Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Arabic and Islamic Natural Philosophy and Natural Science

First published Tue Dec 19, 2006

Natural philosophy, or physics, in the strict sense is the study of natures; however, since by ‘nature’ most medieval natural philosophers meant an internal principle of change or motion that belongs to something essentially, natural philosophy came to be identified more specifically with the study of motion and the conditions purportedly necessary for motion, such as the infinite, place, void and time. Within the medieval Arabic-speaking world there were two primary intellectual traditions in which natural philosophy was done: kalam and falsafa. Kalam, or Islamic speculative theology, in general approached issues in physics from an atomistic framework, which for some of these theologians extended not only to the composition of bodies, but also to motion and time as well, culminating among later Islamic theologians in an occasionalist worldview that reserved causal agency for God alone. falsafa, or simply ‘philosophy,’ had its roots in the Greek intellectual world and more specifically in the philosophical thought of Aristotle as he was interpreted by later Peripatetic and Neoplatonic commentators with the additional supplementation by Galen in biology and anatomy and Ptolemy in astronomy. The following account begins with the atomistic theories found among the Islamic speculative theologians followed by the developments in Aristotelian natural philosophy by Arabic-speaking philosophers and their unique contributions to that field.

1. The Atomism of Kalam

1.1 Atoms and Accidents

Although some early Muslim theologians maintained that there is basically only accidents and that bodies are composites of bundles of accidents, while others held that there are only corporeal bodies and that everything else is constituted out of the interpenetration of these bodies, most Muslim theologians included both atoms[1] and accidents in their ontology and additionally God. One way that this ontology was justified was to begin with a proof for the world's temporal creation. It was argued that if the world were not created, then an infinite number of past days would have been traversed; however, it was held as self-evident that an infinite, let alone traversing it, is impossible. Thus the world must have been created at some first moment. In that case, however, the world must have a Creator. Thus there is what creates, namely, God, and what is created. What is created was divided further into what occupies space, namely, substances or atoms, and what does not, namely, accidents.

Occupying space (tahayyuz) was for the Muslim theologians the necessary result of any thing's being a substance, and it was this attribute of occupying space that confirmed the existence of substances; for occupying space was held to be an attribute that was directly perceived by the senses and as such could not be gainsaid. Thus that substances exist was a matter of direct knowledge. Most Muslim theologians additionally maintained that these substances also have an atomic structure. This is not to say that they thought humans could directly perceive an individual atom taken in isolation—they did not; however, they believed that one could demonstrate that the ultimate material constituents of the world must be discrete rather than continuous. In general, their arguments for atomic rather than continuous substances used paradoxes involving the infinite. For example, it was argued that if a body were continuous, then it would be divisible infinitely, in which case the body would have an actually infinite number of parts that all adhere together to form the body and that correspond with the infinite number of divisions. The existence of an actual infinite is absurd, however, and so the division of the body must terminate at a finite number of indivisible parts or atoms. It does no good to say that the body has only a potentially infinite number of parts corresponding to the divisions rather than an actually infinite number; for it was argued that if something is truly potential, then some agent, such as God, must have the power to bring about or actualize that potentiality. Thus, let God bring about the purportedly potentially infinite number of divisions, in which case there would be an actually infinite number of parts, which again is absurd. Similarly, it is of no avail to say that the divisions are neither actual nor potential, but only imagined, since what is truly impossible cannot be imagined, and the existence of an actual infinite, it was believed, is truly impossible. Another argument for the atomic structure of matter was a variation on Zeno's dichotomy paradox, couched in terms of an ant's creeping over a sandal. If a body were continuous, the argument runs, then should an ant attempt to cross a sandal, it would first need to reach the halfway point on the sandal, but before it could reach the halfway point, it would need to reach its halfway point and so on infinitely. Since an infinite cannot be traversed, the ant could never cross the sandal, but of course a body such as a sandal can be crossed, and thus bodies cannot be continuous, but must be composed of a finite number of atomic parts. Yet another argument observed that differences in size are accounted for by difference in the number of constituent parts that make up the body. Now if bodies were continuous and so composed of an infinite number of parts, then the number of parts constituting a mustard seed and the number of parts constituting a mountain would be the same, namely, infinite. Consequently the two bodies should not differ in size; for one infinite cannot exceed another, and yet such a conclusion is patently false. In the end, most Islamic speculative theologians concluded that the matter constituting the cosmos must be discrete rather than continuous.

Scholars have varied, however, concerning whether the indivisible parts posited in the physics of these theologians should be viewed as extended or point-like. Shlomo Pines argued that although later Muslim theologians took atoms to have a certain measure and so were considered extended, earlier theologians conceived of them as points. Pines wrote his groundbreaking study of Islamic atomism, Beiträge zur islamischen Atomenlehre, in 1936; however, since then more kalam texts have become available. In light of these new sources, Alnoor Dhanani (Dhanani 1994, 90-140) has successfully challenged Pines' suggestion and argued in its place that the atoms of both early and later Muslim theologians are akin to Epicurean minimal parts.[2] In this respect, the atom is the minimal space-occupying unit having a wholly simple internal structure. As such the atom has neither physical nor conceptual features into which it could be divided. As a result of this understanding of atoms, although they function as the components of the various magnitudes composed of them, such as lines, planes and solids, they technically cannot be said to have length, width and depth; for length, width and depth are always bounded by extremities, whereas atoms simply cannot have any extremities, but instead play the role of the extremities themselves of those things that possess length, breadth and depth.

Atoms in themselves again are space occupying; however, among created things the Muslim theologians also posited things that were in themselves not space occupying, but rather inhered in atoms. Things of this latter sort are the so-called ‘accidents.’ Muslim theologians had argued for the existence of accidents from the fact that atoms as such are similar or homogeneous, and so if there are perceptible differences among bodies (and there clearly are such differences), those differences must be due to differences among the accidents that inhere in the atoms. The Muslim theologians then went on to identify no less than twenty-two different kinds of accidents, which include the obvious ones such as taste, color and smell as well as adhesion, force, power and willing, but also less obvious ones such as life and ceasing to exist.

1.2 Space and Time

In addition to God, atoms and accidents, certain Muslim theologians also posited (empty) space. Averroes claimed that they did so in order for there to be a place in which God temporally creates the atoms and accidents, although such a claim is not clearly stated by the theologians themselves. Concerning space two questions were debated among the atomists: one, “Is space discrete (like the atoms that occupy it) or continuous?” and, two, “Is there any unoccupied space, or more exactly, could there be interstitial void spaces between atoms or is the cosmos a plenum?”

While the Islamic theologians were virtually unanimous that matter is discrete, they varied concerning the make up of the space that atoms occupied, namely, whether space is constituted out of exactly fitting atom-sized cells, or whether it is an open continuous expanse. The debate centered on the issue of whether an atom could be placed on top of two atoms such that the top atom straddles both of the bottom atoms equally, for instance like the top block on a small pyramid made up of three equally sized blocks. Those who argued that space must be discrete did so on the basis that if it were not, then atoms would turn out to be at least conceptually divisible, yet all Muslim atomists agreed that atoms are not only physically indivisible, but also conceptually indivisible. One of their most common arguments began with the premise that the atom represents the smallest possible magnitude. If space is continuous such that an atom could straddle two atoms at their boundary and so form something like the aforementioned three-block pyramid, then imagine two such pyramids joined at their bases so that a gap is formed between the two top atoms. In that case, the two top atoms would be separated from one another by a magnitude less than an atom. Since the atom is the least possible magnitude, and yet the magnitude between the two top atoms is purportedly less than an atom, there is a contradiction; for there is a magnitude less than the smallest possible magnitude. Those who argued for a continuous space in contrast began with the premise that an atom can occupy and measure any vacant space that is of a sufficient size to hold it. Thus they had one imagine a line three atoms long and then two more atoms on top of these, where one atom is exactly over the far-right, bottom atom, for example, and another atom is exactly over the far-left bottom atom. Next they had one imagine that at the exact same moment two equal forces push the two top atoms towards each other. Either the two atoms straddle the two boundaries of the three bottom atoms or not. If they straddle them, then space must be continuous and not discrete. If the opponent denies that they straddle the boundaries, then he owes us an answer as to why they do not. Certainly the two atoms can be moved in the manner described; for the only thing that could prevent the motion would be the presence of an obstacle, and yet the adjacent space into which the atoms are moved is supposedly empty. Although this last argument offered a serious challenge to the notion of discrete space, most of the later theologians were in fact inclined to make all magnitudes discrete, whether that magnitude was corporeal, spatial or even, as we shall see, temporal.

The second question concerning space involved the possible existence of interstitial voids and focused on whether two atoms could be separated from one another without a third atom's existing between them. Dhanani (Dhanani 1994, 74-81) has classified the arguments against such a possibility into two types: those involving non-being and those involving the principle ‘nature abhors a void.’ An example of the first kind of argument is the following. Assume that two atoms are separated and that purportedly nothing exists between them. Since one cannot perceive what does not exist, then in the present case one should not be able to perceive a truly empty space between the separated atoms; however, it seems evident that one would be able to perceive the space between them and so that space could not be truly empty, but must be occupied by an atom. An example of the second sort of argument against interstitial voids is taken from the medical arts and the use of cupping glasses for blood letting. It is observed that when a cupping glass is placed over a vein and the air is withdrawn, the flesh is drawn up into the cup. The detractors of interstitial voids used this phenomenon as a verification of the principle that nature abhors a vacuum. Consequently, since nature does abhor a vacuum, void spaces will not exist in nature. Interestingly, the proponents of interstitial voids were able to turn the cupping glass phenomenon against their opponents to show that a void must exist. They had one imagine that a sheet of atoms one atom thick is placed between two cupping glasses and then the air is simultaneously removed from both glasses. Either the sheet is drawn into one or the other glass or it is not. If the sheet is drawn into one cupping glass, there is a void in the other; if the sheet is not drawn into one or the other cupping glass, then there is a void in both. In either case a void has been produced.

As for time, although Moses Maimonides would claim in the Guide of the Perplexed that Muslim theologians had a single atomic theory of time, such a claim seems to be gainsaid by earlier sources available to us (Maimonides 1963, ch. 73, premise 3). The theologian al-Ash‘ari lists no less than three different accounts of the moment and time (al-Ash‘ari 1980, 443). One theory makes time an aggregate of moments, where the moment is a ‘certain duration between one action and the next action’ (Ibid). It is not clear whether the duration in question is some minimal temporal unit or some potentially divisible temporal unit or even whether it could be either depending upon the action in question. If it is some minimal temporal unit, or time atom, then such a view would clearly advocate time's having an atomic structure. A second theory considers the moment an accident. The philosopher Avicenna (980-1037), who was writing a little more than a generation later, commented on this view and noted that the moment-accident posited by certain theologians is what temporally locates an atom and that time is simply a collection of such accidents. The final theory of time, which was by far the most popular among the theologians, made the moment simply some conventionally specified event, such as someone's entering a house, and as such it has no special ontological status, whereas ‘time’ is just another name for the motion of the heavens. It should be noted, however, that if the motion in question had an atomic structure, then ipso facto time would be atomic, and indeed many of those who held this conception of time endorsed atomic motion. Although it not clear whether Muslim theologians explicitly espoused a theory of atomic time, as we shall see in the next section, some of them adopted a theory of occasionalism, which at least implicitly endorses such a view.

1.3 Change and Causality

At least among those theologians who posited both atoms and accidents in their ontology, most changes were explained in terms of one accident's being replaced by its contrary or at least by something acting like a contrary. In this case the atom changes, not the accident, which in fact is annihilated by its contrary. Although accident-replacement was the most general account of change, changes that involve one type of body coming from another type of body (as for example when fire is produced from burning wood or a spark is produced from striking stones together) presented a special case that needed a different analysis of change. Many theologians explained this sort of change in terms of a theory of latency (kumun), which maintained that the fire atoms were already present in the wood or stone, albeit latent in them, and then were made manifest through the action of burning or striking.

Concerning the more prominent sort of change, namely, accident-replacement, two further questions were debated: one, “Does change form a single kind or not?” and two, “Where does locomotion occur, that is to say, do the initial atoms prior to the motion or the subsequent atoms after the motion receive the accident of motion?” One argument used to show that there are several kinds of motion observed that a single kind cannot bring about contradictory things, as for example, a fire does not produce cooling and heating; however, motions do bring about contraries such as being to the right or being to the left or being black and being white. Thus motion cannot form a single kind. An interesting response to this line of thought, which itself constituted an argument that motion forms a single kind, was the following. When a person determines to move, say to the right, then at the next moment there is both a motion and together with the motion a state of being to the right, and so there is a rightward motion. Similarly, should one choose to move to the left, there would be both a motion together with a state of being to the left, and so a leftward motion. Motion then can be analyzed into both a motion and a particular state or manner of being that accompanies the motion (where perhaps the accompanying state is understood as the result of the motion, although it is not explicitly described as such). The motion considered in itself is different from both the accompanying state (or result) as well as the composite of the state and motion. Motions considered in themselves, then, are similar with respect to being motion, but differ with respect to the state or manner of being that accompanies the motions, and so motion considered apart form the accompanying state is a single kind.

The second issue debated by Muslim theologians concerning motion was whether motion should be thought to occur in the first or second moment, as for example whether there is motion at the very moment that one determines to move rightward or at the moment when one is to the right. There were no less than three answers given to this question: one was that the accident of motion occurs at the initial location of the moving body; another located the motion in some second location; and finally one maintained that motion requires the body's being at two locations at two different moments. Those who maintained that the accident of motion occurs at the initial locations claimed that motion is the force of a body that necessitates its being in the second location. Since the force must be initially present in the body if it is to move to the second place, and motion is identified with this force, the accident of motion must be present while the body is still in the initial place. Those who maintained that the accident of motion occurs in the second location did so on the basis of a linguistic analysis of the term ‘motion’; for ‘motion’ means there is a passage or transference of a body; however, there has been no passage or transference of a body while it is still in its initial location. Thus the accident of motion must occur in the second location. Abu Hudhayl (d. 841), who held that motion is different from either the state or composite of state and motion, maintained that motion requires two places and two moments; ‘The body's motion from the first place to the second place occurs in [the body] and [the body] is in the second place at the exact moment it is in [motion], which is the transference and emergence of [the body] from the first place … and so local motion inevitably involves two places and two moments’ (al-Ash‘ari 1980, 355).

Associated with issues concerning motion and change was that of causality, namely, “What or who is the agent that brings about change?” Many of the earlier theologians subscribed to a theory of engenderment (tawallud), which preserved a degree of causal efficacy for humans, whereas most later theologians adopted an occasionalist worldview, which reserved all agency for God and God alone. For the earlier theologians causal agency required a full knowledge (‘ilm) that one is acting as well as the knowledge of what results from that action. Thus causal agency is limited to God and humans. That humans had the power to engender certain actions was assumed by most of the earlier theologians. The question, then, was whether humans had the power to engender action solely in themselves or in other things as well. One of the arguments used by those who thought humans could engender effects in things other than themselves came from the knowledge criterion for agency. It took as an example that when a person beats another, he knows the beating of the other, in which case the knowledge is of the action of the one beating the other (al-Ash‘ari 1980, 401-402). Generalized, the argument seems to be that if one knows that one is an agent (and again it was taken for granted by the early theologians that humans are agents), then one must know the effects of his action, and yet one knows that the effects of certain actions are in others, as in the case of beating and so causing pain. In contrast, others argued that humans only engender actions within themselves, and it is God who brings about the effect in others, as for example, a human may produce the action of willing to throw a stone, but it is God who actually causes the stone to move. One way of defending this thesis was to observe that God creates bodies all at once and that at each moment He recreates them (Ibid, 404). The assumption seems to be that since God recreates bodies, human or otherwise, at every moment, no body survives between two moments such that an action willed in the human body at one moment could be causally efficacious on some other body at a second moment; for in one sense any purported efficacy of what was willed at one moment is wholly disconnected with the events of some second moment.

This latter argument taken to its logical conclusions, however, virtually entails occasionalism, that is, the view that at each moment God recreates the world, its atoms and accidents as well as all actions, whether that of a human or not, and so it is God alone who is occasioning the events that occur in our world. Indeed later theologians would embrace such an occasionalist worldview. Their preferred argument for occasionalism, however, was not the one sketched above, but one based on the notion of possibility (istita‘a).[3] The argument roughly was that a creature only performs some action if it possesses the possibility to perform that action. Whenever the creature possesses this possibility, the possibility is either actualized or not. On the one hand, to affirm a non-actualized existing thing, such as an un-actualized possibility, is tantamount to affirming a non-existing existing thing, which is a patent contradiction. On the other hand, if the possibility is actualized, then the creature must be performing the correlative action, and will always be doing so when it possesses the actualized possibility, but of course created things sometimes act and sometimes do not. Therefore the possibility for a creature to perform any given action must be created for it at any time it acts, and it is God who is constantly creating the possibility to act, and so in effect the correlative action, at every moment something acts. In short, all agency must belong to God and God alone.

1.4 An-Nazzam and Leaps

Again as a general rule most of the speculative theologians adopted an atomistic framework for explaining natural phenomena; however, such a position was not without its critics even within the kalam tradition itself, and the most notorious of these critics was Ibrahim an-Nazzam (d. ca. 840). An-Nazzam denied the atom-accident ontology of most theologians and instead maintained that with the one exception of the accident of motion everything else in our world was a body. Moreover, bodies, as well as space, did not have an atomic structure, but a continuous one according to an-Nazzam. Affirming continuous space and motion left an-Nazzam vulnerable to Zeno-style paradoxes, and indeed the atomist Abu Hudhayl openly confronted him with the ant-sandal paradox sketched above. An-Nazzam's solution was to maintain that a moving object, such as an ant, could cross a continuous space with its infinite number of halfway points by means of a leap (tafra). The general idea was that a moving body could cover a continuous space by making a finite number of leaps and that during each leap the moving body is not in the intervening spaces. In other words, a moving body leaps from some first place to a third place on a continuous magnitude without having passed through any second place between the two.

Despite the counterintuitive nature of an-Nazzam's suggestion, he argued that even the atomists had to posit leaps as well. He had one imagine the rotation of a millstone. Now in a single rotation an atom at the outer edge of the wheel would traverse a distance equal to the circumference of the wheel, whereas an atom at the hub would traverse a shorter distance equal to the circumference of the hub. Since the atom at the outer edge is traversing a greater distance in an equal time as the atom at the hub, the atom at the outer edge must be moving faster than the atom at the hub. An-Nazzam next observed that there is only one of two ways to explain this phenomenon: either the atom at the outer edge leaps over some of the intervening atomic cells, or the atom at the hub rests at some of the atomic cells for a few moments while the atom at the outer edge catches up. The preferred atomist solution to differences in velocity was to posit that slower moving objects have a greater number of intervallic rests than faster moving objects; however, an-Nazzam disallowed this solution with respect to the rotating millstone on the grounds that in that case the millstone would fragment as certain atoms rest while others keep moving. In other words, some atoms that at the beginning of the motion had been next to other atoms would have moved away from each other as the ones nearer the rim kept moving in order to cover the greater distance and the ones nearer the hub rested in order to cover only their respective distance, and so by the atom's moving away from each other, the millstone as a whole would fragment and break up. Yet, argued an-Nazzam, it is directly observable that the stone does not fragment, and thus even the atomists must be committed to leaps.

2. Falsafa: Neoplatonized Aristotelianism in the Islamic World[4]

2.1 The Definition and Form of Motion

The above provides a very general outline of one of the prominent intellectual approaches to natural philosophy in the Arabic-speaking world of the medieval period. The second major tradition of natural philosophy, falsafa, had its origin in Aristotle's physical writings and the Graeco-Arabic commentary tradition that arose up around them. Since natural philosophy, at least as it occurred in the Greek scientific tradition, is the study of natures, and natures are causes of motion or change, understanding what motion is and the conditions necessary for motions within a broadly Aristotelian framework was the primary focus of natural philosophers working in the falsafa tradition. Aristotle himself had defined motion as “the entelekheia of potential insofar as it is such” (Physics, III 1). One of the exegetical issues with which earlier Greek commentaries struggled was how to understand the enigmatic term entelekheia in Aristotle's definition, a term it would seem that Aristotle himself coined. Some argued that entelekheia must refer to a progression or process towards some end or perfection. Others argued that entelekheia must refer in some sense to the completed actuality of some partial end or perfection. The dispute in the ancient world, then, settled upon whether entelekheia is itself a process term or not. If entelekheia is a process term then it is clear how Aristotle's definition of motion describes a process, but it does so by assuming a process term in the definition, whereas Aristotle's definition of motion was intended to provide the most basic account of what a process is and so should not presuppose a process. If entelekheia is not a process term, then Aristotle's definition avoids circularity, but it is no longer clear how it describes a process, since a completion or perfection is the end of a process, not a process itself. The above roughly presents a key philosophical debate surrounding Aristotle's definition of motion as it reached Arabic-speaking philosophers.[5]

Part of this terminological issue was resolved by the Arabic translation of Aristotle's Physics itself; for there Aristotle's definition is rendered “motion is the perfection (kamal) of what is in potency inasmuch as it is such,” where the translation of entelekheia as ‘perfection’ would decidedly bias Arabic-speaking Aristotelians against the process interpretation of that term. Thus the primary issue for these philosophers involved explaining how Aristotle's definition of motion actually describes a process. Perhaps the most sophisticated solution to this issue was that of Avicenna, who in effect argued for motion at an instant (Avicenna 1983, II.1, 83.18-84.19; Hasnawi 2001; McGinnis 2006a).[6] He noted that the perfection in question in Aristotle's definition could not refer either to the starting point or to the ending point of the motion, since in the first case the motion has not yet begun and in the second case the motion is already completed. Thus the perfection must refer to some perfection of the moving object while it is in an intermediate state between these two extremes. So, for example, an object moving between x and z is not in motion at either x or z, but only while it is in the space between x and z. That intermediate state, in turn, could refer either to the whole continuous medium between the two extremes or to a point. So, again, the intermediary state might refer to the whole of the motion along the entire continuous distance between x and z or to the moving object's being at one or another single point along the distance, as for example, y. Avicenna next observed that at every instant during a moving object's continuous motion it is moving, and yet there is no instant at which the whole of the motion exists as some extended magnitude. Thus the perfection in the definition of motion must refer to the perfection of the moving thing at one or another point between the starting and ending points, albeit, as the moving thing is at that point for only an instant. It is the very fact that the moving object is only at the intermediate point for precisely an instant that guarantees that the object is undergoing motion; for should it remain at some point for more than an instant, and so for a period of time, the object would in fact be at rest at that point.

2.2 The Infinite, the Continuous and Criticism of Atomism

Although the above argument provides one medieval Arabic account of the form of motion, there were other causal factors and necessary conditions involved in the analysis of motion. Some of the most significant conditions are (1) the infinite (particularly as it appears in descriptions of the continuous, e.g., the continuous as what is potentially divisible infinitely), (2) place and, closely related to place, (3) void, and also (4) time.

The standard argument against the actual existence of the infinite can be traced back at least as early as al-Kindi and stretches throughout the entire classical period of Arabic or Islamic philosophy up to at least as-Suhrawardi (al-Kindi 1950, 115-116 & 202-203; Avicenna 1983, III.8, 212-214; id., 1985, IV.11, 244-246; Ibn Bajja 1978, 36-37; Ibn Tufayl 1936, 75-77; and as-Suhrawardi 1999, 44).[7] It begins by considering what follows if one assumes that there is an actually infinite magnitude or number. If this were possible, then imagine, for example, two lines running side-by-side in such an infinite magnitude. Next imagine that a finite portion is removed from one of the lines and compare the reduced line with the un-reduced line: either both lines remain infinite or one is finite. If the reduced and un-reduced lines are both infinite, then they are equal to one another, but in that case the lesser is equal to the greater, which is absurd; for the reduced line is less than the un-reduced line by an amount equal to the finite portion that was removed. If the reduced line is finite and the un-reduced line is infinite, then return the finite portion that was removed to the reduced line. In that case since a finite magnitude is being added to a finite magnitude, the resultant of the two must likewise be finite; however, both the lines were initially posited to be infinite, and so an infinite line turns out to be finite, which is contradiction. In short, the assumption of an actual infinite entails either an absurdity or a contradiction and so must be rejected.

Al-Kindi went on to use the conclusion of this argument to argue that time itself must be finite and consequently that the period of time during which the world has existed must be finite. Therefore, he concluded on the basis of this argument that the world must have been created at some first moment of time and so is not eternal (al-Kindi 1950, 121-122 & 205-206). In opposition to al-Kindi most subsequent philosophers in the falsafa tradition took the conclusion of the above argument to entail only that an actual infinite magnitude or number of things could not exist, that is to say, there cannot exist some wholly completed infinite all of whose parts exists at one and the same moment in time. In those cases where not all of the magnitude or its parts exist together at a single moment—as in the case of time and its parts, the past, present and future—then an infinite, they argued, could exist, albeit only potentially.

In addition to offering a means of understanding the eternity of the universe, the notion of a potential infinite was also useful for many natural philosophers in that it provided a way to explain the continuous. Although strictly speaking Arabic-speaking philosophers followed the definition of the continuous given by Aristotle in Physics V 3, which is in terms of two touching limits becoming one and the same, they nonetheless further glossed this definition in terms of being divisible into ever smaller portions without limit, that is, as being potentially divisible infinitely. Clearly the notion of the continuous ran afoul of the atomists' arguments against continua, which we have seen above. In response to such arguments, the philosophers insisted that a continuous magnitude is properly speaking one and unified and as such it is not composed of an infinite number of parts and so does not have an actually infinite number of divisions (e.g., Avicenna 1983, III.2, 182.1-183.17). They further maintained that properly speaking one cannot even say that a continuous magnitude has an infinite number of potential divisions, at least not in the sense that an infinite number of non-actualized divisions exist latently in the continuous magnitude such that they could ever all come to exist so as to be all actualized at once. For the philosophers, there is no real sense that the divisions are in the magnitude, whether actually or potentially; rather, the sense in which a continuous magnitude is potentially divisible ad infinitum is that nothing in the magnitude precludes or hinders one from positing ever-smaller divisions. In other words, when the philosophers say that the continuous is potentially divisible infinitely, they mean that it is impossible to complete the process of division such that the resultant is an actually infinite number of parts. Thus, there is an inherent contradiction in the theologians' objection that if the continuous is potentially divisible infinitely, there must be a power, such as God, that can actualize all the potential divisions; for such an argument absurdly entails that what by definition cannot be completed is completed.

Having shown how the notion of the continuous does not lead to the absurdities presented by the atomists, the philosophers next argued that atomism is itself conceptually incoherent. Their critique of atomic theories of magnitude came in two general forms: arguments attempting to show that atomism cannot even approximate our best mathematics and arguments attempting to show that the notion of minimal parts that are not even conceptually divisible is inadequate to describe certain basic natural phenomena.

The most common mathematical criticism against atomism was that if atomism were correct, then one could not even approximate the Pythagorean theorem, and yet the Pythagorean theorem is the best attested theorem in mathematics (e.g., Avicenna 1983, III.4, 190). The argument begins by envisioning atomic space something like a chessboard, which is a fair approximation of how the theologians did think of atomic space. Next imagine inscribed on this atomic space a right isosceles triangle, whose legs are four atoms longs. The length of the hypotenuse of the triangle must equal the number of atoms that run down the diagonal of the purported atomic square; however, given that the space is atomic, that length would be only four atoms long. Now since according to the Pythagorean theorem the square of the sum of the legs should equal the square of hypotenuse, one would have 42 + 42 = 42, if the space were atomic, but this is clearly false. Since the absurdity arose from taking jointly the two assumptions that the space is atomic and the Pythagorean theorem, one of them must be rejected, and the obvious candidate is to deny that there are minimal atomic units of magnitude. It does no good to say that the diagonal of an atom is longer than its sides; for such an assumption entails that there are lengths shorter than the smallest part, namely, that amount by which the atom's diagonal is supposedly longer than its side, but a length shorter than the shortest length is a contradiction. In short, it would seem that if the Pythagorean theorem is correct, then the atomism of the theologians is false.

A second type of argument used against atomism involved showing that that the notion of conceptually minimal parts was philosophically and scientifically wanting (e.g., Avicenna 1983, III.4, 189-190). The issue at stake concerned how atoms could be aggregated so as to give rise to the physical bodies that we observe around us. There seem to be four possible ways: (1) the atoms could be in succession with one another, but in no way touching one another; or the atoms could be touching one another, in which case they might do so by being (2) contiguous with one another, (3) continuous with one another, or (4) interpenetrating one another. Clearly the bodies we observe around us are unified wholes, that is, their parts are together and so form solids rather than being ‘cloud like.’ Thus the atoms cannot merely be in succession. If the atoms were in contact with one another by interpenetrating each other, then bodies would never be larger than a single atom, but again this outcome is empirically false. Thus, atoms must be in contact by either being contiguous or continuous with one another. In that case, however, imagine three atoms, ABC, that are either contiguous with or continuous with one another. In this case, B must be separating A from C; for if B were not separating A from C, then, for instance, A could be in contact with C despite B‘s presence such that A would in fact be interpenetrating B; but this alternative has already been excluded. Consequently, there must be something, x, in virtue of which B is in contact with A and something, y, in virtue of which B is in contact with C, and x and y must be separate from each other, otherwise A and C would not be separate from each other. In that case, however, B can be conceptually divided into x and y, and yet B was assumed to be a conceptually indivisible, and so there is a contradiction. In short, the conceptually indivisible parts of the atomists are inadequate to explain the existence of the physical bodies that we observe around us.

2.3 Place and Void

Aristotle in his Physics (IV 4, 212a2-6) had argued that place is the first motionless limit of a containing body. His account, however, came under heavy criticism from the late Greek Neoplatonic thinker John Philoponus. Philoponus asserted that place is a (finite) three-dimensional extension that though never devoid of body on its own, nonetheless, considered in itself is self-subsistent, and so in theory could exist independently of a body. One of the ways that Philoponus defended this thesis was to argue that Aristotle's account of place was inconsistent with other features of his philosophical system. Aristotle seemed committed to the following three claims: one, if something has a place, then given his definition of ‘place’ there must be something else beyond that thing that contains it; two, once approximately every twenty-four hours the outermost celestial sphere makes a complete westward rotation; and three, there are only three generic types of motion: motion with respect to (1) place, (2) quantity and (3) quality. Given these beliefs, Philoponus posed the following dilemma. Either the universe as a whole has a place or it does not. If it has a place, then Aristotle's definition of place is wrong since there is nothing beyond the universe itself that contains it. If the universe as a whole does not have a place, then Philoponus asks, “In what respect does the outermost celestial sphere move during the course of its diurnal motion?” Again the motion either could be (1) with respect to the category of place (as when something undergoes locomotion), (2) with respect to the category of quantity (as when something grows or shrinks) or (3) with respect to the category of quality (as when something changes color or temperature and the like). Clearly the universe's diurnal motion is not with respect to either of the categories of quantity or quality, and thus it must be with respect to place; however, in this horn of the dilemma it was assumed that the universe has no place, and so there is a contradiction. Although Philoponus had other arguments for his belief that place is the space occupied by a body, this dilemma is the one that most exercised subsequent Arabic-speaking natural philosophers.

Virtually all Arabic-speaking philosophers adopted Aristotle's account of place as the limit of a containing body, and so the challenge was to explain whether the universe as a whole has a place and in what sense it can be said to move. There were two approaches to this issue: one was to deny that the universe had a place and then explain in what sense it could be said to move, while the other was to assert that the universe has a place and then show how its having a place is consistent with Aristotle's definition of place. Avicenna represents the first approach, whereas Ibn Bajja and Averroes (and it would also seem al-Farabi) took the second approach.

So for instance, Avicenna denied that the universe has a place, but he likewise further denied that the list of the types of motion exploited by Philoponus in his dilemma is exhaustive: one must further add to that list, maintained Avicenna, motion with respect to the category of position (Avicenna 1983, II.3, 103-105.13; McGinnis 2006b). According to Avicenna, then, all cases of rectilinear motion, that is, motion from some spatial point x to a distinct spatial point y, are cases of motion with respect to the category of place, whereas all cases of spinning or rotating, where the moving object does not depart from a given spatial location, are cases of motion with respect to the category of position. Since the universe during its daily rotation does not depart from one spatial location to another it does not need a place and yet it can still move albeit with respect to the category of position, concluded Avicenna.

A contrasting approach is that of Ibn Bajja, who we are told followed al-Farabi; this position would also be the one that Averroes in general would adopt, albeit with certain reservations and modifications (Lettinck 1984, 297-302; Averroes 1962, 141E-144I). Ibn Bajja begins by slightly modifying Aristotle's definition of place; instead of being the first containing limit, place is now identified with ‘the proximate surrounding surface.’ The shift in language is slight, but it allows Ibn Bajja the opportunity to distinguish between two senses of ‘surrounding surface.’ Things can either be surrounded by a concave or convex surface, maintained Ibn Bajja. A Rectilinear body, that is, a body that undergoes rectilinear motion, has as its place a concave surface that is outside of it, whereas a truly spherical body, that is, a body that undergoes circular motion or rotation, has as its place a convex surface, which is inside of the rotating body and is in fact the surface of the center around which the body rotates. Since the universe rotates around the earth, at least according to ancient and medieval cosmology, the universe is ‘surrounded’ by the earth at the earth's convex surface, and thus the universe as a whole has a place, namely, the surface of the earth. Averroes' modifications make the surface of the earth only the accidental place of the universe rather than the essential place, but since Aristotle had spoken of the universe's having a place only accidentally, the Commentator was satisfied.

Natural philosophers writing in Islamic lands did not necessarily defend Aristotle's account of place against Philoponus' critique out of a slavish adherence to Aristotle, but because Philoponus' alternative account of place entailed that there could be a void space, and most Arabic-speaking philosophers thought that the existence of the void was both physically impossible as well as conceptually incoherent. Aristotle himself had presented numerous physical impossibilities associated with a void, whereas Arabic-speaking philosophers explored the conceptually incoherent aspect of the notion of a void in order to show that its existence is impossible. For example, in On First Philosophy al-Kindi observed that the meaning of ‘void’ is a place in which nothing is placed; however, he continued, place and being something placed are correlative terms neither of which proceeds the other, and so if there is a place, there must be something placed, and if there is something placed, there must be a place. Consequently there cannot be a place without something placed in it. Again, however, a place without something placed in it is precisely what is meant by ‘void.’ Therefore, concluded al-Kindi, it is impossible that an absolute void exists (al-Kindi 1950, 109).

Al-Farabi in a small treatise on the void took a similar approach, but now from the direction of what is meant by ‘body’ (al-Farabi 1951). He begins by considering an experiment that might lead one to conclude that a void exists. The experiment involves sucking air out of a vial and then placing one's finger on the mouth of the vial. One next inverts the vial into a bowl of water and then removes the finger from the mouth of the vial. A certain amount of water will be attracted into the vial, and so one might conclude that a void space proportional to the amount of water drawn into the vial was present while one's finger was over the mouth of the vial. The conclusion does not follow, argued al-Farabi; for he believed that one must concede that the purported void space in the vial has a certain volume, but since volume just is a body possessing length, breadth and depth, there must be a body in the purported void space.[8] In this respect al-Farabi was simply following the standard definition of ‘body’ as whatever possesses three dimensions; however, he also suggested that there is something incoherent about considering void as some sort of absolute nothingness possessing three dimensions, since there is no coherent sense in which nothingness could be the subject for the accidental qualities of length, breadth and depth.[9] Given these considerations against the void, continued al-Farabi, one should conclude from the above experiment that the volume of air expanded, and consequently a smaller amount of air now occupies the same amount of space. In other words, the particular volume that a body possesses, and particularly in the case or air, is not essential to that body, and so given the right causal factors or conditions a body's volume can expand or decrease. Al-Farabi's suggestion here was to become the standard among Arabic-speaking natural philosophers when dealing with purportedly artificially manufactured voids.

2.4 Time and Eternity

Like so many issues in natural philosophy, philosophers working in the falsafa tradition took their lead concerning temporal topics from Aristotle. Thus most Arabic-speaking philosophers defined time as the measure of motion with respect to priority and posteriority.[10] Although a number of the most discussed issues and problems associated with time concerned the eternity of the world, and so in a sense belonged to metaphysics, there were some pressing questions concerning the nature of time that remained wholly in the domain of natural philosophy. Arguably the most important of these physical question concerned clarifying which motion or motions time measures. Averroes presented the problem at stake nicely in an extended digression his Long Commentary on the Physics (Averroes 1962, 178F-179I).

Averroes began by asking whether time is associated with every motion or just one special motion. If time were associated with, and indeed generated by, every motion, then there would be as many times as there were motions, and yet it seems immediately obvious that there is but a single time. Thus it would seem that time must be associated with just one special motion; and indeed virtually everyone in the Aristotelian tradition, going back to at least Alexander of Aphrodisias, if not Aristotle himself, did associate time with one special motion, namely, the motion of the heavens. Now, continued Averroes, if time were uniquely associated with this and only this motion, then one's sensing and being aware of time would be associated with one's sensing and being aware of the heavens' motion. Consequently, should someone have never sensed that motion, such as Plato's prisoners in the cave from the Republic, that person would be wholly unaware of time, and such a conclusion simply seems false. In fact, Averroes generalized his argument to include all special motions that exist outside of our souls. Hence it would seem that the motion in question in the definition of time must refer to a psychological motion, that is, some motion that our souls undergo. The difficulty with this suggestion, Averroes concluded, is twofold: first, it implies that there is no time outside the soul, and second, since there will be as many psychological motions as there are souls, we have returned to our initial difficulty of the existence of multiple times.

Averroes' solution is to say that our awareness of time is first and essentially our awareness of ourselves inasmuch as we have undergone some sort of change. We are in turn aware that we have undergone some sort of change by being aware of two different moments, as for example, I am aware that the moment at which I first began to write this account is different from the present moment, in which case I am aware that I have undergone some sort of change. Our undergoing change, however, Averroes quickly added, only results from the heavens' undergoing motion, and should per impossibile the heavens cease moving, then we would no longer undergo change. Consequently, although our awareness of time is associated immediately with our undergoing change, and so we can be aware of time even though we are not aware of any particular extra-mental motion, time itself is associated with the motion of the heavens that is the ultimate cause of our undergoing motion, and so time is one and not multiplied.

Another temporal issue that was clearly of interest to natural philosophers in Islamic lands concerned time's topography: “Is it finite or infinite?” and “Is it ‘rectilinear’ or ‘cyclical’?” Among the Arabic-speaking philosophers, al-Kindi was virtually alone in affirming the finitude of time; most others philosophers argued that time must necessarily be infinite in that it could have no beginning. How various philosophers argued for this thesis reveals that both rectilinear and cyclical conceptions of time were present within the falsafa tradition, where Avicenna advocates a rectilinear conception of time and Averroes a cyclical conception of time.

Again the area where this issue arose concerned proofs for the eternity of time. So, for example, in a novel proof for the existence of time based upon differences in the amount of distance that can be covered by slower and faster moving objects, Avicenna linked time with a possibility or capacity (imkan) for motion (Avicenna 1985, 228-229). He then argued by means of a reducto ad absurdum. He has us assume that time is finite, and so the motion of the universe must have some first moment when it began. Even if the motion of the universe began at some first moment, the argument continues, clearly there would still have been the possibility for the Creator of the world to make a motion that extended further back. In that case, there is a capacity or possibility for motion that precedes the purported first moment, but time according to Avicenna is again just a certain capacity or possibility for motion. Thus a time would have preceded the purported first moment, which is absurd. Since the same argument applies to any purported first moment of time, concluded Avicenna, time can have no beginning and so must be infinite. Clearly, the conception of time implicit in Avicenna's argument is that of a temporal line stretching back infinitely.

Averroes too provided an argument for time's having no beginning, but now in terms of conceiving time as a circle (Averroes 1991, question III). As was explained above, for Averroes time is a consequence and measure of the circular motion of the heavens and so is itself circular. Now just as any point on a circle is both a beginning and ending of some arc on the circle, so any moment assumed in time must be a beginning and ending of some period of time. Consequently time has no beginning. That it should have no beginning, however, is not in the sense that a straight line has no beginning, but in the sense that no point on a circle can be said to be the beginning of the circle. Although Averroes did not explicitly claim that all events and thing will come around again, his argument does seem to imply such a conclusion.

2.5 Ar-Razi and Absolute Time and Space

As noted most of those working in the falsafa tradition drew their inspiration from Aristotle and his later commentators, the most notable exception was the independent philosopher-physician Abu Bakr ar-Razi (ca. 864-925 or -930), whose natural philosophy and cosmology happily drew upon Arabic versions of Plato's Timeaus as well as certain non-Greek sources. Ar-Razi maintained that there were five eternals: (1) the Creator, (2) the Universal Soul, (3) prime matter, (4) absolute time and (5) absolute space (understood as something like void space) (ar-Razi 1939, 195-215). The first three eternal principles find their counterparts in the natural philosophy of the Neoplatonizing Aristotelians in the Islamic world, whereas it is the last two notions that truly set ar-Razi apart from other medieval natural philosophers.

For all of the philosophers we have treated time and place are relative terms, which respectively depend on a motion and a situated thing for their very existence. In contrast, ar-Razi argued that one had to distinguish between the relative conception of these notions and the absolute conception. Thus he distinguished between time (a relative temporal notion) and duration (an absolute temporal notion) as well as between place (a relative spatial notion) and void (an absolute spatial notion). As absolute both duration and void are substances in the sense that they have an existence independent of anything else and thus in principle could exist if everything else failed to exist.

As for the eternity of duration, ar-Razi noted that time (the relative temporal notion) is constantly perishing and coming to be inasmuch as all past time has ceased to be, while future time is constantly coming to be. In this case, time itself is changing, but every change requires a duration during which it changes. If this duration itself underwent change, there would need to be a further duration and so on infinitely. To stop the regress ar-Razi posited an unchanging duration, which is itself the precondition for the measured time of those philosophers following Aristotle.

As for absolute space or void, we have seen how the Arabic-speaking philosophers had closely linked place with something placed in it. Now if the space and what is placed in it were essentially correlatives as the philosophers maintained, then, argued ar-Razi, by imagining the destruction of one correlate, one must likewise imaging the destruction of the other. Let one imagine the destruction of the universe. The notion of void or empty space, claimed ar-Razi, is not destroyed along with imagined destruction of everything occupying it. Thus void and what is placed in it are not correlatives like the philosophers claimed. Hence one must distinguish between the notion of void space, which is not destroyed when one imagines the destruction of the universe, and the notion of place, which is destroyed when one imagines the destruction of the universe. The former is absolute, whereas only the latter is relative.


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Al-Kindi | Aristotle, Special Topics: natural philosophy | atomism: ancient | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Ibn Rushd | Maimonides | Neoplatonism | Philoponus