Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Ludwig Andreas Feuerbach

First published Fri Oct 3, 2003; substantive revision Tue Jul 31, 2007

Ludwig Feuerbach, along with Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Marx, and Nietzsche, must be counted among those philosophical outsiders who rebelled against the academic philosophy of the 19th century and thought of themselves as reformers and prophets of a new culture. Although he began his career as an enthusiastic follower of Hegel, he emerged in the 1840s as a leader of a group of radicals called the Young Hegelians who, inspired by the revolutionary political spirit sweeping over Europe, employed the critical side of Hegel's philosophy to undermine the reactionary alliance of philosophy, State, and Christianity in Prussia. But confronted by censorship, the police, and reprisals against them in the universities they turned against Hegel's philosophy altogether. Expelled from the faculties for which they were trained, many of them became pamphleteers, journalists, revolutionaries, and independent scholars.

Feuerbach is best known for his criticism of Idealism and religion, especially Christianity, written in the early forties. He believed that any progress in human culture and civilization required the repudiation of both. His later writings were concerned with developing a materialistic humanism and an ethics of human solidarity. These writings have been more or less ignored until recently because most scholars have regarded him primarily as the bridge between Hegel and Marx. With the recent publication of a new critical edition of his works, however, a new generation of scholars have argued that his mature views are philosophically interesting in their own right.

1. Life

Ludwig Feuerbach, (1804–1872) was born in Landshut, Bavaria into a distinguished family of five sons and three daughters. The father, who dominated the family, was a famous professor of jurisprudence who, although a political liberal and a Protestant, was knighted by the Bavaria court and revised its legal code. The eldest son, Joseph Anselm, became a noted archaeologist and was father of the famous German painter, Anselm Feuerbach, The second son, Edward, became a professor of jurisprudence, and the third, Karl, became a mathematician after whom a proof was named.

As a child Ludwig was very religious, but while attending the Gymnasium in Ansbach he was introduced by his tutor to the speculative Christian theology propounded by the Hegelian theologian Karl Daub at Heidelberg University. Determined to study theology, Feuerbach, with his father's permission, entered Heidelberg in 1823. The father, who despised Hegelianism, hoped that his son would become disenchanted with it when he encountered the teachings of his friend and rationalistic theologian, H.E.G. Paulus. But Feuerbach was immediately captured by the Hegelian project of Daub and disgusted with the lectures of Paulus. Still, he was troubled by the inability to reconcile his belief in a personal deity with the pure Vernunft of Hegelian philosophy. His sympathetic professor, Daub, recommended he resolve them by studying with the master in Berlin.

Apprehensive about gaining his father's permission to study with Hegel, Feuerbach pretended that he wanted to matriculate in Berlin in order to study with the famous theologian, Friedrich Schleiermacher. The father reluctantly agreed and Feuerbach arrived there in the Spring of 1824. It was indicative of the repressive ethos of the time that he found himself under police surveillance because of his suspected membership in one of the subversive groups of the Burschenschaft movement and he was unable to matriculate until the matter was resolved. Meanwhile, his brother Karl had been put in prison in 1824 for the same reason and after several transfers from one prison to another had attempted suicide unsuccessfully.

Feuerbach sat through Hegel's summer semester lectures of 1824 in Logic and Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Religion and this experience, he wrote later, became the turning point of his life. After a brief semester, he transferred to the philosophy faculty over the objections of his father. For financial reasons, Feuerbach was forced to transfer to Erlangen where he commenced to study anatomy, botany and physiology while working on his dissertation, De infinitate, unitate, atque, communitate, rationis (On the infinitude, unity, and universality of Reason). The argument in the thesis reflects its title: Reason is the unified and general ground of all individuals. Feuerbach sent a copy of the dissertation to Hegel hoping for his approval but inadvisably added a letter in which he offered the very unHegelian opinion that the attempt to comprehend Christianity as the consummate religion, as Hegel had done, was bound to fail. Christianity, he wrote, “is the religion of the pure self.”

After successfully defending his dissertation in 1828, Feuerbach was appointed Privatdozent at Erlangen and began lecturing on topics in the history of philosophy as well as on logic and metaphysics. He published three books between the years 1833–1837: The History of Modern Philosophy from Bacon to Spinoza (1833), The Presentation and Development and Criticism of Leibniz's Philosophy (1837), and Pierre Bayle (1838). These books established his reputation as a rising young scholar and by 1837 he was contributing to the most influential Hegelian journal, the Jahrbücher für wissenschaftliche Kritik.

Feuerbach had hoped his publications might gain him an offer from some other university less conservative than Erlangen. They might have except that against his father's wishes he had also published anonymously in 1830 a book entitled Thoughts on Death and Immortality that argued that individual human consciousness is part of an infinite consciousness into which it will be absorbed at death and that belief in a personal deity and immortality is merely an expression of egoism. This thesis alone might have occasioned censorship but Feuerbach unwisely appended a series of satiric epigrams and aphorisms making fun of popular religious doctrines. The book was confiscated. When he refused to swear that he was not the anonymous author, he was dismissed. Unable to find employment in another university, his academic career was ruined as his father had predicted.

Happily, Feuerbach had fallen in love with a wealthy young woman, Bertha Löw, who was part owner of a small porcelain factory in Bruckberg near Ansbach in Bavaria. They married in 1837 and he retired to Bruckberg to assume the life of an independent scholar in contact with other scholars only through correspondence or when visiting his philosopher friend, Christian Kapp, in Heidelberg. Shortly after his retirement to Bruckberg, Feuerbach made contact with Arnold Ruge, who, with Theodore Echtermeyer, was the co-editor of a new journal, the Hallische Jahrbücher für deutsche Wissenschaft und Kunst, dedicated to using the critical aspects of Hegel's philosophy to bring about social and cultural reform. The editors assumed that Germany under Prussian leadership was on the brink of world leadership in philosophy, religion, and politics if it could only realize the liberal elements inherent in Hegelian philosophy. But by 1839 it became clear to the editors that the progress they envisioned was being hampered by the Prussian state and its resistance to reform in both religion and politics. Threatened by censorship, the Journal moved in 1840 from Prussia to Dresden in Saxony and began to attack openly the governmental system as a reactionary combination of Christianity, Hegelian philosophy, and authoritarian ideology. By 1843, the Journal was publishing the radical attacks of Bruno Bauer and was confiscated, forcing the editors to take it first to Switzerland, where it changed its name to the Deutsche Jahrbücher, and then to Paris, where in 1844 it became the Deutsch-Französische Jahrbücher under the editorship of Ruge and Karl Marx.

Feuerbach had already achieved some favorable attention by virtue of his “Critique of Hegelian Philosophy” published in the Hallische Jahrbücher in 1839. But it was the publication in 1841 of The Essence of Christianity that established him in the minds of his contemporaries as an intellectual leader of the Left Hegelians. He had, to paraphrase the words of Engels, “exploded the System and broken its spell.” The book is still regarded as the precursor of all projection theories of religion.

After emerging from the various controversies swirling around The Essence of Christianity—some radicals, like Max Stirner, thought the book was still too “religious”—Feuerbach revised The Essence of Christianity and then wrote two philosophical manifestos, Preliminary Theses on the Reform of Philosophy (1842) and Principles of the Philosophy of the Future (1843) as well as a little book on Luther. The two earlier works argued that a cultural epoch has come to an end with Hegel and that the truth in Hegel could only be realized in a “new philosophy” that was atheistic. The manifestoes were filled with bold and radical ideas but Feuerbach never systematically developed them and, consequently, never fulfilled the expectations many had for his philosophical career. He returned again to the interpretation of religion in 1845 with Das Wesen der Religion, in which, as we shall see, he significantly revised the position presented in The Essence of Christianity.

In 1848 and at the height of his influence, he became enthusiastic about the revolutions in France and its inevitable impact on Europe. He decided to attend the Frankfurt Assembly as an observer. While there he was invited to give a series of public lectures on the nature of religion by the students of Heidelberg who were eager to have him called to the philosophy faculty. The university not only resisted the pressure of the students but denied him university facilities in which to speak so that the lectures were delivered in the city hall. Disappointed by the failure of the Frankfurt Assembly and the political reaction to it, he returned to the isolation of Bruckberg where he began to dabble in geology at which he could at best be only amateur and by the 1850s he was no longer a dominate philosophical presence in Germany.

The porcelain factory declared bankruptcy in 1860. In poverty and forced to move to Rechenberg near Nürnberg, he was financially supported by friends and by donations from the Social Democratic Workers Party. Although he worked on philosophical issues concerning the freedom of the will and ethics, he published little after 1857 except still another interpretation of religion entitled Theogonie. After a lingering illness he died in 1872 and was buried in Nürnberg.

His private life was marred by three painful events: the death of an infant daughter, a severely wounded relationship with his wife after 1849 because of his infatuation with Johanna Kapp, the daughter of his best friend, and an intrusive search of his house and rifling of his papers and correspondence by the state secret police looking for his connection to a young radical.

2. Early Idealistic Phase

Feuerbach emerged from his doctoral training in 1828 as a speculative German idealist deeply influenced by Hegel whom he called his second father; but like many of the young Hegelians, he found himself involved only a decade later in an Oedipal rebellion. By the end of his career in 1871, he regarded himself as an atheist, materialist, and communist. Because his philosophical views changed so radically over the course of his career, there have been many conflicting scholarly attempts to distinguish periods in his philosophical development. In what follows I do not intend to propose another such periodization but will simply attempt to isolate those most important moments in his career with which any interpreter should be familiar.

Between 1827 and 1839 Feuerbach wrote one dissertation and published four books, three of them histories of philosophy. His dissertation and the Thoughts on Death and Immortality (1830) are normally taken as the most systematic statements of his idealistic period. Interpreters disagree as to how independent from Hegel this position really is. S. Rawidowicz, for example, argues that both texts are “thoroughly Hegelian.” The controversy swirls around Feuerbach's use of “Vernunft,” “Geist,” “Aufhebung”, his conception of nature, the relationship of philosophy to religion, and, in the Thoughts, the concept of love.

Both texts rest on the assumption of the identity of thought and being, and both rest on the claim that both nature and consciousness are grounded in Infinite Spirit which constitutes the self-identical actuality of all beings. One might even say that human reason is simply a mode of infinite reason. Nevertheless, there are Feuerbachian themes that will later prove distinctive: the notion that every self is driven by an inexorable desire to unite with another; that this desired relation of an I with a Thou leads to the apprehension of the species concept, that this species concept is reason, or, in the case of Thoughts, love, and, hence, that this species nature is identical in all human beings and constitutes their unity.

Much of the argumentation of the dissertation is so abstract and complex, as Feuerbach himself later acknowledged, that it is difficult to make it intelligible within a brief compass. The stated aim is to show that by considering pure thought, knowing, and the unity of thinking and knowing, one must conclude that there is one, universal, and infinite reason which constitutes the essence of human beings. This entails arguments (a) that reason cannot be regarded as simply a tool or an instrument of the individual; (b) that contrary to Kant reason is only limited in individuals and not in the species; (c) that since individual sense experience and feelings cannot be communicated in concepts or universals, only thought can enable humans to communicate directly; (d) that since thinking constitutes the self that which one encounters in another is also thought; and (e) that since reason constitutes the essence of the species, “insofar as I think, I am Thou or insofar as I think, I am all men” (GW I:19).

Most of the complex, abstract argument arises from Feuerbach's attempts to differentiate between the thought of individuals, which is determinate and finite, and that mode of thought which he wants to claim is one, universal, and infinite. To do this, he first distinguishes between consciousness and self-consciousness. The former is purely formal and empty. But when the self becomes self-conscious, which is to say, has its own empty form as its own object—thought thinking itself—it is “infinite” in the then technical sense that it is not determined from without.

This distinction is then overlaid with another: between thought and knowing. Thought may be said to be consciousness that is unmediated. Knowing, by contrast, is thought that has become concrete, which is to say, is “characterized by its relation to specific, individual things….” (GW I: 37). Here Feuerbach places his emphasis on the I-thou relationship which is to play such a large role in his later thought, although differently conceived. When the I encounters the other, it comes to the dual consciousness of being both an I and a member of the species, which is to say that the notion of self-identity is twofold: the recognition of one's own species nature and the recognition that the other is also a member of the species. This species notion is an abstraction, exemplified abstractly only in numerous individual beings that pass away. And so, just as the species in nature is constituted by the coming-to-be and passing away of individuals, so self-consciousness has its present existence only in the finite and individual “knowings” which constitute its knowing activity. Still, self-consciousness dissolves all that is individual and determinate equally into nothing. Thought takes only its own essence as its object. Thought thinks itself.

Even friendly commentators on this argument have argued that it is confused; for example, Wartofsky notes that the other is not a particular individual but only thought itself. From an historical standpoint, however, it is important to point out that at this point in his career Feuerbach wanted to establish the activity of thinking as the essential form of human existence and that it is thought which constitutes the basis of human community. Although the arguments are frequently metaphysical and speculative, there is an anthropological and even a political thrust; namely, it is only in reasoning activity that the unity of human beings consist.

Feuerbach's argument that Reason is one, universal, and infinite raises the question whether is appropriate to say that this infinite Reason is the metaphysical correlate of the Christian idea of God, as Hegel seemed willing to say. Even though it is clear from Feuerbach's letter to Hegel accompanying the dissertation that he wanted to be acknowledged as a worthy proponent of the Hegelian project, it is also clear that he differed from his “second father” in one important respect: namely, that the aim of philosophy should now be not only to develop “the concept in the form of its universality,” but to destroy the prevailing notions of time, death, “and the person beyond finitude viewed as absolute … namely God” (GW XVII:106–108).

It was the function of Feuerbach's first book Thoughts on Death and Immortality (1830) to demonstrate this incompatibility between Christianity and idealism and to show that the latter offered a way in which communal human life, though finite, could be more radically affirmed. But unlike the dissertation, the Thoughts was addressed not to other philosophers but to believers whom Feuerbach addressed in a near sermonic mode with the familiar German “Du”. The hope for personal immortality, he insisted, is nothing but an expression of egoism, and the belief in an absolute person is a rejection of infinite Spirit. In the culture of pre-March Germany, these attacks on popular Christian beliefs might have proved damaging enough, but Feuerbach then brashly added a series of satiric epigrams poking fun at pietists and naïve believers. He was dismissed and never again held an academic position.

To minimize the charge that the book was heretical, Feuerbach's initial strategy was to argue (with some historical justification) that it was only in the modern Protestant period that the belief in personal immortality acquired the importance it had for Western religion and culture. He argued that it was not to be found in the Roman and Greek periods nor even in Middle Ages, in which the belief in immortality was only one article of faith among others. Only in the modern Protestant age, he claimed, had it acquired such overwhelming importance. This importance, in turn, is rooted in the Protestant emphasis on the union of the person with the historical person of Christ which over time focused everything on the feelings and deposition of the believer. The result was that “pure naked personhood” was regarded as the only substantial reality.

There are three reasons this belief is so important. First of all, since personhood is restricted on all sides by nature and culture, the pietist has to believe that this life is unsatisfactory and, consequently, there must be a second better life. Secondly, the pietist believes that moral perfection is the essence of personality and since time is required to achieve this perfection, there must be an endless time to achieve it. And finally, since only personhood has absolute reality for the pietist, only the subjective and the individual may be considered real.

Feuerbach's rhetorical strategy was not to attack these beliefs from a rationalistic and skeptical posture but to try to convince his religious readers that these popular beliefs do not exemplify “true religion.” True religion, true humility, will not be concerned about individual salvation but should be “a matter of God, of the will of God, of God in and for himself” (GW I:201; TDI 18). And he argued that there are two crucial determinates of the concept of God which, when analyzed, the pietists must acknowledge are incompatible with their traditional beliefs: God is love, and God is infinite spirit.

To confess that God is love, Feuerbach argued, is already to transcend the popular conception of God as absolute person. And whereas in the Dissertation he had appealed to the unity and universal identity of reasoning, here he used the language of love. Love, he argued, is the unity of personhood and when one enters into the bond of love “essence becomes object of essence, essence touches essence, and in this unity of essence, the separated individual and particular being of both of you disappear with all distinctions and divisions in and between you” (GW I:227; TDI 38). True religion, then is to understand that the desire for a separate life after death is egoism and to embrace death as the total dissolution of the self. Death is the place, so to speak, in God where all particular beings become one, where they are consumed and abolished.

Further, to claim that God is an absolute person is inevitably to conceive of God as finite, as one being existing alongside of other beings. It is to deny God as Spirit for God cannot be Spirit if he is distinguished from nature because then nature falls outside of his essence. Rather God can be Spirit only if nature is included with the divine being. Spirit is the unity of nature and personhood. “God is everything, his essence and being are all essences, not the being of something” (GW I:212; TDI 27).

But to argue that God as Spirit is infinite is to add another reason for the finality of death. If one accepts infinite spirit as pouring its life out into the finite, then God is the ground of this transitoriness and finitude. Consequently, Feuerbach concluded, if you acknowledge God to be the ground of your existence then you must also acknowledge God to be the ground of your finitude, your not-being. All determination and limits are a form of not-being, hence your existence is possible only together with the condition of death (GW I: 233; TDI 42).

Much of the text is less explicitly religious and more metaphysical. There are long sections attempting to show that determinate life is necessarily spread out in space and time and is embodied, and that human beings are both conscious and spirit but that this consciousness is only possible because the “universal essence is an object to you” This series of arguments is often compounded with subsidiary arguments that a modern readers can only call “quaint”, as one commentator does. For example, at one point Feuerbach argues that “it is absolutely certain that, in all of creation, there exists but one animated and ensouled point, and that this point is the earth, which is the soul and purpose of the great cosmos” (GW I: TDI 62). But the overall thrust of the text is clear: all creatures share an identical essence, a pure Spirit which is universal and self-identical in all persons and that although individual and particularity disappear at death, the human essence remains. And in the final pages, Feuerbach returns to the religious rhetoric once more:

God is life, love, consciousness, Spirit, nature, time, space, everything, in both its unity and its distinction. As a loving being, you exist in the love of God; as a conscious being, you exist in the consciousness of God; as a thinking being, you exist in the Spirit of God; as a living being, you exist in infinite life itself … . (GW I 405; TDI 173)

It is not surprising, perhaps, that some contemporary liberal Christian theologians have attempted to extract the “existential” religious truths of Feuerbach's argument from the abstruse speculative idealism in which they are imbedded. They note his critique of modernity's preoccupation with personal immortality and the individualism upon which it rests, his insistence on the embodied nature of human life and the rejection of a soul-body dualism which is implied in the doctrine of immorality, his communal understanding of human nature, and, above all, his opposition to life after death because of its depreciation and affirmation of this life. It is true, that Feuerbach makes these points, but it is also the case that at this stage in his thought, they required the vehicle of Idealism. In retrospect, what is interesting is how they increasingly will seem to him to require naturalism.

3. Criticism of Hegel

As late as the middle thirties Feuerbach was widely regarded in Hegelian circles as one of their rising stars. The Thoughts seemed to confirm this as did the several articles he wrote for the Berliner Jahrbücher, one of which was a defense of Hegel against the anti-Hegelians. Nevertheless, there was one important point on which Feuerbach had always differed from his master: the relation of Idealism to Christianity. Hegel had argued that his philosophy only brought to clarity in the form of ideas (Begriffe) that which Christian theology had expressed in the form of imaginative symbolism (Vorstellung). Consequently, Hegel could consider Christianity to be the “Consummate Religion”. Feuerbach, by contrast, regarded Christianity as a religion of “pure selfhood.” A “true religion” would abandon both of those doctrines so dear to the heart of the naïve Christian believer: the doctrines of immortality and of a personal deity.

Feuerbach's suspicion that Hegelianism was incompatible with Christianity received support from D.F. Strauss' The Life of Jesus Critically Examined (1835). The book was devastating on two fronts: first, it showed in great historical detail that most of the traditional Christian claims about Jesus' supernatural activity were mythical and could not support Christian doctrine. Second, given these facts, it was impossible to claim, as Hegel did, that the Idea was fully embodied in an individual. For Strauss, the Idea cannot lavish its fullness on one exemplar. Moreover, Feuerbach's conviction that Christian faith was inimical to reason and philosophy had been deepened by his own studies of the history of modern philosophy, especially his studies of Leibniz and Pierre Bayle.

Sometime around 1837 or 1838, Feuerbach was rethinking his relationship to Hegel specifically and to Idealism in general. The public break came in 1839 with the essay “Towards a Critique of Hegel's Philosophy” in Arnold Ruge's Jahrbücher, then published in Zurich to avoid censorship. The difficulty with Hegel's philosophy, Feuerbach argued, is that everything in nature and history is seen from the standpoint of development and in such a way that the last stage of this development is regarded as a totality that includes in itself all the previous stages. The result is a not only a complete misrepresentation of nature but of culture and religion, because it ignores all their variety and particularities. It is in this way, for example, that Christianity is determined as the Absolute religion.

The same error is made in philosophy. Hegel's own philosophy is exempt from the assumption that governs the treatment of others; namely, as the perspective of one philosopher whose problems are cast up by his immediate predecessors and, hence, has its own presuppositions and problems. Rather, Hegel, by virtue his claim of beginning only with the structure of Reason itself as manifested in his Logic, regards himself as the “speculative Dalai Lama,” the incarnation of Geist itself. But just as Strauss has shown that there can be no incarnation in history so there can be no perfect manifestation of the universal in one philosophy. Indeed, “incarnation and history are absolutely incompatible” (GW IX: 21; Hanfi, p. 57).

Another difficulty inherent in Hegel's philosophy is that because his Logic is thought both to describe the structures of reality itself as well as to govern the dialectical form which the philosopher uses to explicate it, Hegel confuses the demonstration of his ideas with the substance of philosophy. Demonstration is merely the means by which a philosopher strips the form of “mine-ness” so that the other person may understand it. But the form which a philosopher uses to demonstrate is not the subject matter itself, but only the medium. Hegel, by contrast, has made the form into the essence.

Then there is Hegel's unremitting concern with abstractions which ignore the concreteness of sensuous reality; for example, the notion of “pure being” and the equally vacuous “nothingness,” which if it signifies anything only signifies the limits of thought. Granted that language employs universals, this does not mean that what the sensuous consciousness encounters is not the particular. Sensuous consciousness does not deal with universals but concrete, individual reality. For sensuous consciousness, all words are merely signs by which it achieve its aims in the shortest possible way. Here, language is irrelevant.

All these problems in Hegel, Feuerbach concluded, are rooted in his assumption of Absolute identity, an assumption which is beyond criticism and which he had made from the very beginnings of his philosophical career. Idealism is committed to the unity of subject and object, spirit and nature, thought and being. And the way idealists handle the problem of the objectivity of nature is to appeal to an Absolute subject in which the predicates “nature” and “spirit” are simply attributes of the same thing, the Absolute. Hegelian philosophy is really a “rational mysticism”, which both attracts and repels us. The entire enterprise completely ignores the system of secondary causes that constitutes what we call nature and which can only be grasped empirically. Nature is the proper concern of human knowledge and all speculation that seeks to go beyond nature is futile.

Three years later, the criticism of Hegel has been embodied in a manifesto, Principles of the Philosophy of the Future, which was aimed at nothing less than the overthrow of speculative philosophy and the establishment of a “new philosophy” based on empiricism and “sensuousness”. The Principles, which itself is a revision of an early monograph, Preliminary Theses on the Reform of Philosophy, contains a highly compressed interpretation of the history of the modern philosophy, an analysis of the contradictions in Hegelianism, as well as a brief statement of the new philosophy, all in the space of a few pages. Even though commentators acknowledge the essay is confusing, the criticisms of Hegel are clear.

Feuerbach argues that Hegel's speculative metaphysics of “pure spirit” really must be understood as the culmination of movement that originated in the speculative theology of the Middle Ages when the naïve notion of a personal deity was conceptualized as an infinite, omniscient, omni-benevolent, necessary being. Although this theism permitted the naïve believer to conceive of the deity as a sensuous, loving, personal being, the god of the metaphysicians like Descartes and Leibniz was a pure mind abstracted and separated from all material beings. Since this pure mind, unlike human minds, was not involved in the obscure conceptions that arise by being determined by matter, it is thought thinking itself. “Absolute idealism is nothing but the realized divine mind of Leibnizian theism…” (GW IX:227; PPF 14).

The problem faced by both the earlier theism and the new speculative philosophy, however, is the existence of matter, which is conceived as the opposite of mind or spirit. Theism is perplexed by how it is possible for God to be infinite and yet removed from matter which is outside of it and limits it. And speculative philosophy is also puzzled by how spirit can produce matter. The only consistent answer to this problem, Feuerbach argued, was Spinoza's pantheism, in which matter and spirit were viewed as two of the infinite number of divine attributes. To say this, however, is to say that pantheism is the necessary result of theism, is consistent theism. But if pantheism is the logical development of theism, then it is indistinguishable from atheism because matter is made an attribute of God. Theism, which considered God to be immaterial spirit, has been transformed into “theological materialism.”

The ingenious aspect of Hegel's treatment of this issue, Feuerbach claimed, is his treatment of matter, the Achilles' heel of all Idealism. Hegel argued that the divine Subject objectifies itself in nature and then struggles with this nature in order to achieve self-conscious freedom. Matter is the self-expression (Selbstentäußerung) of Spirit. Matter is taken up as only one moment in the struggle of the divine life. But however ingenious this solution, it is unstable. Hegel, Feuerbach argued, as did Bruno Bauer, may be read either as an atheist who recognizes the truth of materialism by viewing the history of nature and humanity as the life of God or, on the other hand, he may be seen as a friend of theology because he negates the truth of atheism by having God take up matter into his own life. He “negates the negation” and the negation of the negation is the affirmation of God. Thus, Feuerbach concluded, we are in the end once more back in the bosom of Christianity theology.

The Hegelian philosophy is the last magnificent attempt to restore Christianity, which was lost and wrecked, through philosophy and, indeed, to restore Christianity—as is generally done in the modern era—by identifying it with the negation of Christianity. (GW IX: PPF 34)

Compounded with this argument are criticisms of Hegel that arise from Feuerbach's own “new philosophy” that is based on sensuousness and the encounter with the concreteness of reality. For Hegel, the identity of thought and being is the central assumption, and thought can only deal with abstraction. But Feuerbach argues that thought cannot produce existence and that real objects are given only when a being affects us, when our self-activity finds a boundary or resistance in the activity of another being (GW IX:316; PPF 34). And these encounters take place in space and time where space is not considered merely as “negative determination”, as Hegel does. It follows that one should not think of the human primarily as the bearer of reason but as an embodied being in concrete and sensuous relationships with other embodied beings.

These criticisms bring us to a consideration of Feuerbach's own philosophy which has Sinnlichkeit (sensuousness) at its core, a notion that itself raises philosophical issues but which may best be discussed when we return to Feuerbach's mature point of view.

4. The Interpretation of Religion

Feuerbach is best known for his book The Essence of Christianity which burst like a bombshell on the German intellectual scene in the early Forties and was soon translated into English by the English novelist, George Eliot. It quickly became like a Bible to an entire generation of intellectuals who thought of themselves as reformers and revolutionaries, including Arnold Ruge, Karl Marx, Friedrich Engels, Richard Wagner, and David F. Strauss, who wrote that the book was the “truth for our times.”

Superficially, the central thesis is deceptively simple: the self comes to consciousness over against another self and in the process of self-differentiation realizes that it is a member of a species. The imagination under the pressure of wish and feeling seizes on the idea of the species and converts it into an individual being.

Man—this is the mystery of religion—objectifies his being and then again makes himself an object to the objectivized image of himself thus converted into a subject … . (GW 5:71; EC 29f).

But this simplicity vanishes as soon as the reader turns to the first chapter. There one is confronted with argumentation and terminology that are obscure and speculative by contemporary standards. It is argued that (a) religion is identical with self-consciousness, (b) that consciousness is in the strict sense identical with the “infinite nature of consciousness,” and (c) that a limited consciousness is no consciousness. These sweeping assertions are then interwoven with such claims as “man is nothing without an object” or that “the object to which a subject necessarily relates is nothing else than the subjects own objective nature” (GW V:28–32; EC. 1–4). The reader, hoping to understand the ramifications of the simpler thesis, is suddenly wrestling with obscure arguments that seem to be the tip of a greater conceptual iceberg.

The analogy of an iceberg is apt because as Marx Wartofsky has shown, the allusive nature of the book is best accounted for if one understands that it is only intelligible against its Hegelian background; more particularly, The Phenomenology of Spirit. Not only does it recapitulate the theory of self-differentiation in that work but the central ideas of objectification, alienation, and reconciliation are drawn from it. Indeed, what made Feuerbach's book appear to be “the truth for our times” was that it enabled an entire generation of young intellectuals to appropriate the most important elements of Hegel's philosophy of Spirit without accepting his metaphysics and his endorsement of Christianity. Feuerbach, it is said, simply stood Hegel's philosophy of Spirit on its head. Just as Absolute Spirit achieved self-knowledge by objectifying itself in the finite world, so the finite spirit comes to self-knowledge by externalizing itself in the idea of God and then realizing that this externalization is only the form in which the human spirit discovers its own essential nature.

So considered, the argument is an example of Feuerbach's “transformative method,” which he first stated in his Vorläufige Thesen and which Karl Marx thought was Feuerbach's contribution to philosophy. The method states that Hegel's philosophy is based on the reification of abstract predicates like “thought” which are then treated as agents. Since this is the clue to understanding Hegel, it follows that what is valid in Hegel can be appropriated by inverting the subject and predicate and restoring them to their proper relationship. For example, instead of construing the predicate “thinking” as an agent, one transforms the equation and asserts that thinking is the activity of existing individuals. Thought comes out of being, not being out of thought.

Although the central argument is undoubtedly influenced by Hegel, there are other important elements intertwined with it that make it misleading to say that the book is simply an inversion of the Hegelian paradigm. One of the most important of these elements is Feuerbach's interpretation of the role of feeling. Unlike Hegel who regarded religion as basically the apprehension of ideas in symbolic form, Feuerbach believed, with Schleiermacher, that religion was principally a matter of feeling which then manifests itself in longing. Moreover, he regarded feeling as “unrestricted subjectivity;” that is, as unfettered by reason or nature. It assumes the deepest wishes of the heart to be true.

Longing is the necessity of feeling, and feeling longs for a personal God. But this longing after the personality of God is true, earnest, and profound only when it is the longing for one personality… Longing says: There must be a personal God, i.e., it cannot be that there is not; satisfied feeling says he is. (GW V:257f; EC 146)

It is in the chapters dealing with feeling that strike the modern reader as most contemporary because what we find there is a picture of the human self in the grip of the rage to live and longing for a reality that can grant its deepest wishes. In feeling “the whole world, with all its pomp and glory, is nothing weighed against human feeling” (GW V:220; EC 121). This “omnipotence of feeling” breaks through all the limits of understanding and manifests itself in several religious beliefs, all of which Feuerbach explored: the faith in providence, which is a form of confidence in the infinite value of one's own existence; faith in miracle, the confidence that the gods are unfettered by natural necessity and can realize one's wishes in an instant; and faith in immortality, the certainty that the gods will not permit the individual to perish.

Feeling, however, is not the only faculty involved in the religious objectification. The second is imagination (Phantasie) which Feuerbach argued is the original organ of religion. It is original for three reasons. First of all, the imagination, unlike abstract thought, produces images that have the power to stir the feelings and emotions. Human beings are sensuous creatures who require sensuous images as vehicles for their hopes and dreams. Second, the imagination corresponds to personal feelings because it can set aside limits and all laws painful to the feelings. It can make objective to man the immediate, absolutely unlimited satisfactions of his subjective wishes. Third, the imagination, unlike feeling, can deal with abstractions taken from the real world. In this sense it is a mode of representation, but, unlike thought, drapes its abstractions in sensuous imagery.

The imagination, however, is deceptive in the nature of the case, especially when it becomes allied with feeling and wish. It can cheat the reason. It can screen contradictions and set aside limits. It can exercise its deceptive power by confusing the abstract with the concrete, which is precisely what has happened in the Christian religion. The imagination has taken the species characteristics of human consciousness—thought, will, and feeling—and unified them in a single, perfect divine being.

God is the idea of the species as an individual…freed from all limits which exist in the consciousness and feeling of the individual … . (GW V:268f; EC 153)

The strategy of Feuerbach's book is to convince his readers that this explanation best accounts for the form and content of Christian doctrines and practices as well as the contradictions in them. In Part I, which he regards as positive, he attempts to show how each Christian doctrine—creation, Incarnation, Logos, Trinity, immortality—is best understood either as an objectification of some distinctively human predicate or as an imaginative expression of wish and feeling. The doctrine of God and of the Trinity are examples of the former and the practice of prayer and the belief in providence and immortality are examples of the latter. In Part II, “The False or Theological Essence of Religion,” he attempts to show what is harmful in Christianity when it transforms its naïve expressions into theology.

One of the most sensational chapters in the book has to do with Feuerbach's interpretation of the doctrine of the Incarnation. He had argued that Christians assign to the deity those predicates which are the perfections of the human species and which are absolute for it. A predicate is not divine because God possesses it; rather, God possesses it because it is in itself thought to be divine. Without these predicates, God would be a defective being. Consequently, when Christians affirm that God is love, it is the predicate that is decisive. The Christian could not permit the possibility of a subject behind the predicate, so to speak, who could or could not love. But if love is the defining predicate, and if the Christian is affirming that God renounced his Godhead for the sake of humanity, then Feuerbach argued that this is an unconscious confession that love is more important than God.

Who then is our Saviour and Redeemer? God or Love? Love; for God as God has not saved us, but Love, which transcends the difference between the divine and human personality. As god has renounced himself out of love, so we, out of love, should renounce God; for if we do not sacrifice God to love, we sacrifice love to God, and in spite of the predicate of love, we have the God—the evil being—of religious fanaticism. (GW V:109; EC 53)

Just as Hegel held that the Absolute alienates itself when it objectifies itself in creation, Feuerbach argued that the human alienates itself when it objectifies its nature in the Divine. He argued, first, that the very act of attributing human predicates to an external divine being necessarily withdraws these same predicates from the human species to which they properly belong by denying to itself what it attributes to God. Secondly, he argues that when individual feeling is the focus of religion there is a loss of species consciousness and, consequently, a loss of unity with nature and other human beings. It involves a discrepancy between a given individual and his/her essential nature. The only valid object of human veneration should be the species/being.

This argument will probably be convincing only to those who embrace the Hegelian notion of Spirit. But in the second part of his book, Feuerbach leveled a number of criticisms at Christianity that do not depend on this paradigm. Here the crucial term is not “alienation” but “contradictions” and the latter arise when the naïve and involuntary projection of religion is made into an intentional object of theology. Among these contradictions are those doctrines that exhibit the paradoxes of the religious illusion, logical contradictions which arise out of mutually incompatible predicates attributed to the deity, and, finally, incompatible virtues that are inherent in religious faith. For example, Feuerbach argues that one of the contradictions in Christianity is that it teaches that the truth will make human beings free but it also corrupts the “sentiment of truth” by claiming that God revealed himself only at a particular time and place and enables some to believe and not others. This necessarily leads to superstition and sophistry.

Two of these contradictions are especially important. The first is that the theological notion of God contains two incompatible types of predicates: metaphysical and personal. On the one hand, the divine being is said to be omniscient, omnipresent, omnipotent, and impassible; on the other hand, this God is a loving, compassionate being moved by human suffering. Contemporary critics of theism have often remarked on this, especially process philosophers, but Feuerbach tried to explain why the contradiction is inherent in theistic religions. He argues that the metaphysical predicates spring out of the objectification of the human attribute of reason while the personal predicates arise out of the projection of love. The second contradiction is not so much intellectual as psychological. It is the “inward disunion” that arises out of the difference between the virtues of faith and love. Faith, Feuerbach argued, depends on a determinate intellectual judgment as to what is true and false. The concept of heresy is inherent in a religion when faith is made the primary virtue. It follows that those who do not accept the Christian revelation are not merely in error but damned. Faith is essentially partisan. This is why Christians have a special obligation to evangelize non-believers and to reject those among themselves who do not adhere to correct belief, to dogma. But so construed, faith stands opposed to love because love is by its very nature universal and inclusive. This contradiction accounts for why Christian theologians themselves have from the beginning attempted to soften or marginalize the concept of Hell.

Feuerbach was willing to acknowledge that Christian faith does give “a person a peculiar sense of his own dignity and importance” (GW V:413; EC 249). In this sense he might have agreed with Kierkegaard who later argued that the notion of an individual recognized by the Creator of the Universe stretches individual consciousness to its extreme limits. But he also argued that this same belief is not only narcissistic but contributes to the arrogance and fanaticism of Christianity. Furthermore, this dignity is conveyed circuitously, so speak. Believers do not possess dignity in themselves but only acquire it mediated through a deity just as a servant sometimes identifies himself with the social class of the employer.

Feuerbach's book received criticism from two quarters: expectedly from Christian theologians but surprisingly, from the atheists Max Stirner and Bruno Bauer. A well-known Protestant theologian argued that Feuerbach's thesis might apply to Catholicism but not to Protestantism, and Stirner complained that despite Feuerbach's criticism of Idealism, he had merely substituted another abstraction, the human essence, as the basis of morality and veneration. Both criticisms forced Feuerbach to shift his position although the latter criticism shook Feuerbach most deeply. He took care of the Protestant criticism by writing a small book on Luther that enabled him to emphasize even more than he had that the certitude of Christian faith is grounded in a sensuous anthropomorphism in which human welfare is the aim of the Divine. For Luther, everything depends on the conviction that God became man “for us”. To believe in Christ, he argued, is to believe that God has presented mankind with a visible exact image of himself. And as against Stirner, Feuerbach moved towards nominalism and conceded that in his book he had been “still haunted by the abstract Rational Being…as distinct from the actual sensuous being of nature and humanity” (GW X: 188). From this point on, his writings emphasized human sensuousness, the concreteness of experience, and the rejection of any dualism of spirit and matter.

Perhaps smarting from these criticisms, Feuerbach once more revised his explanation of religion in 1845 with a small book entitled Das Wesen der Religion which then became the basis for his Heidelberg Lectures on the Essence of Religion in 1848. Although he sought to convey the impression that his revisions were only minor, a careful reading reveals that he no longer appeals to the Hegelian paradigm of Spirit coming to itself but argues that the origin and ground of religions is the encounter with nature. The human self is an embodied sensuous being immersed in a field of natural beings that impinge on it and upon which it is dependent. Because the human being does not first relate to nature through abstract thought but is concerned with those qualities of nature that strike it emotionally, it does not perceive an objective nature determined by laws but the physiognomic character of things. Things in nature appear to it as beautiful or disturbing or comfortable or threatening. Indeed, it takes considerable social conditioning and education for these perceived quality of nature to be treated as merely subjective. The imagination or Phantasie of archaic humanity fastens on these immediate qualities and under the pressure of desire and wish transforms the beings of nature into ensouled beings, beings that have intentions. Thrown into a world in which it does not feel at home, the human self wishes to change the uncanny being of nature into a known and comfortable nature. Monotheism arises when civilizations sufficiently evolve to regard nature as a whole.

The tendency to personify nature is reinforced by the fact that the imagination is in the service of egoism and the drive-to-happiness (Glückseligkeitstrieb). Impelled by the love of life, the human self instinctively transforms its desires into a being capable of granting them, into a subjective, feeling being. Religious faith is basically the confidence that the gods are concerned with the well-being of human beings in general and the individual in particular. But the imagination does not create out of nothing. It requires raw materials, whether these be the impressionable events and being in nature, sense impressions, or even abstractions that the mind has drawn from sensuous experience.

The differences among religions are due in part to the difference in the raw materials upon which the imagination works. In archaic times, the imagination took flight from natural objects and things—earth, fire, animals, and astronomical bodies. But the imagination can also be fueled by historical personages, such as the Buddha or Jesus, or, indeed, by abstractions themselves, such as “the whole” or “Being as such”. For example, Feuerbach explained the difference between polytheism and monotheism as a result of the imagination being fascinated by the multiplicity of beings, on the one hand, and by the coherence and unity of the world on he other.

There are even different ways in which a given abstraction, such as the coherence of nature, can provide fuel for the imagination. One can distinguish two types of monotheism, the metaphysical, which is characteristic of Christianity, and the practical-poetic, which is characteristic of the Hebrew Bible and the Koran. In the latter, the activity of God is indistinguishable from the activity of nature so that it is indifferent whether one says that God or nature provides food, makes the rain to fall, or endows creatures with sight. Because nature is omnipresent, God is omnipresent; because nature is all-powerful, God is all-powerful. The Christian imagination, however, closes its eyes to nature, separates the personified essence of nature entirely from sense perception and transforms what was originally nature into an abstract unified metaphysical being. Consequently, while there is something lively and animated about Yahweh and Allah, the god of the Christians is a “withered, dried-out God in whom all traces of His origin in nature is effaced” (GW VI: 362; LER 321).

Whereas Feuerbach had sought in The Essence of Christianity to show how every Christian doctrine could be explained as a projection of the species concept or as a wishful illusion, the burden of his Lectures is to reveal the intellectual errors arising from the misinterpretations of nature and, especially, the misinterpretation that occurs when Christians unify the whole of nature under the abstraction “Being”. Consequently, many of the lectures are discussions of the so-called “proofs” for the existence of God and they plod unimaginatively over ground that has been packed down by philosophers such as David Hume. But there are some interesting lectures based on the assumption that the secret of metaphysics and theology is the transformation of names and universals into causes. And there is also an interesting lecture on how the dualism of soul and body arises. There he argued, among other things, that our sense of two distinct ontological realms arises because we utilize two distinct linguistic categories for thinking about each sphere. But it does not follow that because we use one sort of language to talk about the body and another about the mind that they are ontologically separable. The distinction has to do with the perspectives we are compelled to adopt, and not with reality itself.

Just as the explanation of religion is different in the Lectures from what it is in the Essence of Christianity, so, too, are the criticisms. In the earlier work, Christianity was a form of alienation from the human essence. In the latter, Christianity is a disorder of the desires and, hence, a grotesque form of self-understanding. The Christian's desires, unlike the pagan's, “exceed the nature of man, the limits of this life, of this real sensuous world” (GW VI: 259; LER 231). Christians do not accept and affirm themselves as parts of nature. And this reveals itself in two forms: (a) the wish not to be bound by the causal nexus, as seen in the importance given to miracles, and (b) the desire for immortality, a personal existence free from necessity. For a Christian, the “only guarantee that his supernatural desires will be fulfilled lies in his conviction that nature itself is dependent on a supernatural being and owes its existence solely to the arbitrary exercise of this being's will” (GW VI: 262; LER 234). Christianity is a form of diseased Eros resulting in fantastic and unearthly wishes that involve a rejection of embodied, sensuous existence.

It could be argued, as Van Harvey has, that the explanation and interpretation of religion in these later works is more adequate and less speculative than that proposed in Christianity, althought this later interpretation is marred by what seems to be an inconsistency. It is more adequate because he minimizes, perhaps even drops, the speculative theory of consciousness and the projection of the species-being and instead emphasizes those psychological functions that religion serves: the desires for recognition and immortality and the allaying of anxiety in the face of nature's necessities, especially death. Consequently, he concedes that religion serves an existential function that no other human practice has yet filled and that it can only be banished if human beings were to give up their narcissistic hopes and desires. It is inconsistent however because he also seems to argue that because religion is best seen as a misinterpretation of nature it will vanish as our knowledge of nature increases. Religion is really only a prescientific mode of thought.

Feuerbach returned once again to the interpretation of religion in 1857 and published Theogonie nach den Quellen des hebräischen und christlichen Altertums. A second, unchanged version appeared in 1866 under a slightly altered title. Here Feuerbach concentrated upon the subjective grounds of religion. The argument is that the gods do not spring out of the human feeling of dependence or the encounter with nature but are, rather, the reified wishes of humankind. As a conscious being bent on its own fulfillment, the person has purposes, needs, and desires, the shadowside of which is the awareness that these may be frustrated. Hence, all wishes are accompanied by anxiety and fear, a pervading sense of the nothingness that clings to all human activity. With the wish that this nothingness be removed, the conception of the gods arises. When one sees the many intermediate links in the chain between the wish and the realization of that wish the imagination seizes upon the notion of a being that is not subject to limitation and failure, a being that can do what it wishes to do. The gods represent the unity of willing (Wollen) and being able to succeed (Können). A god is simply a being in which this distinction has been annulled. “Where there are no wishes there are no gods”. One might call the book a phenomenology of the wish because the discussion ranges imaginatively over the relationship between the fundamental wish for happiness and such cultural phenomena as systems of morality, law, conscience, the taking of oaths, dreams, miracles, pain, the desire for immortality, and, of course, religion. The arguments are copiously illustrated from classical Greek, Hebraic, and early Christian sources. Indeed, one of the defects of the book is that the arguments tend to deteriorate into a mass of learned historical and philological discussion, a defect the Bolin and Jodl edition of Feuerbach's works in 1907 tried to remedy by the dubious device of eliminating the illustrative materials.

5. The “New” Philosophy

Until two decades ago, Feuerbach's criticism of Hegel and his interpretation of religion were regarded as the high point of his philosophical development and everything after this was viewed as philosophically uninteresting. Sidney Hook could regard his theory of religion as still “the most comprehensive and persuasive hypothesis available for the study of comparative religion” (Hook, 221) but discuss his later views under the rubric “degenerate sensationalism”. Marx Wartofsy, otherwise one of Feuerbach's most charitable interpreters, would write over 340 pages devoted to assessing Feuerbach's development up to The Essence of Christianity but after two concluding chapters dealing with the later work conclude that they were vague, sketchy, and fragmentary.

In the last quarter of a decade, however, there has been a renewed interest in several themes in this later work: especially his social theory of the self and his emphasis on the embodied character of the human organism and the implications of this for a theory of concept formation. In his book Emancipatorische Sinnlichkeit: Ludwig Feuerbach's Anthropologischer Materialismus, Alfred Schmidt, for example, argues that Feuerbach's materialist realism is not just one realism among others but has important implications for the aims and methods of philosophy in general, especially his emphasis on praxis, daily life, and the human need for external objects. Unlike other philosophers before him who emphasized self-consciousness, Feuerbach, it is said, regarded the I as a bodily, temporal, spatially conditioned thing, only an abstraction from materiality. This, in turn, has important implications for understanding human nature, the aims of society, and the conditions for human liberation.

It is difficult to provide a brief, not to speak of critical, commentary of Feuerbach's “new philosophy” for several reasons. First of all, just as he went through several phases in his idealist period, so also he continued to modify his empiricism. The early treatment of the role of the senses, for example, is different in important respects from the discussion in the later essay “Concerning Spiritualism and Materialism” (1863–4). More importantly, his position on materialism itself seems to waver, as I shall point out below. Secondly, there is the matter of philosophical style. It is not only that in his later writings he was determined to avoid professional philosophy and a precise vocabulary, but he often avoided what some would say is the necessary condition of philosophy; namely, arguments rather than bare assertions. Whereas in those writings critical of Hegel, there are often sophisticated philosophical arguments, the later writings are often rhetorical and vague on crucial issues; for example, the relationships among immediacy, perception, thought, and truth.

Nevertheless, there are certain fundamental themes that occur again and again in the later Feuerbach, even though, as we shall see, commentators have differed among themselves concerning the interpretation of these themes, differences occasioned in part by Feuerbach's own ambiguities and sometimes by his changing views. Chief among these themes are: (1) that the human organism is related to the world through its body and the senses (Sensuousness); (2) that the species-being (essence) of man is contained only in community which, however, “rests on the reality of the distinction between I and thou” (GW IX: 339; PPF 91); (3) that mind and body are just two aspects of one material organism; (4) that this organism is animated by an overwhelming drive for fulfillment (Glückseligkeitstrieb) which, in turn, manifests itself in needs and desires. Of these needs, the need for human community is fundamental as are also certain biological needs. Given these themes, the two dominant philosophical problems that emerge are (a) how to delineate the relationship between perception and thought in order to give an intelligible account of knowing and (b) how, after basing human nature on a drive to fulfillment, he can reconcile this with his ethics of altruism.

The first systematic articulation of these themes occurred in the two monographs published in 1842 and 1843: Preliminary Theses on the Reform of Philosophy, and Principles of the Philosophy of the Future. Both are brief and although the criticisms of Hegel are clearly intelligible, the statements constituting the “new philosophy” are often rhetorical and aphoristic, which is one of the reasons they are often judged to be unsatisfactory as philosophy. For example, “Love is objectively as well as subjectively the criterion of being, of truth, and of reality” (GW IX:319; PPF 54). Nevertheless, one may discern the outlines of a position that some recent commentators have thought worth developing. If some of the elements of this outline now sound commonplace, it is worth reminding the reader how powerful they seemed to a generation struggling to formulate an alternative to the dominant, institutionalized Hegelianism.

Many of the themes are, of course, formulated in antithesis to idealism and, hence, an affirmation of some mode of materialism. The argument is that modern philosophy in its search for something immediately certain founded itself on self-consciousness, that is, the thinking ego. But this self-consciousness was only a being conceived and mediated through abstraction. The new philosophy claims that “certainty and immediately are only given by the senses, perception, and feeling” (GW IX: 320; PPF 55). Only the sensuous is clear and certain. Hence, “the secret of immediate knowledge is sensuousness” (GW IX: 321; PPF 55).

Whereas the old philosophy started by saying, “I am an abstract and merely a thinking being to whose essence the body does not belong,” the new philosophy, on the other hand, begins by saying, “I am a real, sensuous being and indeed, the body in its totality is my ego, my essence (Wesen) itself.” (GW IX: 320; PPF 54)

Consequently, the new philosopher thinks in harmony and peace with the senses. If the old philosophy thought in terms of that “realization” of the idea, the new philosophy argues that the realization of the idea can only mean that it makes itself an object of the senses. If the old philosophy thought the knowledge could only be conveyed in universals, the new philosophy is concerned with concrete individuals, with “this” and “that.” The new philosophy is dedicated to thinking of the concrete not in an abstract but concrete manner. If the old philosophy was concerned with Being as such, the new philosophy considers “being as such” as only the name for the totality of interacting beings, and these beings are given as really existing beings.

Being as the object of being-and this alone is truly, and deserves the name of being-is sensuous being; that is the being involved in sense perception, feeling, and love. (GW IX: 317; PPf 52)

As I have noted, the anthropology that underlies the new philosophy is one of the elements that some contemporaries have found interesting. The human body is said to be the way in which the human organism is in the world. It is through the body that the “I” is related to the environment impinging upon it and through which the world is defined and appropriated. The body is always situated in some definite time and space. Consequently, Feuerbach argued that time and space are not mere forms of appearance but are conditions of being, laws of existence.

To-be-here (Dasein) is the primary being, the primary determination. Here I am—this is the first sign of a real, living being. (GW IX:327; PPF 62)

And Dasein, in turn, is constituted by its own unique constellation of senses for mediating the world to consciousness. Each human sense organ has its own unique need for satisfaction and, hence, experiences joy as well as pain, and each is an instrument of consciousness. One might even say that the body is constituted in its mode of being as feeling (Empfindung). Sinnlichkeit, then, is the link between the body and the psyche.

Although the human being is embodied in the world and has this world given to it through the senses. Feuerbach, like Nietzsche, argued that the human being has a species-specific perspective on the world. But unlike Nietzsche, Feuerbach argued that the human being unlike the animal, is not a particular but a universal being. He meant by this that by possessing consciousness, the human organism is not a “limited and restricted being” but rather an unlimited and free being, for “universality, unlimitedness, and freedom are inseparable” (GW IX: 335f; PPF 69). This universality does not consist in some special faculty such as reason but because “this freedom and this universality extend themselves over man's total being.”

It is just this language, which may strike some modern readers as arcane, that has proved interesting to neo-Marxists because in his discussion of alienated labor in the Paris Manuscripts of 1844, Marx had also appealed to the “universality” of the human species-being (Gattungswesen). He had argued that although human beings were physical beings and live in relation to organic nature, they possess consciousness and therefore the realm in which man lives is more universal. He meant by this that all of “inorganic nature” can be assimilated by human consciousness and transformed by natural science so that it becomes integral to human life and activity. The universality of the human species consists in the fact that the whole of nature can serve not only as a direct means of life but as the object and instrument of its own distinctive life activity. Neo-Marxists, like J. Schmidt, have argued that Feuerbach was a precursor of Marx in this important respect. Man is a universal being in the sense that any given sense is elevated by consciousness above its bondage to a particular need and attains independent and theoretical significance. Even the lowest senses of smell and taste “elevate themselves in man to intellectual scientific acts” (GW IX:336; PPF 69).

Feuerbach's notion that sensuousness is the unique way in which persons related to the world is at once his most distinctive idea and the most difficult to render intelligible, not to speak of precise. Not surprisingly, commentators have assessed it quite differently. Alfred Schmidt, H. J. Braun and Michael von Gagern tend to regard this idea as Feuerbach most important contribution to modern philosophy. But Marx Wartofsky argued that although there is an interesting core to Feuerbach's argument that can be salvaged, the category of sensuousness is treated so loosely by him that it is inconsistent at the most crucial points. The most obvious ambiguity consists in the apparent inconsistency between his criticism of Hegel's rejection of sense certainty and immediacy in early pages of the Phenomenology and his own argument that there can be no uninterpreted perception and, hence, that all knowledge in some sense is mediated by thought.

In trying to make sense of his position, it would be anachronistic to interpret Sinnlichkeit as meaning what some modern empiricists would name “sense data.” Although it is clear that the thrust of his later thought is towards an empiricism of some sort, it is also obvious that “sensuousness” includes much more than “sense data”. It includes, for example, what we normally call perception and sensation but it also encompasses much that can not be so classified; for example, he wrote as though feelings and the apprehension of the feelings and intentions of others are perceived by sense. It is not only external objects that are experienced by the senses, he wrote, but

Man, too, is given to himself only through the senses; he is an object of himself only as an object of the senses. (GW IX: 323; PPF 58)

Or again,

we feel not only stones and lumber, flesh and bones; we also feel feelings, in that we press the hands or lips of a feeling being. (Ibid.)

He even stated that not only flesh but the mind and the I are objects of the senses. “Everything is, therefore, sensuously perceptible,” he wrote in a rhetorical flourish, “and although not always immediately so, yet it is perceived through mediation” (GW IX: 324; PPF 58).

It would seem, then, that Feuerbach's position on this matter of mediation is not as far from Hegel's position as he claimed. And this seems to be born out by one paragraph in the Principles in which he writes that

The sensuous is not, in the sense of speculative philosophy, the immediate; namely, it is not the profane, obvious, and thoughtless that is understood by itself. Immediate, sensuous perception comes much later than the imagination and the fantasy. The first perception of man is merely the perception of the imagination and the fantasy. The task of philosophy and of science in general consists, therefore, not in leading away from the sensuous, that is, real, objects, but rather in leading toward them, not in transforming objects into ideas and conceptions, but rather in making visible, that is, in objectifying objects that are invisible to ordinary eyes. Men first see the objects only as they appear to them and not as they are…. Only now, in the modern era, has mankind arrived again…at the sensuous, that is, the unfalsified and objective perception of the sensuous, that is, of the real … (GW IX: 325; PPF 59f).

But if the sensuous is not the immediate and requires philosophy and science to arrive at the objectively real in what sense can be made of the sentence “Truth, reality, and sensation are identical” (GW IX: 316; PPF 51)? It is this oscillation between immediacy and mediation that led Wartofsy to argue that Feuerbach's position is basically unsatisfactory.

Another related ambiguity in Feuerbach's later thought is how we are to understand his materialism. In the Fifties, he was obviously so determined to ground the human organism in nature that he succumbed to what Sidney Hook called “degenerate sensationalism”. In a review of Moleschott's Theory of Nutrition (1850) Feuerbach argued that the natural sciences were the key to understanding the preconditions for revolution because food chemistry, as one of those sciences, had established that the character of societies and cultures was determined by diet. Potatoes, for example, were the diet of the working class in Europe but since potatoes lack phosphorescent fat and protein necessary for the brain, the working class could only hope for revolution by a change in diet. The foodstuff that seems to provide the most promise for revolution is beans. It is in this review that the famous sentence occurs: “man is what he eats.”

A much saner and more interesting essay is “The Dualism of Body and Soul, Flesh and Spirit” (1846) In this essay, he presented some of the then-current thinking in both psychology and physiology and argued that our sense of two distinct and separate ontological realms of mind and body arises from the two distinct linguistic categories our minds employ when thinking about them. When we use the language of psychology, for example, we refer to sensations, feelings, perceptions, intentions, and not to nerves, brain, stomach or the heart. But in the realm of physiology, we need to refer to nerves, blood, oxygen, and the brain and not to perceptions and intentions and the like. We have, in effect, two discrete spheres of discourse about one organism.

These two distinct spheres of discourse reflect the subjective perspective of consciousness itself. When we think from the standpoint of the subject, we know nothing about the genealogy of our feelings and strivings, just as in indulging in eating we are unaware of the workings of the digestive system. But it does not follow from this that because we can think of ourselves as distinct from the body that there is, in fact, an incorporeal reality called the mind which exists independent of it. To conclude this would be analogous to arguing that because we cannot feel within ourselves that we have parents we are, therefore, self-created and owe our existence to no one. The distinction has to do with the perspectives we are compelled to adopt, our mode of knowing and not with reality itself.

Feuerbach had concluded from this that one of the most important philosophical and cultural tasks of his generation was to revise the way human beings think about the relationship of mind to nature because it was the notion of “spirit” that was crucial to both idealism and Christianity. Indeed, the most powerful popular intuition undergirding belief in God was the conviction that spirit could not rise from unconscious nature. The educational system should train students to understand that the mind develops along with the body. Spirit is rooted in the brain, and it is intolerable to think that skull and brain originated in nature but the mind was a supernatural creation. Whatever is the source of the skull and brain must also be the source of the mind, and if nature is the source of the former, then it must also be the source of the latter.

The second major issue dominating Feuerbach's late writing is the formulation of an ethic. This was especially important to him because from the beginning of his career he, like the other Young Hegelians, was primarily concerned with social and political reform. His criticism of religion and of idealism were motivated by the desire to replace an other-worldly type of practice and belief with a this-worldly, humanistic engagement with repressive social conditions. The outlines of a position appear in two monographs, one finished in the early Sixties entitled “Concerning Spiritualism and Materialism,” and the other unfinished entitled “On Eudäimonism”. Informing both of them are two fundamental principles. The first is one to which Feuerbach had long been wedded and that reflects the lingering influence of Hegel; namely, that human self-consciousness only emerges in relationship to another self-consciousness. To use Feuerbach's formulation, the I (Ich) only emerges along with a Thou (Du). This means that only a social person is a person, that the Gattung is exemplified in community. The second principle is that every living organism, including the human, is in the grip of a drive towards self-fulfillment. The object of this drive, Glückseligkeit, is normally translated “happiness” but it is clear from its explication that Feuerbach means something more like Aristotle's “well-being.”

Those contemporary German scholars interested in re-appropriating Feuerbach tend to emphasize the priority of the Ich-Du principle. But in the two writings referred to above, the Ich-Du relationship is explicated in the context of the Glückseligkeitstrieb. And the reason for this seems to be that Feuerbach wished to argue against those theorists who postulate the existence of an independent and free will, on the one hand, and those, on the other hand, who will not permit self-interest in on the ground floor of moral theory.

Although Feuerbach sometimes refers to the Glückseligkeitstrieb as the basic drive (Grundtrieb), he also employs the term to refer to the aggregate of all human drives, needs, and predispositions. In his 1848 lectures on religion, it is defined as “that necessary, indispensable egoism—not moral but metaphysical, i.e., grounded in man's essence without his knowledge or will—the egoism without which man cannot live…that egoism inherent in the very organism …” (GW VI: 61; LER 50). Although every drive is in some sense a drive-to-happiness, not all drives are of equal importance, and the function of reason and will are to direct these drives in the interest of the entire organism. The will is not an independent and autonomous faculty but another name for the seat of Empfindung (feeling). It follows that there is no freedom of the will in the sense of an affectless faculty that springs into action at the direction of the reason. It is itself part of the Glückseligkeitstrieb. Feuerbach wrote that it is a property of the body serving the well-being of the organism and within the conditions of natural necessity. It is free when it can serve the drive to happiness without hindrance.

The Glückseligkeitstrieb is not itself subject to moral judgments; rather, it is the presupposition of any theory of morality, that which must be taken into account when one makes moral judgments. Morality only arises when one considers the effects of one's actions arising from the drive-to-happiness on others. And in reflecting on these effects, morality does not require that one set aside happiness as a criterion guiding one's actions. It only requires that one consider the happiness of others. “Morality…cannot abstract from the principle of happiness; even if it repudiates its own happiness, then it must recognize the other's happiness...otherwise the ground and object of the duty to others falls away, as does even the basis of morality …” (GW X: 75).

To write that the morality cannot abstract from the principle of happiness, of course, does not answer the question how to adjudicate conflicts that arise when one's self-interest or drive-to-happiness seems incompatible with others' self-interest; i.e., when persons differ as to what their happiness consists in. Feuerbach seems to argue that just as a single individual can bring his own individual conflicting drives into some sort of unified and rational agreement, so, too, conflicting individual interests are reconcilable. Indeed, he argues in what seems to be a naïve fashion that “nature solves the problem” (SW X: 270). And it does so because nature is so structured that one's own drive-to-happiness can only be satisfied by the welfare of the others. “Happiness is the principle of morality, not the happiness concentrated in one and the same person, but rather than divided among various persons, encompassing I and thou, thus not the one-sided but rather the two-or-all-sided happiness. The duty “towards self” has its ground and object in personal self-love, but the duty towards others has the self-love in the person of others for its ground and object” (GW XI: 75).

The difficulty here is how to understand how, if one is naturally and inevitably driven to serve one's own interest, the concept of duty towards oneself can even arise and how this, then, can be said to have its ground and object in the service of others. Feuerbach's answer seems to lie in his extension of the I-Thou relationship. His argument is that the I-Thou relationship as exemplified in the sexual relationship is the Grundmodell of ethics because in the sexual relationship the giving of happiness to the other is also the source of happiness in oneself.   What one finds to be the good for oneself is then good for the other. The Golden rule is the kernel of all ethics: do not do to others what one would not want done to oneself (SW X: 276). He then generalizes from this to argue that the well-being of an individual (Ich) finds its satisfaction in the well-being of the neighbor (thou). Indeed, the phenomenon of conscience is the awareness of I in the thou of the other. It tells me that the other is my Du and that I belong to him and him to me. Consequently, solidarity is the aim of human action.

But this argument still does not address the issue of how an “ought” can be derived from a natural drive. Nor does it explain how one can move from a personalist model of I-Thou to the notion of solidarity with a community of many “Thous” to whom the I stands in no immediate relationship and whose well-being may not be reconcilable with mine.

Feuerbach might have argued that that ethics requires some sort of rational anthropology that casts up some normative goals and ends. But it is characteristic of his writings that he does not analyze these matters carefully. He does not dwell on the difficulty inherent in first claiming that the individual is driven by the urge to happiness and then claiming that this happiness includes the happiness of others or how, if this is so, duty arises against inclination. It is enough for him to argue that in daily life, we already find ourselves in families, professions, and institutions. Here sympathy and duties and feelings naturally arise. It is here where love tends to reciprocate love and where if one's own self-interests are pursued at the expense of one's companions, this is met with disapproval and punishment. It is in this concrete life that we realize that Mitmenschlichkeit is where our well-being is realized.


Primary Sources

Primary Sources in the Original German

There are two editions of Feuerbach's work in German but none in English. The first, Sämtliche Werke, is the Bolin-Jodl edition published in ten volumes between 1903 and 1922 by Frommann Verlag in Stuttgart. These ten plus two additional volumes were then reprinted in facsimile between 1960 and 1964 under the editorship of Hans-Martin Sass. The eleventh volume contains Feuerbach's inaugural dissertation in Latin, his Thoughts on Death and Immortality, and an extensive bibliography of Feuerbach scholarship. The twelfth is a double volume containing an expanded version of Bolin's selected correspondence from and to Ludwig Feuerbach together with some of Bolin's memoirs. Since the new critical edition does not yet include Feuerbach's late writings on ethics, I have used volume 10 of the Bolin-Jodel edition and used the abbreviation SW X.

A new critical edition of Feuerbach's work begun in 1981 under the editorship of Werner Schuffenhauer and published by Akademie-Verlag in Berlin has now reached twenty-one volumes. Indispensable for scholarly work, it presents the textual variations of the various editions, restores the original text of the Theogonie, and includes his correspondence. Citations are to this edition, volume, and page; i.e., GW X.126. Corresponding English translations are cited with the keys below.

Primary Sources In English Translation

EC The Essence of Christianity, translated by George Eliot, (Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1989). This is a translation of the second edition and was first published in 1854.
EFL The Essence of Faith According to Luther, translated and with an introduction by Melvin Cherno (New York: Harper & Row, 1967). This is a translation of the slightly worked over edition that Feuerbach himself prepared for the first volume of his collected works in 1846.
FB The Fiery Brook: Selected Writings of Ludwig Feuerbach, with an introduction by Zawar Hanfi (Garden City, N.Y., Doubleday, 1972). In addition to other selections this paperback volume contains translations of the important “Towards a Critique of Hegel's Philosophy” (1839) as well as “Preliminary theses on the Reform of Philosophy,” and “Principles of the Philosophy of the Future.”
LER Lectures on the Essence of Religion, translated by Ralph Manheim (New York: Harper & Row, 1967).
PPF Principles of the Philosophy of the Future, translated with an introduction by Manfred H. Vogel, Library of Liberal Arts (Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1966). This is a translation of the text that appeared in the Bolin-Jodl edition and the paragraph numbers very slightly from those in the new critical edition.
TDI Thoughts on Death and Immortality from the Papers of a Thinker, along with an Appendix of Theological-Satirical Epigrams, Edited by one of his friends, translated with an introduction and notes by James A. Massey (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980).
ER The Essence of Religion, translated by Alexander Loos (Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004).

Secondary Literature

There are four extensive bibliographies in addition to the one published by Hans-Martin Sass in volume XI of the Sämtliche Werke. The first is an enlargement by Sass of his earlier one and appears as an appendix to Hermann Löbbe and Hans-Martin Sass (eds.) in Atheismus in der Diskussion, Kontroversen um Ludwig Feuerbach (Grunewald: Chr. Kaiser Verlag, 1975). The second is compiled by Uwe Schott in Die Jugendentwicklung Ludwig Feuerbachs bis zum Fakultätswechsel 1825 (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1973). The third is by Erich Schneider in Die Theologie und Feuerbachs Religionskritik: Die Reaktion der Theologie des 19. Jahrhunderts auf Ludwig Feuerbachs Religionskritik, mit Ausblicken auf das 20. Jahrhundert und einem Anhang über Feuerbach (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1972). The fourth was compiled by Scott Stebelman covering English-language material published from 1873–1991 in Walter Jaeschke (ed.), Sinnlichkeit und Rationalität: Der Umbruch in der Philosophie des 19. Jahrhunderts (Berlin: Akademie-Verlage, 1992). There is also a useful annotated bibliography in von Gagern 1970. Finally, the Ludwig Feuerbach Gesellschaft on the Internet has a selection of books and articles published since 1990 to which it continually adds.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

atheism and agnosticism | Bauer, Bruno | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Marx, Karl | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst | Stirner, Max