Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Sep 8, 2009

Attention is involved in the selective directedness of our mental lives. The nature of this selectivity is one of the principal points of disagreement between the extant theories of attention. Some of the most influential theories treat the selectivity of attention as resulting from limitations in the brain's capacity to process the complex properties of multiple perceptual stimuli. Other theories take the selectivity of attention to be the result of limitations in the thinking subject's capacity to consciously entertain multiple trains of thought. A third group of theories account for attention's selectivity in ways that need not make any reference to limitations in capacity. These latter theories relate the selectivity of attention to the selectivity required to maintain a single coherent course of action, or to competition between mutually inhibitory streams of processing.

The instances of attention differ along several dimensions of variation. In some of its instances attention is a perceptual phenomenon. In other instances it is a phenomenon related to action. In some instances the selectivity of attention is voluntary. In other instances it is driven, quite independently of the subject's volition, by the high salience of attention-grabbing items in the perceptual field. The difficulty of giving a unified theory of attention that applies to attention's voluntary and involuntary instances, and to its perceptual and enactive instances, makes attention a topic of philosophical interest in its own right.

Attention is also a topic of philosophical interest because of its apparent relations to a number of other philosophically puzzling phenomena. There are empirical and theoretical considerations suggesting that attention is closely related to consciousness. It is controversial, however, whether the relationship of consciousness to attention is one of necessity, or sufficiency (or both or neither). There are also considerations linking attention to demonstrative reference, to the development of an understanding of other minds, and to the exercise of the will.

The controversies concerning attention's relation to these other phenomena often include debates about the philosophical significance of theories developed through the empirical study of attention at the neuropsychological level and at the cognitive level.

1. Historical Overview

1.1 Descartes: Attention and Epistemology

In the early modern period a variety of explanatory roles were assigned to attention by a number of different writers. Descartes' Meditations provides one prominent example. The result of Descartes' First Meditation—that everything can be doubted—is in apparent tension with the Third Meditation's claim that clear and distinct ideas are beyond doubt. Descartes introduces a claim about attention to resolve the apparent conflict here. He claims, in his replies to the seventh set of objections, that it is only when we pay attention to them that clear and distinct ideas provide a place where doubt doesn't take hold:

So long as we attend to a truth which we perceive very clearly, we cannot doubt it. But when, as often happens, we are not attending to any truth in this way, then even though we remember that we have previously perceived many things clearly, nevertheless there will be nothing which we may not justly doubt so long as we do not know that whatever we clearly perceive is true. (‘Replies to Objections’, 309)

This passage is usually cited for the point that it makes about memory, but the picture that Descartes is outlining is clearly one in which attention has an important epistemic role to play: clarity and distinctness realize their epistemic potential only when attention is paid to the ideas that have them. Those ideas can be doubted, as, in accordance with the policy of the First Meditation they must be, but that doubt cannot be maintained by a properly attentive thinker. The crucial first move in Descartes' epistemology—the move from radical doubt to certainty about the truth of particular clear and distinct ideas—is, therefore, a transition that is mediated by attention.

1.2 Berkeley: Attention and Abstraction

A quite different explanatory role is assigned to attention in Bishop Berkeley's Principles of Human Knowledge, although here again we find that it is in order to remove an epistemological glitch that the notion of attention is brought in. In the Introduction to Principles of Human Knowledge Berkeley rejects Locke's claim that there exist such things as Abstract Ideas. But Berkeley retains Locke's commitment to the core empiricist claim that the thinking of thoughts is always a matter of handling ideas received from experience. This would seem to lead to the conclusion that it is not possible to think about abstractia, but Berkeley realizes that that conclusion is unacceptable. It is, as he says, perfectly possible to think about the properties of triangles in general.

In the second edition of the Principles Berkeley added a couple of sentences to the Introduction that make it clear that it is attention and, in particular, the withholding of attention, that is supposed to explain the possibility of thinking about abstractia without the need to postulate Abstract Ideas. These added sentences tell us that:

[It] must be acknowledged that a man may consider a figure merely as triangular, without attending to the particular qualities of the angles or relations of the sides. So far he may abstract, but this will never prove that he can frame an abstract general, inconsistent idea of a triangle. (1710, Introduction to 2nd edn. §16. emphasis added)

In these sentences Berkeley is clearly not attempting to elaborate a theory of attention. He says nothing more about the idea that attention might enable thought about abstractia.

Berkeley's idea that attention and abstraction are linked was taken up in the second half of the nineteenth century by William Hamilton. Hamilton did not, however, think that the link between attention and abstraction provided the starting point for an explanation of attention, nor of abstraction. This is because he took it that the relationship between the two phenomena was too intimate to be explanatory. He writes that:

Attention and Abstraction are only the same process viewed in different relations. They are, as it were, the positive and negative poles of the same act. (1876, 88)

1.3 Locke: Attention as a Mode of Thought

Descartes and Berkeley each treat attention very briefly, but each assigns attention to a particular explanatory role. Locke's treatment of attention is also a brief one, but he has his own theory of the explanatory role that attention plays, and he goes further than either Descartes or Berkeley in giving us a positive account of what attention is. The account is given as part of the catalogue of ‘Modes of Thinking’ that Locke sets out towards the beginning of Chapter Nineteen of Book Two of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding:

[W]hen ideas float in our mind without any reflection or regard of the understanding, it is that which the French call reverie; our language has scarce a name for it: when the ideas that offer themselves (for, as I have observed in another place, whilst we are awake, there will always be a train of ideas succeeding one another in our minds) are taken notice of, and, as it were, registered in the memory, it is attention: when the mind with great earnestness, and of choice, fixes its view on any idea, considers it on all sides, and will not be called off by the ordinary solicitation of other ideas, it is that we call “intention,” or “study.” (1689, II, 19 §1 emphasis added)

In addition to providing these quick theories of ‘reverie’, ‘attention’ and ‘intention or study’, the very same sentence of Locke's Essay provides theories of ‘remembrance’, ‘recollection’, ‘contemplation’, ‘sleep’, ‘dreaming’ and ‘ecstasy’. It is significant that Locke's account of attention is given so briefly, and significant that it goes by as part of a crowd of theories of these various other mental phenomena. Locke is not here engaging in an uncharacteristically slapdash piece of rapid-fire theorizing. His intention in going through this catalogue is to establish that these are topics for which no new substantive theory is needed. They are, in Locke's theory, simply ‘modes of thinking’. ‘Reverie’, ‘study’ etc. are not names for independent phenomena, existing in their own right. They are just various names that thinking is given when it takes place in various ways.

One consequence of Locke's treatment of attention as a mode of thinking is that once we have a theory of thinking before us we need no further theory to account for how attention, contemplation, study etc. are possible. (Just as, to use the classic example of ‘modes’, we need no substantive independent theory, once we have a theory of walking, to explain how limping, pacing or ambling are possible.) We need to say something in giving an analysis of the nature of modes, but the thing we say can be something brief, along the lines indicated by Locke. We don't need a theory that postulates any substances or processes specific to the explanation of attention.

Locke's modal view of attention has the consequence that no substantive theory of attention is needed once our theory of thinking is in place, but it also entails, and for the same reason, that attention cannot figure in the explanation of how thinking itself is possible.

1.4 The Eighteenth and Nineteenth Centuries: Attention in Perception, in Action and in Reflective Thought

Locke viewed attention as an explanatorily slight phenomenon—a mode of thought that is not in need of much explanation, nor capable of providing much. Over the course of the eighteenth century theories of attention moved away from that view. Attention was increasingly treated as a phenomenon with explanatory work to do, and so as a phenomenon for which a substantive independent theory needed to be given. The attempt to provide such a theory got properly underway in 1738 when Christian Wolff's textbook on psychology was the first to devote a whole chapter to the topic of attention (see Hatfield, 1995, for an excellent discussion).

During this period the explanatory remit for theories of attention broadened in two directions. The first move was away from the idea that attention acts on already-received ideas and towards the idea that attention is involved in the initial reception of those ideas. Locke had characterized attention as the registration of already-received ideas into memory. But by 1769, when Henry Home Kames added the appendix of ‘Terms Defined or Explained’ to his Elements of Criticism, attention's role as a regulator of cognitive input was regarded as definitive of it:

Attention is that state of mind which prepares one to receive impressions. According to the degree of attention objects make a strong or weak impression. Attention is requisite even to the simple act of seeing. (1769, 18)

As well as beginning to assign to attention a role in the explanation of the reception of ideas, eighteenth century theories also moved towards including a role for attention in the production of behaviour. This is particularly clear in Dugald Stewart's 1792 Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind. Stewart retains Locke's view that attention has an essential role to play in determining which things get stored in memory. He adds to that view the claim that attention has a role in determining which particular memories get recalled, writing that “Some attention [is] necessary for any act of memory whatever.” (1792, 53). Stewart also claims that attention has a role in the explanation of the development and deployment of at least some skilled behaviours. The example that Stewart gives here is that of ‘the dexterity of jugglers’ which, he says, “merits a greater degree of attention from philosophers than it has yet attracted” (62).

In the century between Locke's Essay and Stewart's Elements, then, attention ceases to be seen merely as a certain mode of idea-handling, and comes to be seen as a phenomenon in need of its own explanation, and with a role to play in the explanation of perception, in the explanation of memory storage and recall, and in the explanation of skilled action.

In the century after Stewart's Elements the diversity among the phenomena that attention was expected to explain continued to grow and it continued to include phenomena from across the psychological spectrum from perception, to thought, to action. By the end of the nineteenth century, in what was a crucial period in the development of scientific psychology, there were some psychologists, such as E.B. Titchener, who took the role of attention in perception and in ‘sensory clearness’ to be its most essential feature (see Titchener, 1908, 1910); others, such as Alexander Bain, who thought that the essential feature of attention was its role in action, (Bain, 1888); and a third group, of whom G.F. Stout was the most prominent example, who argued that the primary job for a theory of attention was to explain attention's role in reflective thought (see Stout, 1891).

As a result of this diversity in their conceptions of attention's explanatory remit (and as a result of the lack an established methodology) the debates between exponents of these various psychological theories of attention got themselves into what was acknowledged to be a ‘chaotic state’ (Pillsbury, 1906).

1.5 William James and His Contemporaries: Deflationary Theories

The diversity of explanatory roles assigned to attention in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries meant that theorizing about attention at the end of the nineteenth century was in a chaotic state. The ambition for theorists of attention writing at the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth centuries was to get this chaos into order. The theories of attention proposed in this period therefore tended to take the form of attempts to reveal attention as something less mysterious. This ambition to give a ‘nothing but…’ reduction of attention can be seen in the most influential work from this period: William James' The Principles of Psychology (1890).

One aspect of James' approach is to play down the more complex perceptual aspects of attention. His chapter on attention includes a discussion of experiments into what we now call ‘subitizing’—that is into the ability to perceive the cardinality of small stimulus sets without needing to count their members—but James writes of these experiments that it “is obvious that such observations decide nothing at all about our attention, properly so called” (407).

Although James plays down attention's role in complex perceptual phenomena, he does assign attention to an important explanatory role in the production of behaviour. He claims, for example, that ‘Volition is nothing but attention’ (424). But when James makes such claims it is as part of a general project that seeks always to be deflationary where possible. When James associated attention with volition it was as a way of suggesting how volition could be given a deflationary treatment, not as a way of inflating attention's explanatory role.

James's somewhat deflationary approach to attention's explanatory remit means that when it comes to giving an account of the ‘intimate nature of the attention process’ James can identify two fairly simple processes which, he claims, ‘probably coexist in all our concrete attentive acts’. and which ‘possibly form in combination a complete reply’ to the question of attention's ‘intimate nature’ (1890, 411). The processes that James identifies are:

  1. The accommodation or adjustment of the sensory organs, and
  2. The anticipatory preparation from within of the ideational centres concerned with the object to which attention is paid. (411)

The first of these processes is reasonably familiar. By ‘the accommodation or adjustment of the sensory organs’ James means such processes as pointing one's ears in the right direction, bringing one's eyes into focus, taking a sniff, and so on.

James's talk of ‘anticipatory preparation’ of ‘ideation centres’ is a little less clear, but the point is again a quite straightforward one. What James has in mind here is simply imagination. His claim is that when attention doesn't involve adjusting one's sense organs it consists in imagining the things or actions that one is attending to, or looking for.

James illustrates his claim about attention's link to imagination with an example from Hermann von Helmholtz. The example is an important one for James and it illustrates some important features of attention that subsequent theorists have tended to neglect. The example involves the variety of attention that needs to be paid when trying to discern the overtones in a note played on the piano. Helmholtz asks us to sit at the piano and to play a G, then, imagining the sound that we have just heard, to play a low C. Doing this, it is claimed, enables one to hear that G is discernibly there (as the third overtone) within the sound produced when C is played. Helmholtz's claim, which James endorses, is that the kind of attention that is paid when listening for an overtone is constituted by the imagining of what that overtone would sound like. James goes onto claim that there is a wide range of cases in which paying attention to what one is doing consists in this same sort of preparatory imaginative engagement.

Here, as in his more frequently discussed treatment of emotion, it is distinctive of James's approach that he tries to account for a large-scale personal-level psychological phenomenon in a realist but somewhat revisionary way, so as to be able to give his account using relatively simple and unmysterious explanatory resources. An alternative deflationary approach—one which James explicitly contrasted with his own—is the approach taken in 1886 by F.H. Bradley.

Bradley advocated a view according to which attention is not the sort of phenomenon for which an independent and substantive theory can or needs to be given. Bradley doesn't develop this point in much detail, and it is a point on which he would later change his mind, but in his 1886 article, ‘Is there a special activity of attention?’, Bradley is concerned with arguing that a project such as James's one of identifying particular processes as the attention-constituting ones was wrongheaded. He claims that no particular attention-processes can be identified since:

Any function whatever of the body or the mind will be active attention if it is prompted by an interest and brings about the result of our engrossment with its product. There is no primary act of attention, there is no specific act of attention, there is no one kind of act of attention at all. (1886, 316)

Although Bradley does not use the Lockean vocabulary, (and although James himself does not seem to have taken Bradley in this way) Bradley's position here has much in common with Locke's claim that attention is a mode. Bradley's position, like Locke's, is that what's essential to an instance of attention is not the matter of which processes are taking place, but the facts about how the things that happen happen.

Other writers contemporary with Bradley and James took different approaches to the project of giving a deflationary explanation of attention. In Theodule Ribot's 1888 book La Psychologie De L'Attention the attempt to explain attention took the form of what we would now classify as behaviourism. In 1888 behaviourism had not yet been established as a general approach in philosophical or psychological theories of the mind, but Ribot's suggestion that attention's behavioural manifestations are essential to it is nonetheless recognizable as an early articulation of behaviourism in a strong form:

Are the movements of the face, the body, and the limbs and the respiratory modifications that accompany attention, simple effects, outward marks, as is usually supposed? Or are they, on the contrary, the necessary conditions, the constituent elements, the indispensable factors of attention? Without hesitation we accept the second thesis.(1888, 19)

A similar approach, although somewhat more moderate, was taken by Alexander Bain, who identified attention, not with its behavioural manifestations themselves, but with truncated versions of the motor-control processes that typically bring about those behavioural manifestations: processes ‘stopping short of the actual movement performed by the organ’ (Bain, 1888, 371). Much as Ribot's view can be seen as an early version of behaviourism, Bain's view can be seen as an early version of the motor-based approaches to attention found in the current literature (see Section 2.8 below).

1.6 The Twentieth Century: Locating Attention at a Bottleneck in Information Processing

The variety among the deflationist explanatory approaches that characterized the theories of attention offered in the nineteenth century gave way in the early twentieth century to a period in which one explanatory tactic was dominant: the tactic of behaviourism. Behaviourists tended to neglect attention, but they did not ignore it entirely. John Dashiell's 1928 Fundamentals of Objective Psychology, for example, is a behaviourist work that attempts to account for attention “as a form of posturing” (Ch. 10, §3). The project of identifying a behaviour with which to explain attention was, nonetheless, an understandably unpopular one. As Gilbert Ryle notes, it is not only attention, but also ‘heed concepts’ more generally, that resist simple behaviourist analysis:

[W]hen a man is described as driving carefully, whistling with concentration or eating absent-mindedly the special character of his activity seem to elude the observer, the camera and the Dictaphone. Perhaps knitted brows, taciturnity and fixed gaze may be evidence of intentness; but these can be simulated, or they can be purely habitual. (1949, 133)

In the middle of the twentieth century behaviourism's dominance waned, cognitive psychology established itself, and a new theoretical approach to the explanation of attention was developed. These three developments were intimately related to one another. Instrumental to all three was the publication in 1958 of Donald Broadbent's Perception and Communication.

The year prior to Perception and Communication's publication had seen B.F. Skinner's attempt, in Verbal Behaviour (1957), to apply a behaviourist explanatory approach to distinctively human aspects of cognition. Skinner's project in that book failed, and Noam Chomsky's famous 1959 review of the book made the failure conspicuous. Chomsky's own work in Syntactic Structures (1957) went some way towards establishing the new cognitive paradigm for psychology by showing how internal processing could be theorized by describing transformations on representations in abstraction from the question of how those representations were realized. Donald Broadbent's distinctive contribution to the overthrow of behaviourism was to show how the move from behavioural data to the postulation of a particular cognitive architecture could be disciplined by the then-new strategy of importing into psychology the intellectual resources used in thinking about information technology. The year in which Broadbent's book was published was the year in which the integrated circuit chip was invented, but it was also the year in which Subscriber Trunk Dialling was introduced to UK telephone exchanges. It was the technology of the telephone exchange that most naturally suggested itself as a metaphor for attention at the time when Broadbent was writing.

Towards the end of Perception and Communication Broadbent explicitly sets out the claim that the theoretical resources developed in thinking about the transmission of information through telephone exchanges provide the basis for an alternative to behaviourism. He also attacks the positivistic methodological principles that had given many behaviourists their motivation. But the central lesson from Broadbent's work, so far as the theory of attention goes, is a lesson that he takes to be independent of this attack on behaviourism and its positivistic foundations. At an early stage in Perception and Communication Broadbent remarks that:

Perhaps the point of permanent value which will remain in psychology if the fashion for communication theory wanes, will be the emphasis on problems of capacity. [...] The fact that any given channel has a limit is a matter of central importance to communication engineers, and it is correspondingly forced on the attention of psychologists who use their terms. (1958, 5)

This introduction of the notion of capacity limitations into discussions of perception and attention was, as Broadbent predicted, hugely and permanently influential.

Broadbent claimed not only that the human brain is subject to capacity limitations of the sort that communications engineers had learnt to theorize, he claimed also that these limitations are clustered so that there is a single bottleneck in capacity that is especially critical to the brain's information handling. The bottleneck was said to occur at the junction of two systems operating in series. The first system has a large capacity for information processing and operates automatically on all of the stimuli with which the subject is presented. The second system has a much smaller capacity and it therefore has to be deployed selectively.

Those who followed Broadbent took it that the bottleneck that results from the connection of these two systems corresponds to attention in the sense that, when a representation of a stimulus passes through that bottleneck, the stimulus ipso facto counts as one to which attention is paid.

Broadbent himself was cautious about presenting his claims about capacity-bottlenecks as a theory of attention. The word ‘attention’ occurs rarely in Perception and Communication. Broadbent's later book, Decision and Stress (1971), does describe his earlier experiments as ‘studies of attention’, but here too Broadbent prefers to talk about the phenomenon observed in the lab as ‘selective perception’ (chapter V) or ‘vigilance’ (chapters II and III). In an article from 1982, entitled, ‘Task Combination and Selective Intake of Information’, he admits that: “The topic of this paper is one that is often termed ‘attention’, and it may seem unduly artificial to have given it a more cumbrous title.” But he goes on to reassert his qualms:

‘Attention’ is a word in ordinary language, that can reasonably be used as a label for experiments in a particular area. Yet it has also been used as a theoretical concept, a mysterious asset or energy which is sometimes attached to human functions and sometimes not. This use of attention [...] is not very helpful, and avoiding the word in the title is a step towards clarity. (1982, 253)

When Broadbent does use the word ‘attention’ it is mostly in discussions of attention shifting. His view, at least in his early work, seems to have been that, where there is a bottleneck in our information processing capacity, there must be additional mechanisms that control how these limited capacity resources will be deployed. These additional mechanisms of bottleneck-control seem to have been what Broadbent thought of as the attention mechanisms. He never took himself to have given a theory of them. Nor were they the topic that was at issue in the debates about attention that Broadbent prompted. Those debates were concerned with questions about the nature and location of the bottleneck itself.

In the decades following Broadbent a great many psychologists devoted themselves to the task of locating the attentional bottleneck that he had postulated and almost all of the psychologists writing at this time were guided to some degree by Broadbent's two-systems-and-a-bottleneck picture of perceptual processing. The question of whether a given task is attention demanding was understood to depend on the question of whether the performance of that task requires the engagement of the small-capacity system that comes after the bottleneck of attention. Research into the attention demands of particular tasks therefore became another way by which to approach the issue of where the attentional bottleneck is located. Broadbent's two-systems-and-a-bottleneck model was frequently questioned, but for most research into attention in the second half of the twentieth century it was very much the orthodox view. Some aspects of it remain orthodox.

2. Theories of Attention

2.1 Capacity-Limitation Theories

Psychologists attempting to produce a theory of attention in the nineteen sixties and seventies were highly influenced by Donald Broadbent's picture of attention as corresponding to a bottleneck in information processing capacity resulting from the connection of two seperate perceptual processing systems. The first piece of business for these psychologists was to locate this attentional bottleneck by determining which sorts of processing are done by the large capacity, pre-bottleneck system and which by the small capacity, post-bottleneck system. Debates between these psychologists gave rise to various selection-based theories of attention.

2.1.1 Early Selection Theory

Broadbent's own account of the distribution of processing between the pre-attentional system and the post-attentional system defines the ‘early selection’ theory of attention. He claimed that only very simple properties are detected by the large capacity system and that any semantic properties, and any properties relating to the particular identity of a stimulus, are detected only after representations of the stimulus have passed through the attentional-bottleneck and into the smaller capacity system.

The personal-level consequences of this early selection theory of attention are that we can recognize what things are and what they mean only if we are paying attention to them, but can detect the simple physical properties of things even when paying no attention to them. The theory can be thought of as a communication-theoretic rendering of two intuitive and readily confirmed ideas: The first is that one has no immediate control over one's awareness of simple features of one's environment, such as the fact that there are people talking in the next room. The second is that the details of these things—such as the semantic content of the conversation—can only be detected for the one or two things to which one is paying attention.

The early selection theory also entails, more problematically, that the semantic properties of an unattended item remain unrepresented in the nervous system, and so that those properties can't have psychological effects. According to this view, therefore, the semantic features of unattended items cannot explain why those items attract attention to themselves, if they do. This aspect of the theory was what its opponents most frequently objected to.

2.1.2 Late Selection Theory

The chief rivals of Broadbent's early selection theory were the ‘late selectionists’, who claimed that all (or almost all) perceivable properties are detected automatically by a large capacity system that operates on all of the stimuli with which the subject is presented. According to the late selection theory of attention the consequences of passing through the bottleneck of attention into the post-attentive small capacity system are only (1) that the subject comes to be conscious of the contents that the large capacity system has already succeeded in encoding and (2) that those contents come to be stored in working memory (Deutsch and Deutsch, 1963).

Although it was originally proposed against the background of Broadbent's now superseded theoretical framework, it would be too quick to dismiss the late selection theory as an obsolete one. The theory has much in common with some plausible and empirically well-supported views found in the current literature. Jesse Prinz, for example, shares the late selectionist's view that attention's primary role is not in managing limited perceptual processing resources, but in projecting already-processed representations to working memory. Prinz's view, varying a theme from the work of Stanislas Dehaene, is that this projection to working memory is what makes it the case that the content represented comes to conscious awareness (Prinz, 2005, Dehaene et al., 2006).

In its traditional form, the central component of the late-selection theory was that the effect of withdrawing attention from a stimulus is that the stimulus is processed without the subject's awareness, rather than not being processed at all. This component of the view has, to some extent, been vindicated. The claim that unattended stimuli are subjected to some processing of which the subject lacks awareness is now uncontroversial. We know that unattended stimuli are processed in a way that allows at least some of their semantic properties to be encoded since we know that the semantic properties of unattended stimuli can produce negative priming effects (Tipper and Driver, 1988). The semantic properties of unattended items have such effects despite the fact that subjects are unaware of what those properties are.

Although the traditional late selection theory is right in taking it that inattention can lead to properties being encoded without our awareness, rather than not being encoded at all, the theory is also committed to the strong claim that attention's only effects are in determining what gets remembered and experienced, and so that there are no attentional effects on the initial perceptual processing to which stimuli are subjected. These claims we now know to be false. In an important and surprising experiment O'Connor et al., used fMRI to compare neural activity in subjects who, in various task conditions, were presented with high and low contrast checkerboard patterns in one or other half of the visual field (O'Connor et al. 2002). In some conditions subjects had to perform a task involving these checkerboard patterns. In other conditions the patterns were irrelevant to the task that the subjects were performing (and in a third condition no pattern was presented, but the subjects were attending to the screen in anticipation of a pattern that was about to be presented). The results of these comparisons revealed that even in the first parts of neural circuitry that information from the retina passes through on its way to the visual cortex—the Lateral Geniculate Nuclei—there is a difference in the baserate of neural activity and a difference in the response that stimuli elicit, depending on what the subject is attending to. These findings indicate that attention's effects are not limited to cortical loci that are upstream from a late process of attentional selection. They refute any late-selection theory according to which the selectivity of attention is entirely a ‘late process’, occuring after initial perceptual encoding is complete.

2.1.3 Other Capacity-Limitation Theories

The early and late selection theories dominated discussions of attention in the decades following Broadbent's seminal work, but by the beginning of the nineteen nineties it had become clear that the debate between advocates of the early selection theory and advocates of the late selection theory was fruitless. Several diagnoses have been proposed as explanations of where the debate went wrong.

Although it is agreed that something went wrong in the debate between early and late selection theories the current literature contains several capacity-limitation based theories that share assumptions with the theories from that problematic debate: There are theories according to which attention corresponds to a capacity bottleneck, much as Broadbent thought, but which say that it is a bottleneck that moves, depending on the demands of the task at hand (Lavie & Tsal, 1994). And there are many theories that retain Broadbent's idea that attentional selectivity is the result of capacity limitations, but that reject the early and late selection theories because they reject the idea that those capacity limitations are clustered into a single bottleneck. In some cases this is because they take the selectivity of attention to be the result of multiple bottlenecks in processing capacity (see, e.g., Johnston and McCann, 2006). In other cases it is because the current theorists see capacity limitations as occuring throughout the processing stream, and not as clustered into bottlenecks at all (see Driver, 2001, for a suggestion along these lines). It is unclear to what extent it ought to be considered problematic that these theories share assumptions with the now-rejected early and late selection theories.

Current theories can retain their commitment to Broadbent's idea that attention is the result of a capacity bottleneck only because they take it that is was not this idea that led the debate between early and late selection theories into fruitlessness. Various theorists suggest various alternative diagnoses of the fruitlessness of the early late selction debate, not all of which are compatible with one another. One diagnosis that several recent theorists agree upon is that the early/late debate was fruitless because the terms ‘early’ and ‘late’ are themselves problematic. If perceptual processing occurs in a parallel processing architecture without any prevailing direction of information flow then there is no sense in labling one part of that architecture as earlier or later than any other. If the attentional bottleneck is located in a system that has such an architecture then it may be this that explains why there was no satisfactory answer to the question of whether attentional selection is early or late. It is with this thought in mind that several writers have suggested that the failure of the debate between early and late selection theories was owing to the fact that that debate requires us to make an assumption about the linearity of the processing stream in which selection occurs (see, e.g., Prinz and Hommel, 2002, 3).

The claim that it was a problematic assumption about linearity that led the early/late selection debate into fruitlessness recieved its most influential treatment in the work of Alan Allport (esp. Allport, 1992). Allport identifies several problematic assumptions that the early/late selection debate requires. His characterization of the assumption about linearity that he takes to be problematic is as the claim that:

[T]he processing of nonsemantic attributes (i.e. the processing of attributes other than symbolic or categorical identity) occurs earlier in a logical/causal sequence of operations than does any semantic or categorical processing. (1992, 187)

This is not immediately satisfactory. The assumption about linearity that Allport identifies does not seem, on the face of it, to be a problematic one. There is nothing to be objected to in the claim that the situations in which we encounter a written word and come to be in a position to know what that word means are situations in which our sensory transducers respond firstly to simple nonsemantic properties of the word. In order for creatures like us to detect the semantic properties of written words, it is necessary for our information processing systems to first encode some information about the simple spatial properties of the lines on the page. This information does then get passed on to subsequent processing stages in which more complex properties, concerned with semantics and stimulus identity, get processed. If this sort of linearity is what Allport was taking issue with then it seems he must have been mistaken. There is nothing problematic about the idea that there is this much linearity in the processing that any given stimulus is subjected to.

Nor is there anything unscientific about it. It continues to be entirely normal for neuroscientists to refer to the processing that takes place in occipital brain areas as ‘early’ and the processing in frontal areas as ‘late’. In a much-cited review of neuroimaging work on attention Sabine Kastner and Leslie Ungerleider, for example, speak of:

… an increase in the complexity of processing as activity proceeds anteriorly through the ventral stream into the temporal lobe. Whereas posterior regions in cortex are preferentially activated during the processing of object attributes, such as colors or scrambled objects and faces, more anterior regions are activated selectively during the processing of intact objects and faces. (2000, 319)

Since this much linearity remains in our current thinking about the architecture of perceptual processing we cannot coherently blame an assumption about this much linearity for the troubles that led to the fruitlessness of the debate between early and late selectionists.

That is not to say that the early/late selection debate was entirely free of problematic assumptions relating to linearity—only that psychology has not yet settled upon a satisfactory account of the way in which assumptions about linearity led the early/late debate into trouble. When, following Broadbent, we think about hierarchical perceptual processing while bearing in mind the communications engineer's concerns about capacity limitations it becomes natural to make some additional assumptions about the way in which this hierarchically organized architecture supports personal-level cognition. These additional assumptions are more plausibly blamed for the early/late debate's problems.

Adopting the point of view of the communications engineer who is concerned with capacity limitations makes it natural to expect the cognitive architecture to be arranged in such a way that once a piece of information has been represented there is no need to represent it again. Given that some of the physical properties of a thing must first be represented in order for the semantic properties of that thing to be detected by the subject, it is natural for the communications engineer to suppose that no further representation of these physical properties needs to be generated in order for the subject to become aware of them, so that a subject who is experiencing the semantic properties of a stimulus must have been through a process that gives him an experience of the thing's simple spatial properties. This additional supposition would be a mistake. In fact, the brain represents the physical properties of stimuli in multiple, parallel, somewhat overlapping systems, only some of which put the subject in a position to think about the properties that they represent. In order to get to a representation of the meaning of the word on a page, the subject's brain must represent that word's physical properties, but it turns out that the brain's representation of simple physical properties doesn't entail that the subject will be in a position to form thoughts about those properties. The subject's access to those properties might require that they be represented all over again, in some parallel system. From the point of view of a communications engineer who is concerned with the management of limited capacity channels this seems strangely profligate. It is this—not, as Allport suggested, an assumption about linearity per se, but an assumption about the linearity of the processes that support personal level thinking—that creates problems for the early/late debate.

Once the problematic assumption about linearity has been made precise, however, we see that it can't be satisfactory to credit the entire collapse of the early/late debate to this assumption. The falsity of the assumption about the linearity of the processes supporting personal-level awareness does not undermine the very idea that the early/late debate is a meaningful one. The problems it creates are largely methodological. The falsity of that assumption means that we can't infer from a lack of personal-level awareness of some content to the absence of representations encoding that content. It also means that Broadbent was wrong in suppose that the psychological effects of unattended stimuli can only depend on those properties that the inattentive subject can be aware of. But these are methodological problems and they don't, by themselves, imply that the debate between the early selection theory and the late selection theory must have been misconceived. The situation that we find ourselves in is, then, a somewhat unhappy one. Everybody agrees that there was something misconceived about the debate between the two theories of attention that dominated the decades following Broadbent's reintroduction of attention to the psychological agenda. The ongoing influence of Broadbent's selection theory, and of the early/late debate, is often noted and sometimes lamented (Driver, 2001, 56). But nobody is clear about whether the elements of those theories that are retained in current theorizing are problematic ones.

2.4 Feature Integration Theory

In the early nineteen eighties Anne Treisman and her collaborators identified the existence of ‘the binding problem’, and described a process that could solve that problem. Treisman proposed that attention be identified with this process. This proposal is known as the Feature Integration Theory of attention. The Feature Integration Theory has been hugely influential, not only as a theory of attention, but also as the framework that introduced and regimented research into the independently interesting question of the binding problem.

Here is a recent statement by Treisman of the way in which the binding problem arises:

Sensory information arrives in parallel as a variety of heterogeneous hints, (shapes, colors, motions, smells and sounds) encoded in partly modular systems. Typically many objects are present at once. The result is an urgent case of what has been labelled the binding problem. We must collect the hints, bind them into the right spatial and temporal bundles, and then interpret them to specify their real world origins. (2003, 97)

The problem that Treisman is here articulating can be made vivid by considering an example. Suppose we have a subject who is presented with a red tomato and a green apple, both at the same time. This visual input is, as Treisman says, initially broken up for specialized distributed processing—so, for example, one part of the brain is responsible for detecting the shapes of things, a different part is responsible for detecting their colours. The shape detecting centres represent the fact that a tomato-shaped thing is present, and they represent the fact that an apple-shaped thing is present. The colour detecting centres represent the fact that a red thing is present, and the fact that a green thing is present. But the subject, if he is a normal human, knows more than is implied by these four facts: He knows that the red thing is the tomato-shaped thing and the green thing the apple-shaped thing. To know this he must have a way of ‘binding’ the representation of red in the colour centre with the representation of the tomato shape in the shape centre. The binding problem is the problem of knowing how to put together the properties that are detected in seperate specialized detection centres.

Treisman's proposed solution exploits the fact that spatial representations are ubiquitous, and the idea that there is only one thing to be seen in any one place at any one time. If the centre for detecting colours detects red at place one, and green at place two, and if the centre for detecting shape detects a tomato shape at place one, and an apple shape at place two, then, given the principle that there is a maximum of one visible object per place per time, the binding problem can be solved. Treisman proposes that we achieve a correctly bound representation by moving a variously sized ‘window’ from one location in the perceptual scene to another. This window blocks out the information from all but a single location, and all the features found at that location can then be ‘bound’ as being features of the same object. The area covered by the window within which features are bound is taken to correspond to the region to which attention is being paid.

There is more than one way to understand the explanatory import of Treisman's claim that the window of attention corresponds to the window within which features are bound. Treisman's early work presents the claim as an attempt to identify the processes of attention (by telling us that they are the processes of feature integration). In her later work the explanation being offered is no longer simply one in which it is attention that occupies the role of explanadum and the binding processes that occupy the role of explanans. Her later claim is that solving the binding problem is one role for the kind of selectivity that attention enables.

In some recent work the Feature Integration Theory has been pressed into the service of more ambitious explanatory goals. The theory plays an important role in John Campbell's 2002 attempt, in Reference and Consciousness, to use attention to explain how the reference of demonstrative expressions gets fixed by their producers and understood by their consumers (see section 3.2). Treisman's own recent work has suggested, albeit tentatively, that descendants of the Feature Integration Theory may provide part of the explanation for “the bound, unitary, interpreted, personal view of the world of subjective experience” (Treisman, 2003, 111). She goes on to suggest, again tentatively, that the sort of explanation that such a theory provides “should give us all the information there is about the conditions that create consciousness” (op cit).

Opposed to those who think that a theory of feature binding will be a large component in our theory of attention, or of the unity of consciousness, or of anything else, are a number of philosophers who deny that feature binding creates a problem that needs serious cognitive apparatus to solve it. Such claims have been made for various reasons. They are generally made as part of large-scale revisionary proposals for the conceptual framework of cognitive neuroscience. Kevin O'Regan and Alve Noë's rejection of the binding problem ‘as, in essence, a pseudo-problem’ (O'Regan and Noë, 2001, 967) comes as part of a general attack on the idea that perception requires the representation of the thing perceived. M.R. Bennett and P.M.S. Hacker, in their book-length critique of the philosophical foundations of neuroscience, claim that the notions of representation and information that enjoy currency in neuroscience are subject to various confusions, and that these confusions lead to it being ‘widespread’ for neuroscientists to make “confused statements of the so-called binding problem” (Bennett and Hacker, 2003, 14). These debates about the status of the binding problem (reviewed by Plate, 2007) turn on foundational issues for the cognitive sciences generally. They have ceased to be specifically concerned with the explanation of attention.

2.5 Coherence Theories

The view that the function of attention is the management of limitations in the brain's information processing capacity has been an orthodox one since Donald Broadbent introduced it in the nineteen fifties, but it has sometimes been called into question. In the nineteen seventies Ulric Neisser and his collaborators carried out a series of experiments showing that, when appropriately trained, a subject can perform two attention-involving tasks concurrently without much interference between them (Hirst et al., 1980, Neisser, 1976). Neisser interpreted these experiments as suggesting that, insofar as there is a bottleneck that attention is needed to manage, it must often be a bottleneck in behavioural coordination, rather than in simple information processing capacity. Simple bodily limitations are what prevent us from looking in two directions at one time, or from writing and throwing a ball with the same hand. Neisser's suggestion was that in many cases cognitive processing was selective, not as a result of limitations in processing capacity, but only in so far as bodily limitations required it to be.

In two papers from 1987, authored individually but published in the same volume, Odmar Neumann and Alan Allport develop a similar idea. Whereas Neisser emphasizes the constraints that are imposed on cognition by the need to manage a single body, Neumann and Allport emphasize the constraints that are placed on cognition by the need to maintain a coherent course of action. They describe their position as a ‘selection-for-action’ theory. If we think of ‘action’ here as referring to bodily behaviour then the selection-for-action theory is very similar to Neisser's view. But Neumann and Allport's point retains its force if we extend the notion of action to include deliberate mental activities, such as puzzle-solving, for which no bodily limitations are in play. Maintaining relevance and appropriateness requires selectivity, quite apart from any limitations of bodily performance or of information processing capacity.

According to Neumann and Allport's view the function of attention is not the management of capacity limitations. It is, instead, the management of capacity excess. It is because we can process multiple stimuli that we can be distracted by them, and because we can be distracted by them, not because we can't process them, that we need mechanisms of attention to provide selectivity and focus. Attention, on this view, serves to lend coherence to, and to prevent competition and interference between, the activity of components in a system that has the capacity to handle far more stimuli than those pertaining to the subject's current task. Such a view contrasts sharply with Broadbent's conception of attentional selectivity as capacity-bottleneck management.

Despite the availability of this highly non-Broadbentian conception of attention's function the Broadbentian idea that attention's selectivity serves to manage limitations in processing capacity continues to be regarded by many psychologists as incontrovertible. The claim that “Because the visual system does not have the capacity to process all inputs simultaneously, there must exist attentional processes that help the visual system select some inputs” continues to be treated as a platitude of the sort that can be used as an uncontroversial opening sentence when introducing one's research. (The example just given comes from the beginning of Vecera (2000), but many more examples of the same claim can easily be found.)

2.6 Competition Theories

Coherence theories, such as those of Neisser, Neumann and Allport, suggest that there are functions for attention other than the management of limitations in processing capacity. These theories are natural accompaniments to views according to which the mechanisms of attentional selection are something other than capacity bottlenecks.

The clearest non-bottleneck mechanisms for achieving selectivity are competitions. The selectivity of a competitive mechanism need not have anything to do with bottlenecks, or with any other limitations of processing capacity: Well organized competitions can always select one winner, however good and however numerous the competitors.

Competition based mechanisms for achieving selectivity come in at least two varieties: In a simple race mechanism each of the competitors independently completes a process that is comparable along some dimension of variation with the processes completed by the other competitors. The competitor that achieves the highest value on the relevant dimension of variation is selected as the winner. In a struggle the competitors don't just get on with their own processing in the hope that they will do it better than each of the other competitors. Instead the active suppression of other competitors is a part of the process that each competitor carries out. Simple race models of attention have been proposed (Shibuya and Bundesen, 1988, Bundesen, 1987) but our best current theories supplement the simple race mechanism with some components of mutual struggle, or with additional processes of top-down control (see Bundesen and Habekost, 2008).

One suggestion for a supplemented-competition mechanism for attentional selectivity is the biased-competition model elaborated in several works by Robert Desimone, John Duncan and John Reynolds. The biased-competition model accounts for various attention-involving effects at the personal and at the sub-personal level as being effects that arise from numerous struggles between the different stimuli that fall within the variously sized receptive fields of neurons throughout the perceptual processing hierarchy. Each one of these struggles is hypothesized as being biased, although not settled outright, by a top-down attention-specific signal (Desimone and Duncan, 1995, Reynolds and Desimone, 2001).

We have said that competition theories are selective in ways that do not involve limitations in capacity, and that such theories are therefore natural accompaniments to the selection-for-action type views (which, as we saw in Section 2.5, involve a radical break from the Broadbentian view of attention's function as the management of capacity limitations). But competition views of attention's mechanisms do not strictly require us to take a non-Broadbentian view of attention's function. Although the biased competition view sits naturally with a non-Broadbentian view of attention's function, Reynolds and Desimone continue to introduce the theory as an attempt to understand attention in recognizably Broadbentian terms, writing that:

The visual system is limited in its capacity to process information. However, it is equipped to overcome this constraint because it can direct this limited capacity channel to locations or objects of interest. (2001, 233)

2.7 Spotlight Theories

Bottleneck metaphors continue to guide the building of theories that attempt to locate the cognitive resources that operate only on attended stimuli. But it has usually been spotlight metaphors that have guided the theories that attempt to say which features of a stimulus determine whether attention is being paid to that stimulus at any given moment. The central idea suggested by the spotlight metaphor is that the determinant of whether or not a stimulus is attended is that stimulus's location.

One can easily see why the spotlight metaphor is appealing. If we are presented with an array of different coloured shapes, appearing and disappearing in various places, then there are various attention demanding tasks that we might perform regarding that array. Some tasks might require us to attend to what's going on at the top of the screen, others might require us to attend to all the red shapes, or to all the triangles, or to something else. Some of these ways of attending seem to be more basic than others. It seems, for example, that attending to things in the top part of the screen might be a primitive task, whereas attending to the triangles could not be primitive in the same way. We cannot simply attend to the triangles. If we want to attend to the triangles, we need first to work out where the triangles are. If, on the other hand, we want to attend to the things in the top part of the screen we do not need to work out whether they are triangles. It is plausible, therefore, that when we attend to the triangles we do so by attending to their locations. In this sense attending on the basis of location seems to be more basic than attending on the basis of shape.

The thought that attending to a location is more basic than attending to a shape might tempt one to think that attending on the basis of location is absolutely basic, so that attention is always and only allocated on the basis of location. If that idea were right then a theory of the spatial allocation of attention—a theory about the moving and focusing of the ‘attentional spotlight’—would be a large and central component in a full account of how attention works. This would be good news for those who want to give a single unified theory of attention, and it would be good news for the scientific project of explaining attention more generally, since attention's spotlight-like behaviours are some of its best understood aspects (see Logan, 1996).

There are reasons to think that location does, as the spotlight metaphor suggests, play a special role in the allocation of attention. But the role of location in the allocation of attention is probably not as straightforward as the most parsimonious of spotlight theories would suggest. Location does have a special role to play in the allocation of attention, but (1) location is not the only property to have such a role, and (2) the role of location is more complicated than a simple spotlight metaphor suggests.

The empirical debates about the direction of the spotlight of attention have focussed mostly on the second of these points. Case studies contrasting the different patterns of attention failure shown by different unilateral neglect patients are an important source of data here. Such case studies are taken as showing that various different frames of reference are involved in the spatial allocation of attention (Behrmann and Tipper, 1999). This indicates that there is no single map of locations determining which items get attention: attention is sometimes allocated on the basis of location in egocentric space, sometimes on the basis of location in more complex frames of reference.

There are also well-known experimental effects suggesting that attention is allocated, not on the basis of straightforward spatial coordinates, but in ways that are constrained by the distribution of objects in space. The classic work in this area is John Duncan's demonstration that attention shifts more readily between two locations that fall within the bounds of a single object than between equidistant locations that are separated by an object boundary (Duncan, 1984). Equally important here are findings from experiments using three-dimensional stimuli and virtual three-dimensional displays. These studies suggest that subjects are unable to differentially attend to depths in an empty space, but that subjects can shift their attention forwards and backward (to a place in front of or behind the point that their eyes are fixating) when the relevant locations are ones in which there are objects present (see Yantis, 1998).

These converging sources of data indicate that the spotlight of attention is not allocated simply on the basis of coordinates in any single spatial frame of reference. This is important for those attempting to localize mechanisms for the allocation of attention within the brain (since different brain areas differ in their mapping of space). And it has been influential in leading psychologists to turn away from simple spotlight metaphors. It should be noted, however, that these findings do not threaten the core of the idea that the spotlight metaphor suggested: The facts about what a person is attending to might still supervene on the facts about where she is attending, even if quite numerous and sometimes complex factors are responsible for determining which location that is.

Other effects are more damaging for a pure spotlight view. A pure spotlight theory, according to which attention is always allocated by allocating it to locations, seems unable to account for the sort of case that Hermann von Helmholtz and William James were concerned with: There is, as their example suggests (see section 1.5), a difference between attending to the pitch of a note and attending to its timbre, or to its overtones. This difference in attention does not seem to correspond to a difference in the location attended. Nor does a purely location based theory of attention allocation seem able to account for the sort attention that one must pay in order to perform a time-based task, such as finding out which of a group of shapes appears on screen for longest. Since some shifts of attention aren't shifts in the location attended, a theory of the factors that determine which locations a subject is attending to cannot tell us the whole story about the allocation of attention. It might nonetheless be a central component in a theory of some of attention's forms.

2.8 Motor Theories

Recent work in which electrodes are used in vivo to stimulate areas of the macaque brain known to be associated with eye-movement coordination has provided compelling evidence for the existence of an anatomical overlap between brain areas involved in eye-movement control and those involved in determining which stimuli elicit the strongest responses in visual cortex. There is evidence that this anatomical fact has some functional significance. One suggestive finding is that the links between frontal eye-movement control areas and attention-like effects in occipital visual areas are spatially specific: An electrode that is placed so that it elicits an eye movement to a particular part of the visual field when activated at one level will, if activated at a lower level, elicit changes in neural responsiveness that are exactly similar to the changes seen when attention is shifted to that same location (Moore and Armstrong, 2003, Armstrong and Moore, 2007).

These anatomical facts are consistent with, and strongly suggestive of, a ‘motor theory’ of attention, according to which the processes underpinning attention are, in at least some cases, truncated versions of the processes underpinning the coordination of movements of sensory orientation. Such theories come in various forms. Their central idea is that “the program for orienting attention either overtly or covertly is the same, but in the latter case the eyes are blocked at a certain peripheral stage” (Rizzolatti et al, 1987, 37).

Recent advocates of motor theories of attention (such as Moore, Armstrong and Fallah, 2003) have characterised their work as a revival of the picture that Alexander Bain proposed at the end of the nineteenth century. Bain (as we saw in Section 1.5, above) identified attention with truncated versions of the motor-control processes that typically bring about attention's behavioural manifestations — processes “stopping short of the actual movement performed by the organ” (Bain, 1888, 371).

Motor theories give a plausible account of some of attention's instances, but there are certain limitations that such theories seem unable to avoid: Since movement of the eyes is always movement to a location motor theories struggle to account for the allocation of attention on the basis of anything other than location. They therefore face the limitations that we saw when considering pure spotlight theories, being unable to account for shifts in attention that don't correspond to differences in the location attended. Nor is it clear how motor theories should be applied to spatial attention in those sensory modalities where the orientation of the sense organs is less straightforward than it is in the visual case. The motor theory does, nonetheless, provide a plausible and well-supported account of the location based variety of visual attention displayed in typical attention-lab experiments.

The success of motor theories in accounting for the sorts of attention that are found in some typical attention-lab experiments can be given either an optimistic or a pesimistic interpretation. The optimistic interpretation sees the motor theory as providing a successful account of the processing underpinning some of attention's simpler but more central varieties. The pessimistic interpretation sees the motor theory as revealing a problem with our usual experimental paradigms. In typical laboratory tasks subjects direct their attention to different parts of their visual field while keeping their eyes fixated on a central spot. The behavioural signatures of attention in such tasks are usually reductions in reaction time to the attended stimuli. The neural correlates of these behavioural signatures are certain biases as to which stimuli most strongly drive the neural circuitry that processes them. The central finding of the motor-theorists is that these neural and behavioural effects can result from attenuated versions of the activity responsible for directing eye movements. The pessimistic interpretation of this finding is as revealing that the signs that were traditionally taken to indicate the direction of attention are actually no more than consequences of the truncated eye-movements that our experimental paradigms induce. If that is right then the phenomenon studied in attention labs may not be the psychologically important one that it has been taken for.

3. Explanatory Roles for Attention

3.1 Attention and Consciousness

3.1.1 Is Attention Necessary for Consciousness?

The question of whether attention is necessary for consciousness can be answered in various ways. One answer is given by those who think that lots of unattended items appear in consciousness. A different answer is given by those who think that only some unattended items figure in consciousness. And a third answer is given if we think that unattended items figure in consciousness only in special circumstances. There is some evidence that people differ as to which of these views they find plausible (Schwitzgebel, 2007). At one extreme end of the spectrum of possible answers to this question is the view according to which attention is strictly necessary for consciousness, so that the things to which we are not paying attention do not figure in our consciousness at all. A number of psychologists endorse this view.

The evidence that is proffered in support of the view that attention is strictly necessary for consciousness comes from a range of experiments showing the surprising extent to which subjects are ignorant of the items to which they have paid no attention. In Mack and Rock's ‘inattentional blindness’ paradigm, for example, subjects who are given an attention demanding task pertaining to a stimulus in one part of the visual field frequently fail to notice shapes or words that are flashed up elsewhere (Mack and Rock, 1998). In Rensink et al.'s ‘change blindness’ paradigm subjects need to see an alternating pair of pictures between ten and twenty times before they can identify a large but narratively inconsequential difference between them (Rensink et al., 1997, Rensink, 2002). In the most memorable of these experiments a large number of subjects fail to notice the central appearance of a man in a gorilla suit when their attention is taken up with the business of counting the number of passes made by one of two teams in a concurrent basketball-type game (Simons and Chabdris, 1999).

No single one of these experiments can establish the claim that attention is always necessary for consciousness—that claim is a universally quantified one, and is not entailed by any one of its instances. Nor is it clear that what we see in these experiments really are instances in which unattended objects drop out of consciousness altogether. The subject's ignorance of the gorilla's appearance, for example, is compatible with its being the case that the presence of the gorilla does make a phenomenal difference for the inattentive subject. To explain the subject's ignorance we need only say that any phenomenal difference that the unattended gorilla makes is a difference that the subject is unable to use in answering the experimenter's question about whether anything strange happened in the scene. It may be that it is a phenomenal difference that is epistemically unusable because it is immediately forgotten (see Wolfe, 1998) or it may, alternatively, be a difference that is unusable because it is too unstructrued and inchoate to be epistemically mobilizable. In that case the effect of inattention would be inattentional agnosia, rather than inattentional blindness (see Simons, 2000).

Absolute amnesia for unattended items, or thoroughgoing agnosia for them, may be indistinguishable from inattentional blindness, both behaviourally, and from the point of view of retrospective phenomenal introspection. For that reason it is not a straightforward matter for the advocates of any of these interpretations of the inattentional blindness and change blindness effects to rule out the alternative interpretations. Subpersonal sources of data (such as experiments using neuroimaging) may be the only sources of data that we have to go on. (See Rees, et al. 1999 for an example in which fMRI data is used to argue against the amnesia interpretation of inattentional blindness effects involving written words).

The puzzle of how we should settle the dispute between different interpretations of the inattentional blindness effects raises the question of whether our commonsence belief that unattended items figure in consciousness is a well founded one. The idea that unattended items figure in consciousness may simply owe its intuitive appeal to a version of the ‘refrigerator-light illusion’: If our reason for believing that we are conscious of the things to which we pay no attention is a reason that depends on our finding that we are conscious of those things whenever we check on them, then that belief is on shaky ground. A checking procedure cannot provide us with good evidence about the status of unattended items since the act of checking is itself an act that involves a shift in attention to the things checked.

Since a direct checking procedure is ruled out we need a more theory-driven way of assessing the dispute between those who claim that the consequence of not attending to an item is that the item drops out of conscious experience and those who claim that inattention simply puts the subject in a poor epistemic position vis-à-vis the unattended items. The current state of our theories is such that it would be premature to try to settle this dispute by inference to the best explanation since neither side of the dispute has a theory of the attention/consciousness relation that has been worked out to a degree that would allow the different explanations to be compared. We can, however, see some of the considerations that the two sides in this debate might invoke. Those who endorse the idea that attention is necessary for consciousness can point to the fact that this view accords well with theories in which attention features prominently in the explanation of consciousness (e.g. Prinz, 2005). Those who prefer the epistemic-deficit interpretation of the inattentional blindness effects can point to the fact that that interpretation flows naturally from the view according to which attention to an item provides the sort of acquaintance that is needed for the use of a demonstrative concept that refers to that item (a view advocated by Campbell, 2002, and discussed in section 3.2 below): If attention to the gorilla is necessary for the forming of a demonstrative-involving thought (such as ‘That's a gorilla’) then there is an immediate explanation, consistent with the idea that unattended items nonetheless feature in the subject's consciousness, for the fact that inattentive subjects are unable to answer questions such as ‘Was there a gorilla?’.

This last point illustrates the fact that our answer to the question about whether attention is necessary for consciousness may have to wait until we have a better understanding of the relation of attention to demonstrative reference (of the sort that's involved in thinking ‘That's a gorilla’), and of attention's role in epistemology more generally. Progress has been made in articulating the questions that philosophical theorizing about attention may help us to answer, but the development of theories that answer those questions remains in its infancy.

3.1.2 Is Attention Sufficient for Consciousness?

In addition to disputes about whether we are conscious of only those things to which we attend there are also disputes about whether we are conscious of everything to which we attend. A number of recent findings suggest that it is possible to attend to things of which one is not conscious. In an experiment by Yi Jiang et al., (2006), for example, subjects are presented with attention-attracting stimuli in such a way that, thanks to an arrangement of mirrors, these stimuli are given to just one eye. Because a more vivid stimulus is presented to the other eye, and because this more vivid stimulus wins the competition for consciousness that occurs in such cases of binocular rivalry, subjects do not consciously experience the less vivid stimulus. The unconsciously processed stimuli in these experiments include erotic photographs. These unseen erotic photographs elicit shifts of attention, as evidenced by the fact that the consciously experienced stimuli presented in the same location as these unseen attention-grabbers are more accurately responded to in an attention demanding task (involving detecting the orientation of gabor-patches). One striking finding from Jiang et al.'s experiments is that the way in which the unseen photographs attract and repel the attention depends on the sexual orientation of the experimental participants.

A natural interpretation of what's going on in these experiments is that the erotic pictures capture the subject's attention despite the fact that the subject has no conscious experience of them. This suggests—although it does not conclusively demonstrate (see Mole, 2008b)—that one may be attending to a thing without being conscious of it. The same conclusion is suggested by a quite different set of experiments involving blindsighted subjects. In these experiments we see that, even though the blindsighted subject has no experience of cues presented in his scotoma, those cues can elicit the same facilitation of processing and reduction of reaction times that are usually taken to be the signatures of attention (Kentridge and Heywood, 2001, Kentridge et al., 2004).

Such experiments show that there is influence operating between unconscious processing and the direction of attention. They therefore place a limit on the closeness of the relationship that can be claimed to exist between attention and consciousness. It is less clear that such experiments straightforwardly refute the view that every object to which we attend is an object of which we are conscious. Theorists who wish to defend the view that attention is only paid to consciously experienced stimuli may accommodate the results of such experiments by admitting that a stimulus can be responsible for directing attention towards the part of space that it occupies without itself being something that gets consciously experienced. This can be admitted by one who continues to deny that subjects attend to any stimuli of which they are not conscious. The point here is that distinguishing between attending to a location and attending to an object enables us to retain the claim that consciousness of a thing is necessary for attention to that very thing, and enables us to retain that claim in the face of evidence demonstrating attention in blindsight (Mole, 2008a). It may be that retaining that claim enables us to give a picture of attention that accords better with the commonsense view of attention and consciousness, but the question of whether it is a claim that ought, ultimately, to be retained is a question in need of further philosophical work.

The disputes about whether attention is sufficient for consciousness, necessary for consciousness, or both, are related to questions about attention's metaphysics. The claim that attention is not sufficient for consciousness is typically made as part of a defence of the idea that attention and consciousness are underpinned by two distinct brain processes (see, e.g., Koch and Tsuchiya, 2007). The claim that attention is sufficient for consciousness but not necessary for it is required by those who, like Locke (see Section 1.3), think that attention is a mode of conscious thinking without any particular process that serves as its underpinning. The claim that attention is sufficient for consciousness and necessary for it is required by those who think that the process by which things come to consciousness and the process by which attention is allocated are one and the same (Prinz, 2005).

3.2 Attention and Demonstrative Reference

Consciousness is one philosophically puzzling mental phenomenon that has been thought to be related to attention in ways that may prove to be explanatorily revealing. Demonstrative reference is another. The clearest recent advocate of the idea that attention contributes to the explanation of demonstrative reference is John Campbell. He writes that:

… the notion of conscious attention to an object has an explanatory role to play: it has to explain how it is that we have knowledge of the reference of a demonstrative. (2002, 45)

Campbell acknowledges that a similar idea was explored in the manuscript on Theory of Knowledge that Bertrand Russell abandoned (under the influence of Wittgenstein) in the summer in 1913. In that work Russell gives the following statement of the idea that reference to particulars requires attention to them:

At any moment of my conscious life, there is one object (or at most some very small number of objects) to which I am attending. All knowledge of particulars radiates out from this object. (1913, 40)

Campbell, in support of the claim that there is an explanatory relation between attention and demonstrative reference, develops two lines of thought.

The first line of thought comes from reflection on examples concerning the requirements that have to be met in order to understand demonstrative expressions in conversational contexts where one of the participants in the conversation uses expressions such as ‘that woman’, but where various women are present, all of whom are possible referents for this demonstrative. Knowing which women is meant, according to Campbell, requires attending to the woman in question and knowing that it is to her that the speaker was attending. This is intended to show more than just that the direction of the speaker's attention is a possible source of evidence for what that speaker means. It is intended as showing that attention and reference stand in a particularly intimate relationship—a relationship that Campbell characterizes by saying that ‘knowledge of the reference of a demonstrative is provided by conscious attention to the object’ (p. 22).

The second line of thought that Campbell develops in support of the view that attention explains demonstrative reference is a line of thought pertaining to deductive arguments in which the premises refer to items that are picked out by demonstratives: Arguments such as ‘(1) That is F. (2) That is G. Therefore (3) That is F and G’. Campbell's thought here is that such arguments depend for their validity on there being no possibility of equivocating on the meaning of ‘that’, as it occurs in the two separate premises. Such arguments can only figure in rationally entitling reasoning so long as there is a single fixing of the referent of ‘that’ in both premises. This reference fixing, Campbell thinks, is achieved if and only if there is no redirection of attention between the premises. Again this is intended to show more than just that there is some causal or evidential relation between attending and referring. It is intended to show that the role played by attention in fixing the reference of a demonstrative is analogous to the role played by a Fregean Sense in fixing the reference of a proper name (Campbell, 2002, Chapter 5).

The explanatory approach that Campbell advocates and that Russell considered has traditionally been thought to suffer from a problem of circularity. This problem is urged by Peter Geach in Mental Acts (1957). Geach considers the suggestion that we can use attention to explain our ability to make reference to the things that we perceive, but thinks that no such suggestion can provide a genuine explanation of reference because:

… it is quite useless to say the relevant sense-perceptions must be attended to, either this does not give a sufficient condition, or else “attended to” is a mere word for the very relation of judgment to sense perception that requires analysis. (1957, 64)

Whether or not Campbell can turn a theory of attention into a non-circular explanation of reference, the idea that attention and reference are related does seem to be an idea that can cast some light on what goes on when we understand referring expressions. Campbell's examples do suggest that we what we attend to and what we refer to are often the same, and there is some empirical evidence, coming from developmental psychology, indicating that attention-related abilities play a crucial role in the infants development of a understanding of its caregiver's demonstrative use (see Section3.3).

3.3 Attention and Other Minds

There are empirical results, coming from developmental psychology, which are suggestive of an intimate link between the the development of various abilities related to attention and the development of various capacities that are involved in understanding the mental states that are being expressed in interactions between the infant and caregiver.

An ability to appreciate what others are attending to appears to be a crucial stage in the normal infant's development towards understanding to the fact that its caregivers' utterances have referential intentions behind them. And, more generally, the development of capacities for attention are important milestones in some distinctively human aspects of infant development (Moore and Dunham, 1995). There is a distinctive developmental pathway in which normal human infants develop an ability and a willingness to attend to the mother, an ability and willingness to attend to the thing that she is attending to, and then, most importantly, an ability and willingness to enter into episodes in which there is a third object that mother and child are attending to jointly, with mutual understanding of the fact that the attention is shared.

There is good evidence that the child's progression along this pathway is intimately related to the develop of abilities to respond appropriately to the mental states of others, and to the development of the ability to acquire new vocabulary on the basis of an understanding of what the words used by its mother refer to. The arrested development of these attention-involving abilities is a revealing marker of the impairments suffered by autistic children, and of the limitations in the mental-state attribution abilities of non-human primates.

Some progress has been made towards extracting philosophical lessons from the empirical work indicating that attention has an explanatory role to play here (see, for several examples, Eilan, et al. 2005).

3.4 Attention and Knowledge

The apparent links between attention and demonstrative reference (see section 3.2) and attention and knowledge of other minds (see section 3.3) might be special instances of a more general connection between attention and the making of epistemic moves. A general connection of that sort may have been what Descartes had in mind when he suggested that attention to clear and distinct ideas is a necessary condition for those ideas to realize their special epistemic potential (see Section 1.1).

It is easy to make plausible the idea that attention is always involved in making epistemic moves. The inattentional blindness experiments, in which subjects are visually presented with large changes while attending to something else, show that inattentive subjects can fail to notice all sorts of perceivable things that attentive subjects find obvious. Something exactly similar seems to be true in the a priori domain. Just as no item is so large, so central, and so well lit that no conscious and sighted observer could miss it, so there is no step in reasoning that is so simple, so compelling and so obvious that every thinker, whether attentive or inattentive, can be expected to recognise it. The inattentional blindness effects show that there are attentional demands that a thinker has to meet before his perceptual encounter with things can provide knowledge of them. It is plausible that there are similar attentional demands that have to be met before the thinker's grasp of a thought gives her a justified belief in the thought's consequences.

In both the a priori case and the perceptual case the acquisition of knowledge seems to require attention, and in both cases this requirement seems to be a practical one. It may be that knowledge of some propositions (of a sort that could serve as a major premise in an inference by which one's perceptual experience could be interpreted) is required if one's experience with a gorilla is to provide one with knowledge of the gorilla's presence. But the requirement on gaining knowledge from experience is not that one must be bearing such propositions in mind. The same is true in the a priori domain. What's required before an a priori entitlement can be recognized cannot be that one has to entertain some prior knowledge of a proposition from which the entitlement can be deduced. To suppose thatsuch occurent propositional knowledge is what's necessary for such moves would be to embark on the regress that Lewis Carroll's tortoise set to Achilles (Carroll, 1895). What epistemic move-making requires is not knowledge of a proposition. What it requires is the right sort of active attention.

The attentional requirements that have to be met before one can acquire knowledge from experience or recognize an a priori entitlement are not requirements merely for alertness. They are not captured merely by saying that, in order to gain knowledge, the thinker has to pay some attention to the relevant ideas. A thinker may be attending to a syllogism, but, if he is attending to its rhythm, he may still be unable to see that the conclusion follows. A non-question begging characterisation of the attentional requirements of knowledge acquisition in general would be an important contribution to epistemology. Current work on attention, focussing as it does on attention as a perceptual phenomenon, may only give us a part of the general theory that we need.

3.5 Voluntary Action

Attention's involvement in voluntary action is a lot harder to study in a controlled way than its involvement in perception. The theories of attention emerging from experimental psychology have, as a result, focussed almost exclusively on attention's perceptual instances. In this respect they contrast with theories that were developed in the period before psychology and philosophy split, in which the action-involving aspects of attention are much more prominent. William James, for example, suggests in the Principles of Psychology that ‘volition is nothing but attention’ (James, 1890 p. 424), and at one time proposed that “Attention, belief, affirmation, and motor volition, are […] four names for an identical process, incidental to the conflict of ideas alone, the survival of one in spite of the opposition of the others.” (1880).

There are some respects in which the issues surrounding attention's relationship to the voluntariness of action parallel the issues surrounding attention's relationship to the consciousness of perception. It seems natural to think that attention is necessary for finely tuned behaviours, much as it seems necessary for the perception of fine detail. But it does not seem natural to think that we must be paying attention to the execution of every act that we voluntarily perform. A case could therefore be made, on commonsense grounds, for claiming that attention figures in the production of some but not all voluntary behaviours. One can imagine this view being challenged by a theorist who claimed that attention is necessary for an action to be voluntary, arguing that there is an illusion (analogous to the refrigerator light illusion) that gives us the mistaken impression that our inattentive acts are voluntary too. As in the case of attention and consciousness there is an epistemological puzzle about the sort of evidence that could settle this issue. This may be a topic for future research.


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