Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Ancient Atomism

First published Tue Aug 23, 2005; substantive revision Tue Oct 18, 2005

A number of important theorists in ancient Greek natural philosophy held that the universe is composed of physical ‘atoms’, literally ‘uncuttables’. Some of these figures are treated in more depth in other articles in this encyclopedia: the reader is encouraged to consult individual entries on Leucippus, Democritus, Epicurus and Lucretius. These philosophers developed a systematic and comprehensive natural philosophy accounting for the origins of everything from the interaction of indivisible bodies, as these atoms—which have only a few intrinsic properties like size and shape—strike against one another, rebound and interlock in an infinite void. This atomist natural philosophy eschewed teleological explanation and denied divine intervention or design, regarding every composite of atoms as produced purely by material interactions of bodies, and accounting for the perceived properties of macroscopic bodies as produced by these same atomic interactions. Atomists formulated views on ethics, theology, political philosophy and epistemology consistent with this physical system. This powerful and consistent materialism, somewhat modified from its original form by Epicurus, persisted as the chief competitor to the teleological natural philosophies of the Peripatetics, Stoics and Platonists.

Since the Greek adjective atomos means, literally, ‘uncuttable,’ the history of ancient atomism is not only the history of a theory about the nature of matter, but also the history of the idea that there are indivisible parts in any kind of magnitude—geometrical extension, time, etc. Although the term ‘atomism’ is most often identified with the systems of natural philosophy mentioned above, scholars have also identified commitments to indivisibles in a number of lesser known figures. Often these are formulated in response to paradoxes like those of Zeno of Elea (early 5th c. BCE) about infinite divisibility of magnitudes. Some of these identifications of other kinds of atomism outside the main tradition are controversial and based on slight evidence.

1. Atomism before Leucippus?

Leucippus (5th c. BCE) is the earliest figure whose commitment to atomism is well attested. He is usually credited with inventing atomism. According to a passing remark by the geographer Strabo, Posidonius (1st c. BCE Stoic philosopher) reported that ancient Greek atomism can be traced back to a figure known as Moschus or Mochus of Sidon, who lived at the time of the Trojan wars. This report was given credence in the seventeenth century: the Cambridge Platonist Henry More traced the origins of ancient atomism back, via Pythagoras and Moschus, to Moses. This theologically motivated view does not seem to claim much historical evidence, however.

In 1877, Tannéry argued that Zeno of Elea's arguments about divisibility must have been formulated in response to a particular view held by some early Pythagoreans. Tannéry's view, which was widely accepted in the early twentieth century, is based on the claim that one of Zeno's paradoxes about the possibility of motion would best make sense if it were attacking an atomist thesis, and thus that the Pythagoreans, who are reported to have talked of monads or unit numbers, must have been atomists of a sort. Tannery's thesis has been thoroughly challenged since then: most scholars instead consider atomism to be one of a number of positions formulated in response to the arguments of Parmenides and Zeno (first half of the fifth century). A fourth-century Pythagorean, Ecphantus, interpreted the Pythagorean monads as indivisible bodies: he is reported to have been sympathetic to atomism of a kind similar to Democritus'. Plato's discussion of the composition of solids from plane surfaces is thought to be based on fourth-century Pythagorean theories.

2. Leucippus and Democritus

Leucippus and Democritus are widely regarded as the first atomists in the Greek tradition. Little is known about Leucippus, while the ideas of his student Democritus—who is said to have taken over and systematized his teacher's theory—are known from a large number of reports. These ancient atomists theorized that the two fundamental and oppositely characterized constituents of the natural world are indivisible bodies—atoms—and void. The latter is described simply as nothing, or the negation of body. Atoms are by their nature intrinsically unchangeable; they can only move about in the void and combine into different clusters. Since the atoms are separated by void, they cannot fuse, but must rather bounce off one another when they collide. Because all macroscopic objects are in fact combinations of atoms, everything in the macroscopic world is subject to change, as their constituent atoms shift or move away. Thus, while the atoms themselves persist through all time, everything in the world of our experience is transitory and subject to dissolution.

According to Aristotle's presentation (On Generation and Corruption I 8), the motivation for the first postulation of indivisible bodies is to answer a metaphysical puzzle about the possibility of change and multiplicity. Parmenides had argued that any differentiation or change in Being implies that ‘what is not’ either is or comes to be. Although there are problems in interpreting Parmenides' precise meaning, he was understood to have raised a problem about how change can be possible without something coming from nothing. Several Presocratics formulated, in response, philosophical systems in which change is not considered to require something coming into being from complete nonexistence, but rather the arrangement of preexisting elements into new combinations. The atomists held that, like Being, as conceived by Parmenides, the atoms are unchangeable and contain no internal differentiation of a sort that would allow for division. But there are many Beings, not just one, which are separated from another by nothing, i.e. by void.

By positing indivisible bodies, the atomists were also thought to be answering Zeno's paradoxes about the impossibility of motion. Zeno had argued that, if magnitudes can be divided to infinity, it would be impossible for motion to occur. The problem seems to be that a body moving would have to traverse an infinite number of spaces in a finite time. By supposing that the atoms form the lowest limit to division, the atomists escape from this dilemma: a total space traversed has only a finite number of parts. As it is unclear whether the earliest atomists understood the atoms to be physically or theoretically indivisible, they may not have made the distinction.

The changes in the world of macroscopic objects are caused by rearrangements of the atomic clusters. Atoms can differ in size, shape, order and position (the way they are turned); they move about in the void, and—depending on their shape—some can temporarily bond with one another by means of tiny hooks and barbs on their surfaces. Thus the shape of individual atoms affects the macroscopic texture of clusters of atoms, which may be fluid and yielding or firm and resistant, depending on the amount of void space between and the coalescence of the atomic shapes. The texture of surfaces and the relative density and fragility of different materials are also accounted for by the same means.

The atomists accounted for perception by means of films of atoms sloughed off from their surfaces by external objects, and entering and impacting the sense organs. They tried to account for all sensible effects by means of contact, and regarded all sense perceptions as caused by the properties of the atoms making up the films acting on the atoms of animals' sense organs. Perceptions of color are caused by the ‘turning’ or position of the atoms; tastes are caused by the texture of atoms on the tongue, e.g., bitter tastes by the tearing caused by sharp atoms; feelings of heat are ascribed to friction. Democritus was taken by Aristotle to have considered thought to be a material process involving the local rearrangement of bodies, just as much as is perception.

A famous quotation from Democritus distinguishes between perceived properties like colors and tastes, which exist only ‘by convention,’ in contrast to the reality, which is atoms and void. However, he apparently recognized an epistemological problem for an empiricist philosophy that nonetheless regards the objects of sense as unreal. In another famous quotation, the senses accuse the mind of overthrowing them, although mind is dependent on the senses. The accusation is that, by developing an atomist theory that undermines the basis for confidence in sense perception, thought has in effect undercut its own foundation on knowledge gained through the senses. Democritus sometimes seems to doubt or deny the possibility of knowledge.

The early atomists try to account for the formation of the natural world by means of their simple ontology of atoms and void alone. Leucippus held that there are an infinite number of atoms moving for all time in an infinite void, and that these can form into cosmic systems or kosmoi by means of a whirling motion which randomly establishes itself in a large enough cluster of atoms. It is controversial whether atoms are thought to have weight as an intrinsic property, causing them all to fall in some given direction, or whether weight is simply a tendency for atoms (which otherwise move in any and every direction, except when struck) to move towards the centre of a system, created by the whirling of the cosmic vortices. When a vortex is formed, it creates a membrane of atoms at its outer edge, and the outer band of atoms catches fire, forming a sun and stars. These kosmoi are impermanent, and are not accounted for by purpose or design. The earth is described as a flat cylindrical drum at the center of our cosmos.

Species are not regarded as permanent abstract forms, but as the result of chance combinations of atoms. Living things are regarded as having a psychê or principle of life; this is identified with fiery atoms. Organisms are thought to reproduce by means of seed: Democritus seems to have held that both parents produce seeds composed of fragments from each organ of their body. Whichever of the parts drawn from the relevant organ of the parents predominates in the new mixture determines which characteristics are inherited by the offspring. Democritus is reported to have given an account of the origin of human beings from the earth. He is also said to be the founder of a kind of cultural anthropology, since his account of the origin of the cosmos includes an account of the origin of human institutions, including language and social and political organization.

A large group of reports about Democritus' views concern ethical maxims: some scholars have tried to regard these as systematic or dependent on atomist physics, while others doubt the closeness of the connection. Because several maxims stress the value of ‘cheerfulness,’ Democritus is sometimes portrayed as ‘the laughing philosopher.’

3. Plato and Platonists

Although the Greek term atomos is most commonly associated with the philosophical system developed by Leucippus and Democritus, involving solid and impenetrable bodies, Plato's Timaeus presents a different kind of physical theory based on indivisibles. The dialogue elaborates an account of the world wherein the four different basic kinds of matter—earth, air, fire, and water—are regular solids composed from plane figures: isoceles and scalene right-angled triangles. Because the same triangles can form into different regular solids, the theory thus explains how some of the elements can transform into one another, as was widely believed.

In this theory, it is the elemental triangles composing the solids that are regarded as indivisible, not the solids themselves. When Aristotle discusses the hypothesis that the natural world is composed of indivisibles, the two views he considers are Plato's and Democritus', although he seems to have more respect for the latter view. Aristotle criticizes both Plato's and the fourth-century Pythagorean attempts to construct natural bodies possessing weight from indivisible mathematical abstractions, whether plane surfaces or numbers.

It has been suggested that Plato accepted time atoms, i.e., indivisible minima in time, but this is controversial. A report by Aristotle suggests that the belief of Plato's student Xenocrates in the existence of indivisible lines was also shared by Plato; other testimony suggests that points are really what Plato refers to as indivisible.

In late antiquity, the Neoplatonist Proclus defended Plato's account against Aristotle's objections; these arguments are preserved in Simplicius' commentary on Aristotle's On the Heavens. Simplicius credits the Pythagoreans as well as Plato with a theory composing bodies from plane surfaces. Simplicius also compares Pythagorean views to Democritean atomism, inasmuch as both theories posit a cause for hot and cold, rather than taking these to be fundamental principles, as the Aristotelians do.

4. Xenocrates

A treatise in the Aristotelian corpus probably not by Aristotle himself (On Indivisible Lines) addresses and refutes a number of arguments offered for the existence of indivisible lines, without naming their author. Plato's student Xenocrates (396-314 BCE), third head of the Academy, is reported to believe in indivisible lines, and he may well be the target of the Aristotelian treatise.

One of the arguments attacked addresses a Zenonian problem about traversing or touching in succession an infinite series of parts. The idea that there are indivisible lines offers an alternative to the view that any extended magnitude must be divisible to infinity. Another argument concerns Platonic Forms, and would only apply to those who accepted their existence. It argues that the Form of a triangle presupposes the existence of a Form of a line, and adds that this ideal line cannot have parts, presumably because parts are taken to be prior to the whole they compose and Forms need to have a kind of primacy to be explanatory. A distinct argument also depends on the idea of priority: it is argued that if the physical elements composing a body are regarded as the ultimate parts prior to a whole, they cannot be further divisible. Although this does not argue for indivisible lines per se, it is used to suggest that the objects of sense as well as those of thought must include things without parts.

A further argument depends on thinking that opposite properties must have opposite characteristics: if ‘many’ or ‘large’ things have infinite parts, it is argued, then ‘few’ or ‘small’ things must have only a finite number of parts. It is then concluded that there must be a magnitude without parts, apparently so that it is not further divisible and thus composed of an infinite number of parts. The last argument depends on the idea that mathematicians talk of commensurable lines, and posit a single unit of measurement: this would not be possible if the unit were divisible, because the parts of the unit, if measured, would be measured by the unit measure and it would then turn out to contain multiple units within itself.

5. Minima Naturalia in Aristotle

An argument in Aristotle (Physics 1.4, 187b14-21) is sometimes taken by later writers as evidence that Aristotle allowed for the existence of minima in natural things. Aristotle writes that there is a smallest size of material substrate on which it is possible for the form of a given natural tissue to occur. Blood and bone, say, are all materially composed of given proportions of earth, air, fire, and water: there needs to be a certain minimal amount of these material components present before the form of blood or bone can occur. This doctrine, while it is surely compatible with the view that the material components are nonetheless infinitely divisible, is sometimes read, by some Neoplatonist commentators and later sources interested in atomist theory, as evidence that Aristotle endorsed the existence of minimal physical parts.

6. Diodorus Cronus

Diodorus Cronus (late 4th c. BCE), a member of the supposed Dialectical School, is reported to have offered new arguments that there must be partless bodies or magnitudes. Most reports suggest that his focus was on logical arguments rather than on physical theory: he used arguments that depend on positing mutually exhaustive alternatives.

Perhaps drawing on an argument of Aristotle's (Sens. 7, 449a20-31]), Diodorus apparently used the idea that there is a smallest size at which an object at a given distance is visible as the basis for an argument that there are indivisible magnitudes. His argument begins from the idea that there is a difference in size between the smallest size at which a given object is visible—presumably from a given distance—and the largest size at which it is invisible. Unless we concede that, at some magnitude, a body is both invisible and visible (or neither), there cannot be any other magnitude intermediate between these two magnitudes. Magnitudes must increase by discrete units.

Sextus Empiricus (AM 10.48ff) reports an argument of Diodorus' also concluding that magnitudes have discrete intervals. It also denies the existence of moving bodies, insisting that bodies move neither when they are in the place where they are, nor when they are in the place where they are not. Since these alternatives are presented as exhaustive, the conclusion must be that bodies are never moving. However, rather than assert that everything is static, Diodorus took the view that bodies must have moved without ever being in motion: they are simply at one place at one moment, and at another place at another moment.

As well as postulating the existence of indivisible smallest bodies and magnitudes, Diodorus seems to have supposed that there are indivisible smallest units of time. The argument about motion does not quite make it explicit that this is what he is committed to, but it is a reasonable inference: given his insistence that bodies are always at one place or another at any given time, he might well suppose that infinite divisibility of time would open up the threatening possibility of indeterminacy as to whether the change of place has taken place.

For those who posit indivisibles as a way to escape paradoxes about infinite divisibility, parallel arguments might equally well have been applied to the problem of completing tasks in an infinitely divisible time. Sextus Empiricus reports that the Aristotelian Strato of Lampsacus (d. 268/70 BCE) argued for time atoms, although this is contradicted by other sources. Sorabji 1983 suggests that Strato merely countenanced the possibility that time could be discrete while space and motion are continuous, without endorsing this position.

7. Epicurean Atomism

Democritus' atomism was revived in the early Hellenistic period, and an atomist school founded in Athens about 306, by Epicurus (341-270 BCE). The Epicureans formed more of a closed community than other schools, and promoted a philosophy of a simple, pleasant life lived with friends. The community included women, and some of its members raised children. The works of the founder were revered and some of them were memorized, a practice that may have discouraged philosophical innovation by later members of the school.

Epicurus seems to have learned of atomist doctrine through Democritus' follower Nausiphanes. Because Epicurus made some significant changes in atomist theory, it is often thought that his reformulation of the physical theory is an attempt to respond to Aristotle's criticisms of Democritus. Even more significant, however, is the increasing centrality of ethical concerns to Epicurus' atomism, and the importance of the view that belief in an atomist physical theory helps us live better lives.

Epicurus takes to heart a problem Democritus himself recognized (see 2. above), which is that atomist theory threatens to undermine itself if it removes any trust we can place in the evidence of the senses, by claiming that colors, etc. are unreal. He notoriously said that ‘all perception is true,’ apparently distinguishing between the causal processes which impact our senses, all of which originate with the films of atoms sloughed off by objects, and the judgments we make on the basis of them, which may be false. Reasoning to truths about things that are not apparent—like the existence of atoms—depends on the evidence of the senses, which is always true in that it consists of impacts from actually existing films. For particular phenomena, like meteorological events, Epicurus endorses the existence of multiple valid explanations, acknowledging that we may have no evidence for preferring one explanation over another.

It may be that Epicurus was less troubled by any such epistemological uncertainties because of his emphasis on the value of atomist theory for teaching us how to live the untroubled and tranquil life. Denying any divine sanction for morality, and holding that the experience of pleasure and pain are the source of all value, Epicurus thought we can learn from atomist philosophy that pursuing natural and necessary pleasures—rather than the misleading desires inculcated by society—will make pleasure readily attainable. At the same time, we will avoid the pains brought on by pursuing unnatural and unnecessary pleasures. Understanding, on the basis of the atomist theory, that our fears of the gods and of death are groundless will free us from our chief mental pains.

Epicurus made significant changes to atomist physical theory, and some of these have been traced to Aristotle's criticisms of Democritus. It seems that Democritus did not properly distinguish between the thesis of the physical uncuttability of atoms and that of their conceptual indivisibility: this raises a problem about how atoms can have parts, as evidenced by their variations in shape or their ability to compose a magnitude, touching one another in a series on different sides. Epicurus distinguished the two, holding that uncuttable atoms did have conceptually distinct parts, but that there was a lowest limit to these.

Epicurus' view of the motion of atoms also differs from Democritus'. Rather than talking of a motion towards the center of a given cosmos, possibly created by the cosmic vortex, Epicurus grants to atoms an innate tendency to downward motion through the infinite cosmos. The downward direction is simply the original direction of atomic fall . This may be in response to Aristotelian criticisms that Democritus does not show why atomic motion exists, merely saying that it is eternal and that it is perpetuated by collisions. Moreover, although this is not attested in the surviving writings of Epicurus, authoritative later sources attribute to him the idea that it belongs to the nature of atoms occasionally to exhibit a slight, otherwise uncaused swerve from their downward path. This is thought to explain why atoms have from infinite time entered into collisions instead of falling in parallel paths: it is also said, by Lucretius, to enter into the account of action and responsibility. Scholars have proposed a number of alternative interpretations as to how this is thought to work.

Epicurus seems to have taken a different view on the nature of properties, denying Democritus' claim that perceived properties only exist ‘by convention’. His successor Polystratus further defended and elaborated a claim about the reality of properties, including relational properties. Moreover, with the recovery of new papyrological evidence, controversy has arisen about the extent to which Epicurus rejected Democritus' attempt to account for all causal processes by the properties of the atoms and void alone. Although Epicurus' ideas have long been known from three surviving letters preserved in the biography by Diogenes Laertius, no copy of his longer work On Nature had been available. However, following excavation of the Epicurean library at Herculaneum that was buried by a volcanic eruption, some parts of this work are being recovered. Many of the scrolls found are badly damaged, however, and interpretation of this newly recovered material is ongoing.

The Herculaneum library contains much work of the Epicurean Philodemus (1st c. BCE). Philodemus wrote extensively, including on the history of philosophy, ethics, music, poetry, rhetoric and the emotions. He wrote a treatise on the theory of signs: because they are empiricists, believing that all knowledge comes from our sense experience, later Epicureans were concerned about the basis for our knowledge of imperceptibles like the atoms, and engaged in an extensive debate with the Stoics about the grounds for inferences to imperceptible entities.

Although Epicurus' doctrines teach the value of a quiet life in a specially constructed Epicurean community and decry the search for fame, atomist theory is also regarded as a cure for the troubles afflicting others outside the community, and there are certainly Epicurean texts written for a wider audience. Besides the letters by Epicurus himself summarizing his doctrines, the Epicurean philosopher Lucretius (d. c. 50 BCE) wrote a long Latin poem advocating Epicurus' ideas to Roman audiences. Lucretius makes clear his close allegiance to Epicurus' own views, and provides more detail on some topics than has survived from Epicurus' own work, such as an extended account of the origins of human society and institutions. A less sympathetic contemporary of Lucretius, Cicero, also wrote a number of Latin works in which an Epicurean spokesman presents the doctrines of the school. Diogenes of Oenoanda propagated Epicurean doctrines in Asia Minor, inscribing them on the wall of a Stoa in his home town. Excavation of these since the nineteenth century has also produced new texts, aimed at converting passersby to Epicurean theory. Smith 1993, in his latest edition of the text of the inscriptions, dates them to the early second century CE.

8. Atomism and Particle Theories in the Sciences

Some figures concerned with the natural sciences, especially medicine, are thought to have regarded organic bodies as made of some kind of particles. The details of these views are often obscure. Galen, in On the Natural Faculties, divides medical theorists into two groups, following the division of natural philosophers. On the one side are continuum theorists, who hold that all matter is infinitely divisible but that all the matter in things subject to generation and corruption is susceptible to qualitative alteration. On the other are those who suppose that matter is composed of tiny, unchangeable particles separated by void spaces, and explain qualitative change as produced only in compound bodies, by rearrangement of the particles alone. In Galen's view, qualitative alteration is needed to produce the powers whereby beneficent Nature directs change: Galen credits the first group with asserting the priority of Nature and its beneficent order, and the latter with denying this.

Although ancient natural philosophers tend to fall on either side of Galen's divide—continuum theory plus beneficent teleology, vs. atomism plus blind necessity— there is a danger in taking this dichotomy to be exhaustive or exclusive of possible natural philosophies. Inasmuch as the view Plato develops in Timaeus is atomistic and also endorses teleological explanation, for example, his position complicates the picture, and other theories of natural philosophy in the Hellenistic period do not divide so neatly onto one side or the other. Galen has polemical interests in discrediting those who deny the need for qualitatively irreducible faculties or powers employed by Nature to produce beneficial results. In cases where we have only scattered reports and secondhand information, it is difficult to know which views should be counted as atomistic.

The theories of Heracleides of Pontus (4th c. BCE) and Asclepiades of Bythnia (2nd c. BCE) are sometimes likened to atomism. Both—a pupil of Plato, and a medical theorist—are said to have posited the existence of corpuscles they call anarmoi onkoi, i.e. some kind of ‘masses’, but the precise meaning is disputed. Although the theories of Asclepiades in particular are often assimilated to atomism, there is reason to think that Galen's identification of his view as atomistic is polemical, and that Asclepiades' particles are capable of division into infinitely many pieces. Erasistratus of Ceos, one of the great anatomists of the third century BCE, is another of those whom Galen suggests may have been on the atomist side, despite his acceptance of design in nature. Erasistratus had posited that the tissues of the body are composed of a triple braid of vein, artery and nerve: Galen reports that even the tissue of the nerve is made up of this tiny braid. He claims that the Erasistrateans are divided as to whether the elemental nerve tissue is a continuous mass or is composed of small particles like those of the atomists.

One of the most prominent writers on mechanics in antiquity, Hero of Alexandria (1st c. CE), is often regarded as an atomist. In the introduction to his Pneumatica, he describes matter as made up of particles with spaces between them. However, Hero's account of pneumatic effects involving the compression of air—discovered by Ctesibius—seems to depend on the deformation of elastic particles which can be compressed artificially but will spring back to their original shape quite vehemently. If so, his account denies a fundamental tenet of classical atomism, that atoms do not change in their intrinsic properties like shape.


The sections of this Bibliography correspond to the sections of the entry.

For works on Leucippus, Democritus, Epicurus and Lucretius, see the relevant articles in this encyclopedia. This bibliography focuses on sources relevant to other figures mentioned in this article:

A. General

B. Atomism before Leucippus

C. & D. Plato, Platonists and Xenocrates:

E. Minima Naturalia

F. Diodorus Cronus

G. Followers of Democritus and Epicurus

H. Atomism and Particle Theories in the Sciences

I. Atomism in other traditions

Atomist theories are also found in classical Islamic and Indian philosophy:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle | atomism: 17th to 20th century | Democritus | Epicurus | Leucippus | Lucretius | Plato | Pythagoras | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes


I wish to thank the editor John Cooper and Tim O'Keefe for helpful comments and suggestions, and Patrick S. O'Donnell and Robert Wisnovsky for bibliographical references.