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Gilbert Ryle

First published Tue Dec 18, 2007; substantive revision Mon Nov 2, 2009

Although Gilbert Ryle published on a wide range of topics in philosophy (notably in the history of philosophy and in philosophy of language), including a series of lectures centred on philosophical dilemmas, a series of articles on the concept of thinking, and a book on Plato, The Concept of Mind remains his best known and most important work. Through this work, Ryle is thought to have accomplished two major tasks. First, he was seen to have put the final nail in the coffin of Cartesian dualism. Second, as he himself anticipated, he is thought to have argued on behalf of, and suggested as dualism's replacement, the doctrine known as philosophical (and sometimes analytical) behaviourism. Sometimes known as an “ordinary language”, sometimes as an “analytic” philosopher, Ryle—even when mentioned in the same breath as Wittgenstein and his followers—is considered to be on a different, somewhat idiosyncratic (and difficult to characterise), philosophical track.

Philosophical behaviourism has long been rejected; what was worth keeping has been appropriated by the philosophical doctrine of functionalism, which is the most widely accepted view in philosophy of mind today. It is a view that is thought to have saved the “reality” of the mental from the “eliminativist” or “fictionalist” tendencies of behaviourism while acknowledging the insight (often attributed to Ryle) that the mental is importantly related to behavioural output or response (as well as to stimulus or input). According to a reasonably charitable assessment, the best of Ryle's lessons has long been assimilated while the problematic has been discarded. If there are considerations still brewing from the 1930s and 40s that would threaten the orthodoxy in contemporary philosophy of mind, these lie somewhere in work of Wittgenstein and his followers—not in Ryle.

But the view just outlined, though widespread, represents a fundamental misapprehension of Ryle's work. First, Cartesianism is dead in only one of its ontological aspects: substance dualism may well have been repudiated but property dualism still claims a number of contemporary defenders. The problem of finding a place for the mental in the physical world, of accommodating the causal power of the mental, and of accounting for the phenomenal aspects of consciousness are all live problems in the philosophy of mind today because they share some of the doctrine's ontological, epistemological, and semantic assumptions.

Second, and importantly, Ryle is not a philosophical behaviourist—at least he does not subscribe to any of the main tenets associated with that doctrine as it is known today. One may be confused by this if one is also confused about Ryle's conception of philosophy. Although there is some truth in identifying him as an analytic philosopher—he announces (1932, 61) that “the sole and whole function of philosophy” is philosophical analysis—this is likely to be misunderstood today if one thinks that the proper goal of philosophy (attainable if not in practice at least in ideals) is definitional analysis. It is this that encourages the association with behaviourism (in at least one of its many senses). But Ryle was not an analytical philosopher in this sense. True, Ryle acknowledges the influence of Moore's emphasis on common sense (and thus on ordinary language); true, he takes himself to be pursuing the type of philosophical investigation (exemplified by Russell's Theory of Descriptions) that involves uncovering the logical form of grammatically misleading expressions. But it is important to take account of the differences that separate Ryle from the early Moore and Russell for it is their conception of philosophy that has been inherited by many of us working within the “analytic” tradition in philosophy today. That is the third point. For Ryle does not believe in meanings (concepts or propositions) as these have been traditionally construed (as stable objects or rules, the grasp of which is logically prior to, and thus may be used to explain, the use of expressions). Indeed, Ryle's conception of philosophy was not fundamentally different from that of Wittgenstein. Ryle sets out in print as early as 1932 a philosophical agenda that prefigures the published work of the later Wittgenstein; the “elasticity of significance” and “inflections of meaning” Ryle finds in most expressions appear to be the family of structures, more or less related, noticed by Wittgenstein; and Ryle's attack on the “intellectualist legend” shares Wittgenstein's concern to understand a proper—non-exalted—place for rules in an explanation of various philosophically interesting achievements. In spite of the fact that some of Wittgenstein's protégés were dismissive of Ryle's work,[1] the best way to understand Ryle is to see him, if not as following in Wittgenstein's footsteps, then as walking some stretches of philosophical terrain down a parallel path.

1. Biography

Gilbert Ryle was born in Brighton, Sussex, England on 19 August 1900. One of ten children, he came from a prosperous family and enjoyed a liberal and stimulating childhood and adolescence. His father was a general practitioner but had keen interests in philosophy and astronomy that he passed on to his children and an impressive library where Ryle enjoyed being an “omnivorous reader” (Ryle, 1970, 1). Educated at Brighton College (where later in life he would return as a governor) Ryle went to Queen's College, Oxford in 1919 initially to study Classics, but he was quickly drawn to Philosophy, graduating in 1924 with first-class honours in the new Modern Greats School of Philosophy, Politics and Economics. While not particularly sporting, his undergraduate studies were relieved by rowing for his college eight, of which he was captain, and he was good enough to have trials for the University boat. After his graduation in 1924 he was appointed to a lectureship in Philosophy at Christ Church College and a year later became tutor. He would remain at Oxford for his entire academic career until his retirement in 1968; in 1945 he was elected to the Waynflete Chair of Metaphysical Philosophy. With the outbreak of war Ryle volunteered. He was commissioned in the Welsh Guards, serving in intelligence, and by the end of the War had been promoted to the rank of Major. He became the Editor of Mind after G.E. Moore's retirement in 1947; a post he held until 1971. Ryle was unstinting in his advice and encouragement to generations of students. With colleagues he was “tolerant (and) uncensorious” (Warnock, xiv), but in philosophical debate he could turn into a formidable opponent, expressing an intense dislike of pomposity, pretence and jargon (Urmson, 271; Gallop, 228). He was also ever ready to challenge both the excessive veneration paid by others to Plato and Classical authors as well as the philosophical positions held by such contemporary colleagues as Collingwood in Oxford or Anderson in Australia. He befriended Wittgenstein whose work, if not his effect on colleagues and students, he greatly admired. “Outstandingly friendly (and) sociable” (Warnock, xiv), he is remembered as an entertaining conversationalist. Despite having turned away from literary studies during his first year at Oxford, sensing he had little aptitude for them, and even though he read little other than the novels of Jane Austen (about whom he wrote authoritatively) and P. G. Wodehouse, the style of Ryle's writing is often literary and instantly recognizable even after a few sentences (Urmson, 271; Mabbott, 223). A confirmed bachelor, he lived after his retirement with his twin sister Mary in the Oxfordshire village of Islip. Gardening and walking gave him immense pleasure, as did his pipe. He died on 6 October 1976 at Whitby in Yorkshire after a day's walking on the moors. “Philosophy irradiated his whole life” (Mabbott, 224). He is reputed to have said that the only completed portrait of him made him look like a “drowned German General” (Mabbott, 224).

2. Philosophy as Cartography

When Ryle became a young don in the 1920s, philosophers could no longer “pretend that philosophy differed from physics, chemistry and biology by studying mental as opposed to material phenomena” (1971b, vii). Although the turn away from psychologism was laudable, philosophers succumbed instead to what Ryle considered to be a regrettable temptation to look for Objects which were neither mental nor material. Such objects were to be for philosophy what beetles and butterflies are for entomology:

Platonic Forms, Propositions, Intentional Objects, Logical Objects…[and even] Sense Data were recruited to appease our professional hankerings to have a subject matter of our own (1971b, vii).

Ryle's campaign against the tendency of philosophers to “hypostasise their own terms of art” lasted throughout his career. Even his very first articles carried the “Occamizing” message that “[p]hilosophical problems are problems of a certain sort; they are not problems of an ordinary sort about special entities” (1971b, vii; these early articles include 1929, 1930, 1933a, and 1933b).

Instead, think of a philosopher, by analogy, as a cartographer. According to Ryle, competent speakers of language are to a philosopher what an ordinary villager is to a mapmaker. A local villager knows his way by wont and without reflection to the village church, to the town hall, to the shops and back home again from the personal point of view of one who lives there. But, asked to draw or to consult a map of his village, he is faced with learning a new and different sort of task: one that employs compass bearing and units of measurement. What was first understood in the personal terms of local snapshots now has to be considered in the completely general terms of the cartographer. The villager's knowledge by wont, enabling him to lead a stranger from place to place, is a different skill from one requiring him to tell the stranger, in perfectly general and neutral terms, how to get to any of the places, or indeed, how to understand these places in relation to those of other villages (1962a, 441).

We are like the villager with respect to our employment of words and phrases. Knowledge by wont of the use of expressions and of concrete ideas is something everybody learns in the course of growing up speaking and understanding a language: “their ‘logical geography’ is taught by one's daily walks” (1945, 207). So too do people know how to operate with ordinary, non-technical, and even semi-technical and technical expressions as well as with relatively concrete and some abstract ideas without being able to codify the rules, permissions, or sanctions that govern their operations.

Now, almost every word or phrase we use contributes to what we say in a way such that had it been replaced by a word or phrase with a different significance, it would have had different “implication threads”:

It would have been a different statement, different in having different implications, in requiring different tests for truth or falsehood, in being compatible and incompatible with different affiliated statements, in being evidence for or against different corollaries, and so on. (1962a, 442-3)

To the extent that I understand what I am saying, I understand the particular differences that the expression contributes to the statements, questions, commands, etc. that I make with it. In making everyday (non-philosophical) statements, or in asking ordinary factual questions, or in giving concrete, practical advice I am like, Ryle says, the villager who simply walks to his destination without having to think about what he is doing or turning back in his tracks. But even in making everyday, non-philosophical statements, I employ a plurality of expressions. The implication threads of some of these expressions may “pull against” the implication threads of others. For example,

…I might truly and intelligibly describe a weary sailor in a storm as having toiled voluntarily, although reluctantly; and then I find myself in a perplexity. For I seem to be saying that he toiled not under compulsion but because he volunteered to do it, despite the fact that he did not want to do it. The natural implication threads of ‘voluntarily’ seem to pull away from the natural implication threads of ‘reluctantly’. (1962a, 443)

To resolve this complexity it is not enough that I be familiar with the separate contributions of the two adverbs. To resolve it, I need to be satisfied that the conflict is only apparent. I am confronted with a conceptual problem that requires that I be able to say how the implication threads of the one bear on the implication threads of the other. This requires abstracting from or ignoring the particular reference to this sailor or that storm; it requires that I operate upon general notions of actions, motive, preference, strength of desires, choice and so on.

The most philosophically interesting questions arise for those cases of conflict that present themselves again and again. We speak in the same breath of a responsible human agent who is, and acts, in a world that is a field of physical, chemical, and biological causes and effects. “Men must, we feel, be free; yet they must, we feel, be amenable to prediction and explanation. Their actions cannot be mechanical. Yet also they cannot be unmechanical” (1962a, 444). From the point of view of laymen and scientists who are actually exploring the world, we find out what there is by perceiving it; yet from the point of view of the inquirer into the mechanism of perception, what we perceive never coincides with the world (1954, 2). The reconciliation of these convictions, an answer to the question how this could be, belongs to philosophy.

We have now to operate upon what we ordinarily operate readily and unquestioningly with. We now need the theory of our daily practice, the geography of our daily walks. When two or twenty familiar implication threads seem to pull across and against one another, it is no longer enough to be able unperplexedly to follow along each one by itself. We need to be able to state their directions, their limits and their interlockings; to think systematically about what normally we merely think competently with. (1962a, 444)

3. Systematic Ambiguity and Type Trespasses

Ryle's concern in much of his work was not simply the charting of the logical bearings of ideas. It was rather to apply this method as a way of testing (and often destroying) philosophical theories themselves. When we put on our philosophical hats and begin to operate not only upon concrete ideas, but abstract ideas or abstractions, we tend to get into trouble. Not only is it the case that every word or phrase we use contributes to what we say in a way such that had it been replaced by a word or phrase with a different significance, it would have had different implication threads; had we used the same word or phrase in a different context what we would have said is also likely to have had a different significance with different implication threads.

A given word will, in different sorts of context, express ideas of an indefinite range of differing logical types and, therefore, with different logical powers. And what is true of single words is also true of complex expressions and of grammatical constructions. (1945, 206)

Thus, even if we were to put aside ambiguity of the kind that logicians ignore (Ryle calls such expressions “pun words”), we are faced with another sort of elasticity of significance which characterizes the use, according to Ryle, “not of a few but of most or of all expressions…”(1945, 205). Unlike ambiguous words such as ‘bank’ or ‘report’ or ‘stud’, the inflections of meaning to which most of our expressions are susceptible nonetheless have affinities: the ideas expressed by these expressions in their various uses are “intimately connected” with each other; they are “different inflections of the same root” (1945, 206). The paraphrases and translations of these expressions will normally have “a precisely similar” flexibility. This means that if we were to paraphrase the expression as it is used in one context in order to make clear its implication threads in that context, we can expect the paraphrase, like the original expression, to express a different idea in a different context. To use a contemporary idiom, the paraphrase, like the original expression, is “context-sensitive”.

The philosophical task Ryle recommends involves tracing the inflections of significance that are conveyed by expressions with a common root in their various uses. On this way of looking at it, it is not wrong to say that the philosopher studies or investigates the idea or the concept of, say, justice. But putting it this way may be misleading if it obscures the fact that the logical force of the relevant words (‘is just’) may change with the context in which it is used. Again, Ryle thought this to be so for most single words and complex expressions and not only the ambiguous “pun-words”. Indeed, “[u]nnoticed systematic ambiguities are a common source of type-confusions and philosophic problems” (1945, 207).

Systematic ambiguity affects not only single words and complex expressions. It affects grammatical constructions as well. Since expressions of the same grammatical constructions function to express thoughts of multifarious logical sorts, those starting to philosophise (those operating upon ideas and not merely with them) “tend to be blind to the fact that different ideas have different logical powers…” (1945, 200). Assimilation of the functions or uses can lead to trouble, and this can be shown by eliciting contradictions, absurdities, and paradoxes.

The inevitable consequence is that naïve intellectual operations with those ideas lead directly to logically intolerable results. Concepts of different types cannot be coerced into similar logical conduct. Some sort of contradiction arises from the attempt and this, in fortunate cases, compels the thinker to turn back in his tracks and try to change his treatment of the outraged concept. (1945, 201)[2]

4. Concepts, Propositions, and Meaning

The implications of this view for the concept of meaning or for nominalisations of the verb ‘to mean’ are important. We are not at all likely to be misled by expressions of the form ‘x means what y means.’ But when we use the expression quasi-descriptively, as in ‘The meaning of x is the same as the meaning of y’ or ‘The meaning of x is doubtful’ we are liable to be misled into thinking that we are referring to some queer new object. Ryle generalises the point to suggest that all the mistaken doctrines of concepts, ideas, terms, judgment, contents, and the like derive from the fallacy

that there must be something referred to by such expressions as ‘the meaning of the word (phrase or sentence) x’ [which is analogous to the policeman] who is referred to by the descriptive phrase ‘Our village policeman is fond of football’. (1932, 56)

The meaning of an expression is not an entity denoted by it and not the nominee of any thing. It would be a related mistake to suppose, Ryle tells us, that a particular concept is precisely indicated by a particular expression: as if the idea of equality could be identified as that for which the word ‘equality’ stands (1945, 206). For Ryle, agreeing here with Wittgenstein, “concepts are not things that are there crystallised in a splendid isolation”; rather

they are discriminable features, but not detachable atoms, of what is integrally said or integrally thought. They are not detachable parts of, but distinguishable contributions to, the unitary senses of complete sentences. To examine them is to examine the live force of things that we actually say. It is to examine them not in retirement, but doing their co-operative work. (1962b, 185) [3]

The idea that expressions have meaning insofar as they stand for things should be rejected. Indeed, some expressions denote (in one of a variety of ways) because they are significant. To learn the meaning of an expression is to learn to operate correctly with it; more like learning a piece of drill than like coming across a previously unencountered object (1957, 365).

Concepts are instead to be understood as that which is conveyed by a word or phrase independently of the language (English or French) in which the word is written or spoken. Although we tend to make use of abstract nouns to talk about that which is conveyed by various words, this should not mislead us. Russell and Moore may have described their pursuits as the investigation of supra-mundane entities, but this was not, claims Ryle, the way they or any other philosopher set about their task. Aristotle, for example, when studying Plato's account of Pleasure, did not “stare hard” at an entity or Essence designated by this abstract noun: “Instead he rightly considered what we are asserting or denying in concreto when we say that someone did or did not enjoy the concert; or that someone enjoys this piece of music more than that piece” (1962b, 185). Unlike the abstract noun “Pleasure”, the live verb is making specific contributions to sense. Similarly, an analysis of the concept, say, of existence “cannot consist just in acts of contemplating a rarefied object, withdrawn, like a coin in a museum, from its native commercial transactions” (1962b, 185).

5. Ordinary Language

Ryle is often described as an ordinary language philosopher or as recommending that philosophy should concern itself with the ordinary use of language. In a certain sense this is apt; in another it is not.

Philosophers may well study the stock use of various expressions. But these may be highly technical or semi-technical expressions, as well as vernacular ones. Berkeley, for example, in examining the stock (and possibly the only) use of ‘infinitesimals’, was examining the way in which this word was employed by mathematicians. Philosophers of law, biology, mathematics, formal logic, theology, psychological and grammar are all required to examine technical terms or concepts. So if ‘ordinary’ is contrasted with ‘technical’ or ‘specialised’ then some philosophy is and some philosophy is not concerned with ordinary language (1953, 304).

But one reason it may be true that philosophy should be couched in vernacular terms has to do with philosophy's special task. Just as the cartographer was required to use a different, more general vocabulary to plot the geography of the local village, so too should the philosopher use a more general vocabulary than the specialist's to plot the “cross-bearings” between the concepts of different theories. The tangles and knots that a philosopher has to unpick are set not by some branch of specialist theory, but “in the thought and the discourse of everyone, specialists and non-specialists alike” (1953, 304).

Talk about the use of an expression, like the use of safety-pins and table-knives, helps us to avoid thinking that we are talking about any queer relations or queer entities; to suppose or half-suppose that “studying the meaning of the phrase ‘the solar system’ [is]… the same thing as studying the solar system” (1953, 306). It reminds us, for example, that when enquiring into the problems of perception or in discussing the concepts of seeing, hearing, and smelling, we are not tackling the questions of opticians, neuro-physiologists or psychologists. We are rather after accounts of how certain words work, “namely words like ‘see’, ‘look’, ‘overlook’, ‘blind’, ‘visualise’, and lots of other affiliated expressions” (1953, 317).

A philosopher of Ryle's ilk is interested in the informal logic of the employment of expressions; the nature of the logical force that expressions have as components of theories and as pivots of concrete arguments. That is why, he says, in our discussions we argue with expressions and about those expressions in one and the same breath. We are trying to register what we are exhibiting; to codify the very logical codes which we are then and there observing (1953, 318).

Often the appeal to what we do and do not say, or can or cannot say is resisted, Ryle says, by those who hold that philosophical disputes can be settled by formalising the warring theses, or translating them out of the natural language in which they were originally constructed into the notation, perhaps, of a Principia Mathematica. As we should expect from a philosopher who sees his job as the plotting of the logical force of expressions as they appear in different contexts, Ryle describes as a “formaliser's dream” the conviction that the investigation can be regularised in such a way as to replace what was philosophically puzzling by logical problems amenable to known and teachable procedures of calculation. Indeed, he denies not only that the logic of everyday statements but even the logic of the statements of scientists, lawyers, historians and bridge-players can in principle be adequately represented by the formulae of formal logic.

Of course, he concedes, the logical behaviour of the terms of non-notational discourse may be assisted by studies in formal logic; so may chess-playing assist generals. But waging a campaign can no more be replaced by playing games of chess than the study of the logical behaviour of the terms of non-notational discourse can be replaced by doing formal logic. Thus in the slogan ‘Back to ordinary language’, ‘ordinary’ may be contrasted with ‘notional’. The slogan can then be used by those who have awoken from the formaliser's dream. So used, he says, it should be repudiated only by those who hope to replace philosophising by reckoning (1953, 316-7).

6. The Official Doctrine and its contemporary offshoots

Ryle's writings on the question of what constitutes a philosophical problem, and of the way to solve it, occupied him in the 1920s and 30s. The Concept of Mind was written after this “long spell of methodological talk”: what was needed was “an example of the method really working” (1970, 12). Although entitled The Concept of Mind, the book, Ryle tells us, is

an examination of multifarious specific mental concepts, such as those of knowing, learning, discovering, imagining, pretending, hoping, wanting, feeling depressed, feeling a pain, resolving, doing voluntarily, doing deliberately, perceiving, remembering and so on. (1962b, 188)

As the analogy of philosophy with cartography suggests, Ryle investigates the workings not just of one concept by itself, but “all of the threads of a spider's web of inter-working concepts” (1962b, 189).

The book focuses on the “type-errors” or “category mistakes” which philosophers of mind are prone to make when they consider the logical form of “mental conduct verbs”, especially if they use as their starting-point the “Janus-faced account of human life” suggested by a Cartesian conception of the mind.

Ryle's explicit target in The Concept of Mind is what he calls the “Official Doctrine”, which results, he tells us, at least in part from Descartes' appreciation that Galilean methods of scientific discovery were fit to provide mechanical explanations for every occupant of space, together with Descartes' conviction that the mental could not simply be a more complex variety of the mechanical. This “two-world”, Cartesian view has distinctive ontological, epistemological, and semantic commitments that each lead to particular philosophical puzzles.

6.1 The ontological commitment

The ontological commitment of the view is that there are two different kinds of things, body and mind, that are somehow harnessed together. The one exists in space and is subject to mechanical or physical laws; the other is not in space and is not subject to these laws. And yet the mind and body influence each other. The view that mind and body are somehow fundamentally different or distinct, but nonetheless interact, leads to the philosophical conundrum known as the mind-body problem. For contemporary philosophers of mind, the mind-body problem no longer involves construing the mind as an independent substance. But working out the relation between mental and physical properties remains an urgent project (Kim, 2). [5]

In contemporary philosophy of mind, Ryle is credited with having established an important connection between mental predicates and behaviour; but many of his successors (Place, Armstrong, Putnam, and Fodor) thought he misconstrued the nature of that connection. When strict physicalist positions were beset by objections from the multiple realisability of mental predicates, “token-physicalist” versions of functionalism (or “ontic-neutral” versions of the causal theory of mind) stepped up to the plate, and advertised that, in acknowledging behavioural outputs as well as stimulus conditions, they were retaining what was right about Ryle's emphasis on behaviour (in the circumstances), but rejecting what they considered the “explanatory vacuity” of conceptual or definitional links between mental predicates and behavioural ones. These were replaced with causal links between the alleged referents of the mental terms and the action to be explained.

But to suppose the explanatory power of mental conduct terms depends on their designating an event or state that is causally related to the performance is to accept another version of the “paramechanical” hypothesis, even though it is now couched in ontic-neutral or physicalist terms.[6]

Although Ryle's own target is the attempt to staple an elusive mental event construed as a conscious “experience” onto a respectable biological (muscular, neurophysiological) causal chain, it is nevertheless clear that the problems he sees will also apply to modern-day variations on the dualist theme. That is, it will also apply to weak, non-reductive identity theories that wish to preserve a causal role for mental properties. For consider:

The episodes supposed to constitute the careers of mind have one sort of existence, while those constituting the careers of bodies have another sort; and no bridge-status is involved…Minds, as the whole legend describes them, are what must exist if there is to be a causal explanation of the intelligent behaviour of human bodies; and minds, as the theory describes them, live on a floor of existence defined as being outside the causal system to which bodies belong. (1949a, 65)

It would be difficult to find a better anticipation of the mind-body problem as we know it today. The problem of mental causation may not be exactly the same as Descartes' problem, but it is nonetheless inherited by anyone who insists that mental properties must, on the one hand, make a causal difference and by those who, on the other, think that physics is a closed causal system. Just as mind-body interaction was a problem for substance dualism, so is mental causation still the problem facing the many varieties of (both reductive and non-reductive) physicalism (Kim, 29-30).

It seems then that the two ontological aspects of the Official Doctrine—finding a place for the mental in the physical world and the problem of mental causation—still survive today.

6.2 The epistemological and semantic commitments

The ontological commitments of the Official Doctrine lead to the mind-body problem; the epistemological commitments of the Official Doctrine lead to the problem of other minds. According to the traditional view, bodily processes are external and can be witnessed by observers, but mental processes are private, “internal” as it is metaphorically described (since mental processes are not supposed to be locatable anywhere). Mental processes or events are supposed, on the official view, to be played out in a private theatre; such events are known directly by the person who has them either through the faculty of introspection or the “phosphorescence” of consciousness. The subject of the mental states is, on this view, incorrigible—her avowals of her own mental states cannot be corrected by others—and she is infallible—she cannot be wrong about which states she is in.[7] Others can know them only indirectly through “complex and frail inferences” from what the body does.

But if all that is mental is to be understood in this way, it is unclear how we are justified in believing that others have the requisite episodes or mental accompaniments. It would be possible, on this view, for others to act as if they are minded, but for them to have none of the right “conscious experiences” accompanying their actions for them to qualify as such. Perhaps we are in much the same position as Descartes who thought it made sense to wonder whether such creatures are automata instead.

The problem of other minds is compounded by even more serious difficulties given certain assumptions about the way language works. Proponents of the Official Doctrine are committed to the view that mental discourse serves to designate items that carry the metaphysical and epistemological load of that doctrine.

The verbs, nouns and adjectives, with which in ordinary life we describe the wits, characters and higher-grade performances of the people with whom we have do, are required to be construed as signifying special episodes in their secret histories, or else as signifying tendencies for such episodes to occur. (1949a, 16-17)

Ryle's criticism of the Official Doctrine begins by pointing out an absurdity in its semantic consequences. If mental conduct verbs pick out “occult” causes then we would not be able to apply those verbs as we do; so something must be wrong with a theory of mental phenomena that renders so inadequate our everyday use of these verbs. For, according to the Official Doctrine

when someone is described as knowing, believing or guessing something, as hoping, dreading, intending or shirking something, as designing this or being amused at that, these verbs are supposed to denote the occurrence of specific modifications in his (to us) occult stream of consciousness. (1945, 17)

Ryle's criticism of the view is that if it were correct, only privileged access to this stream of consciousness could provide authentic testimony that these mental-conduct verbs were correctly or incorrectly applied. “The onlooker, be he teacher, critic, biographer or friend, can never assure himself that his comments have any vestige of truth.” And yet,

it was just because we do in fact all know how to make such comments, make them with general correctness and correct them when they turn out to be confused or mistaken, that philosophers found it necessary to construct their theories of the nature and place of minds. Finding mental-conduct concepts being regularly and effectively used, they properly sought to fix their logical geography. But the account officially recommended would entail that there could be no regular or effective use of these mental-conduct concepts in our descriptions of, and prescriptions for, other people's minds. (1949a, 17)

Ryle is often given credit for having shown some of the many difficulties in substance or Cartesian dualism. But the arguments in The Concept of Mind warn of difficulties for any account that takes mental conduct terms to discharge their explanatory role by signifying inner processes: whether irreducibly mental or at bottom physical. Ryle's target was not merely the ghostliness of the mental processes hypothesized by the Cartesian; it was their essential hidden-ness. The thrust of Ryle's polemic is that theories about the nature of the alleged referents of the mental concepts we employ in our ordinary everyday commonsense practices cannot make a mystery of this employment without threatening to rob the theories of their subject matter. Our practice of employing such mental concepts would be a complete mystery on a view that takes the “truth-makers” of our mental statements to be not only items within an occult (to others) stream of consciousness, but also on a view that takes them to be items within an occult (to most of us) series of computations or neurological events. Both picture the truth-makers of our claims about other minds or our ascriptions of mental predicates as hidden and thus in practice (if not in principle) as inaccessible.

7. The Intellectualist Legend

To highlight the general difficulties with Cartesianism is only part of Ryle's destructive strategy. The other part is to show how logical absurdities arise with one particular offshoot of the Official Doctrine: one he dubs “the intellectualist legend”. This involves the type-error or category mistake of supposing that what distinguishes certain performances from others that are perceptually similar (in one sense of ‘perceptual’) is the addition of some non-perceptual feature. The Official Doctrine construes this feature as a special mental accompaniment.[9] The intellectualist legend, accepting this construal of the Official Doctrine, says that intelligent or rational behaviour can be accommodated or explained by some sort of theoretical operations involving these hidden accompaniments. But if this is a mistake, it is a big one; for it is made not only throughout various sub-branches of philosophy but also in collaborating disciplines. (The idea, for example, that intelligence involves physically realised, (non-introspectible) theoretical (computational) operations is one of the founding blocks of the cognitive sciences.)

This picture of how rational abilities in general are to be explained, including the ability to speak a language, was called into question by Ryle in a number of early papers (especially in 1946a, ostensibly reworked as the second chapter of 1949a, and in 1946b and 1950). It was also called into question by Wittgenstein in his discussion of rules (Wittgenstein, §§143-155 and 179-202).

In broad brush-strokes, Ryle's argument-strategy against the supposition that generally intelligent or rational abilities can be explained in terms of prior theoretical operations (involving the apprehension of the relevant truths) is to exhibit how the supposition leads to logically vicious regresses. Intelligent behaviours cannot be explained, in general, by assuming that theoretical operations have gone on behind the scene, since those operations themselves can be intelligent or non-intelligent. The supposition that intelligent behaviour always requires prior (or even contemporaneous) theoretical operations launches a vicious regress of theoretical operations. Thus, it must be allowed that some intelligent behaviour is not the outcome of prior theoretical operations.

The role of the rules, standards, or norms that govern our practices should neither be exaggerated nor underestimated. For Ryle (as for Wittgenstein), rules are codifications or distillations of normative practices that are already up and running. As Ryle aptly quips,

[t]here were reasoners before Aristotle and strategists before Clausewitz. The application of rules of reasoning and strategy did not have to await the work of their codifiers. Aristotle and Clausewitz were, in fact, only able to extract these rules, because they were already being applied. (1946b, 233)

The crystallisation of performance-rules in rule-formulae is, in some cases, a product of studies in the methodology of the practices in which they have already been applied and not the condition of their being applied. In other words: there must be a way of applying a rule that does not require the prior consultation of an expression of that rule.

Close attention to the cases in which we credit someone for her performance shows that it is often enough for her (merely) to have satisfied certain criteria or for her performance to have lived up to the relevant standard. Close attention to the cases in which we require not only that she satisfy certain criteria but also that she apply the criteria by using an expression of a rule to guide her shows that the latter is in fact a separate skill, which we only sometimes (but importantly not always) demand of the one we wish to credit for her performance.[10]

The ability to apply criteria in order to ensure that one's performance is successful is like showing a ticket in order to ensure one's right to travel by rail (1950, 239-40). It would be a category mistake to imagine that the ticket itself plays a role in the explanation of the train journey on the same level as the pistons, levers, and tracks. So, too, would it be a category mistake to imagine that reasons, for example, play a role in the explanation of action on (almost) the same level as the internal processes that explain (in a different sense) the body's motions; or that meanings or understandings play a role in the explanation of language use on (almost) the same level as the internal processes that explain (again, in a different sense) vocalisations. But just this type of category error seems to be made by those who construe the relevant mental phenomena, including understanding, as inner causal events.[11]

8. Behaviourism

Ryle's view is standardly characterised as a weaker or “softer” version of this doctrine (Smith and Jones, 144). According to this standard interpretation, Ryle's view is that statements containing mental terms can be translated, without loss of meaning, into subjunctive conditionals about what the individual will do in various circumstances. So Ryle (on this account) is to be construed as offering a dispositional analysis of mental statements into behavioural ones. It is conceded that Ryle does not confine his descriptions of what the agent will do (under the circumstances) to purely physical behaviour—in terms, say, of skeletal or muscular descriptions—but is happy to speak of full-bodied actions like scoring a goal or paying a debt.[14] But the “soft” behaviourism attributed to Ryle still attempts an analysis (or translation) of mental statements into a series of dispositional statements which are themselves construed as subjunctive conditionals describing what the agent will do (albeit under the relevant action description) under various circumstances. Even this “soft” behaviourism is bound to fail, however, since mentalistic vocabulary is not analysable or translatable into behavioural statements even if these are allowed to include descriptions of actions. For the list of conditions and possible behaviour will be infinite since any one proffered translation can be defeated by slight alteration of the circumstances; and the defeating conditions in any particular case may involve a reference to facts about the agent's mind, thereby rendering the analysis circular. In sum, the standard interpretation of Ryle construes him as offering a somewhat weakened form of reductive behaviourism whose reductivist ambitions, however weakened, are nonetheless futile.

But this characterisation of Ryle's programme is simply wrong. Although it is true that Ryle was keen to point out the dispositional nature of many mental concepts, it would be wrong to construe him as offering a programme of analysis of mental predicates into a series of subjunctive conditionals. The relationship between mental predicates and the “hypothetical” and “semi-hypothetical” sentences with which we can “unpack” them is other than that required by this kind of analysis.

It will be helpful to keep in mind that Ryle's target is the Official Doctrine with its attendant ontological, epistemological, and semantic commitments. His arguments serve to remind us that we have in a large number of cases ways of telling or settling disputes, for example, about someone's character or intellect. If you dispute my characterisation of someone as believing or wanting something, I will point to what he says and does in defending my particular attribution (as well as to features of the circumstances). But our practice of giving reasons of this kind to defend or to challenge ascriptions of mental predicates would be put under substantial pressure if the Official Doctrine were correct.

For Ryle to remind us that we do, as a matter of fact, have a way of settling disputes about whether someone is vain or whether she is in pain is much weaker than saying that a concept is meaningless unless it is verifiable; or even that the successful application of mental predicates requires that we have a way of settling disputes in all cases. Showing that a concept is one for which, in a large number of cases, we have agreement-reaching procedures (even if these do not always guarantee success) captures an important point, however: it counts against any theory, say, of vanity or pain that would render it unknowable in principle or in practice whether or not the concept is correctly applied in every case. And this was precisely the problem with the Official Doctrine (and is still a problem, as I suggested earlier, with some of its contemporary progeny).

Ryle points out in a later essay that there is a form of dilemma that pits the reductionist against the duplicationist[15]: those whose battle cry is “Nothing but…” and those who insist on “Something else as Well…”. Ryle attempts a dissolution of these types of dilemma by rejecting the two horns; not by taking sides with either one, though part of what dissolution requires in this case, as in others, is a description of how both sides are to be commended for seeing what the other side does not, and criticised for failing to see what the other side does.

The attraction of behaviourism, he reminds us, is simply that it does not insist on occult happenings as the basis upon which all mental terms are given meaning, and points to the perfectly observable criteria that are by and large employed when we are called upon to defend or correct our employment of these mental terms. The problem with behaviourism is that it has a too-narrow view both of what counts as behaviour and of what counts as observable. The attraction of Cartesianism is that it recognizes in a way the behaviourist does not that there may be crucial differences between creatures who—on a certain restrictive notion of behaviour—do indeed behave identically. The problem with Cartesianism is that it attempts to account for these differences by hypothesizing the existence of occult or hidden causes.

In an attempt to defeat the Cartesian or Platonist and remind us that mental predicates have perfectly ordinary standards of application, Ryle focuses on what is observable. It is part of his war against what is not only occult (and observable only through introspection) but also against what is hidden from the viewpoint of a third-party observer. But, in focussing on what is observable, he does not commit himself to reducing what is observable itself to sequences of “muscular behaviour”. Those who attribute to Ryle a “soft” behaviourism are at least correct that the reminders he issues to ward off Cartesianism include frank appeal to what he later will describe as actions much higher up on the “sophistication ladder” like paying a bill, or scoring a goal, as well as to what he will later call “concrete”, “per se”, or “infra” doings like scribbling numbers on a cheque book or kicking a ball between two posts.

Surely, as his earlier critics pointed out (and as those who see him as a behaviourist ignore) some of the phenomena he allows will reintroduce a realm of private occurrences (dreams and imaginings will be the paradigm case). But as Ayer suspects, this sort of “ghost” is an honest ghost. Not simply (as Ayer suggests) because the phenomena do not command the stage of a private theatre: in the sense that no one else can tell us about them they are in that respect private.[16] As Ryle himself admits, “the technical trick of conducting our thinking in auditory word-images, instead of spoken words, does indeed secure secrecy for our thinking…” (1949a, 35).

It is an “honest ghost” since privacy or secrecy of certain episodes will not lead to privacy for them all; and thus the epistemological concomitant to the Official Doctrine that would lead to the problem of other minds is not a threat. Nor does this sort of privacy usher in the semantic consequences of the Official Doctrine. The privacy attending our dreams and imaginings does not impugn our right to draw on observable (in the robust sense of the term) phenomena to defend our right to employ mental predicates for a large number of cases, for “this secrecy is not the secrecy ascribed to the postulated episodes of the ghostly shadow-world” (1949a, 35).

There will indeed be cases in which only the agent can say whether she is pondering, imagining, dreaming, letting her mind wander, calculating, solving, planning, or rehearsing. But the sort of privacy in which only she can say whether she was doing any of these or other particular things is not the sort of privacy that gives rise to philosophical conundrums like the problem of other minds and the problem of necessarily private languages. On the contrary, the ability to describe one's dreams (as well as one's sensations) presupposes a language whose terms have established and public criteria for their correct use.

9. Dispositions

A constant irritant for Ryle, throughout his writings, is “the preposterous assumption that every true or false statement either asserts or denies that a mentioned object or set of objects possesses a specified attribute” (1949a, 115).[17] As an example of a kind of sentence whose primary job is other than fact-stating, consider laws. Although we speak of law-sentences as true or false, “they do not state truths or falsehoods of the same type as those asserted by the statements of fact to which they apply or are supposed to apply” (1949a, 116-7). The way to bring out the difference is to note that part of the point of trying to establish laws is to find out how to infer from particular matters of fact to other particular matters of fact, how to explain particular matters of fact by reference to other matters of fact, and how to bring about or prevent particular states of affairs.

A law, Ryle tells us, is “an inference ticket (a season ticket) which licenses its possessors… to move from one assertion to another, to provide explanations of given facts, and to bring about desired states of affairs by manipulating what is found existing or happening” (1949a, 117).

A dispositional sentence such as ‘Jones believes the earth is round’ is unlike a law-sentence insofar as it mentions an individual, Jones. But it is like a law-sentence insofar as its role is not (or not primarily) one of describing or reporting, or stating that some object has such-and-such an attribute or stands in such-and-such a relation with another object. Its “truth-maker”, to use a contemporary expression, has to be understood in terms of what would satisfy it as opposed to what it purportedly describes.[18] What would satisfy a law is not specified or mentioned in the law-sentence; similarly, what would satisfy a disposition is not specified or mentioned in the disposition-sentence. Nor could it be. What would satisfy ‘Jones believes the earth is round’ is an open-ended (infinite) list of inferrings, imaginings, saying, and doings (etc.) on the part of Jones (1949a, 44). (And note again, a propos of behaviourism, that if ‘imagining’ is construed in one of its ordinary senses, as something someone may be doing just by sitting, unmoving, with his hand on his chin, there is explicit reference to an irreducible-to-behaviour mental occurrence in this specification of what would satisfy the sentence as well as the explicit denial of the finiteness of the long list that would unpack the sentence by alluding to its satisfaction conditions.)

Ryle suggests that ‘John knows French’ is a warrant which gives us the right to infer that John understands what he reads in Le Monde or that he is communicating successfully when telephoning in French. Immediately on specifying what we are entitled to do with the inference ticket ‘John knows French’, Ryle admits that the examples of what would satisfy the sentence are too precise, for

[w]e should not withdraw our statement that he knows French on finding that he did not respond pertinently when asleep, absentminded, drunk, or in a panic; or on finding that he did not correctly translate highly technical treatises. We expect no more than that he will ordinarily cope pretty well with the majority of ordinary French-using and French-following tasks. ‘Knows French’ is a vague expression and, for most purposes, none the less useful for being vague. (1949a, 119)

To adopt a couple contemporary turns of phrases, the warrants or inference tickets provided are therefore pro tanto and occasion-sensitive. The latter is yet another feature of Ryle's view that puts him at a safe distance from ideals of analytical behaviourism.

Ryle concedes that what he says about dispositions is likely to be contested by the “addicts of the superstition that all true indicative sentences either describe existents or report occurrences” (1949a, 119). How could the statement ‘This wire conducts electricity’ be true unless there were something now going on, albeit unfortunately behind the scenes? But consider Ryle's argument against this. Even those who are attracted by this picture will have to admit that we often do know that a wire conducts electricity, that an individual knows French, that a person is proud, that a sugar cube is soluble, without having discovered anything in the appropriate sense “hidden” (read: accessible via introspection or laboratory experiment). In any case what would be the point or the theoretical utility of discovering what is hidden? Ryle suggests the utility would consist only in its entitling us to do just that predicting, explaining, and modifying which we already do and often know that we are entitled to do. Even if these postulated processes were conceded, they themselves are hypotheses or inferences (to the “best explanation”): things the existence of which are inferred from the fact that we can predict, explain, and modify the observable actions and reactions of individuals. So if a theorist demands actual “rails” to ground ordinary inferences, this theorist will have to provide some further “rails” to justify his own peculiar inference (to the best explanation) from the legitimacy of ordinary inferences to the purported “rails” that he supposes to ground them. “The postulation of such an endless hierarchy of ‘rails’ could hardly be attractive even to those who are attracted by its first step” (1949a, 120).

10. Self-knowledge

The editors of a recent volume on self-knowledge write:

Each of us effortlessly knows an enormous amount about those of our attributes which go with our rationality, sentience, and affective susceptibilities: our beliefs, hopes, desires, and fears, whether we have a headache or an itchy toe, whether we are elated or depressed, whom we love and hate, what attracts or repels us. (Wright, et. al., 1)

Whereas knowledge of others' sensations, emotions, and intentional states demands reliance on independently articulatable grounds, self-knowledge is, by contrast, characteristically immediate. This immediacy is already enough to be philosophically perplexing, but not only do we know differently from others what we think, hope, and feel, we are also, in normal circumstances, regarded as knowing best. Furthermore, if we do enjoy certain mental attributes, we are expected to know that we do: our mental states are salient to us. According to the editors, “[t]hese three features of the epistemology of self-knowledge—immediacy, authority, and salience— combine to set a certain explanatory problem…”.

To what extent does this explanatory puzzle arise because of a tacit allegiance to Cartesianism? We have already seen how the epistemological consequences of the Official Doctrine lead to the problem of other minds. The other side of the Cartesian coin seems to put us in an especially privileged position with respect to our own minds. For, if ascribing mental predicates to others is problematic, according to the Official Doctrine, ascribing them to ourselves is problem-free. Immediacy, authority, and salience are features of the epistemology of self-knowledge that the Cartesian view is best-placed to accommodate.

Ryle would see this contemporary expression of the problem of self-knowledge as a result of the conflation of various suspect philosophical tendencies. One of these has its roots in the epistemological strand of the Official Doctrine; another is the tendency of philosophers to underestimate the many-layered complexity of mental discourse. This includes the refusal to acknowledge that the same sentence may have different “elasticities” or kinds of jobs, as well as the tendency to favour sentence-jobs of informing, describing or reporting over those, for example, of explaining, exhorting, encouraging, or admonishing.

For if self-knowledge is to be construed as a sort of perception of inner states or events that are (by the special faculty of introspection or by the “refulgence” of consciousness) “visible” to me but not to others, then Cartesianism, though seeming to leave knowledge of our own minds intact, instead presents an untenable picture of what this “knowledge” can be. Sorting out this confusion puts what can genuinely be called self-knowledge on relative parity with other-knowledge. It will also leave room for the importance of “unstudied talk”, “ego-pronouncements”, or “avowals”, which do enjoy protection from epistemic criticism. But once the nature of this protection is understood, philosophical perplexity should be extinguished, not kindled.

Ryle accepts the sort of privacy or secrecy that attends our dreams, imaginings and silent soliloquies and he concedes that besides the dispositional one there is another sense of ‘know’ which has to do with what a person is presently thinking, feeling or doing. He does not deny the existence of mental processes of this kind (again, a reason to resist calling him a ‘behaviourist’); nor does he deny that I am the only one in position to say what, for example, my musings, ponderings, or dreams are about. Nor does Ryle deny that usually when we witness something, or feel something, or act in such-and-such a way we are able, when asked, to give a correct account of it. He denies, rather, that either the “luminous” or “refulgent” view of consciousness or one that buys into the intellectualist legend is required to accommodate this ability. He acknowledges that the concept of visualizing, imagining, or “seeing” in the mind's eye, and “hearing” in the mind's ear are useful concepts. He denies that these uses commit us to the existence of pictures or images that we contemplate or tunes that we hear: rather than construe someone who pictures his nursery as the spectator of a resemblance of his nursery, he should be construed as resembling a spectator in his nursery (1949a, 234).

Ryle's discussion of avowals introduces, in effect, a different elasticity in our use of ‘know’, when we say, for example, that usually a person knows what she is on about. This has to do with her propensity to avow moods, feelings, inclinations, intentions, desires, and so forth. One striking feature of avowals is that they seem to enjoy a special kind of security from epistemic assessment or criticism. “How do you know?” or “I think you must be mistaken” or “You have been careless in your observations” do not make sense as rejoinders to avowals. For Ryle,

[i]f the avowal [“I feel depressed”] is to do its job, it must be said in a depressed tone of voice; it must be blurted out to a sympathizer, not reported to an investigator. Avowing “I feel depressed” is doing one of the things, namely one of the conversational things, that depression is the mood to do. It is not a piece of scientific premises-finding, but a piece of conversational moping. (1949a, 99)

Ryle warns against construing the fact that avowals are unassailable as indicating that there is special kind of knowledge in play. From the fact that these utterances are protected from epistemic assessment or criticism it does not follow that we have a special kind of knowledge about them; any more, says Ryle, than it follows from the fact that someone is not a quack doctor that he is a good doctor: for he may not be a doctor at all (1993b, 216). For with the idea of knowledge comes the idea of truth, of justification, of representation, of description, of taking closer looks, etc.

The standards for assessing “ego-pronouncements” run along lines of sincerity/insincerity where these in turn are cashed out in terms of lying, feigning (for fun), acting (in a play), putting on (for sympathy), etc. When lying, feigning, etc., are ruled out, then someone's saying so may be on some particular occasion what justifies us in accepting or what gives us a reason to accept what he says. The question of his being wrong (as measured against some additional standard) may not arise. If he is not wrong in saying that he is in pain (because he can only be lying or insincere in the ways that we are imagining have been ruled out) it does not follow that he has a special kind of knowledge. Rather, it would be more appropriate to say that questions of knowledge are here out of place. The discussion of avowals, then, illustrates yet another elasticity or sentence-job for certain mental expressions. None of this is to deny that “I am in pain”, for example, may have a use which, on some occasion, counts as a description. Indeed, it may be both a description and a complaint (1993a, 214).

Many contemporary discussions in philosophy of mind and self-knowledge, accepting a modern variant of the assumptions of Cartesianism, are committed to the view that in using mental predicates, we (or the subject) attribute(s) to the subject a mental state or condition of which her subsequent behaviour is a causal, contingent manifestation. But once the assumption is made that mental verbs function to pick out such underlying states or properties, then seemingly incompatible demands are placed upon these states and the traditional philosophical problem of self-knowledge is revealed. Construed as speaking from and expressing an occurrent state the speaker is authoritative; construed as speaking from or referring to a dispositional state she is not.

In Ryle's (and in Wittgenstein's) hands, pointing to the non-descriptive use of an utterance such as “I intend to go to the store” or “I am bored” is supposed to put to rest the mystery of the avower's authority (on those occasions when she is authoritative); it is not supposed to invite the development of a philosophical account to explain it. It constitutes a step not only in rebutting the Cartesian's accommodation of this authority, but also in denying that there is only one use of the relevant expression—namely, to designate a state, occurrence, or property—in the first place.

11. Thinking

Ryle's express target in The Concept of Mind was the Cartesianism of the Official Doctrine, and the ontological, epistemological and semantic predicament we would be confronted with if the view were correct. Because of this target, many of his reminders about how mental expressions are used point to the kinds of circumstances and performances that would satisfy them: often these include what others suitably trained have no trouble seeing. But he was dissatisfied that in this work he left out some of the cardinal uses of concepts of thinking, in which there may be no performances for others to witness. Certainly, the concept of thinking applies to observable performances. But it also applies to the many thinking-activities we may imagine of Rodin's Le Penseur who is merely sitting on a rock with his chin in his hand. Ryle's professed long-range objective in much of his later work was to come to an understanding of the various sorts of thinking qua pensive without committing either the “Category-howler of Behaviourism or the Category-howler of Cartesianism” (1979a, 17). In these later articles, he suggests that what is needed besides the choice between “not muscular, therefore inner” or “not inner, therefore muscular” is a way of enlarging the domain of the mental so that it includes not only actions or performances but also certain omissions or failures to act that are conceived on a relatively high step of the ladder of sophistication of mental discourse (1979c, 119).

Like all or at least most philosophically interesting concepts, Ryle thought there was no general answer to the question ‘What does thinking consist of?’ (any more that there is a general answer to the question ‘What does working consist of?’).

When we start to theorise about thinking, we naturally hanker to follow the chemist's example, namely, to say what thinking consists of and how the ingredients of which it consists are combined…. But modelling thinking on processes like perspiring, digesting, counting, and apple-picking, which can be broken down into ingredient processes which have been coordinated in a certain way is a mistake…. (1951b, 260)

There is a host of widely different sorts of toiling and idlings, engaging in any one of which is thinking.

Ryle rejects the view that thinking is symbol manipulation: indeed, he denies that words, phrases or sentences are symbols, if symbols are to be understood as proxies or as representations for something else (perhaps that which the word is alleged to designate). Thinking, in the sense of pondering, calculating, and musing, is not reserved for the labour of trying to decide things. Nor do we reserve the title ‘thinking’ for inner processes. An architect can think out his plan while manipulating toy bricks as can a sculptor plan a statue in marble by modelling a piece of plasticine. Additional labours might be necessary to put these plans into words. In general, thinking should not be equated with using language.

Our ordinary ways of describing our ponderings and musings tend to be graphic and not literal. They should be histories, not chronicles, and as such the plot should be told in abstraction from any particular stream-of-consciousness reports of detail we may recall. In only some cases of thinking the accomplishment of a task, if there is one, involves the thinker's being equipped to declare his policy, scheme or theory. But there can be thinking where there is no talking or even the attempt to talk. Mozart's thinking results in something playable, not statable; Cezanne may make mistakes but is not in error. A symphony is not composed in English or German, it has no translation, and there is no evidence for or against it. Thus, although it is an important truth that the products of thinking may be publishable truths or falsehoods (and not unshareable introspectibles), this is true for only some types of thinking (1979b, 85).

When the thinking does result in propositions or sayings, however, the temptation is on the one hand toward excessive inflation, and on the other toward excessive deflation. For the result is not merely a string of words linked together in a grammatically well-formed sentence. In recognising this truth, however, we are tempted toward the view that bits of language are only necessary as the interpersonal vehicles of objective Meanings that are thinkable, in principle, to any hearers or readers of any nationalities.

These Meanings are for the Duplicationist those significance-cargoes that are carried indifferently by your French and my English internal locutions—though the challenge to exhibit to his Reductionist critic even one such cargo, prised off its French or English vehicle, is as usual unwelcome to him. (1979b, 87)

Ryle's solution is to reject the vehicle-cargo model. In owning a penny, the duplicationist is right in saying I own more than a mere metallic disc; but the reductionist is also right in rejecting the idea that I own two things: a mere disc and a non-metallic, unpocketable yet marketable cargo. The word I employ is not a noise and something else as well; nor is just a noise. In learning a word's meaning, I become enabled to conduct with it a host of inter alia informative, calculative, recording, anagram-solving, and versifying transactions of quite specific kinds. Just as a penny is not just a disc and nor is it a disc and something else as well, so a word is not just noise, but nor is it a noise and something else as well. The penny is an institutionally-qualified enabling instrument that I can use for specific sorts of transactions. The word is a complexly qualified noise, endowed with a quite specific saying-power, endowed by institutional regulations, accumulating public custom, pedagogic disciplines, and so on. The formulation of the qualifications of both penny and word would “require not just some simple auxiliary nouns, simple adjectives or simple verbs but a whole batch of syntactically variegated subordinate clauses” (1979b, 88).

Even if it is true that Le Penseur is saying things to himself, this description fails because it stops just where it ought to begin. ‘Murmuring syllables’ to himself is the thinnest possible description of what he is engaged in. A thick description may be that he is trying to find out whether or not the things that he is saying will lead him where he wants to go:

…in his pondering, reflecting, deliberating, etc., the thinker is not guiding himself anywhere, but trying to find out whether this or that track of his own making would or would not qualify as a guiding, as opposed to a mis-guiding, or non-guiding, track. (1968, 494)

Exploring is on a higher-sophistication level than piloting; and piloting is on a higher sophistication level than following a pilot's lead. If Le Penseur is trying to find the proof of a new theorem then he is working on a higher accomplishment-level than he is in trying to teach his student his proof when he has got it; just as trying to teach it is on a higher-sophistication level than that on which his students are working in trying to master it.

On its thinnest description, Le Penseur may be muttering to himself a few geometrical words or phrases, just as on its thinnest description a penny is a piece of metal. But to say that that is not all he is doing (or that that is not all the penny is) is consistent with saying it is the only thing he is doing or with denying that the penny is a piece of metal and something else as well.

A statesman signing his surname to a peace-treaty is doing much more than inscribe the seven letters of his surname, but he is not doing many or any more things. He is bringing war to a close by inscribing the seven letters of his surname. (1968, 496)

Thinking can be saying things to oneself under a thin description. Under a thicker description it may be saying things to oneself with the specific heuristic intention of trying to open one's eyes or consolidate one's grasp. It is this specific, experimental intention that is obliterated, Ryle tells us, by sweeping generic slogans such as “Thought is Language” or “Thinking is Saying Things to Oneself”, whether or not this is supplemented by “…and Something Else as Well.” The adverb ‘experimentally’ adds not an extra action but the intention-to-find-out-what-happens-when…. Neither the Reductionist nor the Duplicationist (the Behaviourist or the Cartesian) can account for the adverb ‘experimentally’.

They had tried to tell us what pondering is, eluding that little knot of subordinate clauses, such as ‘…in order to…’, ‘what happens…’, and ‘…when..’ without which the notion of experimenting cannot be unpacked; no more than burglary, treaty-signing, or goal-scoring can deliberately be described in simple adjectives plus simple verbs, whether mundane or transcendent. What qualifies an undertaking as one of pondering or, not very differently, as one of discussing, is not any catalogue of simple qualities and simple relations, whether rude or refined, but some nexus of statable because statement-shaped conditions. (1979b, 82)

12. Afterword

This has been a short tour through but a patch of the rich philosophical landscape that Ryle has charted, concentrating on the philosophy of language and mind. Left out are a number of themes and interests of Ryle, for example, his discussion of traditions in Philosophy from Plato, through the Phenomenological tradition and the work of Bretano, Husserl, and then Heidegger, through the trenchant exposition of Wittgenstein's Tractatus, to his criticism of Carnap, to Collingwood, and Anderson. I have not commented on his dissolution of philosophical problems he presented in his Tarner Lectures; nor have I been able to include discussions on morality, feelings, pleasure, the self, and much more. Nor is this reading of Ryle a standard one: even many of his students interpreted him as a behaviourist and irrealist. I hope it is enough, however, to raise the possibility that his work has been widely misunderstood, is presently underestimated, and that he has a lot to contribute to today's debates.


Primary Literature

Here is a list of Ryle's works cited in this entry.

In 2009, Routledge published the 60th anniversary edition of The Concept of Mind, together with Ryle's Collected Papers (Volumes 1 and 2). The latter included a critical introduction, forward and preface by the author of this entry.

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

analysis | behaviorism | categories | dualism | functionalism | identity theory of mind | other minds | physicalism | pleasure | propositions | self-knowledge | Wittgenstein, Ludwig


This article uses material from my Re-thinking Ryle, in progress; “Une Cartographie des Concepts Mentaux”, Critical Introduction to Gilbert Ryle's La Notion d'Esprit, Payot, Paris, 7-70; and from my review of Dorit Bar-On's Speaking My Mind: Expression and Self-Knowledge, Mind, vol. 116, no. 463 (July), 727-732. I am grateful to the University of Kent and to the Arts and Humanities Research Council, UK for research leave to work on this project. Thanks to John Flower for his assistance and Tom Baldwin for helpful suggestions.