Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Dec 8, 2001; substantive revision Wed Aug 31, 2005

Much of epistemology has arisen either in defense of or in opposition to various forms of skepticism. Indeed, one could classify various theories of knowledge by their responses to skepticism. For example, rationalists could be viewed as skeptical about the possibility of empirical knowledge while not being skeptical with regard to a priori knowledge and empiricists could be seen as skeptical about the possibility of a priori knowledge but not so with regard to empirical knowledge. In addition, many traditional problems, for example the problem of other minds or the problem of our knowledge of God's existence, can be seen as restricted forms of skepticism which hold that we cannot have knowledge of any propositions in some particular domain thought to be within our ken. This essay will focus on the general forms of skepticism which question our knowledge in many, if not all, domains in which we ordinarily think knowledge is possible. Since this essay is not primarily devoted to a discussion of the history of philosophical skepticism, the general forms of skepticism to be discussed are those which contemporary philosophers still find the most interesting.

1. Philosophical Skepticism vs. Ordinary Incredulity

Even before examining the various general forms of skepticism, it is crucial that we distinguish between philosophical skepticism and ordinary incredulity because doing so will help to explain why philosophical skepticism is so intriguing. Consider an ordinary case in which we think someone fails to have knowledge. Suppose Anne claims that she knows that the bird she is looking at is a robin and that I believe that if Anne were to look carefully, she would see that its coloration is not quite that of a robin. Its breast is too orange. Further, I believe that it flies somewhat differently than robins do. This bird seems to flitter more than a typical robin.

Thus, there are two grounds for doubting that Anne knows that this is a robin:

  1. The color of this bird isn't typical of robins.
  2. The flight pattern of this bird is not typical of robins.

Now, what makes this a case of ordinary doubt is that there are, in principle, two ways of removing the basis for doubt:

  1. Anne could show that the alleged grounds for doubt are false; or
  2. Anne could show that the grounds for doubt, though true, can be neutralized.[1]

Taking alternative (1), Anne could show that there are many robins with the coloration of the bird in question by citing the Audubon Field Guide for Birds in which many of the pictured robins have very orange breasts. In other words, Anne could show that (a) is false.

But in order to remove grounds for doubt, it is not necessary that Anne show that the alleged grounds are false. Alternative (2) is available. Consider ground (b). It could be granted that the bird in question flies in a way that is not at all typical of robins. But suppose that on closer inspection we see that some of its tail feathers have been damaged in a way that could account for the unusual flight pattern. Because the bird has difficulty gliding and flying in a straight line, it flaps its wings much more rapidly than is typical of robins. Thus, although we can grant that (b) is true, we would have explained away, or neutralized, the grounds for doubt.

The point here is that in this case, and in all ordinary cases of incredulity, the grounds for the doubt can, in principle, be removed. As Wittgenstein would say, doubt occurs within the context of things undoubted. If something is doubted, something else must be held fast because doubt presupposes that there are means of removing the doubt.[2] We doubt that the bird is a robin because, at least in part, we think we know how robins typically fly and what their typical coloration is. That is, we think our general picture of the world is right — or right enough — so that it does provide us with both the grounds for doubt and the means for potentially removing the doubt. Thus, ordinary incredulity, say about some feature of the world, occurs against a background of sequestered beliefs about the world. We are not doubting that we have any knowledge of the world. Far from it, we are presupposing that we do know some things about the world. To quote Wittgenstein, “A doubt without an end is not even a doubt” (Wittgenstein 1969, ¶ 625).

In contrast, philosophical skepticism attempts to render doubtful every member of a class of propositions that we think falls within our ken. One member of the class is not pitted against another. The grounds for either withholding assent to the claim that we can have such knowledge or denying that we can have such knowledge are such that there is no possible way to either answer them or neutralize them by appealing to another member of the class. Thus, philosophic doubt or philosophical skepticism, as opposed to ordinary incredulity, does not, in principle, come to an end. Or so the philosophic skeptic will claim!

To clarify the distinction between ordinary incredulity and philosophical doubt, let us consider two recent movies: “The Truman Show” and “The Matrix.” In the former, a character is placed, without his knowledge, in a contrived environment so that his “life” can be broadcast on television. But he begins to wonder whether the world surrounding him is, in fact, what it appears to be. Some events seem to happen too regularly and many other things are just not quite as they should be. Eventually, Truman obtains convincing evidence that all his world is a stage and all the men and women are merely players. The crucial point is that even had he not developed any doubts, there is, in principle, a way to resolve them had they arisen. Such doubts, though quite general, are examples of ordinary incredulity.

Contrast this with the deception practiced in The Matrix. When everything is running as programmed by the machines, there is no possible way for the “people” in the matrix to determine that the world as experienced is only a “dream world” and not the real world (the world of causes and effects). The only “reality” that it is possible to investigate is a computer generated one. (See Irwin 2002, 2005 for collections of articles on The Matrix.)

The Truman Story is a depiction of a case of ordinary incredulity because there is some evidence available for determining what's really the case; whereas The Matrix depicts a situation similar to that imagined by the philosophic skeptic in which it is not possible to obtain evidence for determining that things are not as they seem (at least when the virtual reality is perfectly created). Put another way, the philosophic skeptic challenges our ordinary assumption that there is evidence available that can help us to discriminate between the real world and some counterfeit world that appears in all ways to be identical to the real world. Ordinary incredulity arises within the context of other propositions of a similar sort taken to be known, and it can be removed by discovering the truth of some further proposition of the relevant type. On the other hand, philosophical skepticism about a proposition of a certain type derives from considerations that are such that they cannot be removed by appealing to additional propositions of that type — or so the skeptic claims.

These movies illustrate one other fundamental feature of the philosophical arguments for skepticism, namely, that the debate between the skeptics and their opponents takes place within the evidentialist account of knowledge which holds that knowledge is at least true, sufficiently justified belief. The debate is over whether the grounds are such that they can make a belief sufficiently justified so that a responsible epistemic agent is entitled to assent to the proposition.[3] The basic issue at stake is whether the justification condition can be fulfilled. A corollary of this is that strictly reliabilist or externalist responses to philosophic skepticism constitute a change of subject. A belief could be reliably produced, i.e., its causal pedigree could be such that anything having that causal etiology is sufficiently likely to be true, but the reasons available for it could fail to satisfy the standards agreed upon by both the skeptics and their opponents.

2. Two Basic Forms of Philosophical Skepticism

Consider some proposition, p. There are just three possible propositional attitudes one can have with regard to p's truth when considering whether p is true. One can either assent to p, or assent to ~p or withhold assenting both to p and to ~p. Of course, there are other attitudes one could have toward p. One could just be uninterested that p or be excited or depressed that p. But those attitudes are either ones we have when we are not considering whether p is true or they are attitudes that result from our believing, denying or withholding p. For example, I might be happy or sorry that p is true when I come to believe that it is.

I just spoke of “assent” and I mean to be using it to depict the pro-attitude, whatever it is, toward a proposition that is required for knowing that proposition. Philosophers have differed about what that attitude is. Some take it to be something akin to being certain that p or guaranteeing that p (Malcolm 1963, 58-72). Others have taken it not to be a form of belief at all because, for example, one can know that p without believing it as in cases in which I might in fact remember that Queen Victoria died in 1901 but not believe that I remember it and hence might be said not to believe it (Radford 1966). For the purposes of this essay we need not attempt to pin down precisely the nature of the pro-attitude toward p that is necessary for knowing that p. It is sufficient for our purposes to stipulate that assent is the pro-attitude toward p required to know that p.

Let us use “EI-type” propositions to refer to epistemically interesting types of propositions. Such types of propositions contain tokens some of which are generally thought to be known given what we ordinarily take knowledge to be. Thus, it would not be epistemically interesting if we did not know exactly what the rainfall will be on March 3 ten years from now. That kind of thing (a fine grained distant future state) is not generally thought to be known given what we ordinarily take knowledge to be. But it would be epistemically interesting if we cannot know anything about the future, or anything about the contents of someone else's mind, or anything about the past, or anything at all about the “external world.” We think we know many propositions about those types of things.

Now, consider the (meta) proposition concerning the scope of our knowledge, namely: We can have knowledge of EI-type propositions. Given that there are just three stances we can have toward any proposition when considering whether to assent to it, we can:

  1. Assent that we can have knowledge of EI-type propositions.
  2. Assent that we cannot have knowledge of EI-type propositions.
  3. Withhold assent to both that we can and that we cannot have knowledge of EI-type propositions.

Let us call someone with the attitude depicted in (i) an “Epistemist.”[4] Such a person assents to the claim that we can have knowledge of EI-type propositions.

The attitude portrayed in (ii) has gone under many names. I will follow the terminology suggested by Sextus Empiricus. He used the term “Academics” to refer to the leaders of the Academy (founded by Plato) during the 3rd to 1st century B.C. According to Sextus, they assented to the claim that we cannot have knowledge of what I have called EI-type propositions — although it is far from clear that this was an accurate description of their views. (See the entry on ancient skepticism.) Perhaps the prime example was Carneades (214-129 B.C.). Other philosophers will refer to this view as “Cartesian skepticism” because of the skeptical arguments investigated by Descartes and his critics in the mid-17th century. And still others will refer to it as “switched world skepticism” or “possible world skepticism” because the arguments for it typically involve imagining oneself to be in some possible world that is both vastly different from the actual world and at the same time absolutely indistinguishable (at least by us) from the actual world. What underlies this form of skepticism is assent to the proposition that we cannot know EI-type propositions because our evidence is inadequate.

Those assenting neither to the proposition that knowledge of EI-type propositions is possible nor to the proposition that such knowledge is not possible can be called “Pyrrhonian Skeptics” after Pyrrho who lived between ca 365 - ca 275 B.C. The primary source of Pyrrhonian Skepticism is the writing of Sextus Empiricus who lived at the end of the second century AD. The Pyrrhonians withheld assent to every non-evident proposition. That is, they withheld assent to all propositions about which genuine dispute was possible, and they took that class of propositions to include the (meta) proposition that we can have knowledge of EI-type propositions. Indeed, they sometimes classified the Epistemists and the Academic Skeptics together as dogmatists because the Epistemists assented to the proposition that we can have knowledge, while the Academic Skeptics assented to the denial of that claim.[5]

Another difference between Academic and Pyrrhonian Skepticism is closely related to the charge by the latter that the former is really a disguised type of dogmatism. The Academic Skeptic thinks that her view can be shown to be the correct one by an argument (or by arguments). The Pyrrhonian would point out that the Academic Skeptic maintains confidence in the ability of reason to settle matters — at least with regard to the extent of our knowledge of propositions in the EI-class. One way of understanding the so-called problem of the “Cartesian circle” illustrates the Pyrrhonian point: Descartes is relying throughout the Meditations on his power of reasoning to remove the skeptical doubts that he raises, but to do so means that he has exempted the faculty of reasoning from the doubts that he raised in the “First Meditation” about the epistemic reliability of our faculties. A Cartesian reply could be as simple as paraphrasing Luther: Here I stand, as a philosopher with confidence in reason, and as such I can do no other.[6] Regardless of the adequacy of that kind of response, the point here is that the Pyrrhonians did not think that they had a convincing argument whose conclusion was that withholding assent to non-evident propositions was the appropriate epistemic attitude to have.

I think it is fair to say that Academic Skepticism is usually what is meant when most contemporary philosophers write about skepticism. Thus, it is that form of skepticism to which we will now turn and it is that form that will be the primary focus of this essay, although I will discuss some aspects of Pyrrhonism later.

3. Academic Skepticism

A way to motivate Academic Skepticism and to clearly distinguish it from ordinary incredulity is to trace the way in which Descartes expanded the realm of what was doubtful (and hence not worthy of assent) in the “First Meditation.”[7] Descartes begins by noting that the senses have deceived him on some occasions and, in the voice of his skeptical interlocutor, he conjectures that it is never prudent to trust what occasionally misleads. So, we don't have “certain” knowledge of the external world based upon the testimony of our senses. However, in the voice of the non-skeptical interlocutor, he replies that even though the senses have misled him, he can neutralize that purported basis for doubt by pointing out that we are able to determine when our senses are not trustworthy. Thus, this is a case of ordinary incredulity because he appeals to some knowledge of the world gained through our senses to neutralize this basis for doubt. For example, in looking at a straight stick in water, even though it appears bent, we know not to accept the testimony of our senses at face value. We can neutralize the potentially knowledge-robbing proposition that my senses have deceived me on some occasions by adding to it another proposition to which we assent, namely, I can distinguish between the occasions when my senses are trustworthy and those when they are not. Some propositions in the EI-type (propositions about the external world) can be used to rebuff the grounds for ordinary incredulity. Thus, no basis for (philosophical) Academic Skepticism has been located.

Descartes next considers dreaming. What if he were dreaming at that very moment? Would he still have some knowledge of the external world? Yes; because in dreams and in waking life there are some common general features. So, if he were dreaming, he would not know in particular what is going on about him at that moment, but that does not imply that he fails to have any knowledge at that moment. For example, he still could know that there are hands. More importantly, even more simple things about nature “in general” are not thereby made doubtful. We have not found any reason for doubting that there are material objects or that they have a spatial location, or are in motion or at rest, or can exist for a long or short period of time. Again, no basis for Academic Skepticism has been established.

But then Descartes thinks of a grounds for doubt for which he says he “certainly has no reply.” He puts it this way:

… In whatever way [it is supposed] that I have arrived at the state of being that I have reached — whether [it is attributed] to fate or to accident, or [made] out that it is by a continual succession of antecedents, or by some other method — since to err and deceive oneself is a defect, it is clear that the greater will be the probability of my being so imperfect as to deceive myself ever, as is the Author of my being to whom [is assigned] my origin the less powerful. (Meditations, 147)

In other words, at this point in the Meditations, since he lacks an argument for the claim that whatever is causally responsible for his “state of being” is capable of making his being such that to err would not be natural for it, assenting to propositions arrived at by his “state of being” is not legitimate. Thus, Descartes believes that he has located a basis for doubting all of his supposed former knowledge of the external world that cannot be repulsed by locating another such proposition to which he is entitled. He has found a proposition that, if true, would (by itself) defeat the justification he has for his assenting to propositions about the external world and which is such that (1) he does not (at least at this point in the Meditations) have a way to reject it and such that (2) he has no way to neutralize its effect. Thus, a basis for philosophical skepticism has been found because an entire class of EI-type propositions — propositions that his “nature” has led him to assent to — is now thrown into doubt because he cannot use one member of the class to reject or neutralize the basis for doubting another member of the class.

Descartes apparently thinks that something is worthy of assent only if it is immune to genuine doubt. It appears that he thinks that something, d, is a grounds for genuine doubt of p for S iff:

  1. d added to S's beliefs makes assent to p no longer adequately justified;
  2. S is not justified in denying d;[8]
  3. S has no way to neutralize d.[9]

The final step is to say that some proposition is not worthy of assent if there are genuine grounds for doubting it. Indeed, Descartes grants that even after d is located, p might still be more reasonable to believe than to deny (Meditations, 148). The point is that the pro-attitude should not rise to the level required for knowledge because there is a genuine ground for doubt. Thus, a crucial feature of the Cartesian-style argument for Academic Skepticism is that it employs a very stringent requirement on the type of evidence required for knowledge. It must make a proposition immune to genuine doubt.

To make that clear, let us state the epistemic principle, which we can call the “Eliminate All Doubt Principle,” that apparently informs the Cartesian-style argument:

Eliminate All Doubt Principle [EAD]:
For all propositions x and d, if d satisfies condition 1. in the definition of genuine doubt that x, then if assenting to x is adequately justified for S, then S is adequately justified in eliminating d (either by denying or neutralizing it).

In more contemporary terminology, the ground for doubt proposed by Descartes can be put like this:

U: My epistemic equipment is untrustworthy.

The Cartesian-style argument for Academic Skepticism can now be put like this:

  1. If I know that p, then there are no genuine grounds for doubting that p.
  2. U is a genuine ground for doubting that p.
  3. Therefore, I do not know that p.

The Cartesian-style argument does not readily lend itself to the objection that by employing it the skeptic is contradicting herself on the grounds that the argument purportedly shows that she fails to know because her epistemic equipment is untrustworthy while at the same time she is employing the very equipment that, were the argument sound, would be unreliable. The reason is that she is neither asserting that her equipment is untrustworthy nor claiming that there is an argument which shows that her equipment is untrustworthy. She is merely claiming that U is a genuine ground for doubt. Thus she neither is holding contradictory beliefs nor is her practice somehow incompatible with her beliefs.

The Cartesian-style argument for Academic Skepticism should be contrasted with what many contemporary philosophers take to be the canonical argument for Academic Skepticism which employs the Closure Principle (CP).[10] Letting “h” stand for an EI-type proposition, for example, G. E. Moore's famous “here's a hand” and letting “sk” stand for “I am in a switched-world in which there are no hands, but it appears just as though there were hands,” we can state the canonical CP-style argument for Academic Skepticism as follows:

CP1. If I am justified in believing that h, then I am justified in believing that ~sk.

CP2. I am not justified in believing that ~sk.

Therefore, I am not justified in believing that h.

This argument appeals to a form of the Closure Principle in Premise 1. Letting “Jsx” stand for “S is justified in having some pro-attitude, J, regarding x,” that principle can be stated as:

Closure Principle [CP]:
For all propositions x and y, if x entails y, and Jsx, then Jsy.

(In the CP-style argument: x = h and y = ~sk.)

A crucial feature of CP is that it does not depend upon employing a stringent notion of justification. Suppose that (positive) justification comes in degrees, where the lowest degree is something like mere plausibility and the highest degree is absolute certainty. CP could be recast as follows:

CP*: For all propositions, x and y, if x entails y, and Jsx to degree u, then Jsy to degree v (where uv).

Thus, when the Academic Skeptic employs CP (or CP*), she need not be employing a very stringent notion of justification. That is a primary difference between the CP-style and the Cartesian-style argument for Academic Skepticism.

Another difference is that the Cartesian-style argument concerns knowledge, whereas the CP-style argument concerns justification (to whatever degree). Nevertheless, that difference is insignificant because the debate about the merits of skepticism takes place within the evidentialist account of knowledge. Knowledge is taken to entail adequately justified assent and, hence, “knowledge” could be replaced by “adequately justified assent” in the Cartesian style argument.

Let us return to the central difference between Cartesian and CP-style arguments, namely the former employs EAD while the later employs CP (or CP*). EAD requires that we eliminate any genuine grounds for doubt and those include more than mere contraries (propositions which are such that they both cannot be true, but they both could be false). In addition, recall that according to the Cartesian to be adequately justified in eliminating d as a ground for doubt for x, either S is adequately justified in denying d (assenting to ~d) or S is adequately justified in assenting to some neutralizing proposition, n, such that adding (n & d) to S's beliefs fails to make it the case that x is no longer adequately justified.[11] Thus, since every contrary of some proposition is a potential genuine ground for doubt in virtue of satisfying condition 1. in the definition of genuine doubt, EAD entails CP but CP does not entail EAD.[12] To see that, consider any contrary, say c, of a proposition, say h. The proposition, c, would be a potential genuine ground for doubting h since if c were added to S's beliefs, h would no longer be adequately justified because S's beliefs would then contain a proposition, c, that entailed the denial of h. Furthermore, the only way S could eliminate c as a ground for doubt would be by denying it, since nothing could neutralize it. Thus, EAD has the consequence that if S is justified in assenting to h, then S is justified in denying every contrary of h. But that is just an instance of CP, since (by hypothesis) h entails ~c. That CP does not entail EAD should be clear since there are grounds for doubting h that are not contraries of h. For example, the proposition, U, considered above is a grounds for doubting h, but h and U could both be true.

Thus, there are two basic forms of Academic Skepticism: The Cartesian-style argument that employs the strong EAD principle and the CP-style that employs the weaker CP. Since the CP-style skeptic employs the weaker epistemic principle, it will be best to begin by focusing on it because any criticisms of it are likely to redound to the stronger form.

4. The Argument for Academic Skepticism Employing the Closure Principle

There appear to be only three ways that one can respond to the CP-style skeptical argument: deny at least one premise, deny that the argument is valid, or reluctantly accept the conclusion — if neither of the first two alternatives succeeds. (I say “appear” because I will mention later a fourth alternative that is available to the Pyrrhonian Skeptic.) The second alternative — denying the validity of the argument — has not been taken seriously by the anti-skeptic because it would lead to embracing an extremely severe form of skepticism. If one were to deny that modus tollens is a valid form of inference, one would also have to deny the validity of (i) disjunctive syllogism or (ii) modus ponens and contraposition, since it is easy to transform modus tollens arguments into ones employing the other forms of inference. Hence, if this alternative were chosen, reasoning would apparently come to a complete standstill. That, presumably, is why no one has ever seriously considered this alternative.

So, if we are not to reluctantly embrace the conclusion, it appears as though we must reject either the first premise — an instantiation of closure — or the second premise.

Consideration of CP1

Let us begin an examination of CP1 and the general closure principle of which it is an instantiation. The basic issue is this: Does closure hold for justified belief?

Closure certainly does hold for some properties, for example, truth. If p is true and it strictly implies q, then q is true. It just as clearly does not hold for other properties. If p is a belief of mine, and p strictly implies q, it does not follow that q is a belief of mine. I might fail to see the implication or I might be “wired” incorrectly (from birth or as the result of an injury) or I simply might be epistemically perverse. I might, for example, believe all of the axioms of Euclidean plane geometry, but fail to believe (or perhaps even refuse to believe) that the exterior angle of a triangle is equivalent to the sum of the two opposite interior angles.

What about justified belief? It is easy to see that, as stated above, CP (or CP*) is clearly false. Every necessary truth is entailed by every proposition, and we can be justified in believing a false proposition. But one surely does not want to claim that S is justified in believing every necessary truth whenever S has some justified belief in a false proposition. In addition, some entailments might be beyond S's capacity to grasp. Finally, there might even be some contingent propositions that are beyond S's capacity to grasp which are entailed by some propositions that S does, indeed, grasp. And it might be thought that S is not entitled to believe anything that S cannot grasp.

But it also appears that CP can easily be repaired. We can stipulate (i) that the domain of the propositions in the generalization of CP includes only contingent propositions that are within S's capacity to grasp and (ii) that the entailment is “obvious” to S. The skeptic can agree to those restrictions because the skeptical scenarios are posited in such a way as to render it obvious that our ordinary beliefs are false in those scenarios, and it is taken to be a contingent claim that S is in the actual circumstances as described in the antecedent.

There is one other required clarification of the restricted version of CP. “Justified belief” is ambiguous. It could be used to refer to a species of actually held beliefs — namely, those actually held beliefs of S that are justified. Or it could refer to propositions that S is entitled to hold — regardless of whether S does indeed hold them. If CP is to be acceptable, “justified belief” must be used so as to mean the latter for a reason already cited, i.e., belief does not transmit through entailment.

We are now in a position to ask: Does the restricted form of closure hold regarding what we are entitled to believe — even if we don't, in fact, believe it?

There appears to be a perfectly general argument for the restricted version. Let p entail q, and let us suppose that S is entitled to believe that p iff S has (non-overridden) grounds that make p sufficiently likely to be true:[13]

  1. If S is entitled to believe that p, then S has (non-overridden) grounds that make p sufficiently likely to be true. [by the supposition]
  2. If S has (non-overridden) grounds that make p sufficiently likely to be true, then S has (non- overridden) grounds making q sufficiently likely to be true. [because p entails q]
  3. If S is entitled to believe that p, then S has (non-overridden) grounds making q sufficiently likely to be true. [from 1,2]
  4. If S has (non-overridden) grounds making q sufficiently likely to be true, then S is entitled to believe that q. [by the supposition]
  5. Therefore, if S is entitled to believe that p, S is entitled to believe that q. [from 2,3]

The supposition mentioned above seems plausible given that the debate over the merits of Academic Skepticism employs an evidentialist account of justification. That is, the debate between the Academic Skeptic and the Epistemist is over whether S has adequate grounds for EI-type propositions such that those grounds make p sufficiently likely to be true.

Premise 2 contains the key claim. In spite of the fact that the probabilities (whether subjective or objective) transmit through entailment, it has been challenged. Fred Dretske and others have produced cases in which they believe CP fails and fails precisely because Premise 2 in the general argument for CP is false.[14] Dretske writes:

… something's being a zebra implies that it is not a mule … cleverly disguised by the zoo authorities to look like a zebra. Do you know that these animals are not mules cleverly disguised? If you are tempted to say “Yes” to this question, think a moment about what reasons you have, what evidence you can produce in favor of this claim. The evidence you had for thinking them zebras has been effectively neutralized, since it does not count toward their not being mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras. (Dretske 1970, 1015-1016)

Dretske is speaking of “knowledge” rather than beliefs to which one is entitled, but that seems irrelevant since the issue concerns the supposed lack of a sufficient source of evidence or reasons for the claim that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule. In other words, Dretske grants that S has (non-overridden) grounds that make it sufficiently likely that the animals are zebras, but he holds that S does not have (non-overridden) grounds making it sufficiently likely that the animals are not cleverly disguised mules because S's evidence for the former has been “effectively neutralized.”

The crucial thing to note about this proposed counterexample is that it works only if the Closure Principle entails that the very same source of evidence that justifies S in believing that the animals are zebras must justify S in believing that they are not cleverly disguised mules. Since the “evidence” for the former has been “effectively neutralized,” it is not available for the latter. Now, in response one could claim that once the question of whether the animals are disguised mules has been raised, the evidence is “effectively neutralized” for both the former and the latter, and S is no longer justified in believing that the animals are zebras. Thus, it could be held that this example could actually be used to support CP.

Nevertheless, let us grant that S's evidence for the claim that the animals are zebras cannot be used to show that they are not cleverly disguised mules. It could be argued that this would not force giving up Premise 2 in the general argument for CP.

Such an argument could begin by recalling that Premise 2 claimed merely that whenever S had (non-overridden) grounds that make p sufficiently likely to be true, then S has (non-overridden) grounds for making q sufficiently likely to be true. It did not require that it was the very same grounds in both cases. Dretske's purported counterexample seems to require that CP implies that the adequate source of evidence is the same for both propositions. Thus, letting “xRy” mean that x provides an adequate evidence for y, the counter example depends upon assuming that if closure holds between p and q, then the evidence “path” must look like this:

Pattern 1
       … Rq

Evidence paths specify what propositions serve as good enough reasons, ceteris paribus, for believing other propositions. Dretske is supposing that the very same evidence, e, that I have for p must be adequate for q whenever p entails q.

No doubt this constraint sometimes correctly portrays the relevant evidential relationships when some proposition, p, entails some other proposition, q. For example, suppose I have adequate evidence for the claim that Anne has two brothers, then it would seem that the very same evidence would be adequate for believing that Anne has at least one brother. But the defender of CP, and more particularly the Academic Skeptic, could point out that closure need not require that type of evidence path in all cases in which one proposition entails another.

Two are two other possibilities for instantiating closure that are captured by Premise 2 that can be depicted as follows:

Pattern 2

Pattern 3

Re(where e includes q) Rp

In Pattern 2 cases there is some adequate evidence, e, for p; and p, itself, is the adequate evidence for q, since p strictly implies q. For example, if I have adequate evidence for believing that 2 is a prime number, I can use that proposition as an adequate reason for believing that there is at least one even prime. Indeed, consider any belief arrived at as a result of deductive inference. In such a case, we legitimately infer the entailed proposition from the conjunction of the premises that entails it. The plausibility of the famous Gettier cases depends upon Pattern 2 type cases in which closure holds. Gettier says:

… for any proposition p, if S is justified in believing p, and p entails q, and S deduces q from p and accepts q as a result of this deduction, then S is justified in believing q. (Gettier 1963, 122)[15]

In Pattern 3 cases the order of the evidence is reversed because q serves as part of the evidence for p. For example, I am justified in believing that water is present if I am justified in believing that there is present a clear, odorless, watery-tasting and watery-looking fluid at standard temperature and pressure. This pattern is typical of abductive inferences. In addition, there are cases in which some contraries of h need to be eliminated prior to h's being justified. For example, in the zebra-in-the-zoo case, if I had some reason to think that the animals were cleverly disguised mules, then it could be argued that such a contrary would need to be eliminated before I would be justified in believing that the animals were zebras.

The crucial point for the discussion here is that granting that there is no Pattern 1 type evidence path available to S in the zebra-in-the-zoo case does not require relinquishing premise 2 in the general argument for CP. The reason is simply that CP does not entail that there is Pattern 1 type evidence available in every case in which p entails q. Indeed, it could be suggested that the animals looking like zebras in a pen marked “zebras” is, ceteris paribus, adequate evidence to justify the claim that they are zebras; and once S is entitled to believe that the animals are zebras, S can, using the principle stated by Gettier, justifiably deduce that they are not cleverly disguised mules. That is, S can employ an evidence path like that depicted in Pattern 2. (See Klein 1981, 1995, and 2000a.) Further, if S had some reason to think that the animals were cleverly disguised mules, then S might have to eliminate that possibility before she could justifiably believe that they are zebras. In other words, S might have to employ an evidence path like the one depicted in Pattern 3. The point is that the Dretske-like counterexamples appear to depend upon the false claim that if Premise 2 in the general argument for CP is true, then the evidential relationship between the entailing and the entailed proposition is always correctly depicted by Pattern 1.

In addition to the purported counterexamples to closure that we have just examined, there are some general theories of knowledge in which closure fails. Robert Nozick's account of knowledge is the best such example. Roughly his account is this (Nozick 1981, 172-187):

S knows that p iff:
  1. S believes p;
  2. p is true;
  3. if p were true, S would believe p;
  4. if p were not true, S would not believe p.

This account is often referred to as a tracking account of knowledge because whenever S knows that p, S's beliefs track p. Think of a guided missile tracking its target. If the target moves left, the missile moves left. If the target moves right, the missile moves to the right. According to the tracking account of knowledge our beliefs must track the truth as a guided missile tracks its target.

There is one important clarification of conditions 3 and 4 discussed by Nozick, namely, that the method by which S acquires the belief must be held constant from the actual world to the possible world. A doting grandmother might know that her grandchild is not a thief on the basis of very good evidence, but would still believe that he wasn't a thief, even if he were, because she loves him. So, we must require that the grandmother use the same method in both the actual and the near possible worlds, for otherwise condition 4 would exclude some clear cases of knowledge. This is not the place to provide a full examination of Nozick's account of knowledge.[16] What is crucial for our discussion is that it is easy to see that closure will fail for knowledge in just the kind of case that the Academic Skeptic is putting forward because of condition 4. Suppose S knows that there is a chair before her. Would she know that she is not in a skeptical scenario in which it merely appears that there is a chair? If the fourth condition were true, she would not know that because if she were in such a scenario, she would be fooled into thinking that she wasn't. Thus, either condition 4 is too strong or CP fails.

There are some reasons for thinking that condition 4 is too strong. Consider a relatively simple case in which S seems to have knowledge but condition 4 does not obtain. S looks at a thermometer that is displaying the temperature as 72 degrees. The thermometer is working perfectly and S comes to believe that the temperature is 72 degrees by reading the thermometer and coming to believe what it says. But if the temperature were not 72, suppose that something would affect the thermometer in a way that made it read “72,” so that by employing the same method (looking at the thermometer and coming to believe what it reads) S would still believe that it was 72. (One could imagine all kinds of circumstances that would have that causal result. A comical one: Imagine a lizard that is now sleeping on the thermometer that would stir were the temperature to rise, thus dislodging a small rock that hits the thermometer breaking the mercury column in a way that makes the thermometer still read 72.)

Or consider this case in the literature: You put a glass of ice-cold lemonade on a picnic table in your back yard. You go inside and get a telephone call from a friend and talk for half an hour. When you hang up you remember that you had left the ice-cold lemonade outside exposed to the hot sun and come to believe that it isn't ice-cold anymore. It would seem that you could know that even if in some near world a friend of yours who just happened to be walking by noticed the glass and happening to have a cooler full of ice with him put the glass of lemonade in the cooler to keep it ice-cold for you. Thus, if the lemonade were still ice-cold, you would believe that it wasn't. (See Vogel 1987, 206.)

The moral of these cases seems to be that S can know that p even if there are some near possible worlds in which p is false but S still believes that p (employing the same method of belief formation). Indeed, it could plausibly be maintained that what is required for knowledge is that the method of belief formation work in this world — exactly as it is — even if the method would fail were there to be some slight variation in the actual world.

Further Clarification of Closure

In order to clarify CP further, it would be useful to contrast it with a stronger principle. I have already pointed out that in some cases some contraries of h need to be eliminated before h becomes justified. Suppose, however, that the skeptic requires that all contraries to h be eliminated before h is justified. That is much stronger than CP because CP is compatible with Pattern 1 and Pattern 2 type evidential relationships. In neither is every contrary to h eliminated prior to h. In Pattern 2, the contrary of h is eliminated after h; in Pattern 1, h is arrived at and its contrary is eliminated simultaneously. Keith Lehrer might be appealing to the stronger principle when he writes:

… generally arguments about where the burden of proof lies are unproductive. It is more reasonable to suppose that such questions are best left to courts of law where they have suitable application. In philosophy [emphasis added] a different principle of agnoiology [the study of ignorance] is appropriate, to wit, that no hypothesis should be rejected as unjustified without argument against it. Consequently, if the sceptic puts forth a hypothesis inconsistent with the hypothesis of common sense, then there is no burden of proof on either side … . (Lehrer 1971, 53)

The passage is open to more than one interpretation, but it will serve to illustrate my point, namely that there is a very strong principle — call it the “Eliminate All Contraries First Principle” [EACF Principle] — which requires that all evidence paths exhibit Pattern 3 and that the denials of all contraries to a given proposition appear prior to that proposition.

If EACF were accepted, there is a really easy route to Academic Skepticism. If it were required that the evidence, e, for some hypothesis, h, must contain the denials of all the contraries of h, it is clear that e would have to entail h. To see that, note that (~h & p) as well as (~h & ~p) are contraries of h, and that it is not possible for both ~(~h & p) and ~(~h & ~p) to be true and h to be false. Thus, if the skeptic were to adopt the EACF Principle, the evidence for h would have to entail h. (See Klein 1981, 100-104.) That requirement seems to be too strong for many, if not most, empirically contingent propositions. Hence, it could be plausibly argued that this is an inappropriate way to motivate skepticism because in so far as skepticism remains an interesting philosophical position, the skeptic cannot impose such an outrageous departure from our ordinary epistemic practices.

There is a related point worth mentioning. Note that even EAD, although requiring that we be able to reject or neutralize every potential ground for doubt (i.e., a proposition satisfying condition 1. in the definition of genuine doubt), does not require what EACF does. EAD does not require that we eliminate all of the grounds for doubt (including contraries) before we are justified in believing a hypothesis. Indeed, EAD allows for the possibility that we could use h, itself, or something that h justifies as the basis for rejecting or neutralizing some grounds for doubt.

Consideration of CP2

Now, with those clarifications of CP (and EAD) in mind, we can turn to CP2. It claims that we are not justified in denying the skeptical hypothesis — in other words that we are not justified in believing that we are not being deceived. What arguments can be given for CP2? It is tempting to suggest something like this: The skeptical scenarios are developed in such a way that it is supposed that we could not tell that we were being deceived. For example, we are asked to consider that there is an Evil Genius “so powerful” that it could (1) make me believe that there were hands when there were none and (2) make it such that I could not detect the illusion. But the skeptic must be very careful here. She cannot require that in order for S to know (or be justified in assenting to) something, say x, that if x were false, she would not still assent to x. We have just seen (while examining Nozick's account of knowledge) that this requirement is too strong. So the mere fact that there could be skeptical scenarios in which S still believes that she is not in such a scenario cannot provide the skeptic with a basis for thinking that she fails to know that she is not (actually) in a skeptical scenario. But even more importantly, were that a requirement of knowledge (or justification), then we have seen that closure would fail and, consequently, the basis for the first premise in the CP-style argument for Academic Skepticism would be forfeited.[17]

In addition, we have also seen that if CP is true, and it did seem to be true, then there is one evidence pattern between entailing and entailed propositions that might prove useful to the Epistemist at this point in the discussion. If S could be justified in believing some proposition that entailed the denial of the skeptical hypothesis, then S could be justified in denying that hypothesis by employing evidence Pattern 2. Indeed, as G. E Moore suggested (1962, 242), what is to prevent the Epistemist from claiming that S is justified in denying that she is in a skeptical scenario because S is justified in believing that she has hands and CP is true? A plausible answer to Moore seems to be something like this: The issue that is under dispute is whether S is justified in assenting to (or knows that) she has hands. Thus, the Epistemist cannot reject CP2 by assuming the denial of the conclusion of the skeptical argument. All well and good. But the same sauce cooks the gander, and the skeptic cannot claim as the reason for CP2 that since S is not justified in believing that she has hands, she cannot avail herself of that as her reason for being justified in believing that she is not in a skeptical scenario.

So, what reason can the skeptic give for CP2? I do not know of one that has been offered that is consistent with the defense of CP and that does not beg the question. That is not to say that CP2 is false. Far from it. Perhaps it is true. The issue here is whether we are justified in accepting or rejecting it. It seems that in order to accept it and CP, the skeptic would have to assert that S is not justified in believing that she has hands because evidence Pattern 2 depicts one way in which S could be justified in denying the skeptical scenario. But that would beg the question because the conclusion of the CP-style argument is nothing other than S is not justified in believing that she has hands. [18]

I had mentioned earlier that although there seemed to be only three responses available when confronting the CP-style argument for Academic Skepticism (accept the conclusion, reject one or both of the premises, or deny the validity of the argument), there is, in fact, a fourth alternative. That alternative is simply to point out that given the required defense of CP1 against the counterexample proposed by Dretske, there is no good argument for CP2 (because it would beg the question), and, hence, there is no good way to motivate Academic Skepticism with a CP-style argument.

Of course, the Pyrrhonian Skeptic might point to the possibility that there is also no good argument to the conclusion that we do have knowledge of EI-type propositions. Some might think that the Academic Skeptic wins in such a stand-off. But recall that what distinguishes the Academic Skeptic from the Pyrrhonian Skeptic is that only the Academic Skeptic assents to the claim that we cannot have knowledge. The Pyrrhonian Skeptic withholds judgement regarding whether we can have knowledge. And in a stand-off, the Pyrrhonian would seem to have appropriate attitude.

This concludes the discussion of CP-style skepticism. I would now like to briefly consider the second form of Academic Skepticism, namely the Cartesian-style that employs the Eliminate All Doubt Principle. Then, before we conclude our discussion of Academic Skepticism, I would like to consider one quite popular response to it — contextualism.

5. The Cartesian-style Argument for Academic Skepticism Employing the Eliminate All Doubt Principle

This section can be brief because we can apply the lessons learned in the discussion of CP-style arguments to an evaluation of the Cartesian-style arguments that employ EAD. First, it should be clear that the general argument for the Closure Principle, considered earlier, cannot be used as a model for a general argument for EAD. That argument depended crucially on the fact that h entailed ~sk. (That is what provided the basis for premise 2 in the general argument for CP.) As we saw, the negation of a genuine ground for doubt need not be entailed by h. So, the skeptic has a much harder task in motivating EAD.

Nevertheless, let us grant that some argument could be provided that makes EAD plausible. The same dialectical issues that we have considered in discussing potential counterexamples to CP will recur regarding EAD. Reconsider the zebra-in-the-zoo case. But this time instead of the (contrary) proposition “the animals (I am seeing) are cleverly disguised mules,” consider a potential ground for doubt, i.e., “there are cleverly disguised mules within my perceptual field,” which according to EAD would have to be rejected or neutralized. Now, if the evidence I had for believing that the animals are zebras wasn't adequate to deny the former, it is certainly not adequate for the denying the later. So the EAD skeptic will have to appeal to the analogs of Pattern 2 and Pattern 3 type cases in order to save the principle from a Dretske-like counterexample. Thus, the skeptic employing EAD would be put in the same dialectical situation as the CP-style skeptic because she must provide a basis for the second premise in her argument for Academic Skepticism that (1) is compatible with her required defense of EAD against Dretske-like objections and (2) does not beg the question or appeal to a requirement that all grounds for doubt must be eliminated prior to a proposition being justified.

To sum up: The Cartesian-style skeptic employing EAD is in a worse dialectical position than the skeptic employing CP. Whatever problems are associated with CP skepticism transfer to EAD skepticism and, in addition, there appears to be no plausible general argument for EAD while there was one for CP.

6. Contextualism[19]

Examining the contextualist diagnosis of Academic Skepticism and its suggested solution will allow us to explore a question that remains concerning CP and EAD. It could be held that such skeptics need not employ CP or EAD in general, but rather more restricted versions, namely merely their instantiations as they appear in their respective arguments. The skeptic could maintain that there is something quite special about the skeptical hypothesis such that even though closure might not hold in general between any entailing proposition and every proposition it entails, it does hold between such propositions as “here's a hand” and “it does not merely appear that here is a hand.” Even more strongly, the skeptic could maintain that only the Pattern 3 type evidence path correctly depicts the evidential relationships between those propositions. Hence, in order to be justified in believing the former I must first eliminate the latter, where to eliminate a proposition means (here) nothing more than to be justified in denying it. The requirement that we eliminate all contraries to some proposition, h, before we are entitled to believe that h is too stringent for ordinary contexts, for the reasons cited, but perhaps when engaged in philosophy we have to be justified in believing that the skeptical hypothesis is false before the propositions of common sense are justified. That is essentially what the contextualists claim. They hold that in some contexts — philosophical ones — more stringent standards of evidence obtain than obtain in ordinary contexts. (For defenses of contextualism, see Cohen 1987, 1988; Lewis 1996; DeRose 1992, 1995)

There are two questions we should consider: Is contextualism about knowledge (or justified belief) the correct view to hold? If so, will it shed light on Academic Skepticism?

In answering the first question, it could be argued that contextualism with regard to the attribution of virtually any property is true. (Perhaps it doesn't apply to highly technical ones that only occur in one type of context.) For example, suppose that Mr. Lax says that Sam is happy. We discover that Lax is using “happy” to mean that a person is happy just in case he/she has had more happy moments than unhappy moments during a lifetime. Mr. Stringent demurs. For him, a person is happy only if he/she hardly ever experiences an unhappy moment.

Who is right about whether Sam is happy? Contextualists would say that they both could be because they are not using “happy” with the same criteria in mind. But it is crucial to note that given that each person recognizes that the other is applying different standards, Mr. Lax and Mr. Stringent can agree that, given what Lax means, Sam is happy and that, given what Stringent means, Sam is not happy.

Now, of course, we cannot employ any standards we please and still be speaking a common language. For example, Mr. Lax cannot legitimately lower the standards so as to make it the case that Sam is happy simply because he once was happy for a very short period and, similarly, Mr. Stringent cannot require that Sam is happy only if it is logically impossible that Sam experience an unhappy moment. There is a limited range, albeit rather wide, of appropriate standards for the application of a term.

The predicates “having knowledge,” “having adequate evidence,” “being justified,” and the like, do appear to be similar to most other predicates in this respect: Within a wide but non-arbitrary range of standards, speakers can legitimately demand that S have more or less of the relevant evidence for p before they will agree that “S knows that p” or “S has adequate evidence for p.” So, the answer to the first question about the truth of contextualism seems to be: Contextualism about knowledge attributions is correct. It is just one instance of the general truth that standards for the application of a term vary within a wide but non-arbitrary range as determined by various features of the context.

Let us turn to the second and much more philosophically interesting question: Does the truth of this version of contextualism shed much, if any, light on Academic Skepticism? If it did, then the correct way to diagnose the dispute between the Academic Skeptic and the Epistemist would be to note that the Epistemist is using a lax standard and the skeptic a more stringent one. Having one's ordinary cake is compatible with eating one's skeptical cake because in the ordinary context we do have knowledge, but as standards rise to those employed by the skeptics, we do not have knowledge.

In response, it might be objected that this is not the proper diagnosis of the disagreement between the Academic Skeptic and the Epistemist. What the Academic Skeptic seems to be claiming is that we do not know what we ordinarily claim to know. We don't know EI-type propositions. That is, the Academic Skeptic claims that our ordinary knowledge claims are false. If she is merely claiming that on her standards we don't know, the skeptic's claims — like those of Mr. Stringent — can be granted and then promptly ignored because nothing that we formerly believed that we knew turns out not to have been known. The scope of our knowledge or justified beliefs in the ordinary context is left intact.

Thus, the parallel with the case of Sam's putative happiness seems to break down. In that case, Mr. Stringent would grant that Mr. Lax is correct given what Lax meant by “happy.” But the Academic Skeptic will not grant that the Epistemist is correct when he asserts that he has knowledge. The skeptic reasons that the Epistemist doesn't know that h, even given what the Epistemist means by “know,” because the Epistemist's justification for h isn't good enough. Indeed, the Academic Skeptic employing CP (or the stronger EAD) thinks that there cannot be any evidence for ~sk no matter how low the standards are set; thus, h could not be known.

The issue seems to boil down to this: In the ordinary context is it true — as the Academic Skeptic claims — that in order to know that there are hands, we must first eliminate the skeptical hypothesis?

The Epistemist could argue that this is not required. Suppose we are looking at Dretske's zebras and someone asks whether we have eliminated the possibility that those are cleverly disguised aliens from some planet thousands of light years from our solar system? Or that they are not super-robots newly invented by some very clever third graders in Mrs. Johnson's English class? Or that they are not members of the lost tribe of Israel disguised as zebras who have been hiding out from the Assyrians since the 8th century BC.

Those are so far-fetched, the Epistemist could claim, that even if someone advancing those alternatives happens to believe them, there appears to be no reason why one should have to rise to the bait and eliminate those alternatives prior to being justified in believing that the animals are zebras. The Epistemist could continue by claiming that the skeptical hypothesis — that we are not in the actual world but rather in one which seems identical to it — is just as, or possibly even more, farfetched.

Thus the Epistemist could argue that try as she might, the Academic Skeptic cannot impose the burden of eliminating a farfetched hypothesis merely by raising it, even were she to believe it. On the other hand, the Epistemist could agree that in Dretske's zebra-in-the zoo case, if there really were some evidence, however slight, for the claim that the animals are painted mules, then Mr. Stringent might be able to legitimately require that S rule out that possibility prior to being justified in believing that the animals are zebras. But absent any evidence of that sort, the skeptic's requirements will fall on deaf ears. In parallel fashion, if there really were some evidence, however slight, that there is an evil genius making it merely appear that there are hands, then, perhaps the Academic Skeptic could legitimately require that S eliminate that possibility prior to being justified in believing that there are hands.

Put another way: The Epistemist can claim that the range of relevant alternatives is bounded by those propositions for which there is some, even minimal, evidence. The Epistemist will claim that it is a context-invariant feature of knowledge attributions that the relevant evidence does not include the denial of contraries for which there is no evidence whatsoever. The issue seems to be whether our ordinary knowledge claims are true — not whether they would be true in some context with requirements more stringent that those ordinarily applied.

7. Pyrrhonism

As mentioned at the beginning of this essay, what distinguishes Pyrrhonian Skepticism from Academic Skepticism is that the former does not deny that we can have knowledge of what I have called EI-type propositions. They also would not assent to the Epistemist's claim that we can have such knowledge. Let us see how they arrived at that position.

To deny something is merely to assent to its negation. Since the Pyrrhonians took assent, i.e., the pro-attitude required for knowledge, to involve a kind of certainty that the matter had been finally and fully resolved, they did not assent to what they took to be non-evident propositions.

In distinguishing Pyrrhonism from the Academic Skeptics (in particular, Carneades and Cleitomachus), Sextus writes in Outlines of Pyrrhonism, [PH]:

… although both the Academics and the [Pyrrhonian] Skeptics say that they believe some things, yet here too the difference between the two philosophies is quite plain. For the word “believe” has different meanings; it means not to resist but simply to follow without any strong impulse or inclination, as the boy is said to believe his tutor; but sometimes it means to assent to a thing of deliberate choice and with a kind of sympathy due to strong desire, as when the incontinent man believes him who approves of an extravagant mode of life. Since, therefore, Carneades and Cleitomachus declare that a strong inclination accompanies their credence … while we say that our belief is a matter of simply yielding without any consent, here too there must be difference between us and them. (PH I:230)

So, the Pyrrhonians would not assent to non-evident propositions. Of course, a crucial issue concerns the scope of the non-evident. To try to resolve that is beyond the scope of this essay (but see Burnyeat & Frede 1997). For our discussion we can suppose that a sufficient condition for some proposition being non-evident obtains whenever there can legitimately be disagreement about it. And, taking the cue from our discussion of Academic Skepticism, I think we can also safely stipulate that there can be legitimate disagreement about some proposition if there is some evidence for it and some evidence against it. So, the question is whether the proposition S can have knowledge of EI-type propositions can be the subject of legitimate disagreement.

Putting the matter that way seems to make the answer obvious. There are arguments for Academic Skepticism which have some plausibility, and some plausible objections to those arguments that support the Epistemist's view. Plausible arguments for something constitute some evidence for it. So, we can safely conjecture both that it is not evident that we can have knowledge of EI-type propositions and that it is not evident that such propositions necessarily fall outside our cognizance. Thus, the primary question then becomes this: What prompted the Pyrrhonian to withhold assent to all non-evident propositions?

The answer is that they found over and over again that neither experience nor reason was able to settle disputes about the non-evident. But the Pyrrhonians did not eschew what they called “appearances” or reasoning. Quite the contrary, the Greek for “skeptic” is closely related to the verb “sképtomai” which means “to inquire.” Thus, calling oneself a Pyrrhonian Skeptic did not imply a disregard for inquiry or reasoning. Indeed, the modes, to be discussed later, were not designed to inhibit reasoning. Rather, they were designed to assist the Pyrrhonian in continuing to inquire by shielding her from the disquieting state of dogmatism.

Pyrrhonian skepticism was thus a way of life without assent. As such, it has been ridiculed. The Pyrrhonian was likened to someone with Alzheimer's — surviving only if someone else were around to save him from all sorts of perils: falling into pits, being attacked by a dog or run over by a chariot. That caricature seems to miss the point that the Pyrrhonian only withheld assent with regard to the non-evident propositions.[20] Assent to what was evident (i.e., what appears to be) or a weaker pro-attitude toward the non-evident were commonplace.

As mentioned above, the Pyrrhonians would practice what they called the “modes” in order to try to assure that they were not “perturbed” by assenting. Like piano exercises for the fingers that would result in semi-automatic responses to the printed notes on a sheet of music, the modes were mental exercises that would result in semi-automatic responses to claims being made by the dogmatists — those who assented to the non-evident.

The Pyrrhonians believed that (but would not have assented to the claim that) there were two potential sources of knowledge: perception and reasoning. When the results of perception were introduced to settle a non-evident matter — say the actual color of an object (as opposed to how it appeared to someone), they would point out some or all of the following (Sextus Empiricus, PH I:40-128):

  1. Members of different species of animals probably perceive colors quite differently because their eyes are constructed differently.
  2. Members of the same species would have different perceptions of the color depending upon such things as the condition of their eyes, the nature of the medium of perception (varying light conditions for example), and the order in which objects were perceived.

Being reminded of the relativity of perception could incline a person to refrain from assenting to judgements of perception, when those judgements were about the “real” properties of the objects. As Sextus wrote:

… When we question whether the underlying object is such as it appears, we grant the fact that it appears, and our doubt does not concern the appearance itself, but the account given of the appearance. (PH I:19-20)

Now, perhaps a careful analysis of what is meant by “real” properties coupled with a Cartesian-like answer to some of the doubts raised earlier in the Meditations would suffice to respond to the Pyrrhonian concerning the relativity of our senses. For example, if we took the “real” color of objects to be that property (or state) of the object, whatever it is, that produces perceptions of a certain sort in humans under “normal” circumstances and if we could distinguish (as Descartes suggested) normal from abnormal circumstances, then we might have a basis for resisting the Pyrrhonian modes concerning perception. But be that as it may, whether we can have knowledge of EI-type propositions is not a matter that is potentially resolvable by direct appeal to our senses. It will only be resolved if either the Epistemist or the Academic Skeptic has a compelling argument. Thus, the issue here is whether reasoning can settle matters.

The Pyrrhonians thought that there were modes which could induce withholding assent to the results of reasoning. It is to those modes that we should turn.

Perhaps the most influential passage in the corpus of the Pyrrhonian literature is a section from PH entitled “Five Modes of Agrippa.” Although the chapter title mentions five modes, two of them repeat those found elsewhere and are similar to the ones just discussed concerning perception. They are the modes of discrepancy and relativity and are important because they provide the background for understanding the description of the three modes concerning reasoning. Specifically, it is presumed that the relevant object of inquiry is subject to legitimate dispute and that reasoning is employed to resolve the dispute. The issue before us then is whether reasoning can legitimately lead to assent. Sextus writes:

The Mode based upon regress ad infinitum is that whereby we assert that the thing adduced as a proof of the matter proposed needs a further proof, and this again another, and so on ad infinitum, so that the consequence is suspension [of assent], as we possess no starting-point for our argument … We have the Mode based upon hypothesis when the Dogmatists, being forced to recede ad infinitum, take as their starting-point something which they do not establish but claim to assume as granted simply and without demonstration. The Mode of circular reasoning is the form used when the proof itself which ought to establish the matter of inquiry requires confirmation derived from the matter; in this case, being unable to assume either in order to establish the other, we suspend judgement about both. (PH I:166-169)

The question is this: Supposing that the dogmatist assents to something, say p, on the basis of a reason, say q, and gives r as his reason for q, etc., how should the Pyrrhonian react in order to avoid the snares of dogmatism? The suggestion in this passage appears to be to force the dogmatist into either an apparently never ending regress or an arbitrary assertion or begging the question.

This strategy seems to be based upon the claim that there are (only) three possible patterns which any instance of reasoning can take. I will call the first pattern “infinitism.” Today we commonly refer to the second account as “foundationalism.” Finally, I will refer to the third possibility as “coherentism.”

The so-called “regress problem,” can be stated briefly in this way: There are only three possible patterns of reasoning. Either the process of producing reasons stops at a purported foundational proposition or it doesn't. If it does, then the reasoner is employing a foundationalist pattern. If it doesn't, then either the reasoning is circular, or it is infinite and non-repeating. There are no other significant possibilities.[21] Thus, if none of these forms of reasoning can properly lead to assent, then no form can.

So, we must look briefly at the reasons that a Pyrrhonian might have for thinking that foundationalism, coherentism and infinitism are inherently incapable of providing an adequate basis for assent.[22]

8. The Mode to Respond to the Foundationalist

The Pyrrhonian is not (and cannot consistently be) assenting to the claim that foundationalism is false. Rather, a Pyrrhonian employing this mode would be attempting to reassure herself (and perhaps show the Epistemist) that the so-called foundational proposition stands in need of further support. In other words, the Pyrrhonian believes that a foundationalist cannot rationally practice his foundationalism because it inevitably leads to arbitrariness — i. e., assenting to a proposition which can legitimately be questioned but is, nevertheless, assented to without rational support.

So, how could the Pyrrhonian proceed? To begin to answer that question it is important to note that foundationalism comes in many forms. But all forms hold that the set of propositions can be partitioned into basic and non-basic propositions. Basic propositions have some autonomous bit of warrant that does not depend (at all) upon the warrant of any other proposition.[23] Non-basic propositions depend (directly or indirectly) upon basic propositions for all of their warrant.

Suppose that an inquirer, say Fred D'Foundationalist, has given some reasons for his beliefs. Fred offers q (where q could be a conjunction) for his belief that p, and he offers r (which could also be a conjunction) as his reason for q. Etc. Now, being a foundationalist, Fred finally offers some basic proposition, say b, as his reason for the immediately preceding belief. Sally D'Pyrrhonian asks Fred why he believes that b is true. Sally adds the “is true” to make clear to Fred that she is not asking what causes Fred to believe that b. She wants to know why Fred thinks that b is true. Now, Fred could respond by giving some reason for thinking that b is true even if b is basic, because basic propositions could have some non-autonomous warrant that depends upon the warrant of other propositions. But that is merely a delaying tactic since Fred is not a coherentist. In other words, he might be able to appeal to the conjunction of some other basic propositions and the non-basic propositions that they warrant as a reason for thinking that b is true. But Sally D'Pyrrhonian will ask whether he has any reason that does not appeal to another member in the set of basic propositions for thinking that each member in the set is true. If he says that he has none, then he has forfeited his foundationalism because he is really a closet coherentist. Being true to his foundationalism, he must think that there is some warrant that each basic proposition has that does not depend upon the warrant possessed by any other proposition.

The crucial point to note here is that Sally can grant that the proposition has autonomous warrant but continue to press the issue because she can ask Fred whether the possession of autonomous warrant is at all truth conducive. That is, she can ask whether a proposition with autonomous warrant is, ipso facto, at all likely to be true. If Fred says “yes,” then the regress will have continued. For he has this reason for thinking that b is true: “b has autonomous warrant and propositions with autonomous warrant are somewhat likely to be true.” If he says “no” then Sally can point out that he is being arbitrary since she has asked why he thinks b is true and he has not been able to provide an answer.

Let us look at an example. Often it is held that first-person introspective reports are basic because they have some “privileged” status. My basic reason for thinking that there is an “external” object of a certain sort is that I am having an experience of a certain sort. Now, what Sally should ask is this: “Why do you think you are having an experience of that sort?” Or, again to emphasize that she is not asking for an explanation of the etiology of Fred's belief that he is having an experience of that sort, she could ask: “Why do you think that the proposition ‘I am having an experience of a certain sort’ is true?”

The dilemma is that either Fred has a reason for thinking that proposition is true or he doesn't. If he does, then the regress has not stopped — in practice. If he doesn't, then he is being arbitrary — in practice.

Once again, it is crucial to recall that Pyrrhonians are not claiming that foundationalism is false. They could grant that some propositions do have autonomous warrant which is truth-conducive and that all other propositions depend for some of their warrant upon those basic propositions. What lies at the heart of their view is that there is a deep irrationality in being a practicing self-conscious foundationalist. The question to Fred can be put this way: On the assumption that you cannot appeal to any other proposition, do you have any reason for thinking that b is true? Fred not only won't have any such reason for thinking b is true, given that assumption, he cannot have one (if he remains true to his foundationalism). Arbitrariness seems inevitable. Of course, foundationalists typically realize this and, in order to avoid arbitrariness, tell some story (for example, about privileged access) that, if true, would provide a reason for thinking basic propositions are at least somewhat likely to be true. But then, the regress of reasons has continued.

9. The Mode to Respond to the Coherentist

At its base, coherentism holds that there are no propositions with autonomous warrant. But it is important to note that coherentism comes in two forms. What I choose to call the “warrant-transfer form” responds to the regress problem by suggesting that the propositions are arranged in a circle and that warrant is transferred within the circle — just as basketball players standing in a circle pass the ball from one player to another. (See Sosa 1980, and BonJour 1978.) I could, for example, reason that it rained last night by calling forth my belief that there is water on the grass and I could reason that there is water (as opposed to some other liquid, say glycerin, that looks like water) on the grass by calling forth my belief that it rained last night.

Long ago, Aristotle pointed out that this process of reasoning could not resolve matters. As he put it: This is a “simple way of proving anything” (Posterior Analytics, I, iii, 73a5). The propositions in the circle might be mutually probability enhancing, but the point is that we could just as well have circular reasoning to the conclusion that it did not rain last night because the liquid is not water and the liquid is not water because it did not rain last night. In this fashion anything could be justified — too simply! It is ultimately arbitrary which set of mutually probability enhancing propositions we believe because there is no basis for preferring one over the other.

The warrant-transfer coherentist could reply to this objection by claiming that there is some property, P, in one of the two competing circles that is not present in the other and the presence of that property makes the propositions in one and only one of the circles worthy of assent. For example, in one and only one of the circles are there propositions that we actually believe, or perhaps believe spontaneously.[24] But, then, it seems clear that the warrant-transfer coherentist has adopted a form of foundationalism since he is now claiming that all and only the propositions in circles with P have some autonomous bit of warrant. And, all that we have said about the dilemma facing the foundationalist transfers immediately. Is the possession of P truth conducive or not? If it is … You can see how that would go.

So much for the warrant-transfer version of coherentism. The second form of coherentism, what we can call the “warrant-emergent form” does not imagine the circle as consisting of propositions that transfer their warrant from one proposition to another. Rather warrant for each proposition in the circle obtains because it is a member of a set of mutually probability enhancing propositions. Coherence itself is the property in virtue of which each member of the set of propositions has warrant. Warrant emerges all at once, so to speak, from the web-like structure of the set of propositions. The coherentist can then argue that the fact that the propositions cohere provides each of them with some prima facie credibility.

This might initially seem to be a more plausible view since it avoids the circularity charge. But, aside from the problem that are too many competing circles that are coherent, the coherentist has, once again, embraced foundationalism. The coherentist is now explicitly assigning some initial positive warrant to all of the individual propositions in a set of coherent propositions that does not depend upon the warrant of any other proposition in the set. In other words, he is assigning to them what we have called the autonomous bit of warrant and, once again, the dilemma facing the foundationalist returns.

10. The Mode to Respond to the Infinitist

The third mode is designed to provide the Pyrrhonian with a way of responding to a dogmatist who assents to some EI-type proposition, x, and ceaselessly provides new answers to the question “What reason do you have for x?” Since there is always another reason, one that has not already been employed, that needs to be given for any offered reason, assenting to x would be inappropriate. Since the Pyrrhonian (or the Epistemist) does not know either whether there is such an infinite set of reasons available or whether there is no such set available, withholding assent to the proposition that knowledge of EI-type propositions is possible seems appropriate.

For those reasons, infinitism (as far as I can tell) has never been seriously considered as a model of reasoning suitable for the dogmatist because it is obvious that it cannot provide a model of reasoning that could lead to assent. A disputed proposition could never be fully justified for whenever a reason is provided the infinitist is committed to thinking that in order to settle the matter another, as yet “unused,” reason must be provided. Since that process can never be completed, infinitism cannot provide the dogmatist with a model that will settle matters.[25]

11. The Overall Effect of the Modes

It appears that the Pyrrhonian has a viable strategy for resisting dogmatism because no process of reasoning is such that assent — that is, holding that the matter in question has been settled — is the appropriate attitude to have toward any non-evident proposition.


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Related Entries

Descartes, René: epistemology | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | skepticism: ancient


I wish to thank Anne Ashbaugh and Laurence BonJour for their help with this entry. I should also note that some parts of the entry rely upon and, in some cases, significantly repeat sections of Klein 2002. I also relied on parts of Klein 1995, 1999, 2000a, and 2003.