis for a priori knowledge of domains that exist independently of our concepts. An important case in point is the very case of arithmetic that motivated much of the discussion of the analytic in the first place. Recent work of Crispin Wright (1983) and others on the logicist program has shown how a version of Frege's program might be rescued by appealing not to his problematic Basic Law V, but instead merely to what he calls “Hume's Principle,” or the claim that for the number of Fs to be equal to the number of Gs is for there to be a “one-to-one correspondence” between the Fs and the Gs (as in the case of the fingers of a normal right hand and a left one). According to what is now regarded as “Frege's Theorem,” the Peano axioms for arithmetic can be derived from this principle in standard second-order logic (see Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic). Now, Wright has urged that Hume's Principle might be regarded as analytic, and perhaps this claim could be sustained by an examination of the language faculty along the lines of §4.4. If so, then wouldn't that vindicate the suggestion that arithmetic can be known a priori?

Not obviously, since Hume's Principle is a claim not merely about the concepts F and G, but about the presumably concept independent fact about the number of things that are F and the number of things that are G, and, we can ask, what justifies any claim about them? As Boolos (1997) asks in response to Wright:

If numbers are supposed to be identical if and only if the concepts they are numbers of are equinumerous, what guarantee do we have that every concept has a number? p253)

One might reasonably worry that such an unrestricted claim about the extensions of concepts risks the same fate that befell Frege's Basic Law V, and will be shown to be inconsistent (see §3.3 above). In the light of that fate and subsequent developments of set theory, it is hard to see how to justify believing Hume's Principle without appealing, as Quine claimed we must (§3.4) to “the elegance and convenience which the hypothesis brings to the containing bodies of laws and data,” i.e., to our best overall theory of the world (see Wright 1999 and Horwich 2000 for subtle discussions of the issues).

The problem here becomes even more obvious in non-mathematical cases. For example, philosophers have wanted to claim not merely that our concepts of red and green exclude the possibility of our thinking that something is both colors all over, but that this possibility is ruled out for the actual colors, red and green, themselves. It is therefore no accident that Bonjour's (1998:184-5) defense of a priori knowledge turns on including the very properties of red and green themselves as constituents of the analytic propositions we grasp. But it is just such a wonderful coincidence between merely our concepts and actual worldly properties that a linguistic semantics alone does not obviously insure.

But suppose there in fact existed a wonderful correspondence between our concepts and the world, indeed, a deeply reliable, counterfactual supporting correspondence whereby it was in fact metaphysically impossible for certain claims constitutive of those concepts not to be true. This is, of course, not implausible in the case of logic and arithmetic, and is entirely compatible with, e.g., Boolos' reasonable doubts about them (after all, it's always possible to doubt what is in fact a necessary truth). Such necessary correspondences between thought and the world might then serve as a basis for claims to a priori knowledge in at least a reliabilist epistemology, where what's important is not a believer's ability to justify his claims, but merely the reliability of the processes by which he arrived at them. Indeed, in the case of logic and arithmetic, the beliefs might be arrived at by steps that were not only necessarily reliable, but might also be taken to be so by the believer, in ways that might in fact depend in no way upon experience, but only on his competence with the relevant concepts (Kitcher 1980, Rey 1998 and Goldman 1999 explore this strategy).

Such a reliabilist approach, though, might be less than fully satisfying to someone interested in the traditional a priori analytic. For, although someone might turn out in fact to have a priori analytic knowledge of this sort, she might not know that she does (reliabilist epistemologists standardly forgo the “KK Principle,” according to which if one knows that p, one knows that knows that p). Knowledge that the relevant claims were knowable a priori might itself be only possible by an empirically informed understanding of, e.g., one's language faculty, and, à la Quine, by its consonance with the rest of one's theory of the world. But the trouble then is that claims that people do have a capacity to arrive at knowledge in deductively reliable ways seem quite precarious. Williamson (2006), for example, points out that present psychological research on the nature of human reasoning suggests that people, even on reflection, are surprisingly poor at appreciating deductively valid arguments. As logic teachers will attest, appreciating the standard rules even of natural deduction is for many people often a difficult intellectual achievement. Consequently, people's general competence with logical notions may not in fact consist in any grip on valid logical rules; and so whatever rules do underlie that competence may well turn out not to be the kind of absolutely reliable guide to the world on which the above reliabilist defense of a priori analytic knowledge seems to depend. In any case, in view merely of the serious possibility that these pessimistic conclusions are true, it's hard to see how any appeal to the analytic to establish the truth of any controversial claim in any mind-independent domain could have any special justificatory force.

In fact, once one appreciates the serious doubt about whether even our most fundamental concepts correspond to anything in the world, it is unclear that we really expect or even want the analytic to provide knowledge of concept-independent domains. Consider, for example, the common puzzle about the possibility that computers might actually think and enjoy a mental life. In response to this puzzle, some philosophers (e.g., Wittgenstein 1953/67:p97e, Ziff 1959) have suggested that it's analytic that a thinking thing must be alive, a suggestion that certainly seems to accord with many folk intuitions (many people who might cheerfully accept a computational explanation of a thought process often balk at the suggestion that an inanimate machine engaging in that computation would actually be thinking). Suppose this claim were sustained by a Chomskyan theory, showing that the ordinary notion expressed by the natural language word “thinking” is, indeed, correctly applied only to living things, and not to artifactual computers. Should this really satisfy the person worried about the possibility of artificial thought? It's hard to see why. For the serious question that concerns people worried about whether artifacts could think concerns whether those artifacts could in fact share the real, theoretically interesting, explanatory properties of being a thinking thing (cf. Jackson 1998:pp34-5). We might have no reason to suppose that being alive actually figures among them, and so conclude that, despite these (supposed) constraints of natural language, inanimate computers could come to “think” after all. Indeed, perhaps the belief that thinking things must be alive is an example of a false belief that, we saw in §§4.2-4.3, an externalist Chomskyan could claim is part of the constitutive conditions on “think” (again, one doesn't have the concept unless one feels the pull). Alternatively, of course, one could insist on adhering to whatever meaning constraints turn out to be imposed by natural language and so, perhaps, deny that inanimate computers could ever think. But, if the explanatory point were correct, it would be hard to see how this would amount to anything more than a verbal quibble: so computers don't “think”; they “think*” instead.

In sum: an account of the language faculty might provide a basis for ascribing competence with the concepts that that faculty might deploy, and thereby a basis for intentional realism and a distinction between analytic and synthetic claims. It might also provide a basis for a priori analytic knowledge of claims about concept-dependent domains, such as those of ethics and aesthetics. However, in the case of concept-independent domains, such as logic and mathematics, or the nature of worldly phenomena like life or mind, the prospects seem more problematic. There may be analytic claims to be had here, but, in the immortal words of Putnam (1965/75:p36), they would “cut no philosophical ice…bake no philosophical bread and wash no philosophical windows.” We would just have to be satisfied with theorizing about the concept independent domains themselves, without benefit of knowing anything about them “by virtue of knowing the meanings of our words alone.” Reflecting on the difficulties of the past century's efforts on behalf of the analytic, it's not clear why anyone would really want to insist otherwise.


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analysis | a priori justification and knowledge | behaviorism | Carnap, Rudolf | definitions | epistemology | Frege, Gottlob | Kant, Immanuel | logical constants | logical positivism | logical truth | logicism | meaning, theories of | metaphysics | naturalism | operationalism | phenomenology | Quine, Willard van Orman | rationalism vs. empiricism | Russell, Bertrand | verificationism