Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Bruno Bauer

First published Thu Mar 7, 2002; substantive revision Fri Dec 11, 2009

Bruno Bauer (1809–1882), philosopher, historian, and theologian. His career falls into two main phases, divided by the Revolutions of 1848. In the 1840s, the period known as the Vormärz or the prelude to the German revolutions of March 1848, Bauer was a leader of the Left-Hegelian movement, developing a republican interpretation of Hegel, which combined ethical and aesthetic motifs. His theory of infinite self-consciousness, derived from Hegel's account of subjective spirit, stressed rational autonomy and historical progress. Investigating the textual sources of Christianity, Bauer described religion as a form of alienation, which, because of the deficiencies of earthly life, projected irrational, transcendent powers over the self, while sanctioning particularistic sectarian and material interests. He criticized the Restoration state, its social and juridical base, and its orthodox religious ideology. Analyzing the emergence of modern mass society, he rejected liberalism for its inconsequent opposition to the existing order, and for its equation of freedom with property, but he accused socialism of an inadequate appreciation of individual autonomy. After the defeats of 1848, Bauer repudiated Hegel. He predicted a general crisis of European civilization, caused by the exhaustion of philosophy and the failure of liberal and revolutionary politics. New prospects of liberation would, he believed, issue from the crisis. His late writings examined the emergence of Russia as a world power, opening an era of global imperialism and war. These writings influenced Nietzsche's thinking on cultural renewal. Friedrich Engels and Karl Kautsky claimed Bauer's religious criticism for the socialist movement, while the anti-traditionalist conservatism and anti-Semitism of his late work link him to the revolutionary right in the twentieth century.

1. Career

In 1815, Bauer's family moved to Berlin from Eisenberg in Thuringia, south-eastern Germany. At the University of Berlin (1828–1834), he studied under Hegel, Schleiermacher, and the Hegelians Hotho and Marheineke. On Hegel's recommendation, Bauer's 1829 essay on Kant's aesthetics won the Prussian royal prize in philosophy. From 1834 to 1839, he lectured on theology and biblical texts in Berlin. He was transferred to the theology faculty at Bonn after publishing an attack on his colleague and former teacher Hengstenberg. He taught in Bonn from 1839 till spring 1842, when he was dismissed for the unorthodoxy of his writings on the New Testament. The dismissal followed a consultation by the ministry of education with the theology faculties of the six Prussian universities, but no consensus emerged from the academic inquest. The order for Bauer's dismissal came directly from the King of Prussia, Friedrich Wilhelm IV, who had decreed the suspension from state employment of participants in a banquet to honour the South German liberal Karl Welcker, held in Berlin in 1841. On that occasion, Bauer had proposed a toast to Hegel's conception of the state.

From 1842 to 1849, Bauer was active in political journalism and historical research on the Enlightenment and the French Revolution. He argued against the emancipation of Prussian Jews in 1842–43, seeing this proposal as a political legitimation of particular religious interests. He was the object of polemical attacks by Marx and Engels in The Holy Family (1844) and The German Ideology (written in 1845–46). With his brother Edgar, Bauer founded the Charlottenburg Democratic Society in 1848, and stood unsuccessfully for election to the Prussian National Assembly on a platform of popular sovereignty.

Remaining in Prussia after the defeats of 1848–49, Bauer continued to produce work of biblical criticism and political analysis. He wrote in the mid 1850s for Die Zeit, a government-sponsored newspaper, in which his anti-liberalism took a conservative turn. He contributed articles on European affairs to other newspapers, such as Die Post, the Kleines Journal, and the New York Daily Tribune. From 1859–66 he collaborated with F.W.H. Wagener on his conservative Staats- und Gesellschafts-Lexikon, editing almost all 23 volumes, and writing numerous articles, several with anti-Semitic themes. In 1865 he acquired a small farm in Rixdorf, on the outskirts of Berlin. He died there in April 1882.

2. Bauer's Writings, 1829–50

Bauer was a prolific writer, publishing a dozen substantial books and over 60 articles between 1838 and 1848 alone, but no critical edition of these works exists. They included analyses of Hegel, the Bible, modern theologies, the Enlightenment, and the French Revolution and its aftermath. The interpretation of Bauer's work is problematic for several reasons. Because of anonymous, pseudonymous, and collaborative publication, some attributions are disputed; and divergences exist between Bauer's published texts and private correspondence. In the anonymous Trumpet of the Last Judgement (1841) and Hegel's Doctrine of Religion and Art (1842), Bauer spoke not in his own voice, but in the ironic guise of a conservative critic of Hegel, attributing to Hegel his own revolutionary views.

Three lines of interpretation of Bauer can be distinguished. These focus on his early work; his later writings have attracted little critical attention. The first sees Bauer as a radical subjectivist, whose social and religious criticism was closer to Enlightenment rationalism than to Hegel (Sass, 1978; Brudney, 1998). The second, largely influenced by Marx, insists on Bauer's abandonment of the Hegelian left after 1843 (Rossi, 1974; Pepperle, 1978). The third emphasizes the continuity throughout the Vormärz of Bauer's thought and of his republicanism, based on the Hegelian idea of the unity of thought and being (Moggach, 2003, 2006).

Bauer's prize manuscript of 1829, De pulchri principiis, presented the unity of concept and objectivity as the central idea of Hegel's idealism. It examined this unity as expressed in art, comparing Hegel's aesthetic theory to Kant's Third Critique. The manuscript supplemented the criticisms of Kant from Hegel's Berlin Aesthetics lectures with the logical analysis of categories provided by the 1827 Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences. Bauer argued that while the Critique of Judgement attempted to bridge the gap between thought and being, and thus opened the way to Hegel, it reproduced the antinomies characteristic of the first two critiques. Kant's synthesis failed, since he continued to define the concept as merely subjective, and the object as the unknowable thing-in-itself, transcending the cognitive power. Self-consciousness, or the subject of the transcendental unity of apperception, was likewise impervious to cognition from the Kantian standpoint. In Hegel's syllogisms of the idea, objectivity attained rational form, while the concept acquired an explicit, material existence. Beauty, life, and idea were moments in the process which constituted the actuality of reason. As the immediate unity of thought and objectivity, art illustrated the inexhaustible fecundity of the philosophical Idea. The manuscript underlined the opposition of faith and reason in its critique of the religious conceptions of the unity of thought and being. Faith was taken to be inimical to free inquiry, which is the element of reason.

Throughout the 1830s, however, Bauer sought to reconcile thought and being through the idea of rational faith. In Zeitschrift für spekulative Theologie, which he edited between 1836 and 1838, and in Jahrbücher für wissenschaftliche Kritik, he offered a speculative account of Christian doctrines as exemplifications of logical categories. In the 1838 Religion of the Old Testament, Bauer depicted religious experience as a product of self-consciousness. He proposed both a transcendental account, stressing the conditions of possibility of religious experiences, and a phenomenological sequence of their forms: a legalistic subordination to an authoritarian deity in the early books of the Old Testament expressed a merely external relation between God and man, while the messianic consciousness of later books heralded a higher form, the immanence of the universal in the community; but this consciousness could only point up the inadequacy of the law, not yet propose the effective overcoming of estrangement. The texts of the 1830s located the logical structure which, for Bauer, defined the religious consciousness: the immediate identity between particularity, whether of a subject or a community, and the abstract universal, a unity achieved without self-transformation. By 1839, Bauer deduced the political implications of this view: the religious consciousness asserted this immediate identity as a monopolistic, sectarian claim, excluding other particulars from equivalent status. The essence of religion for Bauer was now a hubristic particularism, which also conferred a transcendent status on the universal, as a realm divorced from concrete social relationships. This position received its fullest exposition in Bauer's Christianity Revealed (1843). He already sketched this argument in Herr Dr. Hengstenberg, of 1839, publicly breaking with orthodox and conservative versions of Christianity, and stressing the discontinuity between Christianity and Judaism. By 1840–41, Bauer would present the emancipated philosophical self-consciousness as opposed to all forms of religious representation. His political radicalism and republicanism were cemented by his recognition of the structural identity between the private interests fostered by the Restoration order, and the monopolistic religious consciousness.

Bauer's political and theoretical radicalization is evidenced in his biblical studies. The series is comprised of Critique of the Gospel of John (1840), and the three-volume Critique of the Synoptic Gospels (1840– 42). Together with his 1838 study of the Old Testament, these volumes criticized the stages of revealed religion, and forms of self-alienated spirit in history. Bauer's critique of John's gospel demonstrated the opposition between the free self-consciousness and the religious spirit. His stated purpose was to restore the Christian principle to its source in creative self-consciousness; he did not yet openly oppose the principle itself, but sought to differentiate it, as a rational idea, from ecclesiastical dogmatism. The positivity of Christianity derived from the abstract understanding, rather than from speculative reason, which led religious experience back to its subjective roots. The rational core of Christianity was the identity of God and man, but theology had built an untenable doctrinal system on this foundation. Speculation now undermined dogma; it was not confirmed by it, as Bauer's mid-1830s articles had maintained. In his correspondence, though not in this text itself, Bauer indicated that this restoration of the Christian principle was also its overthrow, as the unity of universal and particular could now be grasped in more tangible and earthly forms. Christianity was a necessary but now transcended stage in the development of the human spirit, to be supplanted by new expressions of autonomous self-consciousness.

In his critique of the Synoptics, Bauer's object was more openly to negate dogmatic Christianity, mobilized in defence of the absolutist order. The incidents described in the gospels were products of the religious consciousness, rather than factual reports. Bauer's critique of John convinced him that the gospel narrative was a purely literary product, and he now argued that the Synoptics too contained no historically authentic material. Bauer attempted to establish the historical priority of Mark, and the specific elaborations undertaken sequentially by Luke and Matthew. He depicted miracles as fallaciously displaying the immediate causality of the universal in nature, and criticized the naturalistic explanations favoured by theological rationalism. The third volume of the series denied the historicity of Christ. The Christian idea that God and mankind share the same essence appeared as the religious representation of a single empirical individual who assumed the universal power of spirit. Like his contemporaries D.F. Strauss and Ludwig Feuerbach, Bauer understood this synthesis instead as a project immanent in human history. As Bauer's political writings from this period show, he proposed that the assumption of universality, and the transcendence of particular interest, were historical tasks, undertaken by the state and the republican citizenry. In the Synoptics texts, Bauer explicitly equated Christianity and feudalism, and defended the freedom and equality of self-consciousness. Religion and the absolutist state were mutually sustaining, sharing the essential features of alienation and repression. Christianity represented the completion of the religious consciousness in pure abstraction, and the dissolution of all genuine ethical bonds. Bauer contended that Judaism presupposed the subordination of nature to religious interests, but still maintained the natural links of kinship and ethnicity. Christianity eliminated this limited Sittlichkeit in favour of the purely abstract self, thus perfecting alienation and requiring its definitive resolution.

The political application of the doctrine of self-consciousness can be traced through two texts on the state, also dating from 1840–41. In The Evangelical State Church of Prussia and Science, Bauer described the essence of the state as free development. The state was the dialectical agency of historical progress and of the universality of the will, manifesting the capacity to abstract from any given content and express itself in ever new forms. While signalling empirical tendencies which might limit the state's progressive function (the prominence of religious interests, and hesitancy before the social question, the emergence of new forms of urban poverty and exclusion), Bauer contended that the genuine state, as the expression of freedom, was in constant transformation. His surface claim was that the Prussian state is such an institution, though his contemporary correspondence belied this view. He defended the 1817 union of the Lutheran and Reformed churches in Prussia as the political overcoming of religious oppositions, whose basis had been eroded by the Enlightenment. Through its (still abstract) grasp of the universal concept of man, against religious particularity, the Enlightenment had transformed religious consciousness into self-consciousness. (This process formed one of the major themes of Bauer's Christianity Revealed, along with a critique of French materialism for its inadequate grasp of freedom). The churches were now impotent to perpetuate their own existence without the support of the state. Countering conservative historians like F.J. Stahl, who championed the independence of the churches, Bauer's “The Christian State and Our Times,” of 1841, again identified the state as the focus of ethical life. Stahl's position implied a derogation of the spirituality of the state, presenting it as an agency of external constraint, to uphold the orthodox ecclesiastical and political order against the flow of history, and to defend a social order governed by irrational privileges and immunities. Bauer denounced not only the Christian state of Friedrich Wilhelm IV, but also the formal Rechtsstaat, or liberal constitutionalism. For Bauer, both these positions defined freedom as private interest, religious or economic; but as particularity, these attitudes had to be purged away in the name of a new political order. Bauer maintained that Hegel's view of freedom as universality was far in advance of liberal views, even if the Philosophy of Right was inconsistent or incomplete. This was Bauer's provocative claim at the Welcker banquet of 1841, which occasioned his dismissal from the university. The elimination of egoistic atomism by moral self-consciousness was the pre-requisite for the republic, or the free state.

The anonymous Trumpet of the Last Judgement, or Posaune (November, 1841), and its sequel, Hegel's Doctrine of Religion and Art (1842), interpreted Hegel as sounding a call for revolution, to bring this state into being. Bauer claimed that the consequences of Hegel's system were the overthrow of church and state; and that Hegel's conservative critics were right to see him as the most dangerous adversary of the Restoration. Written ironically as pietistic denunciations, Bauer's two texts attributed to Hegel a theory of infinite self-consciousness, in which the concept of substance and a transcendent absolute were necessary but self-annulling illusions. Recapitulating the issue in his own voice in 1845, Bauer identified a tension in Hegel's thought between Spinoza and Fichte, between inert, undifferentiated substance and creative form. The Posaune, however, argued that the Spinozist moment, though necessary to Hegel's dialectic, was fully assimilated to infinite self-consciousness. In absolute spirit, properly understood, all religious pretensions dissipated, while the absolute itself dissolved into the critical activities of conscious individual subjects. Nothing transcendent remained. Yet, the Posaune recognized, Hegel also stressed the concept of substance. Its role had to be accounted for. In its apparent transcendence, substance disciplined the immediate, particular self. This was necessary because, as Hegel argued, particularity cannot be the criterion of theoretical or practical reason; rather, individuals must first internalize substance, as a principle of universality, as a stage in reaching infinite self-consciousness. The undifferentiated, pure universal of substance subsumed all particularity, including the self. This initial, Spinozist moment created an appearance of pantheism in Hegel, which misled interpreters like D. F. Strauss. In Bauer's depiction, however, Hegel proceeded to dissolve substantiality as a power independent of consciousness. This dialectical resolution was not equivalent to renouncing objectivity, but meant that substance, once it had demonstrated to the particular consciousness the need to transcend itself, might not claim an immediate validity either. Disciplining their own immediate interests, individuals could then become the organs through which the universal attained conscious form. The dialectical illusion of substance was a necessary stage, because in it the unity of concept and objectivity could first be glimpsed; but this illusion had to be overcome in further historical and theoretical development. The subject must appear as potentially universal, and the objective must show itself as a purposive order, responding to the subject's striving for rational freedom. This development entailed transforming substance into the record of the acts of conscious spirit, an inner relation of self-consciousness to itself. Subjectivity thus assimilated the principle of universality, which it now contained as its own character, not as something alien to it. But this relation was not confined to an inward experience, since, as Hegel maintained, reason must realize itself in the world. The externalization of reason produced a historical sequence, including the forms of alienated life. The stages in this sequence could be grasped as moments in the unfolding unity of thought and being. Bauer described self-consciousness, conceived as an immanent and subjective universality, as the motive force of history, generating historical content by taking up and transforming the given. As Bauer's 1829 manuscript had also declared, at stake was not only the subjective realisation of the concept, but the fate of the idea, the unity of thought and being; and this required that the objectivity of the historical process be equally emphasized. This historical and critical idealism, which the Posaune attributes to Hegel, was politically revolutionary: it affirmed the rights of free self-consciousness against any positive institution which could not justify its existence before rational thinking, against state, religion, and social hierarchy.

Bauer used his central concept of infinite self-consciousness, a term taken from Hegel's theory of subjective spirit, to reconfigure the Hegelian absolute, bringing art and philosophy into close proximity, and excluding religion as a form of alienated reason, while recognising its past historical necessity. Bauer insisted on the immanence of the universal in history, as the record of struggles for liberation, and of alienation, which was necessary to discover the meaning of rational autonomy. Bauer's ethical idealism resembles a doctrine that Kant calls perfectionism, or Vollkommenheit, a form of rational heteronomy, one of whose meanings is that action is validated by its contribution to historical progress. Bauer equated perfectionism and autonomy, as an uncompromising commitment to remodel political and social relations and institutions. Subjects acquired autonomy by freeing themselves from particular interests, and by repudiating transcendent universals, religious and political institutions which claimed to be underivable from self-consciousness, and exempt from history. Bauer denounced the ancien régime and its Restoration surrogates as a feudal system of tutelage and irrational privileges. Arrogating universality to itself, the authoritarian state which arose over these exclusive particulars thwarted the self-activity of its people, and concealed the source of its authority behind a veil of religious sanctification. Bauer maintained that the state, and not religion, was the principal adversary. Against this order of alienated spirit, he insisted that the decisive political question was the source of the state's authority, whether in tradition and religious sanction, or in the popular will. This question was to be resolved without compromise. Bauer asserted that his objective was not merely political, but social emancipation. The social question, the polarizations and crises of civil society to which Hegel had been alert, could be resolved not by direct appeals to the particular interests of one class, but by a common republican struggle against multiform privilege. The result of this combat would be the attainment of justice in all spheres of social life.

Two texts, dating from late 1842 and early 1843, The Jewish Question, and “The Capacity of Present-Day Jews and Christians to Become Free,” elaborate Bauer's critique of the religious consciousness and of political reformism. The consequence of their publication, however, was that Bauer forfeited his leading position in the opposition movement, as he challenged one of its central demands. The question was whether the explicitly Christian state of Prussia could eliminate restrictions on Jewish participation in civil institutions. While liberals and republicans advocated emancipation, conservative opponents defended the state's exclusive confessional allegiance. Bauer's interventions attacked the state for defending privilege, and claimed that it used religion as a mask for its interests in maintaining relations of subordination; but he also criticized Jews and their supporters for claiming freedom on the basis of a particular religious identity. Political and social freedom required the renunciation of all particularistic ties with the past; thus, as a precondition of juridical equality, Jews must renounce their religious allegiance, as must Christians. Christianity demonstrated a historically higher degree of consciousness, since it cancelled the externality of the deity. But this was not a unilateral progress upon Judaism, because Christianity, and especially Protestantism, generalized alienation to encompass all aspects of life. The superiority of Christianity consisted in its radical negativity, making requisite a transition to a new and higher form of ethical life. By exacerbating the contradiction between self-determination and self-abasement, the way was cleared for an epochal resolution. These interventions were censured by Marx, and by leading liberal spokesmen. Bauer remained adamant that his position was the correct progressive stance.

In his studies of the French Revolution and its impact on Germany, Bauer traced the emergence of mass society, based on conformity and inchoate particularism. The dissolution of the feudal estates by the Revolution produced a purely atomistic society, characterized by the assertion of individual property right. The attachment to private economic interest made impossible a concerted opposition to privilege and to the existing order, and had caused the ultimate defeat of the revolutions that had spawned it. The Jacobinism of the French Revolution, which Bauer in many ways endorsed, had been directed against this attitude, but had failed to overcome it; and this proprietary particularism now threatened the republican movement of the Vormärz. The masses, encompassing both the proletariat and the bourgeoisie, represented inertia and stagnation, and formed the bulwark of the existing order. Their opposition to this order was merely apparent. Liberalism unconsciously expressed this development of mass society, defining freedom as acquisition. Bauer criticized liberal constitutionalism as a vacillating, compromising attitude toward the feudal regime. Even in its most advanced form, that endorsed by Hegel, constitutionalism juxtaposed two diametrically opposed principles of sovereignty, popular and princely, and was unable to resolve the contention between them. Incipient socialism shared the same terrain as liberalism, the defence of private interest, but proposed inconsequent and unacceptable solutions to the conditions which liberalism simply affirmed. For Bauer, socialism was irredeemably heteronomous. The socialist movement, he claimed, sought to organize the workers in their immediate, particular existence, and not to transform them. He saw in the proletariat pure particularity, and, unlike Marx, denied that this particularity could transform itself into a genuine universal unless it first renounced its own sectional interests. Bauer also anticipated the negative effects of a socialist organization of labour. While criticizing capitalism for its irrational competitive forms, he defended the principle of competition itself as a necessary condition for progress, the independence of persons, and the possibility of conscious, free self-determination. Bauer's pre-1848 work revived the classical republican themes of the opposition of commerce and virtue, but gave them a new shape, consistent with his Hegelianism. In 1842–43, Bauer confidently predicted the triumph of republican principles and institutions, though this confidence waned as the political crisis deepened. In his two electoral addresses of 1848–49, he defended popular sovereignty and the right of revolution, demanding that the new constitution be promulgated as an act of revolutionary will, and not received as a concession from the king.

3. Bauer's Late Work, 1850–1882

While he continued to proclaim the continuity of his thought, Bauer's late work was characterized by the definitive abandonment of his Vormärz republicanism. The failure of 1848, he argued, demonstrated the bankruptcy of the European philosophical tradition. Instead of the triumph of republics, Bauer now foresaw an age of global imperialism. The decisive political question after 1848 was the rise of Russia. Bauer predicted that Russian pressure would promote a pan-European union, as a stage in a movement toward a global absolutism. The revolutionaries of 1848 still presupposed, uncritically, that states were independent units. The next historical period would initiate a genuine continental crisis. Anticipating Nietzsche, Bauer contended that the impending collapse of European civilisation would make possible a new beginning, a liberation from traditional forms and values, together with their metaphysical and religious sanctions. Bauer's abiding opposition to liberalism now induced him to collaborate in conservative causes; but his conservatism was unconventional. Like Nietzsche, he continued to repudiate tradition and religion. Because of his anti-Semitism, Bauer was claimed as a precursor by some National-Socialist authors, though Ernst Barnikol, for example, disputes a direct connection (Barnikol 1972, pp. 350–53).

For Bauer, the revolutions of 1848 were so closely connected with the Enlightenment, Kantian, and Hegelian projects that their failure sounded the death-knell of philosophy and its claims to rational individual autonomy. Bauer's late critique assimilated Hegel with Spinoza and the metaphysics of substance, understood as the negation of form and subjectivity. Unlike his Vormärz position, he asserted in texts of 1852 and 1853 that Hegel had yielded to the influence of Spinoza, effacing individuality, and submerging concrete particulars under illusory, abstract logical categories. Bauer now described the Hegelian idea as being itself a transcendent illusion. Its inability to admit concrete particulars derived from the substantiality of the system itself. The result was that Hegel had discounted individuality in favour of conformity. While prior to 1848 Bauer proclaimed that Hegel had taught “the republic and the revolution,” he now decried the absolutist tendencies of the Hegelian system, whose oppressive unity paralleled the historical trend toward an all-encompassing political despotism. Bauer accused philosophy of contributing to an inexorable process of levelling and uniformity in the post-revolutionary state (Bauer, Russland und das Germanenthum, I, pp. 40–54). These criticisms anticipated Rudolph Haym's polemic in Hegel und seine Zeit (1857).

In common with many post-1848 intellectuals, Bauer's abandonment of metaphysics led him to a new conception of critique as a positive science or empirical investigation. Bauer no longer contended that history represents an unfolding dialectic of self-consciousness. Critique was to permit the observer to examine historical phenomena without distortion or partiality, and without an a priori systemic concern. Bauer maintained that scientific research must remain independent of ecclesiastical and political tutelage. Its objective was to determine the relation of nature to rights and freedom of the will (concepts which the late Bauer retained, while rejecting their metaphysical foundations); but critique did not enjoin practical intervention in political affairs. The correct stance was now disinterested contemplation of the inevitable processes of cultural decay and regeneration, and an attempt to salvage one's own independence from the general wreckage of philosophical systems and political life.

The conclusion of this new critique was that the future belonged not to the republican people, or to separate national states, but to a transnational imperialism, involving the confrontation of two absolutist programmes. In one of these, the Western European, political absolutism arose over modern mass society as its necessary complement. Bauer had earlier criticized this configuration as an outmoded form of state, to be supplanted by the republic; he now described it as the result of an incomplete political development, which would issue in a contention for world domination. Within the Western European form, Bauer distinguished two variants: Bismarck's state socialism, imitating eighteenth-century Prussian militarism, attempted to subject economic production to political control, suppressing innovation and personal independence; while Disraeli's romantic imperialism sought to level and subordinate English society before a paternalistic monarchy. In opposition to the west, the second major absolutist form was that of Russia, a substantial power with limited internal distinctions. Its cohesiveness derived from the fusion of political and ecclesiastical power, and the absence of the modern idea of subjectivity. Bauer noted that Hegel had mistakenly discounted this zone from world history. Like the anarchist Michael Bakunin, Bauer claimed that Russia owed its original state formation to Germany; but Russia had otherwise been impervious to western philosophical influence, adopting only what served its immediate, concrete ends. Animated by hatred and shame of its past insignificance, Russia too was ambivalent. It did not directly provide the solution to the contemporary political crisis, but elicited a decisive struggle with the west. The vigour of an alien adversary would force Europe to transform itself, and offered the only remaining prospects of a cultural renewal. Preceding any such renewal would be the extension of imperialism across the continent and the globe, and the clash of rivals for dominance within the new empire. Bauer concluded that world war was inevitable.

Bauer's prognosis anticipated aspects of Karl Kautsky's 1915 theory of ultraimperialism, though without the latter's optimism that this trend heralded a reduction in conflicts among contenders for hegemony. Imperialism, moreover, did not stimulate, but hampered economic growth, since insecurity and permanent military mobilization undermined productive activity. The historic function of the globalizing process was to eliminate national identities, laying the basis for an eventual cosmopolitan rebirth. Bauer saw nationalism as a dissipated force. The emerging world order was framed not by the defence of national interests, but by a struggle for transnational supremacy among elites with no local loyalties. The growing centralization of political power was abetted by the levelling forces of the socialist movement, with its own internationalist pretensions. This trend also underlay what Bauer called political pauperism, a generalised disqualification of individuals from participation in political activity. The conclusion of this process would be to perfect mass society, which Bauer had analyzed since the 1840s. The principle of substance, non-differentiation, and conformity would reach its ultimate extension, and could then be overthrown. World imperialism would issue in an all-embracing catastrophe, the apocalyptic end of the old, Christian-Germanic order. Only then would new cultural possibilities emerge. Though these could not be predicted in detail, they would involve the emergence of an unprecedented creative individuality, freed from religious and metaphysical illusions.

Bauer likened the present crisis to the end of the classical world in Roman imperialism. His studies in the 1850s located the origins of Christianity in the second century CE, concluding that the first gospel was written under Hadrian (117–138 CE), though slightly predated by some of the Pauline epistles. Bauer traced the evolution of Christian ideas from Hellenism and Stoicism, deriving the logos doctrine of John's gospel from Philo and neo-Platonic sources. As in Herr Dr. Hengstenberg, he denied that Christianity had emerged directly from Judaism. More than in his early work, though, he now stressed the revolutionary power of the early Christian religion, as a source of liberation for the excluded and impoverished elements of the Roman Empire. His final book described Christianity as the socialist culmination of Greek and Roman history. Responding to this argument in his very positive obituary of Bauer, Friedrich Engels acknowledged the importance of Bauer's late work for the socialist critique of religion (Sozialdemokrat, 1882). In 1908, Karl Kautsky's book, The Origins of Christianity, applied Bauer's thesis.

Bauer's late writings identified sentiment and pietistic feeling-certainty, rather than autonomous reason, as the principal force in shaping modern subjectivity. His studies of the Quakers and of pietism described passive inwardness and sentiment as the dominant characteristics of the German Enlightenment. The practical reason of Kant and Fichte merely translated the inner voice of pietist conscience into a rationalist idiom. Bauer also described pietism as the end of Christianity, since it destroyed dogma in favour of inner illumination and personal moral rectitude. Consistent with his Christianity Revealed, Bauer continued to define positive or statutory religions by their exclusive dogmas and symbols; and he still saw the general course of history as dissipating these dogmas, as mere illusions. He discounted the mobilizing potential of religion in the modern imperial order. In the Posaune, he had denounced Schleiermacher's efforts to restore dogmatic Christianity through an appeal to feelings of dependency. Now he claimed that the force of sentiment, contrary to Schleiermacher's supposition, was to dissolve dogmatic religion into personal conviction. The new world empire would end with the inner erosion of religious belief. Not rational speculation, but sentiment, would effect this transformation.

A stringent anti-nationalism and a marked anti-Semitism characterized Bauer's later thought. He defended German culture against its political appropriation by the Prussian and Austrian regimes, but criticized its insufficiencies, in Goethe, for example, who remained enthralled to the metaphysical tradition. Bauer stressed that Germany was not a racial unit, but a historical and cultural artefact, reinforced by racial mixing, and not by racial purity (Barnikol 1972, p. 393). It is clear, however, that some elements were excluded from the mix: unlike his earlier treatment of the Jewish question as historical, cultural, and religious, he now asserted that a natural distinction of race created an impassable divide between Jews and Europeans (Bauer, “Present Position of the Jews,” 1852). His claim that the political significance of the Jews throughout the political spectrum was a testimony to the debility of European culture and to the approaching crisis was greeted by National-Socialist authors.

Bauer's late work contains prescient observations on globalization and world war, and has affinities with a variety of twentieth-century ideological forms, from socialism to imperialism and anti-Semitism. In contrast, his early work bespeaks an original, Hegelian republicanism, and offers cogent analyses of Restoration political thought and the rise of mass society. His intellectual legacy is complex and contentious.

In September 2009, on the occasion of Bauer's bicentenary, a three-day international conference was held at the Friedrich-Schiller-Universität, Jena, and in Bauer's nearby birthplace of Eisenberg. Disputed issues involved the content, continuity, and political bearing of Bauer's pre-1848 works, his relations with Karl Marx, Max Stirner, and other contemporaries, the question of his anti-Semitism, and his attitudes toward imperialism after 1848. The Proceedings of the conference will be published under the title Bruno Bauer: Ein ‘Partisan des Weltgeistes’?, ed. Klaus-M. Kodalle and Tilman Reitz, Königshausen und Neumann, Würzburg.


Major Works by Bruno Bauer, 1829–1882

Journals edited by Bruno Bauer

Secondary Sources

Books and Articles

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Feuerbach, Ludwig Andreas | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | idealism | Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | Marx, Karl | Stirner, Max