Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Jul 4, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jun 12, 2007

The nature of species is controversial in biology and philosophy. Biologists disagree on the definition of the term ‘species.’ Philosophers disagree over the ontological status of species. A proper understanding of species is important for a number of reasons. Species are the fundamental taxonomic units of biological classification. Environmental laws are framed in terms of species. Even our conception of human nature is affected by our understanding of species. In this entry, three philosophical issues concerning species are discussed. The first is the ontological status of species. The second is whether biologists should be species pluralists or species monists. The third is whether the theoretical term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.

1. Overview

What are biological species? At first glance, this seems like an easy question to answer. Homo sapiens is a species, and so is Canis familaris (dog). Many species can be easily distinguished. When we turn to the technical literature on species, the nature of species becomes much less clear. Biologists offer a dozen definitions of the term ‘species’ (Claridge, Dawah, and Wilson 1997). These definitions are not fringe accounts of species but prominent definitions in the current biological literature. Philosophers also disagree on the nature of species. Here the concern is the ontological status of species. Some philosophers believe that species are natural kinds. Others maintain that species are particulars or individuals.

The concept of species plays an important role both in and outside of biology. Within biology, species are the fundamental units of biological classification. Species are also units of evolution — groups of organisms that evolve in a unified way. Outside of biology, the concept of species plays a role in debates over environmental law and ecological preservation. Our conception of species even affects our understanding of human nature. From a biological perspective, humans are the species Homo sapiens.

This entry discusses three philosophical issues concerning species. The first issue is their ontological status. Are species natural kinds, individuals, or sets? The second issue concerns species pluralism. Monists argue that biologists should attempt to find the correct definition of ‘species.’ Pluralists disagree. They argue that there is no single correct definition of ‘species’ but a plurality of equally correct definitions. The third issue concerns the reality of species. Does the term ‘species’ refer to a real category in nature? Or, as some philosophers and biologists argue, is the term ‘species’ a theoretically empty designation?

2. The Ontological Status of Species

2.1 The Death of Essentialism

Since Aristotle, species have been paradigmatic examples of natural kinds with essences. An essentialist approach to species makes perfect sense in a pre Darwinian context. God created species and an eternal essence for each species. After God's initial creation, each species is a static, non evolving group of organisms. Darwinism offers a different view of species. Species are the result of speciation. No qualitative feature — morphological, genetic, or behavioral — is considered essential for membership in a species. Despite this change in biological thinking, many philosophers still believe that species are natural kinds with essences. Let us start with a brief introduction to kind essentialism and then turn to the biological reasons why species fail to have essences.

Kind essentialism has a number of tenets. One tenet is that all and only the members of a kind have a common essence. A second tenet is that the essence of a kind is responsible for the traits typically associated with the members of that kind. For example, gold's atomic structure is responsible for gold's disposition to melt at certain temperatures. Third, knowing a kind's essence helps us explain and predict those properties typically associated with a kind. The application of any of these tenets to species is problematic. But to see the failure of essentialism we need only consider the first tenet.

Biologists have had a hard time finding biological traits that occur in all and only the members of a species. Even such pre Darwinian essentialists as Linnaeus could not locate the essences of species (Ereshefsky 2001). Evolutionary theory explains why. A number of forces conspire against the universality and uniqueness of a trait in a species (Hull 1965). Suppose a genetically based trait were found in all the members of a species. The forces of mutation, recombination and random drift can cause the disappearance of that trait in a future member of the species. All it takes is the disappearance of a trait in one member of a species to show that it is not essential. The universality of a biological trait in a species is fragile.

Suppose, nevertheless, that a trait occurs in all the members of a species. That trait is the essence of a species only if it is unique to that species. Yet organisms in different species often have common characteristics. Again, biological forces work against the uniqueness of a trait within a single species. Organisms in related species inherit similar genes and developmental programs from their common ancestors. These common stores of developmental resources cause a number of similarities in the organisms of different species. Another source of similar traits in different species is parallel evolution. Species frequently live in similar habitats with comparable selection pressures. Those selection pressures cause the prominence of similar traits in more than one species. The parallel evolution of opposable thumbs in primates and pandas is an example.

The existence of various evolutionary forces does not rule out the possibility of a trait occurring in all and only the members of a species. But consider the conditions such a trait must satisfy. A species' essential trait must occur in all the members of a species for the entire life of that species. Moreover, if that trait is to be unique to that species, it cannot occur in any other species for the entire existence of life on this planet. The temporal parameters that species essentialism must satisfy are quite broad. The occurrence of a biological trait in all and only the members of a species is an empirical possibility. But given current biological theory, that possibility is unlikely.

Other arguments have been mustered against species essentialism. Hull (1965) contends that species have vague boundaries and that such vagueness is incompatible with the existence of species specific essences. According to Hull, essentialist definitions of natural kinds require strict boundaries between those kinds. But the boundaries between species are vague. In all but a few cases, speciation is a long and gradual process such that there is no principled way to draw a precise boundary between one species and the next. As a result, species cannot be given essentialist definitions. (Hull's argument against species essentialism is very similar to one of Locke's (1894[1975], III, vi) arguments against kind essentialism.)

Sober (1980) raises a different objection to species essentialism. He illustrates how essentialist explanations have been replaced by evolutionary ones. Essentialists explain variation within a species as the result of interference in the ontogenetic development of particular members of that species. Organisms have species specific essences, but interference often prevents the manifestations of those essences. Contemporary geneticists offer a different explanation of variation within a species. They cite the gene frequencies of a species as well as the evolutionary forces that affect those frequencies. No species specific essences are posited. Contemporary biology can explain variation within a species without positing a species' essence. So according to Sober, species essentialism has become theoretically superfluous.

In a pre Darwinian age, species essentialism made sense. Such essentialism, however, is out of step with contemporary evolutionary theory. Evolutionary theory provides its own methods for explaining variation within a species. It tells us that the boundaries between species are vague. And it tells us that a number of forces conspire against the existence of a trait in all and only the members of a species. From a biological perspective, species essentialism is no longer a plausible position.

2.2 Species as Individuals

Let us turn to the prevailing view of the ontological status of species. Ghiselin (1974) and Hull (1978) suggest that instead of viewing species as natural kinds we should think of them as individuals. Hull draws the ontological distinction this way. (Instead of the phrase ‘natural kind,’ Hull uses the term ‘class.’) Classes are groups of entities that can function in scientific laws. One requirement of such laws is that they are true at any time and at any place in the universe. If ‘All copper conducts electricity’ is a law, then that law is true here and now, as well as 100,000 years ago on some distant planet. Copper is a class because samples of copper are spatiotemporally unrestricted —copper can occur anywhere in the universe. Individuals, unlike classes, consist of parts that are spatiotemporally restricted. Think of a paradigmatic individual, a single mammalian organism. The parts of that organism cannot be scattered around the universe at different times if they are parts of a living, functioning organism. Various biological processes, such as digestion and respiration, require that those parts be causally and spatiotemporally connected. The parts of such an organism can only exist in a particular space-time region. In brief, individuals consist of parts that are spatiotemporally restricted. Classes consist of members that are spatiotemporally unrestricted.

Given the class/individual distinction, Ghiselin and Hull argue that species are individuals, not classes. Their argument assumes that the term ‘species’ is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory. So their argument concerning the ontological status of species focuses on the role of ‘species’ in evolutionary biology. Here is Hull's version of the argument, which can be dubbed the ‘evolutionary unit argument.’

The Evolutionary Unit Argument: Since Darwin, species have been considered units of evolution. When Hull and others assert that species are units of evolution, they do not simply mean that the gene frequencies of a species change from one generation to the next. They have a more significant form of evolution in mind, namely a trait going from being rare to being prominent in a species. A classic example of such evolution is the change in frequencies of different colored peppered moths in Nineteenth Century England. Prior to the industrial revolution, most peppered moths were light gray and few were coal black. During the industrial revolution, selection caused the frequency of coal black peppered moths to dramatically increase.

A number of processes can cause a trait to become prominent in a species. Hull highlights selection. Selection causes a trait to become prominent in a species only if that trait is passed down from one generation to the next. If a trait is not heritable, the frequency of that trait will not increase cumulatively. Hereditary relations, genetic or otherwise, require the generations of a species to be causally connected. Reproduction requires the generations of a species to be causally and hence spatiotemporally connected. So, if species are to evolve in non trivial ways by natural selection, they must be spatiotemporally continuous entities. Given that species are units of evolution, species are individuals and not classes. (For recent responses to the Evolutionary Unit Argument see Dupré 2001, Reydon 2003, and Crane 2004.)

The conclusion that species are individuals has a number of interesting implications. For one, the relationship between an organism and its species is not a member/class relation but a part/whole relation. An organism belongs to a particular species only if it is appropriately causally connected to the other organisms in that species. The organisms of a species must be parts of a single evolving lineage. If belonging to a species turns on an organism's insertion in a lineage, then qualitative similarity can be misleading. Two organisms may be very similar morphologically, genetically, and behaviorally, but unless they belong to the same spatiotemporally continuous lineage they cannot belong to the same species. Think of an analogy. Being part of my immediate family turns on my wife, my children and I having certain biological relations to one another, not our having similar features. It does not matter that my son's best friend looks just like him. That friend is not part of our family. Similarly, organisms belong to a particular species because they are appropriately causally connected, not because they look similar (if they indeed do).

Another implication of the species are individuals thesis concerns our conception of human nature (Hull 1978). As we have seen, species are first and foremost genealogical lineages. An organism belongs to a species because it is part of a lineage not because it has a particular qualitative feature. Humans may be a number of things. One of them is being the species Homo sapiens. From an evolutionary perspective, there is no biological essence to being a human. There is no essential feature that all and only humans must have to be part of Homo sapiens. Humans are not essentially rational beings or social animals or ethical agents. An organism can be born without any of these features and still be a human. From a biological perspective, being part of the lineage Homo sapiens is both necessary and sufficient for being a human. (For further implications of the individuality thesis, see Hull 1978 and Buller 2005.)

2.3 Species as Sets

Some philosophers think that Hull and Ghiselin too quickly dismiss the assumption that species are natural kinds. Kitcher (1984) believes that species are sets of organisms. Thinking of species as sets is an ontologically neutral stance. It allows that some species are spatiotemporally restricted sets of organisms, that is, individuals. And it allows that other species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets of organisms.

Why does Kitcher believe that some species are individuals and other species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets? Following the biologist Ernst Mayr, Kitcher suggests that there are two fundamental types of explanation in biology: those that cite proximate causes and those that cite ultimate causes. Proximate explanations cite the more immediate cause of a trait, for example, the genes or developmental pathways that cause the occurrence of a trait in an organism. Ultimate explanations cite the evolutionary cause of a trait in a species, for example, the selection forces that caused the evolution of thumbs in pandas and their ancestors.

For each type of explanation, Kitcher believes that there are corresponding definitions of the term ‘species’ (what biologists call ‘species concepts’). Proximate explanations cite species concepts based on structural similarities, such as genetic, chromosomal and developmental similarities. These species concepts assume that species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets of organisms. Ultimate explanations cite species concepts that assign species evolutionary roles. These species concepts assume that species are lineages and thus individuals.

Kitcher is correct that biologists attempt to explain the traits of organisms in two ways: sometimes they cite the ultimate, or evolutionary, cause of a trait; other times they cite a structural feature of an organism with that trait. A problem with Kitcher's approach is his characterization of biological practice. Biologists since Darwin have taken species to be evolutionary units. A glance at a biology text book will reveal that the evolutionary approach to species is the going concern in biology. The groups that correspond to Kitcher's structural concepts are not considered species by taxonomists. Groups of organisms that have genetic, developmental, behavioral and ecological similarities, are natural kinds in biology, but they are not considered species. Consider such groups of organisms as males, females, tree nesters and diploid organisms. These groups of organisms cut across species. For instance, some but not all humans are males and many organisms in other species are males. Male is a kind in biology, but it is not a species. Kitcher's motivation for asserting that species are sets is to allow spatiotemporally unrestricted groups of organisms to form species. That motivation, however, is not substantiated by biological theory or practice.

2.4 Species as Homeostatic Property Cluster Kinds

Another response to the species are individuals thesis is offered by proponents of an alternative approach to natural kinds. According to Boyd (1999a, 1999b), Griffiths (1999), Wilson (1999), and Millikan (1999), species are natural kinds on a proper conception of natural kinds. These authors adopt Boyd's Homeostatic Property Cluster (HPC) theory of natural kinds. HPC theory assumes that natural kinds are groups of entities that share stable similarities. HPC theory does not require that species are defined by traditional essential properties. The members of Canis familaris, for example, tend to share a number of common properties (having four legs, two eyes, and so on), but given the forces of evolution, no biological property is essential for membership in that species. For HPC theory, the similarities among the members of a kind must be stable enough to allow better than chance prediction about various properties of a kind. Given that we know that Sparky is a dog, we can predict with greater than chance probability that Sparky will have four legs.

HPC kinds are more than groups of entities that share stable clusters of similarities. HPC kinds also contain "homeostatic causal mechanisms" that are responsible for the similarities found among the members of a kind. The members of a biological species interbreed, share common developmental programs, and are exposed to common selection regimes. These "homeostatic mechanisms" cause the members of a species to have similar features. Dogs, for instance, tend to have four legs and two eyes because they share genetic material and are exposed to common environmental pressures. An HPC kind consists of entities that share similarities induced by that kind's homeostatic mechanisms. According to Boyd, species are HPC kinds and thus natural kinds because "species are defined . . . by . . . shared properties and by the mechanisms (including both "external" mechanisms and genetic transmission) which sustain their homeostasis" (1999b, 81).

HPC theory provides a more promising account of species as natural kinds than essentialism. HPC kinds need not have a common essential property, so the criticisms of species essentialism are avoided. Furthermore, HPC theory allows that external relations play a significant role in inducing similarity among the members of a kind. Traditional essentialism assumes that the essence of a kind is an internal or intrinsic property of a kind's members, such as the atomic structure of gold or the DNA of tigers. Such intrinsic essences are ultimately responsible for a kind's similarities. HPC theory is more inclusive because it recognizes that both the internal properties of organisms and the external relations of organisms are important causes of species-wide similarities. For instance, HPC theory but not essentialism cites interbreeding as a fundamental cause of similarity among the organisms of many species.

While HPC theory is better at capturing the features of species than essentialism, does HPC theory provide an adequate account of species as natural kinds? Here are two potential problems with HPC theory. HPC theory's objective is to explain the existence of stable similarities within groups of entities. However, species are also characterized by persistent differences. Polymorphism (stable variation within a species) is an important feature of nearly every species. Species polymorphisms are easy to find. Consider sexual dimorphism: within any mammalian species there are pronounced differences between males and females. Or consider polymorphism in the life cycles of organisms. The lives of organisms consist of dramatically different life stages, such as the difference between the caterpillar and butterfly stages of a single organism. HPC theorists recognize the existence of polymorphism, but they do not recognize polymorphism as a central feature of species in need of explanation. HPC theorists privilege and attempt to explain similarities. In addition to Boyd's ‘homeostatic’ mechanisms we need to recognize ‘heterostatic’ mechanisms that maintain species variation.

A second concern with HPC theory involves the identity conditions of species. The members of a species vary in their traits. Moreover, they vary in their homeostatic mechanisms. Over time and across geographic regions, the members of a single species are often exposed to different homeostatic mechanisms. Given such variation, what causes organisms with different traits and exposed to different homeostatic mechanisms to be members of the same species? The common answer is genealogy: the members of a species form a continuous genealogical entity on the tree of life. A species' homeostatic mechanisms are mechanisms of one species because they affect organisms that form a unique lineage. Boyd and promoters of HPC theory recognize the importance of genealogy and see historical relations as one type of homeostatic mechanism. However, Boyd does not see genealogy as the defining aspect of species, and this goes against a fundamental assumption of biological systematics: species are first and foremost continuous genealogical entities. Boyd is quite clear that similarity and not genealogical connectedness is the final arbitrator of species sameness. This assumption makes sense given that Boyd believes that species are kinds and kinds are ultimately similarity-based classes that play a role in induction. But this view of the identity conditions of species conflicts with the standard view in biological systematics that species are continuous genealogical lineages. It should be mentioned that Griffiths' (1999) version of HPC theory is more in line with biological systematics. On that version of HPC theory genealogy is essential for defining species and similarity is a consequence of genealogy.

2.5 Species and Population Structure Theory

Another approach to species, which is in line with the view that species are individuals, is offered by Ereshefsky and Matthen's (2005) “Population Structure Theory” (PST). PST treats similarity as just one type of trait distribution in species. PST does not privilege similarity over polymorphism, so PST offers a more inclusive account of trait distributions in species than HPC theory. In addition, PST highlights a common type of explanation in biology, namely one that cites the population and inter-population structures of species. Such population structure explanations explain trait distributions in species, whether those distributions involve similarity or dissimilarity.

Population structure explanations are pervasive in biology. Consider a population structure explanation of sexual dimorphism within a species. Male elk have a number of similarities, including having large, fuzzy antlers. What explains this similarity? One cause, the proximal cause, is the individual development of each male elk. Another explanation, the distal cause, turns on relationships between male and female elks. Male antlers are the result of sexual selection. Such selection requires the participation of both male and female elk. Looked at in this way, we see that the existence of similarities within lower level groups (here within the genders) depends on higher level groups (here species) and the diversity within them. That is, polymorphism at the higher level, and the population structure that binds polymorphism, is essential in explaining lower level similarities within the genders and other sub-groups of a species.

Population structure explanations are common, and arguably essential, for understanding diversity and similarity within species. Such explanations are also essential for understanding the identity conditions of species. As we have seen, species are first and foremost genealogical entities. Genealogy is an inter-population structure: species are lineages of populations. So according to biological systematics, species identity is defined in terms of population and inter-populational structures, not organismic similarity. PST theory properly captures the identity conditions of species.

3. Species Pluralism

Biologists offer various definitions of the term ‘species’ (Claridge, Dawah, and Wilson 1997). Biologists call these different definitions ‘species concepts.’ The Biological Species Concept defines a species as a group of organisms that can successfully interbreed and produce fertile offspring. The Phylogenetic Species Concept (which itself has multiple versions) defines a species as a group of organisms bound by a unique ancestry. The Ecological Species Concept defines a species as a group of organisms that share a distinct ecological niche. These species concepts are just three of a dozen prominent species concepts in the biological literature.

What are we to make of this variety of species concepts? Monists believe that an aim of biological taxonomy is to identify the single correct species concept. Perhaps that concept is among the species concepts currently proposed and we need to determine which concept is the right one. Or perhaps we have not yet found the correct species concept and we need to wait for further progress in biology. Pluralists take a different stand. They do not believe that there is a single correct species concept. Biology, they argue, contains a number of legitimate species concepts. Pluralists believe that the monist's goal of a single correct species concept should be abandoned.

3.1 Varieties of Pluralism

Species pluralism comes in various forms (for example, Kitcher 1984, Mishler and Brandon 1987, Dupré 1993, and Ereshefsky 2001). Kitcher and Dupré offer forms of species pluralism that recognize the species concepts mentioned above — biological species, phylogenetic species, and ecological species — as well as other species concepts. As we saw in Section 1.2, Kitcher accepts species concepts that require species to be individuals, and he accepts species concepts based on the structural similarities of organisms. The latter type of species are not spatiotemporally continuous entities. Such species merely need to contain organisms that share theoretically significant properties. Dupré's version of species pluralism is more robust. He recognizes all of the species concepts found in Kitcher's version of pluralism. Dupré's pluralism also allows species concepts based on similarities highlighted by non biologists. For example, Dupré accepts species concepts based on gastronomically significant properties.

If one thinks that the term ‘species’ is a theoretical term found within evolutionary biology, then one might find Dupré's version of pluralism too promiscuous. If the question is how the term ‘species’ is defined in biology, then how it is defined outside of biology does not count. Think of a parallel situation in physics. When we are interested in the scientific meaning of the term ‘work’ we do not attend to its meaning in the sentence ‘How was work today?’ Similarly, the use of the word ‘species’ by culinary experts does not reveal the theoretical meaning of ‘species.’

Kitcher's pluralism is more circumspect: it limits species concepts to those that are legitimized by theoretical biology. Still, one might worry that Kitcher's form of pluralism is too liberal. Kitcher's pluralism allows that some species are spatiotemporally continuous entities (individuals), while other species may be spatiotemporally unrestricted entities (natural kinds). As we saw in Section 2.1, Hull's evolutionary unit argument states that within the purview of evolutionary biology, species must be individuals. Kitcher's pluralism does not satisfy this requirement. If one assumes that ‘species’ is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory and that species are individuals, then Kitcher's pluralism is too inclusive.

Another version of species pluralism is found in Ereshefsky (2001). This version of pluralism adopts Hull's conclusion that species must be spatiotemporally continuous lineages. Nevertheless, this version of pluralism asserts that there are different types of lineages called ‘species.’ The Biological Species Concept and related concepts highlight those lineages bound by the process of interbreeding. The Phylogenetic Species Concepts highlight those lineages of organisms that share a common and unique ancestry. Ecological approaches to species highlight lineages of organisms that are exposed to common sets of stabilizing selection. On this form of species pluralism, the tree of life is segmented by different processes into different types of species lineages.

It is worth noting that the motivation behind Dupré's, Kitcher's and Ereshefsky's versions of pluralism is ontological not epistemological. Some authors (for example, Rosenberg 1994) suggest that we adopt pluralism because of our epistemological limitations. The world is exceedingly complex and we have limited cognitive abilities, so we should accept a plurality of simplified and inaccurate classifications of the world. The species pluralism offered by Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky is not epistemologically driven. Evolutionary theory, a well substantiated theory, tells us that the organic world is multifaceted. According to Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky, species pluralism is a result of a fecundity of biological forces rather than a paucity of scientific information.

3.2 Responses to Pluralism

Not everyone is willing to accept species pluralism. Monists (for example, Sober 1984, Ghiselin 1987, Hull 1987, de Queiroz 1999, Mayden 2002, Brigandt 2003, and Wilkins 2003) have launched a number of objections to species pluralism. One objection centers on the type of lineage that should be accepted as species. Some monists allow the existence of different types of base lineages but contend that only one type of lineage should be called ‘species’ (Ghiselin 1987). For instance, supporters of the Biological Species Concept believe that lineages of interbreeding sexual organisms are much more important in the evolution of life on this planet (Eldredge 1985). They argue that only the Biological Species Concept, or some interbreeding concept, should be accepted.

However, adopting only an interbreeding approach to species has its costs: it would exclude all asexual organisms from forming species. Interbreeding requires the genetic contributions of two sexual organisms. Asexual organisms reproduce by themselves, either through cloning, vegetative means or self fertilization. Some reptiles and amphibians reproduce asexually. Many insects reproduce asexually. And asexuality is rampant in plants, fungi and bacteria. In fact, asexual reproduction is the prominent form of reproduction on Earth (Hull 1988). If one adopts an interbreeding approach to species, then most organisms do not form species. This seems a high price to pay for species monism.

Another objection to species pluralism is that pluralism is an overly liberal position (Sober 1984, Ghiselin 1987, Hull 1987). Pluralists allow a number of legitimate species concepts, but how do pluralists determine which concepts should be accepted as legitimate? Should any species concept proposed by a biologist be accepted? What about those concepts proposed by non biologists? Without criteria for determining the legitimacy of a proposed species concept, species pluralism boils down to a position of anything goes.

Species pluralists respond to this objection by suggesting criteria for judging the legitimacy of a proposed species concept. (Dupré 1993, Ereshefsky 2001). Such criteria can be used to determine which species concepts should be accepted into the plurality of legitimate species concepts. Candidate criteria are the epistemic virtues that scientists typically use for determining the scientific worthiness of a theory. For example, in judging a species concept, one might ask if the theoretical assumptions of a concept are empirically testable. The Biological Species Concept relies on the assumption that interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages. It also assumes that organisms that cannot interbreed do not form stable lineages. Whether interbreeding and only interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages is empirically testable. So the Biological Species Concept has the virtue of empirical sensitivity. Other criteria for judging species concepts include intertheoretic coherence and internal consistency. Pluralists can provide criteria for discerning which concepts should be accepted as legitmate. Thus the ‘anything goes’ objection can be answered.

A final response to species pluralism is that all well-accepted species concepts are captured by a more inclusive species concept. De Queiroz (1999) and Mayden (2002) observe that all prominent concepts assume that species taxa are lineages. Consequently, de Queiroz and Mayden offer a Lineage Concept of Species that, according to Mayden (2002, 191), “serves as the logical and fundamental over-arching conceptualization of what scientists hope to discover in nature behaving as species. As such, this concept can be argued to serve as the primary concept of diversity.” De Queiroz and Mayden believe that the species concepts currently accepted describe different types of species lineages, for example, interbreeding lineages, ecological lineages, and phylogenetic lineages, and the Lineage Species Concept provides the proper account of all species lineages. De Queiroz and Mayden believe that their species concept is a monist answer to pluralism because it provides the one correct account of species.

A problem with de Queiroz and Mayden's Lineage Species Concept is that it is too inclusive. Recall that Mayden believes that the Lineage Species Concept captures that “over-arching conceptualization of what scientists hope to discover in nature behaving as species” (ibid.). Such a conceptualization should capture what is common to all species, and it should capture what is unique to them. Interbreeding, ecological, and phylogenetic species are all lineages, so the lineage species concept captures an important similarity of species. However, all genera, families, and other Linnaean taxa are also lineages. The lineage concept is too inclusive because it captures all Linnaean taxa.

4. Does the Species Category Exist?

There is one other item concerning species pluralism worth discussing. Suppose one accepts species pluralism. The term ‘species’ then refers to different types of lineages. Some species are groups of interbreeding organisms, other species are groups of organisms that share a common ecological niche, and still other species are phylogenetic units. Given that there are different types of species, one might wonder what feature causes these different types of species to be species?

Perhaps they share a common property that renders them species. If one adopts the thesis that all species are genealogical lineages, then a common feature of species is their being lineages. However, this feature is also shared by other types of taxa in the Linnaean Hierarchy. From an evolutionary perspective, all taxa, whether they be species, genera, or tribes, are genealogical lineages. We need to locate a feature that is not only common in species but also distinguishes species from other types of taxa.

Biological taxonomists often talk in terms of the patterns and processes of evolution. Perhaps there is a process or a pattern that occurs in species but not in other types of taxa. Such a process or pattern would unify the types of lineages we call ‘species.’ Let us start with process. The Biological Species Concept highlights those species bound by the process of interbreeding. The Ecological Species Concept identifies those species unified by stabilizing selection. The species highlighted by Phylogenetic Species Concepts are unified by such historical processes as genetic and developmental homeostasis. A survey of these different species concepts reveals that species are bound by different types of processes. So no single type of process is common to all species. Arguably, none of these processes are unique to species either (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).

What about pattern? Do species display a pattern that distinguishes them from other types of taxa? If by pattern we mean ontological structure, then species have different patterns. Species are individuals, but they are different types of individuals. Species of asexual organisms and species of sexual organisms have different structures. Both types of species contain organisms that are genealogically connected to a common ancestor. But the organisms in a sexual species are also connected by interbreeding. Thus species of sexual organisms form causally integrated entities: within a given generation, their members exchange genetic material through sexual reproduction. Species of asexual organisms do not form causally integrated entities: their organisms are merely connected to a common ancestor.

There are other suggestions for the common and unique pattern of species. Many observe that the organisms of a species often look the same or that the organisms of a species share a cluster of reoccurring properties. To the extent that this is true, it is also true of genera and some other higher taxa. The members of some genera tend to look the same and have a cluster of stable properties. Another suggestion for the pattern that distinguishes species is their ability to evolve as a unit — species are the units of evolution, other types of taxa are not. But again, many higher taxa have such unity as well (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).

The above survey of candidate unifying features is far from exhaustive. But the result is clear enough. Species vary in their unifying processes and ontological structure. Furthermore, many features that biologists and philosophers highlight as unique to species occur in many higher taxa as well. Given this survey, what position should we adopt concerning the nature of species? There are several options. According to one option we should keep looking for the unifying feature of species. This is the option favored by some monists (Sober 1984). Contemporary biology may not have discovered the unifying feature of species, but that does not mean that biology will not find such a feature in the future. To give up the search for the unifying nature of species would be too hasty.

Another option starts with the assumption that the search for the unifying feature of species has gone on long enough. Biologists have looked long and hard for the correct definition of ‘species.’ The result of that search is not that we do not know what species are. The result is that the organic world contains different types of species. The conclusion drawn by some pluralists (Kitcher 1984, Dupré 1993) is that the term ‘species’ should be given a disjunctive definition. Species are either interbreeding lineages, or ecological lineages, or phylogenetic units, or….

A third option, like the previous one, assumes that biologists have looked long enough for the unifying feature of species. In that search, biology has learned that there are different types of lineages called ‘species.’ But proponents (Ereshefsky 1998) of this option do not opt for a disjunctive definition of ‘species.’ According to this option, we should doubt the very existence of the category species. Those lineages we call ‘species’ vary in their patterns and processes. Furthermore, the distinction between species and other types of taxa is riddled with vagueness. Consequently, we should doubt whether the term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.

To better understand this third option it is useful to see more precisely what is being doubted. Biologists make a distinction between the species category and species taxa. Species taxa are the individual lineages we call ‘species.’ Homo sapiens and Canis familaris are species taxa. The species category is a more inclusive entity. The species category is the class of all species taxa. The third option does not call into question the existence of Homo sapiens or Canis familaris or any other lineage that we call ‘species.’ The third option just calls into question the existence of the categorical rank of species.

Darwin may have had this third option in mind when he wrote his friend Joseph Hooker:

It is really laughable to see what different ideas are prominent in various naturalists' minds, when they speak of ‘species’; in some, resemblance is everything and descent of little weight — in some, resemblance seems to go for nothing, and Creation the reigning idea — in some, sterility an unfailing test, with others it is not worth a farthing. It all comes, I believe, from trying to define the indefinable (December 24, 1856; in F. Darwin 1887, vol. 2, 88.)

Darwin considered the term ‘species’ indefinable. He could have meant a couple of things by this. Perhaps Darwin meant that the term ‘species’ is an indefinable primitive term in evolutionary theory though he still believed in the existence of the species category. Or perhaps Darwin doubted the existence of the species category altogether. According to Beatty (1985), Darwin doubted the existence of the species category. There is also evidence that he doubted the existence of the other Linnaean categories (Ereshefsky 2001). Still, Darwin believed in the existence of those lineages we call ‘species.’ He just doubted whether the species category and the other Linnaean categories — the grid we place on the tree of life — exists in nature.

This encyclopedia entry started with the observation that at an intuitive level the nature of species seems fairly obvious. But a review of the technical literature reveals that our theoretical understanding of species is far from settled. The debate over the nature of species involves a number of issues. One issue is their ontological status: are species natural kinds or individuals? A second issue concerns pluralism: should we adopt species monism or species pluralism? A third issue, and perhaps the most fundamental issue, is whether the term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.


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evolution | individuals | natural kinds | ontology and ontological commitment | scientific realism


The author thanks Paul Griffiths, Ingo Brigandt, and Ernesto Alvarado Reyes for suggesting ways to improve this entry.