Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Pierre Bayle

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Tue Aug 19, 2008

Pierre Bayle (1647-1706) was a Huguenot, i.e., a French Protestant, who spent almost the whole of his productive life as a refugee in Holland. His life was devoted entirely to scholarship, and his erudition was second to none in his, or perhaps any, period. Much of what he wrote was embedded in technical religious issues such as that of the Real Presence (roughly, the relation between Christ and the sacrament of the Eucharist). Nonetheless, for a century he was one the most widely read philosophers ever. In particular, his Dictionnaire historique et critique was the single most popular work of the eighteenth century. The content of this huge and strange, yet fascinating work is difficult to describe: history, literary criticism, theology, obscenity, and much more, in addition to philosophical treatments of toleration, the problem of evil, epistemological questions, and much more. His influence on the Enlightenment was, whether intended or not, largely subversive. Said Voltaire: “the greatest master of the art of reasoning that ever wrote, Bayle, great and wise, all systems overthrows.”

1. Bayle's life, work and circumstances

More than for most philosophers, the circumstances of Bayle's life determined the shape, content and thrust of his work. Curiously, accounts nowadays of the lives of historical philosophers, usually written by philosophers for philosophers, often begin with this sort of statement, even though most philosophers otherwise write as if circumstances were irrelevant. In the case of Bayle, however, the importance of circumstances is undeniable, to the point that ignoring them inevitably leads to distortion and misinterpretation.

An emblematic event in the life of Bayle was the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes in 1685, which from his point of view was an instance of grotesque intolerance based on moral and logical absurdity. The greater part of his life's work can be understood as Bayle's attempt to lay bare the absurdity represented by this event. Nor was the significance of the event merely symbolic for Bayle, since he himself was a victim of the intolerance to an extreme degree.

The Revocation (as it came simply to be called, so momentous was it) must be understood in the context of the general reformation of Christianity in the sixteenth century. Perceived ecclesiastical abuses, both moral and doctrinal, had led many to believe that such radical overhaul of Roman Catholicism was required that, in the end, separation from Rome was often the result. The separation of the Protestants, as they were called, was generally based on political power, either of a majority or simply of those in a position to exercise it. In France, however, the situation was more complicated, because the Protestants, or Huguenots, were never more than about a twentieth of the population. Even so, they had influence beyond their numbers, and they took sides in a protracted political struggle that emerged as the civil Wars of Religion, one of the grisliest chapters in French history. After most of a century of death and upheaval, the French were ready for a settlement, which came about when the succession of the crown passed to the Protestant Henry of Navarre, but on condition of his abjuration of Protestantism, i.e., conversion to Catholicism. “Paris is worth a Mass,” quipped the new Henry IV, who was then uniquely in a position to terminate the Wars of Religion, which he did with the Edict of Nantes (1598). This royal decree recognized the rights of Protestants in at least certain domains, but in terms that were far from fully favorable to Protestant interests (for example, only Catholics were to be admitted to the universities). Moreover, Henry's successors gradually chipped away at Protestant guarantees in a policy of persecution aimed, as they saw it, at uniting the French state (un roi, une loi, une foi — one king, one law, one faith). Finally, Louis XIV, the “Sun King,” abolished the Edict altogether, even though it had been issued in perpetuity, on the ground that it was no longer needed since there were no longer any Protestants.

Amidst this mess, Pierre Bayle was born in 1647, the son of a Protestant minister in Le Carla (now Le Carla-Bayle), a small town in the foothills of the Pyrenees. Typically, the family was financially impoverished, and Pierre, after primary school, could be only home-schooled until he was 21. Then, when his older brother had at last graduated from the only place the family could afford at the Protestant school at Puylaurens, he left home for what soon became the crossroads of his life. For within three months he had moved on to the Jesuit school in Toulouse, where he abjured his Protestantism. His conversion was short-lived however, for he after graduating with a master's degree he returned to the Protestant fold. Commentators differ on the significance of this episode. The interpretation in terms of venal self-interest seems mistaken, however. While Bayle's abjuration made him eligible for a Jesuit scholarship, his re-conversion returned him to a state that was far worse, for in the eyes of the authorities he was now not just a heretic, but a relapsed heretic, liable to the severest of penalties. He therefore fled France for the Calvinist stronghold of Geneva. He went with the renewed blessing of his family and the knowledge, given that both his changes of religion were sincere, that errors of conscience could occur in good faith.

A menial job of tutoring kept body and soul together in Geneva, but also kept him from the scholarly life Bayle craved. He eventually slipped back into France for a position at the Protestant Academy at Sedan, where he remained until its suppression by the government in 1681. Eventually, he was given a position at the Ecole Illustre in Rotterdam, a school for the community of Huguenot refugees there, whose numbers increased dramatically after the Revocation. Despite still-onerous teaching commitments, Bayle began his serious publishing career with works defending the French Reform from Catholic persecution and criticisms on many topics, but particularly on the doctrine of the Real Presence of Christ in the sacrament of the Eucharist, which the Huguenots denied. Works from this period include: Pensées diverses (1682), the Critique générale (1682), Nouvelles lettres (1685) and La France toute catholique (1686). The philosophical basis for his argument against Catholic persecution appeared the following year in the Commenttire philosophique, a classic in the literature on toleration.

Bayle's position on toleration was found inimical to the Protestant cause by his erstwhile friend and colleague from Sedan, Pierre Jurieu, whom he had helped bring to the safety of Holland. Jurieu, “the Theologian of Rotterdam,” soon became the bitterest enemy of Bayle, “the Philosopher of Rotterdam,” and the two engaged in long and caustic polemic that was neither positive nor productive in any sense. These were difficult times for Bayle. His father and both brothers died within two years, one of the latter while languishing in a French jail because of Bayle's publications. He had also assumed editorship of one of the first of the learned journals, Nouvelles de la République des Lettres, the rigors of which contributed to his plight and the resulting breakdown he suffered in 1687.

Bayle's life, and the subsequent course of intellectual history, were dramatically altered by the publication of his Dictionnaire historique et critique, which began appearing in 1696. Certainly, Bayle's material situation was improved, not to mention that of his publisher, since the work was soon on its way to becoming the philosophical best-seller of the eighteenth century. Bayle was at last able to give up teaching. But what accounts for the success of this strange work? It is not a dictionary in the usual sense; rather it is a hodge-podge encyclopedia of intellectual curiosities, serious argument on a variety of topics, salacious stories, exacting textual scholarship, and much more that drew a readership hardly less diverse than its contents. To be sure, its entries are alphabetically arranged, but perhaps ninety-five percent of the work is to be found in the footnotes, called Ôremarks,’ that often bear little relation to the main text. Readers obviously dipped here and there into this massive work of nine million words, and had a wonderful time.

Not everyone was happy with the work, however. Unhappy were authorities in France, of course, where the proscribed work nonetheless showed up, and the reactionary Jurieu, who mobilized the Consistory of the Walloon Church in Rotterdam against Bayle, who was then constrained to publish Eclaircissements or “Clarifications” of his treatment of atheism, Manicheanism, skepticism and obscenity. In addition to work for further editions of the Dictionnaire, Bayle's last years were spent in continued theological debate, now primarily with liberal coreligionists such as Leclerc. Bayle, whose health had never been robust, died on 28 December 1706, probably of a heart attack precipitated by tuberculosis.

2. The Bayle enigma

There is a general problem in the interpretation of Bayle that has been acknowledged (and even insisted upon both by critics and admirers) in the literature from his own time to the present. It is a problem not just of deciding whether Bayle succeeded in what he was trying to do, which would be difficult enough given the charged topics that he often dealt with, but even and especially in deciding the nature of what he was trying to do. One might not go so far as to claim that meaning is author's intention (the so-called intentional fallacy), but it is hard to deny that author's intention is at least relevant to meaning. And what Bayle's intentions were has been a matter of debate from the beginning.

According to just the twentieth-century interpretations, Bayle might have been a positivist, an atheist, a deist, a skeptic, a fideist, a Socinian, a liberal Calvinist, a conservative Calvinist, a libertine, a Judaizing Christian, a Judeo-Christian, or even a secret Jew, a Manichean, an existentialist. To be sure, not all of these exclude the rest; for example, skepticism has often been associated with fideism. But atheism, for example, is certainly incompatible with deism and the other forms of theism. Moreover, there is at least some plausibility to all of these interpretations.

Perhaps one way of sorting out his cacophony is in terms of the distinction that Bayle himself drew between two kinds of philosophers: the lawyers, who represent their case in the best light possible and their opponents' in the worst, and the reporters, who tell it as it is, with respect to all views. Bayle might be a reporter, equitably relating all views, even those that are mutually inconsistent, especially in the Dictionnaire, which is the work on which the panoply of interpretations is largely based. When justifying himself to the Walloon Church over the obscenities alleged to be found there, he claimed not to be producing obscenities but only to be relating, as a good historian must, what others had produced. Even so, some of the views that he clearly purports to relate as a reporter are his own, both in the Dictionnaire and especially in the whole rest of his work, which deals almost exclusively with religious topics. And here there is a special problem of interpretation.

A case can be made that the logic of Bayle's various positions on toleration, evil, truth, substance and accident, lead ineluctably to atheism. The thoroughly rational position, Bayle seems to say repeatedly, is to reject the existence of the God of the Judeo-Christian tradition. He no less frequently asserts his belief in the tenets of the Calvinist faith in which he was raised, and for which, not incidentally, he made such sacrifice. We are thus faced with an inconsistent triad: Bayle's clearly articulated and acknowledged principles entail atheism; Bayle does not accept atheism; Bayle is neither stupid nor dishonest. He sees the incompatibility of the first two claims, but nonetheless makes them (that is, Bayle neither nods nor winks).

From his own time to the present, it has been the third claim that has drawn closest scrutiny. Given the stressful period of the Revocation and its aftermath, the possibility of a nodding (or even crazed) Bayle has some plausibility. But it is a winking Bayle who came to be the “Arsenal of the Enlightenment.” Those looking to discredit religion and theism generally had only to focus on what is most obvious, consistent and rationally cogent in his work. If there are also claims there of Christian orthodoxy, they were taken as so much hand-waving dissimulation in an effort to slip the real message past censorious authorities. Whatever his intentions, this impulse toward modern atheism was Bayle's greatest single influence.

This interpretation was another of the topics on which Bayle had to defend himself before the Walloon Consistory. His defense in the Eclaircissement, and in fact throughout his work, was an appeal to a fideism that seems to have made incompatibility with reason a condition for an article of faith. Certainly, Bayle asserts that the value of faith is directly proportional with its repugnancy to reason. In this, Bayle was only pursuing a line to be found in Scripture, especially St. Paul, whom Bayle cites repeatedly and at length on the rational foolishness of faith in still another Eclaircissement, on Manicheanism and the problem of evil. Arguably, his is the only conception of faith that avoids the heresy of Pelagianism, according to which people are able to save themselves, independently of divine grace. For if we can reason ourselves to the truth (or even the probability, or plausibility) of what is believed on faith, and such belief is a sufficient condition for salvation, then, contrary to Calvinist doctrine, faith is not necessary. Of course, even this defense is open to the winking Bayle interpretation.

One way to express the issue, at least, is with respect to Bayle's reaction to the horrors of the Revocation. The fact is that after the death of his imprisoned brother, Bayle hardly ever again referred to divine providence. This silence is remarkable for one whose Calvinism dictated belief in strict predestination based on the sufficiency and necessity of grace. What ought to have been a consolation was ignored. Why? It might be that for him the Revocation came to represent the hypocrisy, not just of Roman Catholicism, but of Christianity and all religion — hypocrisy being the very failing condemned by the Gospel more than sins of the flesh or any other sin. The issue is epistemologically underdetermined by its very nature, for Bayle's behavior was compatible with both atheistic dissimulation and sincere fideism. This issue is also morally idle given Bayle's own view on toleration of dissenting belief, expressed by the scriptural injunction, judge not. Only God has the privileged access necessary to judge conscience.

3. Bayle's skepticism

Bayle has generally been regarded as a skeptic of some sort, but the sort has seldom been specified with any precision. Three kinds seem relevant. The most influential kind has already been alluded to, namely religious skepticism, which may be taken to mean that Bayle did not in fact believe all, or perhaps any, of the religious views that he asserted. The evidence for attributing such skepticism to Bayle could hardly be stronger. Such beliefs are, according to Bayle, contrary to reason. But the evidence against doing so is at least equipollent: Bayle claims, repeatedly and unequivocally, to be a believer. Those who take Bayle to be a religious skeptic discount this testimony as dissimulation. What the motive for it would be is unclear. Fear of censorship is implausible; Bayle hardly lacked for courage, and in any case did not have a great deal to fear in relatively liberal Holland. Moreover, that Bayle should have foreseen the skeptical influence he was to have on the Enlightenment credits him with an unlikely prescience and deviousness, making him, to use one of his own favorite expressions, a snake in the breast — indeed, the wiliest of them.

A more tractable and philosophically more interesting form of skepticism attributed to Bayle is Pyrrhonism. This interpretation has the advantage of reconciling his denigration of reason and profession of faith: the one is a preparation for the other. The principal text for Bayle's Pyrrhonism is the Dictionnaire article on Pyrrho, especially remarks B and C. There he argues that the same reasons that led the Cartesians to assert that sensory qualities such as colors, heat, cold and smells are not in the objects of the senses, but instead are modifications of the mind, in fact show that all qualities have this status. In fact, says Bayle, even granting that God is veridical, Descartes's proof of the external world itself is flawed. For, as Malebranche argued, in no way can belief in that world be based on the veracity of God, who in any case allows us to be deceived about sensory qualities, and who might therefore allow us to be deceived about all else in the world.

In this text Bayle also gives arguments that purport to show that reason itself is unreliable. Principles of reason that are as evident as could be are revealed as incompatible with what is known to be true. However, the examples that Bayle gives indicate the tenuousness of his Pyrrhonism. The principle that no human body can be in two places at once, or be interpenetrated by its own parts, is at odds with the doctrine of the real presence of Christ in the sacrament of the Eucharist. Now, this is the Catholic conception of the Eucharist, which Bayle himself rejects. In fact, all of the arguments emerge from a conversation that Bayle places between two Catholic priests, thus, for whatever reason, distancing himself from them. It has recently been argued in fact, that the reason Bayle distances himself in this way is that he is offering a reductio ad absurdum of Catholic fideism based on philosophical skepticism. That is, Bayle rejects even this ground-clearing role for skepticism as preparation for faith, since it would be an instance of Pelagianism.

Generally, Bayle's arguments concerning skepticism are highly contextualized. He offers no in vacuo critique of pure reason. The arguments usually occur in the Dictionnaire, whose entries offer some minimal constraint on what Bayle says, and they usually occur in religious debate of some sort, where the role of faith needs to be ascertained. Nor is there ever a wholesale rejection of reason, which would be paradoxical, given Bayle's use of argument. In the ancient world, Sextus Empiricus thought of argument as like a purgative that once having done its work is itself flushed away. Although he employs his own version of the medical model (reason is like a corrosive that first cleans a wound but then eats through flesh and bone to the very marrow), Bayle seems to have a very different view. Shifting analogies in response to the liberal Protestant Jacquelot, who had criticized his fideism as renouncing reason altogether, Bayle explained that individual defeats of reason entailed only a retreat to a more defensible position, something that happens all the time in philosophy. His assessment of reason, even in his most outré statements (reason is like a runner who does not know when the race is over, or like another Penelope undoing at night what was done during the day), is on a case-by-case basis, and whatever generalizations he offers are open to revision.

Bayle seems to espouse something of a holistic web of belief, of the Quine-Ullian sort, at least in the sense that cognitive antinomies are resolved by rejecting the principles causing them, beginning with those farthest from the center. Bayle, however, includes religious truths as at the very center, trumping all others. Another complication is that sometimes there seems no way to resolve the antinomies, as in the case of the divisibility of matter. The relevant maxims of reason seem equally central, yet yield an exhaustive and inconsistent triad of views, none of which is true. Unlike the Pyrrhonists, however, whose aim is to sustain antinomies, Bayle tries to resolve them. If there is the occasional standoff, Bayle's attitude is one of regret and patience, for he is interested in overcoming doubt, not generating it. The motivation he gave for the Dictionnaire, after all, was the correction of errors, confusion and doubt in previous such works.

The form of skepticism that seems best to capture this attitude is Academic skepticism, which is in fact the position he explicitly espouses when accused of Pyrrhonism by Jurieu. This skepticism is not the negative dogmatism, as defined by Sextus, that nothing can be known. Rather, it is the methodological position expressed by Cicero's injunction always to preserve the integrity of one's power of judgment; that is, not to dissipate it in accepting as true what one does not perceive to be true. In this sense, the first of Descartes's rules of method in the Discourse is an Academic principle, perhaps the only one: to avoid precipitateness and prejudice and to rely only on one's own ability to discern the truth. Integrity is a matter of honestly preserving the wholeness of one's own judgment.

Part of this outlook would be the reportorial role that Bayle assumes, of giving unimpeded voice to all views, even those that compete with his own. Only a lawyer would argue a single position to the exclusion of all others. Moreover, if this Academic skepticism were Bayle's outlook, he could not have espoused it as such, for to do so would be still another form of dogmatism. Thus, instead of defining, arguing and recommending Academic skepticism in any direct fashion, he would give instances if it, practice it himself and generally seek its promulgation through edification. This might be exactly what he does.

If Bayle doubts, he does so on a highly contingent and non-theoretical basis. He is prepared to accept what he finds to be evident, but the fact of the matter is that he does not find it very often, at least not in philosophy. In history, on the other hand, there is a kind of certainty appropriate to the domain that is often enough to be found. The Dictionnaire itself cannot be interpreted except as stupendous testimony to the ability of an individual to overcome passion and prejudice and arrive at historical truth — so much so that Bayle's historical method has been viewed by the literature as a form of Cartesianism, despite the Cartesians' own dismissal of history. Only in one domain, however, is anything like strictly Cartesian infallibility to be found, and that is morality. There, the individual conscience is inviolate. Even if it errs with respect to the objective moral character of an act, conscience, so long as it acts with integrity, cannot morally err and is to be respected. Such is the basis for Bayle's view on toleration.

4. Bayle on toleration

No philosophical topic occupied Bayle more than toleration. Many of the articles of his Dictionnaire deal with it, and most of the rest of his other works are directed either largely or entirely to the topic, most notably, his Commentaire philosophique. It is an area in which he clearly had a profound impact on the Enlightenment. Locke also might have found in Bayle, if not a source for his own views, then at least moral support for them, which he himself might have provided for Bayle. In any case, their views are very similar, even to the point of excluding Catholics from the provisions of toleration (although their theories provide little on behalf of this exclusion and much against it).

The toleration in question means religious toleration, although what is said about it can be extended to political and other forms of toleration. The question is whether someone whose sincere belief is perceived to be in error should be forced to change it. Bayle's view is that in this case of the erring conscience, as it was called, constraint, even in the perceived interest of the errant individual, is never justified. The relevance of this issue in the context of Huguenot persecution is obvious.

Bayle's direct arguments on behalf of toleration are not very convincing, however, at least not when taken in isolation. Consider, for example, his argument that if even the true church had the right to persecute the heretic, then every church would have that right, with the result that a heretical church would be in a position to persecute the true church. Quite apart from whether this conclusion is so obviously false as to serve as the reductio as absurdum that Bayle intends, his argument turns on an equivocation. A premise of the argument is that only if the true church believed that it was the true church would it be in a position to persecute, otherwise it would give up its position and join, or at least seek, what it would take to be the true church. But if this belief justified the true church, then it would justify every church that had it. The equivocation concerns the sense in which the true church might base its right to persecute. Certainly, only if a church believed itself to be the true church would it be in a position to exercise its putative right to persecute. But this is not to say that this belief by itself justifies the persecution. Such a view would beg the question against those who, like Jurieu, think that only the objective fact, in this case of actually being the true church, can ever justify.

Bayle is far more convincing when he generalizes from carefully articulated examples, the best of which is that of the wife of Martin Guerre. Bayle, whose native Le Carla was the next village over from the site of the actual events, would have known about the case from the local retelling of it, which has been continuous from the fifteenth century to the present. The short of the story is that Martin Guerre goes off to war, leaving behind his wife, child and problematic existence, and is replaced eight years later by an impostor who claims all his rights, including those of the marriage bed. According to Bayle, because she thinks the man is her husband, the wife, in ceding him those rights, not only is inculpable of an act that otherwise would be adulterous, but actually performs her duty. He concludes, more generally, “the erroneous conscience procures for error the same rights and privileges that the orthodox conscience procures for truth.”

An instructive curiosity is Bayle's handling of this case from the point of view of the impostor. Because the wife has an obligation to submit to him, the impostor has a right to treat her as his wife. But it does not follow, according to Bayle, that the impostor would be justified in exercising that right. The sort of case that he has in mind is the magistrate, and likely the church. With respect to their behavior there are two notions of right: immunity from punishment and justice. Whatever their pronouncements, they are to be obeyed; but they might yet be culpable before God. This distinction does not elucidate the case of Martin's Guerre's impostor, who is an authority of neither church nor state. But it does emphasize Bayle's contention that if the heretic has the duty to act according to conscience, then he has a right to do so; but if he has a right to do so, then everyone has a duty not to interfere. The individual conscience is autonomous and ought to be tolerated.

Even this position is less than straightforward, however, for it may happen that the individual conscience calls for persecution. Bayle seems not to have fully considered this case, but his best answer would seem to be that the conscientious persecutor should be restrained, but in a way that least poses a direct threat of temptation to conscience. That is, the conscience of even a persecutor must be respected, such that although it is regarded as mistaken, the individual should not be forced or even bribed to act against it. Rational persuasion to the contrary would seem to be the sole remedy recommendable by the alleged skeptic Bayle. What this case shows, in addition, is that while conscience is necessary for right action, it is not sufficient. It supplies a formal requirement, as it were, with the content of the act being determined on other grounds. To be told to act according to conscience is in effect to be told to do what one thinks is right. But arriving at what one thinks is right is another matter, involving reason, but also other factors such as grace or education, which for Bayle are not much different from a matter of luck.

5. The problem of evil

The problem of evil, which has drawn philosophical attention from antiquity to the present, has been typically expressed as follows: if God is almighty, then He is able to prevent evil; if God is all-good, then He is willing to prevent evil; but there is evil; therefore, God is either unable or unwilling to prevent evil. With the tacit premise that God is both all-good and almighty, an inconsistent set appears, which led Epicurus, who first articulated it, to conclude that God does not exist. For later thinkers, especially in the Christian tradition, the set posed a dilemma inviting denial or reinterpretation of one of the explicit premises.

Reflections on evil span Bayle's work from beginning to end. It is tempting to think that Bayle became obsessed with the problem of evil only after his breakdown in the mid-to-late 1680's, but in fact, a philosophical interest in evil, especially moral evil, appears in his work before that time. The 1679 Harangue de Mr. de Luxembourg à ses juges is the satirical apology of a man accused of magic and devil worship, wherein the defendant argues that he was capable, entirely by his own devices, and free of any infernal aid, of committing every evil act for which he had been accused of seeking the devil's assistance. This theme of the independence of moral evil from supernatural causes is taken up again in the better known Pensées diverses sur la comète of 1682, where Bayle shows that the identification of atheists with moral viciousness is a groundless prejudice. Since, for Bayle, religion, morality and salvation are all independent, no inference can be made from one's religion (or lack thereof) to one's moral character.

There is no philosophical issue closer to the core of Bayle's thought than the problem of evil. Evidence of his concern with it appears repeatedly throughout his work. Moreover, such was Bayle's pessimistic view of life that it was no merely theoretical issue. As he put it in the Manichean article, “man is wicked and unhappy; everywhere prisons, hospitals, gibbets and beggars; history, properly speaking, is nothing but a collection of the crimes and misfortunes of mankind.” No question for him, therefore, of taking the Augustinian line of denying the reality of evil. In fact, if there were a rational solution to the problem it would be the utterly terrifying one of denying the goodness of God. In the event, however, Bayle denied that there is any rational solution, arguing against three notable attempts thereat. Throughout these arguments Bayle emphasizes not only the intractability of the problem, but the horrendous nature of the evil generating it.

The most dramatic attempted solution came from the Manicheans, who denied divine omnipotence. Although God would prevent evil if He could, the fact is that He cannot, being opposed by an equal but malevolent power. In articles on the Manichees and early Christian heretics such as the Paulicians and Marcionites who proposed similarly dualistic solutions, Bayle conceded that on purely rational grounds, their view was no less rational than the orthodox one. On a priori grounds dualism is the weaker, since a rival divinity is inconsistent with the perfection of God. On a posteriori grounds, dualism has the upper hand, for the fact of evil, which is undeniable, is no less inconsistent with divine perfection. So strongly did Bayle present the Manichean case that this was one of the four topics on which he had to provide an Eclaircissement for the benefit of the Walloon church. Dualism, according to Bayle, can be rejected only on the basis of scripture, which clearly asserts both the perfection of God and the presence of evil. In answer to those who claim that evil cannot be introduced into a divinely created world , Bayle appeals to the modal principle ab actu ad potentiam valet consequentia (from the actual to the possible is a valid deduction). The actuality appealed to here is not the actual presence of evil (for this would validate the consequence only that evil is possible); rather, the appeal is to the actual coexistence of a perfect God and evil, an actuality that is an object not of empirical discovery but of scriptural revelation.

Another version of this solution was attempted by the Socinians, who also saw God as incapable of preventing evil, because His power is limited, not by a rival divinity, but by His ignorance. God just did not know that Adam would sin, or that the world would have its unhappy history. The Socinians were a very ill-defined group traceable to the late sixteenth-century Italian Fausto Sozzini, the Polish Brethren, and Unitarianism. Although almost universally condemned, their views were much in the air while Bayle was writing. For them, reason is the only rule of faith, such that anything contrary to reason must be rejected. Thus the rejection of the propagation of the original sin of Adam and with it the need for a divine redeemer in Christ, a mere man whose only role is as a moral example. An eternal hell is thus rejected because the suffering involved would be of no use to anyone, neither to those suffering it nor to those witnessing it.

Bayle, of course, will have none of this. As to the denial of divine foreknowledge, which Bayle finds incredible by itself, God is still not exculpated, since once Eve had sinned, He should have known that Adam would do the same, a possibility that ought to have been considered in any case. In a typical argument, Bayle asks us to imagine a group of mothers who allow their daughters to attend a ball unchaperoned. The woman whose daughter is seduced may be excused if the daughter was thought to be strong enough to resist the seduction, but not if she was inexperienced. Even so, Bayle again despairs of reason's ability to refute the view. “Those who engage in dispute with the Socinians, and take new roads, seldom fail to lose their way.” Once again, only scripture, which the Socinians accept, can provide the proper defense.

Bayle's work on the problem of evil was closely followed by Leibniz. On this and other topics, he had great admiration for Bayle (“one of the most gifted men of our time, whose eloquence was as great as his acumen and who gave great proofs of his vast erudition”) and wrote his Theodicy largely as a response to Bayle, beginning from a very different view of life. Said Leibniz concerning Bayle's cynical view cited above: “I think that there is exaggeration in that; there is incomparably more good than evil in the life of men, as there are incomparably more houses than prisons. With regard to virtue and vice, a certain mediocrity prevails.” But Leibniz's own neo-Plotinian attempt at solution of the problem in terms of this as the best of all possible worlds had proleptically been criticized by Bayle as an instance of Stoic fatalism, or of what for him amounted to the same thing, Spinozism — a charge laid by others as well against Leibniz. Moreover, Leibniz's mechanical account in terms of the simplicity and fecundity of the world's laws might apply to the material world, but not to the world of conscious agents, whose irreducible moral experience requires the ability to complain and struggle with God, as Job did, over their misery.

For Bayle, there is no solution to the problem of evil; rather, we must take up an attitude of acceptance in the face of this mystery, and indeed, in the face of all religious mysteries. The autonomy of each individual's moral perspective best indicates Bayle's attitude concerning the problem. Although he asserts the divinity of Christ, he agrees with the Socinians on the importance of the moral example of Christ, and for him the message of Christ is one of toleration. This is one reason why Bayle was at such length in showing that Luke 14:23, compel them to enter, was not the injunction to forced conversions that it had been taken to be by Augustine and many subsequent thinkers. Only toleration can guarantee the fundamental moral principle of an autonomous conscience, which wrestles with the pragmatic difficulties of religious faith, sincerely and with integrity, even though this makes possible error and heresy. The value of this conscience is not what it brings about — anything that it brought about could be better achieved directly by God — but its exercise by the individual. The connection between this view and Kant's categorical imperative has been noted in the literature. However, not only is Bayle's theory of the intrinsic value of obeying one's conscience reminiscent of Kant, but so too is the relationship between Bayle's views on conscience and his treatment of the problem of evil. In J.P. Schneewind's recent book, The Invention of Autonomy (1998), the argument is made that Kant invented his theory of autonomy in thinking about the problem of evil as he read the works of Leibniz, Rousseau, and Pope. It would seem, therefore, that Kant and Bayle came to their respective moral theories by means of similar kinds of reflections, a possible link between these two authors (through the medium of Leibniz) which has not yet been fully appreciated.

6. Bayle's influence

Bayle undeniably had an enormous influence given the wide readership of his work; but the precise nature of that influence, even in individual cases, remains a desideratum of research. Bayle's connections with Locke, Leibniz, Kant and the Enlightenment have already been at least suggested. Here the debt to him of Berkeley and Hume will be looked at.

The literature regards Bayle, not only as an original source for the Enlightenment, but as a conduit of the views and arguments of his immediate predecessors in the seventeenth century. A good example of where Bayle's role has not been made precise is his discussion of the primary-secondary quality distinction. Bayle is supposed to have conveyed Foucher's arguments against the distinction to Berkeley and Hume. The contention is that just as Malebranche produced arguments to show that secondary qualities exist only in the mind, so his critic Foucher extended those same arguments to show that primary qualities also exist only in the mind. In fact, however, the arguments that Foucher actually deployed were directed less against Malebranche, whom he took simply to assume the distinction, than against Descartes and especially Rohault. His point was not to undo the distinction, but to show that however it was understood, it was incompatible with Cartesian dualism.

It was Bayle himself in the famous note B of the Pyrrho article who took Foucher to be extending Malebranche's arguments: “if the objects of our senses appear to us coloured, hot, cold, smelling, tho' they are not so, why should they not appear extended and figured, at rest, and in motion, though they had no such thing.” Although a parallel is established, the argument is obviously not very strong. Now, the most notable mutatis mutandis argument employed by Berkeley against the distinction is based on the relativity of sense perception: the perception of both varies under varying conditions, so if the variation of secondary qualities is a reason to place them in the mind, it is also a reason to place the primary in the mind. This argument is not to be found in Foucher or in this article, but it does appear in note G of the Zeno article, unconnected with Foucher: “the modern Philosophers, though they are no Sceptics,” have made secondary qualities no more than perceptions in the mind; “why should we not say the same thing of extension?” Bayle again deploys the weak parallel argument above, and then continues: “Observe also, that the same body appears to us little or great, round or square, according to the place from whence we view it: and certainly, a body which seems to us very little, appears very great to fly.” A problem for this text as a source for Berkeley is that this very argument is to be found better presented in Malebranche, who is cited here along with other moderns such as Lamy and Nicole, who are supposed to be undone by it. Given that Malebranche is cited by Berkeley more often by Berkeley's notebooks than anyone but Locke, it would seem more likely that Berkeley went straight to Malebranche for his arguments on the primary-secondary distinction.

A stronger connection between Berkeley and Bayle would be the text itself, and especially note H, of the same Zeno article. By appeal to theoretical parsimony, according to Bayle, “the Cartesians may maintain that no such thing as matter exists; for whether it doth or doth not exist, God could equally communicate to us all the thought we have.” Such divine communication is, of course, precisely what Berkeley was to advocate. Moreover, Bayle in note G extends Zeno's argument against motion by denying that extension exists. His argument is that extension cannot be composed of mathematical points or of atoms, nor can it be infinitely divisible. It remains an open question how this squares with Berkeley's comment in his notebooks, which he repeats there, that “Malebranche's & Bayle's arguments do not seem to prove against Space, but onely Bodies.” The only other time Bayle is mentioned in Berkeley's entire work is in the Theory of Vision Vindicated, where he is mentioned, with Hobbes, Spinoza and Leibniz, as an author whose popularity shows how atheistic principles have taken root.

That Bayle exercised an enormous influence on Hume is beyond doubt. Not long before publishing his Treatise, Hume drew the attention of his friend Michael Ramsey to four texts that would facilitate his reading of it. One of them was “the more metaphysical Articles of Bailes [sic] Dictionary; such as those [on] Zeno, & Spinoza.” Now, it is conceivable that Hume encountered these texts, and recognized their propaedeutic value, only after completing his Treatise; but this bare possibility (the letter was written two years before its publication) is absolutely ruled out in the case of Bayle, if not of the other texts Hume names, by Hume's so-called early memoranda and especially by the use (unacknowledged, as was typical for the period) that he actually makes of Bayle's work in the text itself.

Of the philosophical entries in the early memoranda, about half deal with Bayle. Even more important are the textual uses of Bayle. Kemp Smith long ago drew attention to five issues on which, in his view, Bayle had an unquestionable influence on Hume. First, from the article “Zeno” Hume takes Bayle's tripartite division of the possible ways that space and time might be constituted: from mathematical points, or from physical points, or as infinitely divisible. But whereas Bayle argued in no uncertain terms that none of these possibilities was rationally defensible, Hume in effect opts for physical points with his conception of indivisible minima sensibilia (colored points, in the case of space). Although the result is a non-standard account of geometry as an inexact science, Hume thinks that he thereby preserves reason from otherwise irresolvable antinomies.

Second, Hume is supposed to have been influenced by Bayle's historical account of the types of skepticism and his own use of skeptical argument in attacking orthodox positions. Bayle's position on skepticism has been discussed above. It may not be too misleading to describe Hume's resolution of skeptical difficulties in terms of “taste and sentiment” as a naturalistic version of Bayle's supernaturalistic resolution in terms of grace that was described by the same phrase.

A third connection concerns the metaphysics of substance, mode and identity. Hume takes from the article “Spinoza” the objections Bayle lodged against Spinoza's “hideous hypothesis” that there is but a single substance which is God, and applies these objections to the view that humans possess a soul that is a simple, indivisible and immaterial substance. The whole of Hume's argument in three stages and two rebuttals of a reply is lifted from Bayle. Both the unique substance and the substantial soul are supposed to be indivisible, yet are really identical to the extension that is their mode, hence are divisible; both have contrary properties; etc. The upshot is that just as Spinoza's hypothesis is “unintelligible,” so is the theologians' supposition concerning the soul.

Fourth, Kemp Smith draws attention to the discussion of animal intelligence in the article “Rorarius.” In this instance, the influence of Bayle is less clear. Presumably, he had in mind chapter nine of the Enquiry; but here one finds as the main exercise an application of the argument by analogy with an emphasis on the importance of experience. There is, however, an ultimate appeal to instinct to explain the cognitive behavior of both men and animals. And here Bayle might have played a role, alluded to immediately above.

Finally, Hume might have been influenced by Bayle's treatment of religious questions, especially the argument from design. This is an exceedingly vexed area because of the questionable orthodoxy of Bayle's views and the expression of them. Many of the same ambiguities, of course, infect Hume's views on these questions, although his heterodoxy seems far less debatable.


[Note: a year-by-year list of everything published on Bayle during the twentieth century is to be found below in Mori, 1999.]

A. Primary literature

B. Primary literature in translation

C. Secondary literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Enlightenment | evil, problem of | skepticism | toleration