Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Jun 11, 2003; substantive revision Tue Dec 4, 2007

“Biodiversity” is often defined as the variety of all forms of life, from genes to species, through to the broad scale of ecosystems (for a list of variants on this simple definition see Gaston 1996). "Biodiversity" was coined as a contraction of "biological diversity" in 1985, but the new term arguably has taken on a meaning and import all its own. A symposium in 1986, and the follow-up book BioDiversity (Wilson 1988), edited by biologist E. O. Wilson, heralded the popularity of this concept. Ten years later, Takacs (1996, p.39) described its ascent this way: "in 1988, biodiversity did not appear as a keyword in Biological Abstracts, and biological diversity appeared once. In 1993, biodiversity appeared seventy-two times, and biological diversity nineteen times". Fifteen years further on, it would be hard to count how many times "biodiversity" is used every day by scientists, policy-makers, and others. The global importance of biodiversity now is reflected in the widely accepted target to achieve a significant reduction in the rate of loss of biodiversity by the year 2010 [see 2010 Biodiversity Target].

While the history of this term is relatively short (compare it to other terms covered in this encyclopedia), it already has raised important, distinctive, philosophical issues. Some of these are entangled in the very definition of "biodiversity", an issue treated in the first sections below. A challenge is the reconciliation of process-based and elements-based perspectives on biodiversity. Overall, the major issue for biodiversity is how its conservation may be integrated with other needs of society.

1. Concepts of Biodiversity

The sequel to that first biodiversity book, naturally titled Biodiversity II (Reaka-Kudla et al. 1997), documents the rapid rise of the term "biodiversity" in importance and influence. But it also traces the study of aspects of biodiversity back as far as Aristotle. To some extent, biodiversity merely offers a new, emotive, term for some older ideas and programs. In fact, "biodiversity" is now used sometimes to mean "life" or "wilderness" or other conservation values. "Biodiversity" also has served on occasion as a catch-all for "conservation" itself.

The scientific literature illustrates how most any conservation activity might use the label "biodiversity". On the one hand, workers taking advantage of the acknowledged importance of the term have expanded its meaning to capture concerns at a fine scale, such as that focussing on a favourite single species. This focus might be referred to more accurately as one of "biospecifics". At the coarser scale, one important interpretation, discussed below, advocates a primary linkage of biodiversity to the maintenance of ecosystem processes — what might be called the "bio-processes" approach.

The nub of the problem of defining biodiversity is that it is hard to exclude anything from a concept that is taken so easily to mean "everything". Sarkar (2005) has argued that interpreting biodiversity across all biological levels, from genes to ecosystems, amounts to considering all biological entities, so that biodiversity absurdly "becomes all of biology".

Callicott et al. (1999) examined "biodiversity" as one of the current normative concepts in conservation. They concluded that it remains ill-defined, and that distinctions can be made between "functional" and "compositional" perspectives in approaching biodiversity. "Functional" refers to a primarily concern with ecosystem and evolutionary processes, while "compositional" sees organisms as aggregated into populations, species, higher taxa, communities, and other categories. Callicott et al. call for a better integration of these different perspectives, an issue discussed below in the section on Integrating Process and Elements Perspectives.

Norton (1994) has argued that there will never be a single "objective scientific definition" of biodiversity, in the sense of a prescription for how to measure it. In fact, Norton claims that any increase in our understanding of biodiversity will make it less likely that there will be a single objective measure. This biodiversity pluralism is based on an argument that inevitably there are many different "theory bound" versions of biodiversity and many different ways to value it. This perspective is in accord with recognition of functional-compositional perspectives on biodiversity. For example, Norton (1994; 2001) points to recent emphasis on structure and process regarding ecological "health" or "integrity" that is seen as going beyond a conventional elements-oriented perspective for biodiversity. One cannot aggregate all these different versions of biodiversity. Instead, we are to "describe in ways appropriate given certain purposes" and the choice among these different biodiversity "models" will depend on what values are important to the decision-maker.

This perspective is characterized as "post-positivist" because it recognizes biodiversity as inevitably value-laden — there is no one, correct, measure of biodiversity to be discovered but many, each having different values. Roebuck and Phifer (1999) lament what they perceive as current "positivism" in biodiversity conservation, described by them as based variously on processes of verificationism and falsificationism in seeking facts. They argue that biodiversity conservation is rooted primarily in ethics and we must not continue to back away from values and advocacy.

The idea that the choice of a measure of biodiversity depends on values finds support in Sarkar (2005). He argues that biodiversity operationally amounts to whatever is the valued target of conservation priority setting for different localities.

Biodiversity may be a catch-all for various aspects of conservation, but the fresh perspectives arising from recognition of "biodiversity" suggest possible unifying concepts. E. O. Wilson (1988) sees "biodiversity" as corresponding to a dramatic transformation for biologists from a "bits and pieces" approach to a much more holistic approach. Wilson describes this change in perspective as a realization that biological diversity is disappearing and, unlike other threatened things, is irreversible. Wrapped up in the term therefore is the idea of a "biodiversity crisis". Ehrenfeld (1988) similarly reinforces this idea of the value of diversity in the aggregate. He argues that diversity previously was never regarded in itself to be in danger, but that biodiversity now is recognised as endangered in its own right. Wrapped up in the term therefore is the idea of a "biodiversity crisis". While the case for such a crisis itself raises debates about measures and definitions (see Sarkar, 2005), the definition of "biodiversity" sometimes explicitly reflects these links to an extinction crisis. Takacs (1996) reviews cases where the definition of biodiversity is wrapped up in the idea of strategies needed to preserve variation. In accord with this perspective is a shift to a focus on valuing ecosystem processes. This focus arguably will ensure maintenance and ongoing evolution of these systems, and therefore all of biodiversity.

Holistic perspectives on biodiversity have emerged also through another important focus. For Wilson (1988), biodiversity captures the idea of a "frontier of the future", presenting a dazzling prospect of largely unknown variety, with unanticipated uses. Biodiversity is seen by many as a symbol for our lack of knowledge about the components of life's variation, and their importance to humankind (see Takacs 1996). These arguments suggest that core biodiversity values might be based more on what we do not know than what we do know. Biodiversity can be viewed as primarily capturing the two-fold challenge of unknown variety, having unknown value.

Anticipated future uses and values of the unknown are captured in the idea of "option values" (for definitions, see World Conservation Union 1980). A species, or other element of biodiversity, has option value when its continued existence retains the possibility of future uses and benefits. Option value corresponds not just to unknown future values of known species, but also to the unknown values of unknown species (or other components of variation). This concept is at the core of biodiversity because it links "variation" and "value". Estimating and quantifying the largely unknown variation that makes up biodiversity is one and the same as quantifying corresponding option values of biodiversity. According to this emphasis, a basic definition of biodiversity might be expanded as: the variety of all forms of life, from the scale of genes through to species and ecosystems …so forming a "calculus" — a means for measurement and comparison — of option values.

Focussing on this important aspect of biodiversity does not throw away the other possible "biodiversity" values that might be listed (process-based "resilience" of ecosystems, current commodity values of species, etc.), but facilitates integration of biodiversity's option values with those other values. These possibilities are discussed further in the section on Integrating Process and Elements Perspectives.

Given that holistic approaches may integrate functional and compositional aspects, the following sections address these different biodiversity perspectives. The next section addresses the early attempts to address values of biodiversity as a whole that emerged from dissatisfaction with the "bits and pieces" focus on individual species. A later section, Alternatives to Unit-species, presents attempts to address some weaknesses of this initial approach.

2. From Species Values to Biodiversity Values

2.1 Species Values and Triage

In developing ideas about the overall value of biodiversity it has been natural to draw on existing arguments about values of individual species (for review, see World Conservation Union 1980; Norton 1988). Commodity value and other direct use values have intuitive appeal because they reflect known values. But a key problem is that species need to be preserved for reasons other than any known value as resources for human use (Sober 1986). Callicott (1986) discusses philosophical arguments regarding non-utilitarian value and concludes that there is no easy argument to be made except a moral one. Species have some "intrinsic value" — reflecting the idea that a species has a value "in and for itself" (Callicott 1986, p.140) — and there is an ethical obligation to protect biodiversity.

A philosophical issue is whether such species values depend on a human-centered perspective. The environmental ethics entry notes that assessments of issues concerned with biodiversity allow for "commitment either to a purely anthropocentric or purely non-anthropocentric ethic". Regan (1986) argues that we need "duties that are independent of out changeable needs and preferences." Callicott (1986) sees the intrinsic value of species as not independent of human values, because such values can be linked to Hume's theory of moral values. Norton (1986) sees all species as collectively embraced by an environmental ethic that is anthropocentric.

Randall (1988, p. 218) has argued that preference is the basis for value and that it is possible to treat all species values as preferences of humans. Preferences-based approaches to valuation can provide economic (dollar) estimates of value. This valuation process may include methods for assessing and quantifying option values. A claimed advantage of such approaches is that the only good way to protect species is to place an economic value on them. Randall argues that such quantification is advantageous because the species preservation option will fare well when the full range of values is included in conservation priority setting.

The context for many of these arguments has been a consideration of various criteria for placing priorities among species for conservation efforts. These considerations have led to debates about the role of "triage" based on species prioritization. Triage recalls the medical context in which priorities are set for investments in saving patients. Applied to conservation, individual species are differentially valued and assessed relative to differential opportunity costs. The best conservation package is to be found through a process of calculating costs and benefits of protection of individual species.

2.2 Species as Equal Units and SMS

Many biologists have rejected the idea of triage and argue that we must try to save all species (Takacs 1996). Philosophical issues arise in the debate as to whether biodiversity should be approached through the process of differentially valuing species, so that choices could be made in the face of a budget, or regarding species as the fundamental unit and trying to protect them all. The latter option is arguably more holistic and in accord with a focus on all of biodiversity (the individual species focus is sometimes viewed as the first of three phases of growth in biological resources assessment; see the section on The Shift from Elements to Processes).

If one nominated a "prequel" to Biodiversity (1988) it might be The Preservation of Species (Norton 1986). The title suggests a species focus, but the book's subtitle refers to biological diversity. This book documents an attempt to move from values of species to some overall value of biodiversity, rejecting typical triage arguments based on benefits versus costs for individual species. Here, Norton criticizes the "benefit — cost" approaches as piecemeal because every species must exhibit actual or potential use to justify itself. He argues that every species arguably has utilitarian value and that species perceived values are hard to estimate. For this reason, trying to place dollar values is "doomed to failure" (1986, p. 202). Norton concludes that we can't try to sum up values (in accord with his general advocacy of no aggregation of biodiversity values). It is argued that we should abandon the "divide and conquer" approach and look at total diversity, with species as a unit: "each species in an area can be viewed as a unit of total diversity." Ehrenfeld's (1988) position is even more sharply defined: "value is an intrinsic part of biodiversity; it does not depend on the properties of the species in question."

This perspective demands some alternative to species-based triage that will still accommodate the reality of limited resources. The idea of a "safe minimum standard" (SMS) for biodiversity has been proposed as a suitable alternative to triage. Norton advocates an SMS based on unit-species, interpreted to mean that all species are saved unless costs are intolerable; he argues for "preservation of species as a general policy". Wilson (1992, p. 310) also has advocated an SMS in which all species are to be protected unless costs are too high. He argues that we "treat each as an irreplaceable resource for humanity". This is directly in preference to a cost-benefit approach, characterized as examining single species and their properties and deciding how much to invest.

The SMS leaves the idea of "too high a cost" open to different interpretations. These vary with philosophical perspectives about the nature of values. For example, "deep ecology", where biodiversity is independent of human value, responds differently to "utilitarianism", where biodiversity might be preserved to extent that measurable benefits to humans exceed costs (see The Preservation of Species). Randall's (1986, p. 103) utilitarian position considers intrinsic or option value of unit-species in conjunction with any recognized utilitarian value: all species not already distinguished in having recognised human-use values "would be treated as having a positive but unknown expected value; implicitly all would be treated as equally valuable."

Despite difficulties in actual implementation, the ideal of an SMS based on species as units of biodiversity has remained popular from the 1986 The Preservation of Species through at least to Takacs' review (1996). In the latter book, objections to attempts to differentiate and prioritize among species are extended to take into account approaches developed in the early 90's that quantify taxonomic distinctions among species. These methods address the idea that a species that is taxonomically (or phylogenetically) distinctive may deserve a higher priority for biodiversity conservation (see World Conservation Union 1980). Takacs (1996; p. 61) cites early proposals of this kind for a "calculus" of biodiversity, and objects to the resulting "intricate" calculations to prioritize species based on taxonomic distinctiveness. He claims that "we can avoid tedious mathematical calculations of relative species value by switching to biodiversity". Takacs joins others in arguing that we do not know enough about species to assign different values (for further review, see Faith 1994). As an alternative to such a triage approach, an SMS-style approach again is advocated based on the number of unit-species saved within a budget.

In conclusion, the SMS is compatible with an all-of-biodiversity perspective that views species collectively, avoiding the seemingly arbitrary "bits and pieces" approaches to individual species priorities that arguably are poorly justified given our poor knowledge. The SMS approach, however, arguably suffers from a double-barrelled arbitrariness of its own, in the choice of a level of variation (species) and the choice of a threshold on costs. Alternative approaches are considered in the next section.

3. Alternatives to Unit-species

We can recognize two alternatives to the use of species as equal-weight units for an SMS. One of these (see the section on The Shift from Elements to Processes) consciously moves further away from units or items of any kind. Here, the valuation of species is seen as problematic, with arbitrary solutions. Valuation is to encompass all of biodiversity but through a functional perspective, shifting the focus to ecosystems processes (Norton 1994, 2001).

The other alternative [see the section on Option Value and Hierarchy of Variation] might be viewed as going to the other extreme. Units or elements of biodiversity are seen (at least implicitly) at every level of biological variation, and the quantification of variation is to provide relative valuations (e.g. of different places) for priority setting.

These two perspectives provide different responses to the issues concerning taxonomic distinctiveness valuations on species — so providing one benchmark for comparisons. In the ecosystem processes case, this has provided a prototype example of problems with attempts to value species-units. In the hierarchical variation case, it has provided a prototype example of the quantification of unknown variation and option value at one nominated scale of biodiversity.

3.1 The Shift from Elements to Processes

Norton (2001) summarizes the development of the process perspective on biodiversity by describing three phases of growth in "biological resources" conservation over the past years. The first was the focus on individual species. The second phase was a "problematic" perception of biodiversity as all about protection of "objects" — merely expanding the list of "items" from the first phase. Here, Norton (2001) objects to an "atomistic" bias of western culture towards objects. He argues that biodiversity has been wrongly focussed on "inventory" of species, genes, ecosystems and has neglected processes that create and maintain natural values. This inventory perspective is described as "static", not dynamic (see also Frankel and Soule 1981; Takacs 1996).

Norton argues that the inadequacy of this second phase, being "ill-suited" to an emerging process orientation, has lead to the third phase based on ecosystem processes. Here, values are not to be attached to objects; instead, we should value (or "abhor") processes. This approach is characterised as more dynamic in its perspective, as systems oriented, and therefore more "holistic". The focus is on maintaining functions of healthy ecosystems, such as provision of clean air and water. This process orientation is compatible with much recent work internationally on ecosystem services [Takacs 1996; Millennium Ecosystem Assessment].

The term "biodiversity" is used in this context largely as an assumed foundation for ecosystem processes. Norton (2001) sees the process focus as replacing, not complementing, the "increasingly obsolete" inventory/items perspective of biodiversity, arguing that we "will likely move away from the inventory-of-objects approach altogether". The processes perspective is to determine how we look at biodiversity: "…applied to biodiversity policy, we can focus on the processes that have created and sustained the species and elements that currently exist, rather than on the species and elements themselves" (2001; p. 90). Further, "it is reasonable to interpret advocates of biodiversity protection as valuing natural processes for their capacity to maintain support and repair damage to their parts" (2001; p. 91).

Related arguments are found in the advocacy of "biological integrity" (Karr 1991), in preference to biodiversity, as a focus for conservation management. Biological integrity is primarily concerned with the persistence of biogeographic, evolutionary, and ecosystem processes, such as those relating to energy flows. For Angermeier and Karr (1994), "integrity is reflected in both the biotic elements and the processes that generate and maintain those elements, whereas diversity describes only the elements." They conclude that "resource policy would be most effective if based on the more comprehensive goal of protecting biological integrity." Biological integrity is discussed further in the section Integrating Process and Elements Perspectives.

3.2 Option Value and Hierarchy of Variation

The other alternative to the unit-species approach departs from it by increasing not decreasing our focus on items or elements. The unit-species perspective has been justified through option values and a response to a lack of knowledge — we do not know enough to differentially value species. But consideration of option values also has been used to justify a move away from a species-as-units approach, to embrace a whole hierarchy of possible units. Suppose, for example, that the units of interest are features of species (a feature might be some morphological characteristic shared by all members of that species). These features in general have unknown future values. It follows that total option value would be increased by having more features protected. If we apply the rationale that all these features should be treated as units of equal value, then some species (those that are phylogenetically distinctive; see below) will make larger contributions to the overall feature diversity represented by a set of species. thus, equal value at the fine scale among features leads to differential values at the coarse scale among species. We see that the same argument used to justify species as equal-value units can be used to justify differential valuation of species (Faith 1994).

Feature diversity can provide a basis for valuation, but it raises measurement challenges. Not only do we not know, in general, the future value of different features, but also we cannot even list the features for most species. Phylogenetic pattern provides one way to estimate and quantify variation at the feature level. A species complements others in representing additional evolutionary history (Faith 1994), as depicted in the branches of an estimated phylogeny. The degree of complementarity reflects the relative number of additional features contributed by that species. For example, given some subset of species that are well-protected, and two species in that taxonomic group that are endangered, the priority for conservation investment may depend on the relative gains in feature diversity (the complementarity values) expected for each species. We do not know in practice what all the actual features are, but can make a prediction about relative gains and losses. The predicted total feature diversity of a set of species is referred to as its "phylogenetic diversity" (PD; Faith 1994).

In practice, PD calculations may be integrated with species' estimated extinction probabilities ("probabilistic PD"; see Witting and Loescke, 1995). Priorities for conservation efforts for endangered species then can respond to both threat and the potential loss of PD. One such conservation program, attracting much attention, is the EDGE program (“evolutionarily distinct and globally endangered”; for discussion see Faith (2007)).

A nice illustration of the contrast between biodiversity assessments at the species and features levels is found in the recent study of Yesson and Culham (2006). They showed that, while many cyclamen plant species are likely to be impacted by expected climate change, the expected loss of cyclamen PD nevertheless would be relatively low. The set of cyclamen species resistant to climate change would retain high PD because they are dispersed throughout the phylogenetic tree. Such a potential retention of feature diversity, and corresponding evolutionary potential (for discussion, see Forest et al., 2007), suggests that future climate change impacts studies may focus on PD as an important complement to species-level studies. This link from option values to processes is discussed further below in the section Integrating Process and Elements Perspectives.

This phylogenetic diversity perspective can be reconciled with the rejection (Takacs 1996) of "intricate" calculations of phylogenetically based valuations of species. Some proposed taxonomic distinctiveness methods indeed simply have been species-based attempts to assign differential values. But when the focus is on biodiversity units at a lower level, it is not an attempt to apply differential values to species as fundamental units of biodiversity, but equal values to those lower-level units. The focus on these units rather than conventional species is highlighted by the fact that for subsequent priority setting on places, species sometimes are ignored altogether (Faith 1994). We return to this issue below, in discussing ways to side-step contentious species designations in DNA barcoding (see the section on Biodiversity and DNA barcoding).

A conclusion is that a taxonomic/phylogenetic distinction among species is not a fruitless distraction from "biodiversity" — it is all about biodiversity. Features of species quantified in this way are just one part of a whole hierarchy of variation. Sarkar and Margules (2002) emphasize that, when we speak of genes, species, and ecosystems, it is not that these form the specific entities of interest but instead are benchmarks for the full hierarchy of variation: "there is heterogeneity at every level" (2002, p. 301).

The value of all of biodiversity is in this full hierarchy of variation — measuring one measures the other. These values may also encompass intrinsic values of biodiversity. Callicott (1989) and others have followed Aldo Leopold's (1949) work in arguing that all levels of biological organization (species, biotic communities, ecosystems) have intrinsic value. This suggest that any calculus of relative option values (indicating relative value contributions made by species, places, etc) is also a calculus of relative intrinsic values.

For conservation priority setting, each new place (for example) adds some biodiversity to the total for a set of places. This open-endedness means we must consider costs; there is no possible policy position that can ask to "save all the pieces". However, this comparison among places is arguably made easier also because we only require complementarity — marginal gains in variation — rather than total amounts. Sarkar and Margules (2002, p. 302) argue that, if we are considering conservation actions in different places, then "an absolute concept or measure of biodiversity is not needed," and "the relative concept of biodiversity built into the definition of complementarity has the level of precision needed to undertake conservation planning."

This perspective, while useful, may be too narrow. Sarkar and Margules (2002) describe biodiversity as rooted in place, but this is just one scale of decision making. We can apply the same complementarity principle to species not places, as in the example of complementarity values at the underlying feature level estimated from phylogenetic pattern (a general conceptual model for complementarity at different levels of biodiversity is found in Faith 1994).

Sarkar and Margules describe the use of a relative concept of biodiversity based on complementarity as "philosophically uncharted territory." At issue are the empirical and "conventional" elements involved in estimating complementarity values. These issues are addressed in the section on Biodiversity and Growth of Knowledge.

An appealing property of unit-species approaches was that quantification of option values allowed the political process to balance these with other values of society. A full hierarchical perspective suggests a continuum of variation rather than a countable number of objects. The relative complementarity value (say, of a place) is not the relative number of different species but the relative amount of the hierarchy of variation gained in that place. Thus, quantifying complementarity values provides the ability to balance these with other kinds of values, through the political process and the use of tools such as multi-criteria analyses [e.g., see A Biodiversity Conservation Plan for Papua New Guinea Based on Biodiversity Trade-offs Analysis] that work with values naturally expressed in different measurement units. This capacity potentially helps integrate option values with process-based values, as discussed in the next section.

4. Integrating Process and Elements Perspectives

The functional/process (see the section on The shift from Elements to Processes) and elements/inventory perspectives (see the section on Option Value and Hierarchy of Variation) each try capture all of biodiversity, but have different emphases. Consideration of biodiversity option/intrinsic values will not in general capture all important considerations about processes. Also, taking processes into account will not always capture option values defined at the level of elements. Here, the danger in ignoring elements-option values is that priority-setting and management in a given place may be able to address ecosystem resilience and other process goals, but still also allow loss of components of biodiversity of global value.

The two alternatives, presented as dichotomous above, may be viewed as partly overlapping, and not mutually exclusive. An option value approach based on units does not neglect process. The descriptor, "static", has been used to describe this so-called "inventory" approach (e.g. Norton 2001), with clear negative connotations relative to the desirability of "dynamic" approaches. But the biodiversity measures based on phylogeny, for example, capture evolutionary processes that support future variation. Consideration of a hierarchy of elements of biodiversity can be expected to include diversity of processes (following Noss 1990; but see Angermeier and Karr 1994). Further, "static" entities of biodiversity typically are protected using dynamic approaches to biodiversity conservation, as in methods that set conservation priorities on different places taking climate change into account. Such links between what we protect and how we protect it suggest that concerns about biological integrity (see the section on The Shift from Elements to Processes) may be reconciled with biodiversity goals. Management focussed on biological integrity will be critical for the persistence of biodiversity in those places recognised as having high complementarity values.

While process considerations clearly support biodiversity conservation, the maintenance of option values based on elements of biodiversity also ensures processes and services. For example, Turner (1999), using the similar term "insurance value" rather than "option value", observes that "the number of species … serves as a valuable index of ecosystem reliability. These results support the hypothetical ‘insurance’ value of biodiversity, that is, insurance against the failure of ecosystems to provide goods and services." This is one way in which biodiversity option or insurance values apply at the "local" scale.

The perception of conflict between process and elements perspectives appears sometimes as a tension between global and local aspects of biodiversity. For example, Vermeulen and Koziell (2002) see global biodiversity values as ignoring important local values of biodiversity, relating to ecosystem services. They argue that treating biodiversity as one composite property corresponding to global values is not helpful, and is a consequence of the fact that "the global consensus is that of wealthy countries" (2002, p. 89). They recommend the consideration of biodiversity in terms of services derived from it, and not as an end in itself. Thus, the claim is that "the most useful biodiversity assessments are those based locally" (2002, p. 83).

An alternative to a proposed preference for local values of "biodiversity" is to pursue balanced trade-offs (and synergies) among local and global values. As long as local values and opportunities, whatever their source, are given weight in these trade-offs, there is no need to try to define (or re-define) the "important" values of biodiversity as local not global. Apparent conflict is resolved also by realizing that often the local values and opportunities have little to do with the biodiversity (biotic variation per se) of the place (though they typically will link to its "biospecifics").

A trade-offs perspective based on complementarity suggests that there is good capacity for balancing different values in setting priorities in a given region. Every place has biodiversity, but its contribution to the global option values of biodiversity is indicated by its complementarity value, not its total diversity. It is the comparison of the place's current complementarity value to the other values/opportunities in that place that matters when considering trade-offs at a regional scale. There may be apparent high conflict in a region, in that places with high biodiversity have high values for some other land use opportunity, but in such cases the region may well be able to satisfy both needs. Trade-offs applications based on complementarity have suggested that other values can be integrated without much penalty to biodiversity goals [an example is A Biodiversity Conservation Plan for Papua New Guinea Based on Biodiversity Trade-offs Analysis]. The Millennium Ecosystem Assessment [Millennium Ecosystem Assesment web pages] emphasized trade-offs of this kind to find a balanced provision of the various ecosystem services provided by the world's ecosystems. The assessment also called for further work on developing a calculus of biodiversity, so that these trade-offs approaches could integrate the biodiversity gains from a wide range of conservation instruments (protected areas; payments to private land owners; control of invasive species, etc.)

Recent work has suggested that the most effective pathway to achieving the 2010 biodiversity target for a significant reduction in the current rate of biodiversity loss [see 2010 Biodiversity Target] is to find balanced trade-offs and synergies between biodiversity and other needs of society. (See “Actions for the 2010 biodiversity target in Europe: How does research contribute to halting biodiversity loss?”) The Global Biodiversity Information Facility (GBIF) has a major campaign to address the 2010 target, based on mobilising extensive museum species collections data to form the biodiversity calculus needed for exploring trade-offs and synergies in different regions [see GBIF 2010 Campaign]

In conclusion, a possible resolution of the conflict between elements-based and processes-based interpretations of biodiversity may be part operational, part conceptual. Operationally, trade-offs processes can balance different values, whatever their labels. Conceptually, biodiversity may retain its original connotation of biotic variation at all levels. This does not deny that attention to processes is a good way to protect biodiversity, nor that ecosystem services represent important values of society, including provision of resources. It is interesting that Takacs (1996) points to Ehrenfeld and others as making early attempts to move beyond the "resource" school in valuing biodiversity as a whole. Yet Norton (2001) and others, in linking "biodiversity" to maintenance of ecosystem processes, move back to the resource perspective — as evidenced in Norton's reference to three phases of "biological resources", not "biodiversity", protection.

An earlier section (Concepts of Biodiversity) referred to a call for "post-positivism" and greater focus on advocacy in the context of a biodiversity concept seen as properly value-laden. Such a perspective has some compatibility with trade-offs; advocacy and society's values may determine how well biodiversity conservation fares in the course of trade-offs. But a "new positivism" may be required also, in trying to better estimate and quantify unknown aspects of biodiversity in order to better inform the inevitable trade-offs processes. The final section of this SEP entry addresses this problem of growth of knowledge, which itself has raised philosophical issues.

5. Biodiversity and Growth of Knowledge

The sections above highlighted the role of complementarity — the additional contribution made by a place (or other entity, such as a species) to the overall representation of the hierarchy of variation that makes up biodiversity. But the true biodiversity complementarity of a place inevitably is unknown and must be estimated using some known, "surrogate", information. We may not know enough in a particular case to consider surrogates that are to reflect a fine scale of variation. For example, at a whole country scale, to a first approximation all species may be judged equal in comparing biodiversity contributions of different places. A whole country study may not focus directly on variation at the genetic or even species scales, but might use ecosystem types or similar as the surrogates to assess representativeness of its protected areas system. If the assessment reveals that a whole ecosystem type is not represented, then this directs priorities for land acquisition. If all types are already represented, then variation within these can be the focus, perhaps as indicated by representation of species.

Sarkar and Margules (2002) discuss the role of biodiversity surrogates, arguing that even the relative concept of complementarity has a "conventional" element built into it because it relies on "estimator" surrogates (say, a set of butterfly species) for "true" surrogates (say, the use of species as the basis for assessing complementarity of places). Whereas estimator surrogates, they argue, are subject to empirical justification, true surrogates are still dependent on convention. They defend this conventional element: "a philosophical point, widely appreciated by philosophers of science, but often not explicitly acknowledged by scientists, deserves to be noted in relation to this: conventional elements almost always enter into theoretical reasoning in science (Nagel 1961; Sarkar 1998). But ‘conventional’ does not mean ‘arbitrary’: it means that there were choices to be made, no single option was dictated by the facts at hand, and a choice was justified instrumentally by its ability to achieve the purpose for which it was intended" (2002, p. 307).

The empirical approaches for determining effective "estimator" surrogates for biodiversity have raised philosophical issues as well. There are plenty of observations about the congruence (or not) of surrogates with other components of biodiversity (for review, see Faith 2003), but what constitutes good evidence for an effective biodiversity surrogate?

Popperian corroboration provides one pathway to assess evidence for such hypotheses. Corroboration is attractive because it does not attempt to assign probabilities of truth to hypotheses (Popper 1982, p. 346), but instead focuses on the evaluation of the particular evidence at hand. Proposals have focussed on the idea that corroboration assessment asks whether apparent good evidence for an hypothesis is "improbable" without the hypothesis — it cannot easily be explained away by other explanations (possible explanations suggested by our "background knowledge"). Popperian background knowledge is assigned an important role in this interpretation — the investigator is obligated to try to discover any background knowledge that would suggest that the evidence is probable even without the hypothesis (for discussion, see Faith and Trueman 2001; Faith 2006).

The interest in the role of corroboration in biodiversity studies has prompted debates about its role and meaning. As background to these issues, it is revealing to examine one of Popper's own examples of falsification/corroboration, as presented in the entry on Karl Popper. This example, based on the discovery of the planet Neptune, effectively highlights the limited prospects for actual falsification, but may be under-appreciated as an example of corroboration. The hypothesis of interest in this example is Newton's theory, and the evidence is the observation of the new planet, in a position predicted by this hypothesis. Popper (1982, p. 247) argues that "a moving star, planet, would have been significant, because unexpected." Popper argues, "the unexpectedness of an event can be identified with a low probability, in the sense of the calculus of probability, on the background knowledge" and that the "predictions which lead to the discovery of Neptune, were such a wonderful corroboration of Newton's theory because of the exceeding improbability that an as yet unobserved planet would, by sheer accident, be found in that small region of the sky where their calculations had placed it". Corroboration was achieved because "the success of the prediction could hardly be due to coincidence or chance".

This example supports the idea that Popperian corroboration for a biodiversity hypothesis arises only if the evidence is judged to be improbable — in spite of attempts to identify background knowledge that suggests that the evidence is probable even without the hypothesis. For biodiversity surrogates, a common hypothesis is that the pattern of species "turnover" over different geographic areas for one taxonomic group will indicate the pattern for all biodiversity. Good evidence for the surrogacy hypothesis is typically claimed when the pattern for the surrogate taxonomic group is congruent with that of some target set of taxa. However, on many occasions such evidence can be explained away as probably arising simply because of a shared bias in the geographic sampling of the surrogate and target taxonomic groups (for review, see Faith 2003). The evidence based on congruence can be explained away as a probable result even without the hypothesis. Based on such evidence, corroboration for the surrogacy hypothesis is low.

The following sections address the potential role of such corroboration assessments in two other areas of biodiversity assessment: phylogenetic inference and species inference (discussion of corroboration assessment in the context of biodiversity monitoring can be found in Downes et al. 2002). The section, Biodiversity and DNA barcoding, then links all these issues to the controversies surrounding an emerging area of biodiversity assessment, called “DNA barcoding”.

5.1 Phylogenetic Hypotheses

The problem of inferring phylogenetic patterns within a taxonomic group from character data has long raised philosophical issues. Popperian falsification has been used to argue for the justification of one inference method over others (one out of many ways of measuring goodness-of-fit of characters to phylogenetic trees is claimed as uniquely capturing the idea of falsification; for review, see Faith and Trueman 2001). An alternative perspective is that Popperian corroboration embraces all inference methods in phylogenetics. In this interpretation, the Popperian evidence for a phylogenetic tree hypothesis is a measure of the goodness-of-fit (as defined by any given inference method) of observed character data to that hypothesis. Degree of corroboration of a phylogenetic tree hypothesis is given by improbability of that goodness-of-fit — that is, the difficulty in explaining fit that good by other factors, including elements of chance, that make up our "background knowledge". This reflects the obligation to try to explain-away evidence through identification of some background knowledge that implies that the evidence was probable anyway (Faith and Trueman, 2001; Faith, 2006). The goal of the search is a high probability of the evidence given only background knowledge, even while the desired outcome may be a low probability.

5.2 Species Hypotheses

Testing an hypothesis that a set of populations is a single species is important to conservation management. Also, sets of recognised species often form the basis for surrogates for geographic priority setting. Corroboration may play a role in the ongoing debates about the definition of a species and how species status is to be determined. The entry on species discusses the issue of species pluralism — the idea that there is not just one correct species concept. While twenty or more different concepts have been identified (some based on a designated species discovery process), a possible emerging consensus (e.g. see Claridge et al. 1997; Mayden 1997) is that all of these may be unified under an evolutionary lineage concept. This is based on the idea of an evolutionary species, defined as: "a single lineage of ancestor-descendant populations which maintains its identity from other such lineages and which has its own evolutionary tendencies and historical fate." (Wiley 1981, p. 25).

This "primary" concept arguably is compatible with most other proposed species concepts (for discussion, see Mayden 2002). However, a difficulty is that this seems to simply produce many so-called "secondary concepts", corresponding to all the previously proposed ways of detecting and/or defining species. For example, Mayden (1997) refers to these as "operational concepts" that are "tools" for discovering all the different ways to realize the primary concept. The unconstrained use of these tools suggests a "grab-bag" that amounts to reliance as much as ever on expert opinion. An issue therefore is whether a unified species concept can be matched by some unified operational framework for identifying species. Mayden (2002) does claim that there is Popperian "testability" and possible "falsification" for species hypotheses. He argues that the typical process is one in which we do not reject species status if there is no falsification.

Corroboration assessment may be an important missing element in this framework. In much the same role it plays for phylogenetic hypotheses, it can allow many different kinds of evidence (suggested by different secondary concepts), all brought to bear on a single species concept. Evidence for a species hypothesis will be some fit of observations to the hypothesis, and corroboration will depend on the improbability of such goodness-of-fit without the hypothesis (Faith and Trueman 2001; Faith, 2004). This supports a unified species concept as something more than just a shifting of the pluralism problem down one level — the inevitable pluralism now properly reflects the various kinds of evidence that may bear on the same concept. There are no a priori restrictions on the form of the evidence for species hypotheses, but assessment of improbability of evidence is important in avoiding an arbitrary, grab-bag, approach. Further, over time, experience in corroboration assessment in different contexts — for example, for different kinds of organisms — may have lessons about the context-dependent pitfalls of certain kinds of evidence. This process will help evaluate new kinds of evidence, such as that from DNA barcoding, discussed below in the section on Biodiversity and DNA barcoding.

5.3 Biodiversity and DNA barcoding

The philosophical issues concerning biodiversity surrogacy, phylogenetic inference, and species inference are all relevant to a new, and controversial, source of biodiversity information — DNA barcoding. A DNA “barcode” refers to a short region of a gene that changes over evolutionary time at a rate that results in measurable distinctions among species (analogous to the barcodes on products in stores). The Consortium for the Barcode of Life [see CBOL] has brought together natural history museums and other research organizations with the goal of producing DNA barcoding information for all named species on the planet. Such a large-scale DNA barcoding program potentially offers a wealth of new information for biodiversity assessment, filling both taxonomic and geographic knowledge gaps. However, much of the controversy over the past few years (for review, see Rubinoff et al., 2006) arises from the proposed link from one short bit of DNA (e.g., approximately 600 base pairs of mitochondrial DNA) to the supposed identification and discovery of actual species. While some recent reviews (e.g., Vogler and Monaghan 2007) have pointed to the success of DNA barcodes over many different taxonomic groups, there remains the concern that the use of one small bit of molecular data cannot be used to determine species status.

DNA barcoding programs can address two different goals. First, such programs may be concerned about diagnosis and identificaiton of already-known species (e.g., invasive species that are difficult to identify by morphological characters). Second, such programs may be interested in the discovery of new species, including "cryptic" species that may not be revealed by morphological or other characters. The second goal raises issues about species concepts and the nature of DNA bracoding based evidence for species status.

The use of limited molecular data for inferences about species identification and discovery points to some interesting philosophical issues. For example, “hypothesis-driven science” is seen as abandoned through the adoption of degree-of-difference thresholds and other simple recipes for DNA-barcoding-based species delimitation (deSalle et al, 2005). A related concern is that the scientific requirement for “total evidence” is neglected when DNA barcoding is used on its own for species inference (Fitzhugh, 2006, citing Carnap 1950). Fitzhugh argues that "for one to rationally believe a conclusion on the basis of some set of evidence, then all available relevant evidence must be taken into consideration. Barcodes cannot be used, even initially, to understand biodiversity because they are incomplete and often incongruent with other sources of data." Similar arguments are used in calling for an "integrative taxonomy" that includes DNA barcoding in combination with other lines of evidence (e.g., Dayrat, 2005).

The philosophical arguments for total evidence would seem to place severe limits on the role of DNA barcoding for biodiversity assessment. An alternative argument is that DNA barcoding, in providing one form of valid evidence for species hypotheses, clearly can be charactersied as “hypothesis driven”. The limited evidence from DNA barcoding here is not taken to be the only possible evidence, but nevertheless is regarded as potentially able to provide some degree of corroboration for a species hypothesis. This corroboration assessment process does not strictly require "total evidence", because the focus (as described in the overview on Popperian corroboration above) is about probing the current evidence to see if it can be explained away. The different ways that barcode data potentially can mislead should be integrated into such assessments. Only evidence from DNA barcoding that is improbable — not easily explained away — provides high corroboration.

An effective integrative taxonomy will depend on Popperian corroboration assessments to provide the necesary critical questioning of evidence, from various sources, for species hypotheses. It is premature to claim (as in Rubinoff et al., 2006) that an integrative taxonomy based on corroboration is already in place. The required corroboration process goes well beyond the simplistic view of corroboration as depending on the number of bits of evidence. Because it is improbability of evidence that matters, a small number of bits of evidence might provide higher corroboration, compared to that provided by some alternative large number of bits of evidence.

Missing from emerging DNA barcoding programs is any well-defined process for such Popperian corroboration assessments of species hypotheses. This limits the capacity to combine corroborated evidence for species hypotheses from DNA barcoding with corroboration derived from evidence from other data sources.

While the definition of “the barcode of life” is clearly focused only on the species level ("a short DNA sequence from standardized portions of the genome, used as an aid in identifying species"; see the Consortium for the Barcode of Life — CBOL), others have suggested that this wealth of new information need not be tied to species hypotheses in order for it to be useful for biodiversity assessment. One proposal is that it is possible to side-step the contentious species designations and make use of corroborated phylogenetic patterns (e.g., Faith and Baker, 2006). Such an approach then uses PD calculations (see the section on Option Value and Hierarchy of Variation) to quantify gains and losses in biodiversity, without counting changes in species numbers. Such an application of PD makes an assumption that the limited DNA sequence data provides useful information about phylogenetic pattern.

The vast biodiversity knowledge gap suggests that DNA barcoding applications makes it tempting to consider barcoding data for any one taxonomic group as valuable information for making predictions about other taxonomic groups. Application of PD to inferred phylogenetic patterns may boost surrogacy in reflecting historical processes and relationships among geographic areas that are shared by many different taxonomic groups. For example, the phylogeny for one taxonomic group may reflect historical processes/relationships among geographic areas that are shared by other taxonomic groups, so that observed differences among areas in PD-complementarity values also reflect the values that would have been calculated for the other groups. Such a surrogacy hypothesis remains largely untested, and requires corroboration assessments (see the section on Biodiversity and Growth of Knowledge).

6. Conclusions

There is a nice parallel to be found in the debates about the definitions/concepts of species and the broader definitions/concepts of biodiversity. In both cases, an unnecessary pluralism has developed because operational issues have become intertwined with definitions (for species — the meaning sometimes is to include information about the process of species detection; for biodiversity - the meaning sometimes is to include information about the process of biodiversity protection). In both cases, there is perhaps a good case for monism regarding the concept, with pluralism welcomed at the operational level (for species — many kinds of evidence for hypotheses; for biodiversity — many kinds of protection strategies and many kinds of values of society to be traded-off).

Despite a wide range of usage, biodiversity remains a concept strongly linked to the idea of biological variation that is largely unknown in its extent, and its future values. Any "calculus" of biodiversity providing quantitative estimates of this unknown variation automatically provides at the same time a measure of those values that link to the need to maintain variety — option values and intrinsic values. Such values broadly reflect values of elements of biodiversity having unknown present value. These quantified values typically will not be in conventional units (e.g. dollars), but nevertheless can be balanced with other values of society. Decision making (for example, deciding whether we should invest in conservation of area A or area B) may require only estimates of relative gains in represented variation offered by different places (their "complementarity" values). Complementarity helps integrate biodiversity option values with other values attributed to biodiversity, and with values of society more generally. This integrative process, together with processes for the growth of knowledge about components of biodiversity, provide an alternative to the "post-positivism" perspective that sees biodiversity conservation as predominantly value-laden.

The perspective that biodiversity reflects option and intrinsic values, to be balanced with other values, appears to be compatible with the broader discipline of conservation biology: "the field is rooted in a philosophy of stewardship rather than one of utilitarianism or consumption. The latter has been the basis of traditional resource conservation, that is, conserving resources solely for their economic use and human consumption" (Meffe 2000).


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ethics: environmental | Popper, Karl | species