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Saint Bonaventure

First published Tue Nov 1, 2005

Bonaventure of Bagnoregio (ca. 1217 to 15 July 1274), the religious name of Giovanni di Fidanza, was a Franciscan friar, Master of Theology at the University of Paris, Minister General of the Franciscan Order, and Cardinal of the Catholic Church. During his lifetime he rose to become one of the most prominent men in Latin Christianity. His academic career as a theologian was cut short when in 1257 he was put in charge of the Order of Friars Minor (O.F.M.). He steered the Franciscans on a moderate and intellectual course that made them the most prominent order in the Catholic Church until the coming of the Jesuits. His theology was marked by an attempt completely to integrate faith and reason. He thought of Christ as the “one true master” who offers humans knowledge that begins in faith, is developed through rational understanding, and is perfected by mystical union with God.

A master of the memorable phrase, Bonaventure held that philosophy opens the mind to at least three different routes humans can take on their journey to God. Non-intellectual material creatures he conceived as shadows and vestiges (literally, footprints) of God, understood as the ultimate cause of a world philosophical reason can prove was created at a first moment in time. Intellectual creatures he conceived of as images and likenesses of God, the workings of the human mind and will leading us to God understood as illuminator of knowledge and donor of grace and virtue. The final route to God is the route of being, in which Bonaventure brought Anselm's argument together with Aristotelian and Neoplatonic metaphysics to view God as the absolutely perfect being whose essence entails its existence, an absolutely simple being that causes all other, composite beings to exist. These three routes are outlined in Sections 3, 4, and 5 below.

1. Life and Works

On 2 February 1257, Br. Bonaventure was appointed Minister General in charge of the Franciscan Order.[1] This act of ecclesiastical preferment effectively split his life into two halves, the burdens of the ecclesiastical administrator replacing the leisure of the scholar. He is thought to have been forty years old at the time—the minimum age for a Minister General—giving him a birth date of 1217.

Bonaventure was born Giovanni di Fidanza in Bagnoregio in Tuscany. He himself attests that he was healed miraculously as a child by the intervention of Francis of Assisi, shortly after the saint's death on 3 October 1226[2]: “when I was a boy, as I still vividly remember, I was snatched from the jaws of death by his invocation and merits.” He did not rush to join the Franciscans, but matriculated as a layman in the Arts faculty at the University of Paris in 1235 and proceeded all the way to the Master of Arts, around 1243. The Arts curriculum at Paris then consisted of the seven liberal arts, supplemented by some works of Aristotle. Heavily weighted in favor of the trivium—the linguistic arts of grammar, rhetoric, and logic—teaching in the quadrivium—the four mathematical and scientific disciplines—was somewhat limited, partially due to the prohibition of Aristotle's works in natural philosophy at Paris in 1210. Though some Masters of Arts, such as Roger Bacon and Richard Rufus, were teaching the Aristotelian natural philosophy, the requirements for becoming a Master of Arts as late as 1252 listed only the old logic, new logic, and the On the Soul (De anima) among Aristotle's works; the earliest record of Aristotle's entire natural philosophy and metaphysics as required for graduation only appears in 1255,[3] two years before Bonaventure left the University. His writing reflects this education; a master of logic and rhetoric, he was less deeply read in the Aristotelian and Islamic philosophical texts than his Dominican contemporaries, Albert and Thomas.

About the time young Giovanni began to study Arts, Alexander of Hales, Master of Theology and initiator of the practice of commenting on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, took the Franciscan habit. His conversion gave the Franciscans a Chair in Theology, the Dominicans having acquired two Chairs during the university strike of 1229-30. Hales held him in the highest regard and said that “in him Adam seemed not to have sinned (Salimbene 1905–1912, 664). Giovanni took the Franciscan habit in 1243/4, using the name “Bonaventure” to celebrate his “good-fortune” under Francis and Hales.

Bonaventure attended lectures and disputations in theology from 1243 to 1248. Writing about 1280, the Franciscan chronicler Salimbene said: “Br. John of Parma [Franciscan Minister General] gave the license to Br. Bonaventure of Bagnoregio to read at Paris, which he had never yet done because he was not yet installed in a Chair. He then read the whole Gospel of St. Luke, a commentary that is very beautiful and complete. This was in 1248.”[4] This entry refers to Bonaventure's cursorie lectures as “Bachelor of the Bible,” 1248-1250. From 1250-2 he commented on the Sentences (Sententiae in IV Libris Distinctae). Once Master, he revised the Commentary (Commentaria in Quatuor Libros Sententiarum), his major philosophical and theological work. In 1252-3 he was a “formed Bachelor” of Theology, performing the three duties of a Master: lecturing on the Bible, engaging in disputations, and preaching. In 1253 the Masters and students of the University of Paris went on strike, all but the friars. The two Dominicans and William of Meliton, O.F.M., continued to teach and refused to take an oath of loyalty to the University corporation, for which they were expelled from the “university of masters,” an action defended by the University in a letter of 4 February.[5] Bonaventure received the licentia docendi by Easter 1254, in the midst of this conflict. He assumed the Franciscan Chair in theology immediately, but taught only at the Franciscan convent, unrecognized by the University.

Bonaventure performed all three tasks of a Master of Theology from 1254-57. He revised his commentary on Luke and composed commentaries on John and Ecclesiastes. He also held three sets of disputed questions. The questions On the Knowledge of Christ (De scientia Christi), which develop his illumination theory of knowledge, probably came out of his inception as Master in 1254. The questions On the Mystery of the Trinity (De mysterio Trinitatis), which elaborated his view of God, were likely the last ones he wrote (Hayes 1992, 40-44; 1979, 24-29). Both were composed in a lofty style that gives no evidence of the conflict embroiling Paris at the time. The third set of disputed questions, however, were On Evangelical Perfection (De perfectione evangelica) and consisted in a defense of the friars' way of life, under attack by non-mendicant Masters led by William of St. Amour. In October 1256, Pope Alexander IV ordered the secular Masters at Paris to accept Bonaventure and the Dominican Thomas of Aquino in their rightful places as Masters of Theology, but it was not until 12 August 1257 that they did so. But six months earlier Bonaventure had been appointed Minister General.[6] In addition to the normal magisterial writings, Bonaventure also wrote On Retracing the Arts to Theology (Opusculum de reductione artium ad theologiam) while Master; and probably in 1257, while leaving the University, he managed to compose his Breviloquium, a “short reading” that contains in outline the main theses of a theological summa that would never be composed.

From this point on, Bonaventure's writing reflected the needs of the Order, but he did not cast aside his philosophical mind. Bonaventure quickly set a firm direction for the Order in an “encyclical letter” to all the friars on 23 April 1257, which admonished them to recover the “somewhat tarnished” luster of the Order. The Minister General followed with three tracts written in 1259-60 for the spiritual edification of the friars: A Soliloquy about Four Mental Exercises (Soliloquium de quatuor mentalibus exercitiis), The Tree of Life (Lignum vitae), and The Triple Way (De Triplici via).

Bonaventure's most influential work over the centuries was composed at this time. For Francis's feast day in October, 1259, Bonaventure visited Mt. Alverna, the very place where Francis himself had received a mystical vision of Christ “under the appearance” of “a Seraph having six wings” and had had “imprinted in his flesh” the stigmata or wounds of Christ[7] Here Bonaventure conceived the idea for his Journey of the Mind to God (Itinerarium mentis in Deum), a mental and spiritual journey to God whose basic outline—though not its details—could be understood by even the simplest friar. The journey follows the route first charted by St. Augustine—from the exterior world to the interior mind, and from the interior but inferior human mind to the superior mind, namely, to God. Bonaventure allegorically understood the six wings of the angelic Seraph Francis saw to stand for six ways God can be approached and therefore arranged his Journey into seven chapters. The two lower wings of the Seraph symbolize seeing God through “footprints (vestigia),” signs in the sub-human world that point to God, including signs in the physical universe itself (c. 1) and signs found in the sensory life humans have in common with other animals (c. 2). The two middle wings of the Seraph symbolize seeing God in his “image,” namely, in humans understood as bearing within their intellectual nature special signs pointing to God. Here Bonaventure distinguished signs of God found in the “natural” exercise of the mind in theoretical knowledge (c. 3) from those found in its exercise in the practical sphere “reformed by grace” (c. 4). The two highest wings of the Seraph symbolize seeing God in himself, first in the way reason sees God as having one divine nature (c. 5) and then as faith sees God in the Trinity of persons (c. 6). These three sets of twin “steps” culminate in the “mental and mystical transport” found in mystical experience (c. 7), the end of the Journey. For each step, Bonaventure used material from earlier writings; but the Journey, like all his later works, is only a sketch the Minister General knew he would never have the leisure to complete. The result is his writing achieves a combination of scriptural imagery, philosophic depth, mystical yearning, and density more meditative than demonstrative. But the Journey does provide an appropriate outline for looking at Bonaventure's philosophy. After considering his views on the relation of philosophy, faith, and theology (Section 2), we shall look respectively at Bonaventure's views on physical creation (Section 3), human nature and cognition (Section 4), and on God (Section 5).

The General Chapter of 1260 held in Narbonne, France, the first where Bonaventure presided, ratified his codification of the legal statutes under which Franciscans lived, known as the “Constitutions of Narbonne” and also asked him to write a definitive Life of St. Francis, which he did in 1261. These two works set the Order on a moderate course that lasted for centuries and led Franciscans to call Bonaventure their “second founder.”

For most of the period from 1257 through 1266 Bonaventure trekked through France and Italy by foot, as did all friars when they traveled. In 1266 he returned to Paris, where his friars were under attack both from conservatives in the Theology faculty and from radicals in Arts. Bonaventure began a series of writings devoted primarily to moral matters: Collations on the Ten Commandments (Collationes de decem praeceptis), Lent of 1267; Collations on the Seven Gifts of the Holy Spirit (Collationes de septem donis Spiritus sancti), Lent of 1268; a defense of the friars bearing the Socratic title Apologia pauperum (Defense of the Mendicants), 1269. On 10 December 1270, Etienne Tempier, bishop of Paris, condemned certain erroneous Aristotelian propositions. During Easter-tide of 1273 Bonaventure delivered his magisterial Collations on the Hexameron (Collationes in Hexaemeron).

The last period of Bonaventure's life saw him rise to become one of the most prominent men in Christendom. During the three year Papal vacancy, from 29 November 1268 to 1 September 1271, Bonaventure preached an important sermon in Viterbo and was probably instrumental in the invention of conclave. He is said to have been offered the papacy by the electors and to have suggested Teobaldi Visconti instead. After Teobaldi's election as Pope Gregory X, he appointed Bonaventure cardinal on 28 May 1273,[8] where he preached on reunification of eastern and western Churches, a major goal of the council which seemed to have been achieved when he suddenly fell ill on 15 July 1274 and “at the hour of Matins died Br. Bonaventure of happy memory, Bishop of Albano, who was a man eminent for his knowledge and eloquence (homo eminentis scientie et eloquentie), a man outstanding for his sanctity and acknowledged for the excellence of his life, both religious and moral…Br. Peter of Tarantasia [also a Cardinal] celebrated the funeral mass and preached on the theme ‘I am saddened over you, my brother Jonathan.’ There were many tears and much weeping, for the Lord had given him such grace that the hearts of all who saw him were seized with a desire for his love.”[9]

2. Philosophy, Faith, and Theology

Without exception, every word of philosophy Bonaventure ever wrote is contained in works explicitly religious—in sermons, works of spiritual direction, and theology. He never wrote the kind of introductions to the principles of metaphysics and natural philosophy that Thomas Aquinas composed in his On Being and Essence (De ente et essentia) and On the Principles of Nature (De principiis naturae), nor did he comment on Aristotle's works. Commentators writing during the twentieth century neo-thomistic revival compared Bonaventure with three other thinkers: Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas. P. Mandonnet thought he had no philosophy of his own, but was an Augustinian theologian, pure and simple, all of whose conclusions depend on faith. E. Gilson thought Bonaventure developed an Augustinian philosophy within his theology: “with St. Bonaventure the mystical synthesis of mediaeval Augustinianism was fully formed, just as that of Christian Aristotelianism was fully formed with St. Thomas.” F. Van Steenberghen thought his philosophy a failed Aristotelianism separate from but at the service of his Augustinian theology.[10] None of these interpretations quite captures Bonaventure's relation to these three philosophers or his own approach to the relations among reason, faith, and theology, because they implicitly employed a Thomistic model for being an Aristotelian, with the result that Bonaventure's failures derive from his not being the kind of Aristotelian Thomas Aquinas was.

Bonaventure's approach to Aristotle was quite different from Albert and Thomas. He felt no need for detailed knowledge of the text of Aristotle. As a student in Arts he had learned from his Masters, not from detailed study of Aristotle's text, broadly Aristotelian philosophical principles—the categories and transcendentals, the causes and predicables, and fundamental notions like potency and act, possible and necessary—sufficient to do his own work. As a philosopher and theologian, he was perfectly capable of using such borrowed principles to draw his own conclusions, ones which he himself said depended more on Alexander of Hales than on any philosopher: “For I do not intend to advocate new opinions, but to reweave the common and approved ones.” Consequently, Bonaventure was not a failed Aristotelian for the simple reason that he never tried to be an Aristotelian in the Dominican way at all. On the other hand, while Augustine was clearly Bonaventure's favorite theological authority, he was not, properly speaking, an Augustinian. Even when he draws Augustinian conclusions, Bonaventure does not employ Augustinian arguments. In truth, Bonaventure was, broadly speaking, an Aristotelian in his philosophical principles, but not in his conclusions. A better way to describe his philosophical conclusions and his way of drawing them is that his thought was Franciscan in inspiration and Bonaventurean in execution.

The pressing issue concerning philosophy, faith, and theology in the 1250s was how to set up theology as an Aristotelian demonstrative science. Albert had done so in his commentary on the Sentences (1243-9), which Bonaventure had on hand when writing his own commentary. Demonstration is causal knowledge, and a science in Aristotle's sense is systematic knowledge of one limited subject developed through demonstrating necessary conclusions by making use of certain fundamental causal principles relevant to the subject at hand. The task theology had set itself, then, was to discover and present systematically the truths set out in that most unsystematic of books—the Bible.

Since a “science” is causal knowledge, Bonaventure devoted the four questions of the prologue to his commentary on Book 1 of the Sentences, which serves as his introduction the whole “science” of theology, to its four causes—efficient, final, formal, and material. These causes in turn clarify the relations between philosophy, faith, and theology.

Since science exists as an intellectual habit in the mind of the knower, the efficient cause of any book of theology is the author who wrote it, Peter Lombard in the case of his Sentences, Bonaventure himself in the case of his commentary. Lombard was no mere scribe, compiler, or commentator; he was an “author,” and the same is true of Bonaventure himself. This simple point distinguishes faith, whose sole efficient cause is God working through grace, from both philosophy and theology, whose efficient cause is the human mind, though even here God has a role to play.

When he came to clarify the end of theology, Bonaventure understood that Aristotle had sharply distinguished practical science—whose end is deeds—from theoretical science—whose end is knowledge. So he asks whether theology is “for the sake of contemplation or for the sake of our becoming good.” The answer is that theology is more perfect than any philosophical science because it breaks through the bounds of this Aristotelian dichotomy. Neither theoretical knowledge nor practical deeds get to the center of the moral life, which is love—both the “affection” of love and the theological virtue of charity. The kind of intellectual virtue that prepares the mind for charity is a “wisdom” that “involves knowledge and affection together.” The “knowledge that Christ died for us,” for example, is far different from the knowledge of the geometer or the knowledge of the general. Consequently, theological wisdom is both “for the sake of contemplation and also for our becoming good, but principally for the sake of our becoming good” through enlivening our knowledge and deeds with Christian “affection.

The form that produces “science” is its “method of proceeding.” Now “the end imposes necessity on the means, since ‘teeth are sharp in order to cut,’ as Aristotle says.” Since theology is “designed to promote the faith,” it employs “the method of argumentation or inquiry” first developed by Aristotle. By adapting the philosophical method to the data of faith, theology attempts to “confound the adversaries of the faith,” “strengthen those weak in their faith,” and “delight those whose faith is complete.” Bonaventure situated theology within the hierarchy of the sciences by adverting to Aristotle's notion of “subalternated sciences.” The Philosopher had recognized that optics—which studies visible lines—is a science “subalternated” to geometry—which studies lines as such. Theology depends upon Scripture in a similar way, for scripture offers certain truths to be believed, but theology looks at the same truths “as made intelligible.” In this way, theology is different from the faith it tries to understand and from the Scripture that offers faith to us.[11]

To understand theology as a “science” making faith intelligible, Bonaventure must clarify its material cause. Determining that material cause of theology is the same as settling on its subject. On this point, there had been considerable dispute among the Masters. Aristotle's “sciences” were all limited to a particular genus, such as “animal” or “soul” or “memory” or “ethics.” Even his universal science of metaphysics was limited to studying substances; it eschewed the other categories. Theology, by contrast, cuts across all genera and includes God, who is not confined within any genus. Bonaventure was familiar with many accounts of the subject of theology: “things and signs,” the work of “reparation for sin,” “Christ—head and members,” “God,” and “the object of belief (credibile). To throw light on these conflicting answers, Bonaventure turned to his study of the Arts. Priscian had noted three different senses of the subject of grammar. Its subject in the sense of its “root principle” is the “letter” that makes up words; its subject conceived as an “integral whole” is “a fitting and complete oration;” and its subject conceived as “universal whole” is “meaningful sound, articulated and ordered.” There are three correlative senses of the subject of theology: “God” is the “principle” of the subject and “Christ—head and members” is the “integral whole,” the entirety of what theology studies. But the most important sense of “subject” is the “universal whole.” Therefore, “the subject of this book, properly speaking,” is the “object of belief,” a subject that lets theology range over all realities and all thoughts about which one can have religious faith.

Bonaventure does not explicitly address the principles of theology. But he further clarifies its “subject” in a way that points to those principles. To faith, Scripture adds the notion of “authority,” and to the faith and authority of Scriptural revelation, theology adds “proof.” Theology presupposes faith but adds to it rational demonstrations about matters of faith. Consequently, Bonaventure adds a telling qualification to his description of the subject of theology. Theology's subject is the object of belief “in so far as the believable is transformed into the notion of the intelligible, and this happens by the addition of reasoning.”[12] With this concise formula, Bonaventure includes within theology both religious belief transformed by arguments from natural reason and natural reason transformed by arguments based on religious revelation. If so, then theology must have the kinds of principles that make possible both kinds of arguments: the fundamental truths of faith drawn from the Bible and tradition, but also fundamental truths of reason. What makes all such basic truths theological is their argumentative function. Theological arguments may draw from revelation by using revealed truths as premises and they may draw from reason by using rational truths as premises. Both kinds of arguments are theological because of the use to which they are put. In this way, philosophical reasoning has an integral place within the domain of Bonaventurean theology.

Bonaventure showed how philosophical reasoning works in theology in the very structure of his disputed question On the Mystery of the Trinity. Each question is divided into two articles, the first proven using rational premises and the second proven using premises drawn from faith. In Question 1, for example, God is rationally proven to exist in Art. 1, then shown to be a trinity of persons using arguments based on faith and reason in Art. 2. Theology, then, consists most fundamentally in the understanding that results from joining rational arguments and faith-based arguments together.[13] The same mode of reasoning is found in On Reducing the Arts to Theology. Here “reduction” consists in developing analogies that move the mind from the liberal arts to theology and back again. Bonaventure argues for each point by combining one claim based on reason with another based on revelation, as though they were wall and buttress of the cathedral of theology. Philosophical reasoning, then, is an absolutely integral part of Bonaventure's faith-based theology.

3. Physical Creation

In the first step of the Journey Bonaventure focuses upon the sensible objects of the physical world around us, both taken in themselves and in reference to our sense awareness of them. Like all creatures, sensible things are understood to be signs that ultimately can direct humans to the divine art or wisdom through which all things have been made. Bonaventure's semiotics distinguishes four sorts of signs. All creatures can be seen as “shadows” (umbra) and “vestiges” (lit. footprints, vestigia): “For a creature is called a shadow based on its properties which point to God in some type of causality in an indeterminate way. But a creature is called a vestige based on properties which point to God as triple cause–efficient, formal, and final cause; for example, the properties: one, true, and good.”[14] In addition, Bonaventure posits two higher types of semiosis pertinent solely to rational creatures, which are “images” (imago) pointing to the First Principle through its properly rational powers which have their source and highest object in God and “likenesses” (similitudo) of God to the extent that they are recipients of divine grace and conform themselves to the divine will. All creatures, from rocks to angels, are signs in the sense of shadows and traces of God, for they all bear a relation of causal dependency upon God as their source; but only rational creatures can have the divine as an object of their activities and, for that reason, can conform themselves to the divine will and become likenesses of God.

3.1 The Physical World

Bonaventure's understanding of the physical world is heavily indebted to two fundamental sources: the Biblical account of creation, mediated by Patristic commentaries, and the Aristotelian view of nature, taken chiefly from Aristotle's writings on natural philosophy, such as the Physics (Physica) and On the Heavens (De caelo), but combined with the commentaries of Averroes, the tracts of Avicenna, and the Timaeus of Plato in the Latin translation of Chalcidius. Bonaventure constructs a view of the physical world that is indebted to both of his fundamental sources, but ultimately gives the Scriptural text and the related Patristic tradition precedence whenever his sources come into conflict. His manner of synthesizing those sources into a coherent and impressive whole is what gives his views on nature their distinctive character.

3.2 Creation

The tension between the newly translated Aristotelian corpus and the traditional theological teaching of the Church regarding the doctrine of creation was well understood by Bonaventure's time. Indeed, the prohibitions of 1215 and 1231 regarding the teaching of the Aristotelian writings on natural philosophy had given way to the direct teaching of Aristotle in the Faculty of Arts by the time Bonaventure took his master of arts degree at the University of Paris, and by the time he left the University, the Aristotelian corpus in its entirety was a subject of examination for candidates for degrees in the Faculty of Arts. Yet the Aristotelian doctrine of the eternity of the world was given various interpretations. Some favored a benign interpretation, claiming that all Aristotle meant in Physics VIII was that the world and its motion did not arise from some earlier motion, but rather time, moveable things, and motion were all coeval and concomitant.[15] Others, however, chief among them Robert Grosseteste, argued that the views of Aristotle should be taken at face value and what the Stagirite intended was the eternity of the past; the Greek Fathers and Aristotle's own commentators both were in accord that the Aristotelian outlook involved the beginninglessness of the past and unoriginated matter.[16]

Bonaventure's own position takes its origins from a combination of elements coming from Alexander of Hales and Grosseteste. Following the lead of the latter, Bonaventure rejects, albeit with some hesitation, the benign reading of the Stagirite; in all likelihood, Aristotle did intend to teach that the world was beginningless:

And this view [i.e., that matter eternally existed under some form] seems more reasonable than its opposite, namely, that matter existed eternally incomplete, bereft of form and divine influence, as some of the philosophers posited. Indeed, this view seems so reasonable that the most excellent of the philosophers, Aristotle, fell into this error, at least as the saints impute it to him, his commentators expound him, and his own words indicate.[17]

Yet the most striking feature of Bonaventure's account of the philosophers is the manner in which he juxtaposes the doctrine of creation, as he understands it, with the philosophical theory of origins. According to Bonaventure, only two theories regarding the origin of the cosmos are really tenable: first, the theory of the pagan philosophers according to which the world is eternal and the matter of the universe is without ultimate causal origin; second, the Christian doctrine of creation according to which the universe depends entirely for its being on God, is produced “from nothing (ex nihilo),” and is temporally finite in the past. The third possibility, namely that the world is both produced from nothing and eternal, Bonaventure vehemently rejects on the grounds that such a position is inherently contradictory:

Response: To posit that the world is eternal or eternally produced, while positing likewise that all things have been produced from nothing, is altogether opposed to the truth and reason, just as the last reason stated showed. Indeed, it is so opposed to reason that I do not believe any philosopher, however small his intellectual abilities, took this position. For this involves, in itself, an obvious contradiction. To posit, however, that the world is eternal on the supposition that matter is eternal seems reasonable and understandable… [18]

Returning to the last argument, we find the reasoning to which Bonaventure refers. The argument is an elegant synthesis and restatement of the position of Parisian theologians since the time of William of Auxerre, but is especially indebted to the Quaestiones of Alexander of Hales. Everything that depends entirely for its being on something else is produced by that thing from nothing. The world depends entirely for its being on God. Hence, the world must be produced from nothing. If the world is produced from nothing, it must either arise out of the “nothing” as out of matter or out of the “nothing” as out of a point of origin. The world cannot arise out of nothing as out of matter. Thus the world must arise out of nothing as out of a point of origin. If, however, the world arises out of nothing as out of a point of origin, then the world has being after non-being. Nothing having being after non-being can be eternal. The world, as a created thing, has being after non-being. Therefore, the world, precisely as created “out of nothing,” cannot be eternal.[19] The philosophical force of the expression that there be a logical moment at which we could say that the world is not and with reference to which the world begins to be. The ontological reference of such a logical moment is the divine eternity with respect to which (‘after’ which) the world begins.

To Bonaventure's mind, the creationist view of the universe alone accounts for the total being of the universe in the sense of explaining both its structure and the fact that it exists; the view of the ancients only explains the order and the pattern of the universe without reaching the depths of accounting for why the universe exists at all. A sign of this shortcoming is to be seen in the shared presupposition of Plato and Aristotle that matter is unoriginated. Furthermore, to the extent that the ancient pagan views of the universe involve the infinity of past time, with all the philosophical difficulties that the eternity of past time entails, natural reason would seem capable of arriving, in principle, at the conclusion that the world was created, even though, historically speaking, the greatest of the ancient philosophers failed to do so.

3.3 Matter

The conflict between Scriptural sources and the Aristotelian writings on the issue of the primordial state of matter is not so severe, because in the Aristotelian corpus there is no description of the primordial state of matter, and the other sources available to Bonaventure are themselves in disagreement. Augustine, for example, had suggested in his literal commentary on Genesis that the matter of the world could have been made all at once, whereas in his Confessions (Confessiones) he had suggested that there might be an indeterminate and inchoate initial state of matter. This possibiliity was further corroborated by such pagan authors as Plato and Ovid, who had posited a primordial chaotic state of matter out of which the present cosmic order gradually emerged (Plato, Timaeus 52D-53C, 54-55; Ovid, Metamorphoses, 43:5–45:7).

Bonaventure begins by distinguishing the consideration of matter from the actual existence of matter in the order of natural history.[20] We may consider matter simply as a constitutive principle of things and as such it is pure potency; this is the way that the concept of matter functions in Aristotle's Physics and, to Bonaventure's mind, how Augustine spoke of matter in the Confessions. But we may also think of matter as it actually exists in time. In this respect, matter never exists and cannot exist as lacking all form. Such a claim, however, does not require that material creation was brought forth as fully formed, even if such a position might be more philosophically defensible than its opposite.[21] Instead, Bonaventure suggests that physical matter was created in a state wherein it had a tendency and capacity to admit many different forms, though it had none of them in its own right. Rather, its potentiality to develop distinct forms required further external, divine agency in order for the distinct things having diverse forms to fully emerge.[22] Physical matter's properties in its incomplete state included extension and visibility (properties arising from the form common to all physical things, namely, light). These features are still shared by all the items in the physical world, even though Bonaventure admits, in accord with the Aristotelian teaching on the heavens, that heavenly bodies, such as the stars, have matter that differs in kind from that of terrestrial things. Accordingly, after things were fully produced matter was twofold, terrestrial and celestial, but in its primordial state physical matter enjoyed a corresponding unity that was one of contiguity, i.e., it was one mass.[23] This primordial unity of physical matter continues to have some scientific bearing for Bonaventure since it grounds the consideration of the general physicist who may prescind from the process of generation and corruption and consider bodies simply in terms of their mobility in place and extension.[24]

3.4 Light

Bonaventure's treatment of light is mainly found in the discussion of light in his commentary on Lombard's Sentences, Bk. 2, d. 13. In this theological context, light mainly bears upon the work of the six days of creation, and Bonventure must take a position on the Genesis account of the creation of light. Though he acknowledges Augustine's spiritualizing interpretation of light, an interpretation that identifies the light spoken of in Genesis with the creation and activities of the angels, Bonaventure inclines to a more literal interpretation.[25] This means that Bonaventure had to take a position on the contemporary debates on light and its nature.

The two positions that Bonaventure discusses are what we may call a broadly Aristotelian position, one eventually adopted by Thomas Aquinas, and a broadly Augustinian position advocated by Robert Grosseteste in his On light (De luce). According to the first, light is simply an accidental form, one found in degrees in different bodies, but according to the second, light is perhaps a substance or at least a substantial form communicating extension and visibility to physical things.

Bonaventure discounts the possibility that light is a substance, because it is purely active and if it were a substance in its own right it would be God and not a creature. He does allow, however, that light is a substantial form and is the substantial form that is concomitant with the mass of matter in its primordial state.[26] In this originating condition, light gave the mass of matter its extension and visibility and the hierarchy of heavenly bodies corresponds to the hierarchy of things capable of partaking either more or less in the light that renders bodies active and extended. For Bonaventure, then, light is a substantial form, but only the partial perfection of any given physical substance, whether celestial or terrestrial. Since Bonaventure endorses, usually without any elaborate argumentation, the general claim that there is a plurality of substantial forms within any composite thing, his doctrine of light really means that light is the first form, endowing each thing with extension, and preparing the way for further perfections such as the forms of the elements or the forms of mixtures or compounds.

3.5 Seminal reasons

The transition in the order of natural history from bodies that are simply such, extended and endowed with the ability to act and be acted upon, to the bodies of plants and animals is explained in part through the motions of the celestial bodies and their causal influences on matter. In part, however, matter itself has latent structures that simply await the correct circumstances and conditions to cause the emergence of a higher type of body. These latent structures, originally sown into matter at its creation, Bonaventure calls, following the terminology of St. Augustine, rationes seminales or seminal reasons, a term hearkening back to the cosmology of the ancient Stoics. Seminal reasons amount to a lingering impact of the creator on the matter of the physical world since their presence in matter originates with creation. In physical science, Bonaventure believes seminal reasons help to explain the successive emergence of the different kinds of bodies suitable for higher and higher types of life. But this process of gradual emergence does not apply to the creation of human life, since human souls for Bonaventure are incorruptible and can only arise through the direct action of the creator.

Though from our post-Darwinian perspective we may be tempted to see in the doctrine of seminal reasons, whether in Augustine or Bonaventure, a curious, yet awkward anticipation of the doctrine of evolution, similarities between the doctrine of seminal reasons and certain elements in evolutionary theory are more apparent than real. First, though seminal reasons do provide directionality and progression for the succession of physical types in natural history, they are themselves latent forms within matter and not reducible to more fundamental mechanical or chemical processes; rather, they underlie such processes. Second, seminal reasons are never appealed to in order to explain the demise of one living species and the emergence of another species to replace the former, a key feature of Darwinian explanations. Third, seminal reasons are not, as we have just seen, universal in their application to the living things that occur within the order of natural history; human beings, at least in terms of their souls, fall outside the range of influence of seminal reasons.

3.6 Living Things

Bonaventure's doctrines regarding living things are mainly inspired by an Aristotelian biology. Living things are such thanks to the kind of forms they have, namely, soul, which is defined as the first actuality of a body having life potentially. Soul is understood as the form that makes a thing alive and able to enjoy the type of life that it does. Consequently, souls are termed either vegetative, sensitive, or rational, according to the functions that the living things themselves exercise.

3.7 Sense Cognition

The world as it is revealed to us through the senses provides the means for our re-entering ourselves and ascending to higher things. Furthermore, the senses themselves are equally signs of higher things.

Physical things considered in their own right evidence “weight, number, and measure” (Psalm 83:8), thereby causing us to contemplate their own measure, beauty, and order. These features are grounded in the activities and natural powers of sensible substances. The nature of sensible substances accordingly expresses in their actions and interactions the measure, beauty, and order of their origin and thereby attest to the power, wisdom, and goodness of the Source from which they spring.[27] Likewise, the origin, size, number, beauty, fullness, function, and origin of physical things point to the Divine Source and its essential properties of power, wisdom, and goodness.[28]

The pointing of physical things towards their Source finds its parallel in sense cognition itself, which also points towards that same Source. Drawing his point of departure from the Neoplatonic theme of macrocosm and microcosm, Bonaventure discovers an analogy between Aristotelian cosmology and the process of sensation. Each sensible object generates a likeness of itself in the medium through which it is perceived, and that likeness in turn generates another likeness successively in the sense organ, causing the sense power to apprehend the sensible object. The process so described reflects the process of the emanation of forms from the heavenly bodies and also the manner in which creatures, going forth from their Principle, return to their Source through the exercise of their natural activities. A similar pattern emerges within the different acts exercised by each sense power: the sense apprehends (apprehensio) the object, delights (delectatio) in its object, provided that the object does not exceed the natural limits of the organ, and judges (diiudicatio) or discriminates the quality of its object. This last act, found in both the external senses and the internal senses, takes on a special role for Bonaventure. Such a sense judgement, through comparative awareness, detaches the object from a given place and time, thereby preparing the way within the realm of sense cognition for intellectual cognition.[29]

4. Intellectual Creatures

When we arrive at the threshold of intellectual cognition, we are entering the next step along the Bonaventurian journey. This level of creaturely being points to the Divine Source, but in ways that are more direct than those in which sensible creatures do. In exercising their powers of intellect and will, intellectual creatures discover the highest and most perfect object of their powers in the Divine Source of their being, since God is the First or Highest Truth and the First or Chief Good. Accordingly, intellectual creatures have God as their ultimate object, whereas all creatures have God as their Cause. Consequently, intellectual creatures show themselves to be “images” and “likenesses” of God, while they show that all creatures are “shadows” and “vestiges” of God.

Bonaventure traces out how intellectual creatures and intelligible objects reflect the divine Source. If we begin with something as immediate and basic as simple apprehension on the part of the human intellect, we find that an object of simple apprehension (such as the natural kind “dog”) is susceptible of definition. Yet every definition requires a genus and a differentia. Through the generic term we are led to a further object of simple apprehension, usually itself susceptible of definition. If the genus is definable, we may state its definition, but we shall eventually find ourselves through continuing the process of definition arriving similarly at one of the supreme general or Aristotelian categories; if the genus is not definable, then we have arrived at one of the Aristotelian categories. Once we arrive at a category, we confront an item not susceptible of further definition, though it admits of description. If the categorical item is an accident, it satisfies the description of an accident as ‘being through another;’ if we are dealing with substance, then the item we are considering satisfies the description of substance as ‘being in itself’.

The resolution of all our items of simple apprehension into the concept of being is metaphysically and epistemologically crucial: metaphysically, it opens up a route of argumentation that leads to the existence of God; epistemologically, such a resolution means that behind all, even the most determinate and specific, conceptions of things lies a transcendental awareness of being that informs all of our knowledge. If we take the concept of substance as being in itself, we cannot come to know a particular substance's definition without the concept of being presupposed in the background, and in addition we are concomitantly aware of the transcendental properties of being (unity, truth, and goodness) in any such notion. Such co-extensive transcendental properties, however, are only one of the two types of properties that belong to being; the other transcendental properties (later called disjunctive properties) prove extremely useful for increasing our metaphysical knowledge. Being may be conceived of as either actual or potential, absolute or dependent, prior or posterior, immutable or mutable. Yet to conceive of being as potential, dependent, posterior, or mutable requires that we already be acquainted with being as actual, independent, prior and immutable. In other words, the more perfect of the two disjuncts in any of the disjunctive transcendentals must be an item we acknowledge in our awareness of being:

Since privations and defects may only be known through positive features, our intellect does not fully resolve the understanding of any one created thing unless it is assisted by an understanding of the purest, most actual, complete, and absolute being, which is being simply and eternally and in which are found all the formulas of things in their purity. Indeed, how can the mind know that this being is defective and incomplete unless it has some awareness of being without defect? And the same line of analysis pertains to the other conditions of being mentioned above.[30]

At one level, this line of argumentation is part of an argument for the existence of God. But, at another level, it is an effort to demarcate the proper object of the human mind as being and to point out that, if we reflect upon the notion of being (ens) in terms of its actuality (esse) we are inexorably led to the conclusion that there is a Perfect Being.[31] We reach the same kind of conclusion if we reflect, not upon the primary object of the mind, but upon its operations. The certainty of judgment requires that we be aware of the impossibility of our being mistaken combined with our awareness that the truth that we know cannot be otherwise; indeed, the most fundamental truths we know are all immutable. But, following Augustine, Bonaventure claims that there is no source for immutable truth other than God, since God is the only immutable and unchanging Being.[32]

What we find when we look within ourselves is that we are pointed above to God, who is the light of the mind, guaranteeing the certainty of our judgments. This thesis, usually called by scholars divine illumination, was quite ancient by Bonaventure's time; it was part of the philosophical teaching of Augustine. What makes Bonaventure's version so philosophically distinctive is that he proposes to synthesize the epistemology of divine illumination with the Aristotelian account of abstraction. Bonaventure is thoroughly committed to the integral role played by the agent and possible intellects in human intellectual cognition. The agent and possible intellects are not separated substances, in the way envisaged by Averroes, but properly human faculties essential to the constitution of the human soul. [33] Hence, unlike his contemporaries, who often thought of the human possible intellect as being illumined by God functioning as an agent intellect, Bonaventure assigns each human being an agent intellect. Differing from other of his contemporaries, Bonaventure also insists that the possible intellect always remains the recipient of the intelligible species abstracted by the agent intellect and the faculty of apprehension; accordingly, the possible intellect continues to be part of the human soul even when the soul is separated by death from the body.[34] Abstraction is, for Bonaventure, the source of our concepts of things. How then does illumination work and why is it necessary? The divine light works together with the human intellectual faculties as a “regulative and moving cause,” ensuring that the human mind grasps the immutable truth of the creature; it does not and cannot replace the human intellectual faculties in their proper roles.[35] The appeal to divine illumination is justified, primarily if not exclusively, for the reason that there is an incommensurability between our intellectual faculties and the ordinary objects we know as created and mutable, on the one hand, and the immutable truths we come to know. Inasmuch as things cannot give what they do not have, the only source of eternal and immutable truth is God's Light.

In general, the activities proper to intellectual creatures point much more directly than merely sensible or sentient creatures to the divine Source. Both the objects of the understanding and the will are ultimately rooted in God as Being and Goodness. This more direct pointing to God on the part of the intellectual creature is also seen in the intellectual creature's constitution, both psychological and ontological. The image of God is found in the fundamental interrelatedness of the memory, understanding, and will. Each act of memory calls to mind the past, is aware of the present and anticipates the future; each act of understanding presupposes the memory of first principles; and each act of will presupposes the act of understanding and moves the mind to further acts of memory. This triadic structure of the human mind reflects its Source: the Perfect Being that is simultaneously, Highest Unity, Supreme Truth, and Ultimate Good.[36] Likewise, the ontological constitution of intellectual creatures, humans and angels, moves us along the road to the consideration of God. Each intellectual creature is composed of act and potency, metaphysical principles that Bonaventure understands to be co-extensive with matter and form.[37] Accordingly, even intellectual creatures are composed of form and matter.[38] For Bonaventure, it is the conjunction of form and matter that explains the individuality of each thing.[39] But that even the highest creatures are composed of potency and act in this fashion entails that they are derived from a Source that is not so composed, but is, instead, pure act and hence pure form.

5. God

In his Collations on the Hexameron Bonaventure read Genesis spiritually, distinguishing seven levels of “vision” corresponding to the seven days of creation. The first level is “understanding naturally given” or philosophy, which he divided following the Stoics into logic, ethics, and physics, the last further subdivided following Aristotle into natural philosophy, mathematics, and metaphysics. The focus of metaphysics is on causal relations between God and creatures. Here “the philosophers—the finest and the ancient philosophers—came to this conclusion: there is a beginning, and an end, and an exemplar cause” of the universe,[40] that is, God is the efficient, final, and formal cause of the world. Since efficient causality connects metaphysics to physics and final causality connects it with ethics, the “true metaphysician” focuses on exemplar causality,[41] a kind of formal causality which is the grand theme of Bonaventurean metaphysics.

To pursue this theme, Bonaventure made use of materials drawn from earlier philosophers about three important points: the transcendentals, the three Neoplatonic routes to God, and the difference between scientific principles and conclusions. About the transcendentals, Aristotle made metaphysics the science of substance. Centuries later, Avicenna transformed it into a science truly universal in scope by insisting that it study the nine accidents, as well as substance, and also the attributes that transcend the categories (Avicenna, Metaphysica, 1.5, 8). Philip the Chancellor codified this doctrine into four transcendentals—being, one, true, and good (Aertsen 1996, 25-70). Bonaventure opens consideration of God in his Commentary on the Sentences by noting that the categorical attributes of being are “its special properties which characterize its imperfection,” but the transcendentals are “its general conditions which characterize its perfection.”[42] The transcendentals therefore set the terms for treating God.

When he read “the books of the Platonists,” Augustine opened up three routes to proving the existence of God, though he himself explored only one. Arguments like Aristotle's that begin in the world must proceed from effect to cause and have been called cosmological arguments, though aitiological—meaning simply an argument uncovering causesseems a better description. When Augustine turned within his mind he opened up two other routes to God. The second route also proceeds from effect to cause, but starts within the mind and searches out God as the ultimate cause of the mind's knowledge. This is the illumination argument for God. Augustine's turn inward also opened up a third route, later given by Kant the unhappy name of ontological argument. The fullest development of this neoplatonic approach to God stood ready to be realized, when all three routes, the aitiological, illuminationist, and ontological, would be scouted out by one and the same philosophical mind. That mind was not Augustine's or Anselm's but Bonaventure's.

If the transcendentals came primarily from Muslim Aristotelians, especially Avicenna, and the three routes to God were opened by Augustine, the last set of materials Bonaventure used to construct his arguments for the existence of God came from Aristotle himself. “Science” consists in knowledge of a limited subject achieved through demonstrating conclusions about it based on un-demonstrated principles. Bonaventure was one of a group of Parisian theologians, including the Dominicans Albert and Thomas, who attempted to set up Christian theology as an Aristotelian science. He therefore approached the issue of the existence of God with a sharp distinction between principles and conclusions in mind. The question he asks is not “Does God exist?” but “Is the divine being so true that it cannot be thought not to be?” This Anslemian formulation offers two options: God's existence is either a principle or a demonstrated conclusion. Philosophers are inclined to pick one route to God and reject all others, but Bonaventure had learned from Francis, the poor man of Assisi, that the world is filled with signs of God that even the simplest peasant can grasp. Bonaventure's response to the problem of the existence of God was therefore most unusual. He pursued all three routes to God; and he even ranked them: Illumination arguments make us “certain” of God's existence; aitiological arguments give us “more certain” knowledge of God's existence; while ontological arguments show that God's existence is “a truth that is most certain in itself, in as far as it is the first and most immediate truth.”[43] Let us look at each of them in turn.

5.1 Bonaventure's Illumination Argument

The transcendental that initially opens up arguments for the existence of God is “truth.” Bonaventure bases his illumination argument on the epistemological sense of truth, inspired by Augustine's memorable description of his own inward route to God:

And admonished by all this to return to myself, I entered inside myself, you leading and I able to do so because you had become my helper. And I entered and with the eye of my soul, such as it was, I saw above that eye of my soul, above my mind, an unchangeable light.…Whoever knows the truth knows this light…. O eternal truth and true love and loved eternity, you are my God; to you do I sigh both night and day. (Augustine, Confessiones, 7.10; CCSL 27: 103)

In his Commentary on the Sentences, Bonaventure extracted from Augustine's stirring rhetoric the logical core of the illumination argument, reducing it to plain and dispassionate syllogisms, as he had learned from his teachers in Arts at Paris:

All correct understanding proves and concludes to the truth of the divine being, because knowledge of the divine truth is impressed on every soul, and all knowledge comes about through the divine truth. Every affirmative proposition proves and concludes to that truth. For every such proposition posits something. And when something is posited, the true is posited; and when the true is posited that truth which is the cause of the true is also posited.[44]

Bonaventure understood that the step from a true proposition to divine truth is a large one, so he advocates a moderate illuminationist position, one that depends on both divine and created causes. Bonaventure's Augustinian illumination theory avoids the problems of Platonism, which turns knowing the world into knowing God, and the problems of Muslim illuminationism, which thought a creature could do what it takes the infinite mind of God to accomplish.[45] “For certain knowledge, eternal reason is necessarily involved as a regulative and motive cause, however, not as the sole cause or in its full clarity, but along with a created cause and as contuited by us ‘in part’ in accord with our present state of life.”[46]

To explain the contribution of the “created” causes of knowledge, Bonaventure noted that the content of human knowledge comes from four kinds of “created” causes: the passive intellect within the individual soul as material cause, for it receives knowledge; the individual agent intellect as efficient cause, for it abstracts the content of knowledge from sensation; the essence of an individual creature known as formal cause, for the creature is “what” we know; and epistemological truth as end. These “proper principles” of knowledge do not involve God.[47]

Above and beyond these “created” causes, knowledge also requires an “eternal” cause. In the mental acts of abstracting universals and arguing inductively, the human mind generalizes well beyond the data of our experience. It is one thing to be able to generalize so, quite another to be sure one has succeeded. Intuition into the essence of a creature involves truths that are not only universal, but also necessary and certain. God is acquainted with the full extension of any universal, since the divine idea of any truth consists in knowledge of that truth in absolutely all its actual and possible instantiations. The infinite extension of God's knowledge is what makes divine understanding certain, and this certainty in the divine mind is on loan, so to speak, to the human mind. “If full knowledge requires recourse to a truth which is fully immutable and stable, and to a light which is completely infallible, it is necessary for this sort of knowledge to have recourse to the heavenly art as to light and truth: a light, I say, which gives infallibility to the [created] knower, and a truth which gives immutability to the [created] object of knowledge.”[48] Here Bonaventure makes more precise Augustine's “light” and “truth.” They are the two sides of certitude, so it is the certainty, and only the certainty, found in human knowledge that requires divine illumination; all other features of human knowledge–abstraction, universality, correspondence–come from created causes.

5.2 Bonaventure's Aitiological Argument

The aitiological argument is “more certain,” because it begins with a real effect outside the mind and therefore better fits Aristotle's model of demonstration. But Bonaventure does not follow Aristotle's argument from motion, because motion falls under the categories. More promising were neoplatonic aitiological arguments (Boethius Consolatio philosophiae III 10; Anselm, Monologion 1-3), which combine an empirical premise with a participation premise. This is how Bonaventure packed his aitiological argument into a single syllogism: “Every truth and every created nature proves and leads to the existence of the divine truth. For if there is being by participation and from another, there must exist a being due to its own essence and not from another.”[49]

For his empirical premise Bonaventure turns again to truth, but ontological truth. All creatures are true to the extent that they actualize the potential perfections of their natures, and they are false to the extent that they fail to do so, because ontological truth is “the indivision of act and potency.” So “in a creature there is indivision combined with difference between act and potency.” All creatures are partial actualizations of truth. Ontological truth takes us to the heart of Bonaventurean metaphysics. Aristotle's definition of prime matter as pure potency means that everything that contains potency of any sort, even an angel, must contain matter. This universal hylomorphism leads in turn to Bonaventure's doctrine of being: “Matter gives independent existence (existere) to form, while form gives the act of being (essendi actum) to matter.”[50] Every created being (ens) is an ontological composite of independent existence (existere) and being (esse), where esse signifies the nature or essence of the thing. From rocks to angels, all creatures are true to the extent that the potencies of their “existence” given by matter are realized through the perfection of their “being” through form.

The participation premise moves from effect to cause within the line of formal causality. A necessary condition for the existence of any attribute by participation is that the same attribute is present in its exemplar essentially, that is, intrinsically. Participation does not immediately take us to God, but initially describes relations between creatures. A statue or computer can have certain human attributes–shape, color, size, computational skill–but only because these features are caused by the artisan who made it. This is how participation works within the created order. It is transcendenal “truth” that moves the argument beyond creatures to God. If incomplete realization of an intrinsically imperfect categorical attribute–like white or horse or dirt–implies that those attributes must also exist in some other creature “essentially,” then transcendental attributes should behave the same way. But no creature could be such an exemplar. The exemplar for ontological truth must therefore be God, who perfectly realizes his own essence, which is to say that God is true “essentially.” In On the Mystery of the Trinity, Bonaventure expands this line of argument further in the direction of the transcendentals. There he identifies nine more disjunctive transcendentals, in addition to the pair “by participation” and “essentially,” where the lesser implies the existence of the greater.[51]

Just as his illumination argument uncovered God as a kind of formal and efficient cause of certitude, so Bonaventure's aitiological argument uncovers God as formal cause of truth in creatures. But in addition it ends just where his ontological argument begins. For what does an ontological argument do but peer into the inner logic of such an exemplar essence and try to capture the logical consequence that it must exist?

5.3 Bonaventure's Ontological Argument

Bonaventure was the first thirteenth-century thinker to pay serious attention to the ontological argument. He read the Proslogion of Anselm through Aristotelian lenses. Now Aristotle had recognized three different kinds of scientific principles: common axioms governing all thought, so well known that no one can deny them, and proper principles limited in range to a given science–its definitions and postulates. Anselm seemed to mean that God's existence is an axiom of thought known by all humans, and Bonaventure agrees: “since our intellect is never deficient in knowing about God if it is, so it cannot be ignorant of God's existence, absolutely speaking, nor even think God does not exist.”[52]

While Anselm thought this conclusion rules out even the possibility of atheism, Bonaventure more realistically shows how atheism is possible. The problem is with our defective knowledge of God's nature. Error there can lead by logical inference to the conclusion that God does not exist in the first place. We are spontaneously theists, but can convince ourselves to become atheists. Inadequate definition of God points to a second problem. Knowing God exists is similar to knowing axioms because both are recognized by all. The difference is that we are quite certain “the whole is greater than the part,” because the terms involved in this axiom are so familiar to us; but about God's existence we have more an opinion than certain knowledge, because we lack an adequate definition of God's nature.

There are two remedies for the defects in our knowledge of “what” God is, one taken from faith, the other from reason. Both make knowledge of God's existence more like a postulate known with certitude by the “wise” than like an axiom recognized by “all” humans (Boethius, De hebdomadibus, 40). For Christian belief and for theology, God's existence is an article of faith. The other remedy is Bonaventure's adaptation of Anselm's argument conceived as a philosophical argument on behalf of a metaphysical postulate.

Bonaventure's ontological argument contains two moments, so to speak, one negative, the other positive. Negatively, Bonaventure's ontological argument proceeds as a reduction to absurdity of the atheistic proposition. Anselm had taken a peculiar description of God, “something than which a greater cannot be thought,” which Augustine had used to argue through a reductio ad absurdum to the conclusion that God must be incorruptible, and Boethius used to argue that God must be good, and he had used it to argue by reductio that God must exist in the first place. Bonaventure recognized the affinity with arguing by reductio in support of the principle of non-contradiction:

As a union of things in the greatest degree distant from each other is entirely repugnant to our intellect, because no intellect can think that one thing at the same time both is and is not, so also the division of something entirely one and undivided is entirely repugnant to that same intellect. For this reason, just as it is most evidently false to say that the same thing is and is not, so also it is most evidently false to say at the same time that the same thing is in the greatest degree and in no way is.”[53]

But his study of Aristotelian philosophy made Bonaventure more sensitive than Anselm to the limitations of reductio arguments. Positive insight into principles is more than negative reductio leading up to principles, so snaring the atheist in a contradiction is still one step away from affirming that God exists. To make this step intelligible he emended the ontological argument in a positive direction.

Bonaventure therefore explains what makes a proposition “self-evident,” which in turn opens the way for deducing God's existence out of God's essence.

Principles are “self-evident” (cf. Aristotle, Topics, 100a31–b21). In the second of Aristotle's modes of per se (Aristotle, Posterior Analytics 73a34–b3), the essence of the subject causes the predicate. This provided Bonaventure with an ingenious explanation of why principles are self-evident: “We know principles to the extent that we understand the terms which make them up, because the cause of the predicate is included in the subject.” If the essence of the subject term is what connects it to the predicate term in a self-evident proposition, then the essence of God must be what makes “God exists” self-evident. The positive ontological argument contains an inference to the existence of God that runs through the divine essence.

Most descriptions of the divine essence are inappropriate for the ontological argument, but the transcendentals are the right terms because they do not imply imperfection, can be predicated non-metaphorically of God, and are primordial, the “first notions falling into the mind.”[54] All more specific concepts presuppose transcendental notions, and Anselm's own formula was no exception to this rule. In his Commentary on the Sentences Bonaventure used the transcendental “true” as the middle term of his positive ontological argument; in the disputed question On the Mystery of the Trinity he used “good,” and in the Journey of the Mind to God he used “being.”

In the Commentary, Bonaventure introduces his arguments for God's existence with an elaborate treatment of truth. As a relation, truth always involves a comparison. Epistemological truth is an “indivision” between the human mind and the thing known. Ontological truth is an “indivision” between potency and act within a creature; the more it fulfills its nature, the truer it is. These two senses of truth open up a comparison of creature as participant to God as exemplar. All three, epistemological, ontological, participationist truths, are imperfect, combinations of truth and falsity. They point to their exemplar, the one “pure” truth, present only in God, where there is “pure indivision mixed with no diversity.”[55] This last sense of truth Bonaventure uses in his ontological argument:

We know principles to the extent that we understand the terms which make them up, because the cause of the predicate is included in the subject. This is why principles are self-evident. The same thing is true about God. For God, or the highest truth, is being itself, that than which nothing greater can be thought. Therefore, God cannot be thought not to be, for the predicate is already included in the subject.[56]

Bonaventure includes the negative reasoning so prominent in Anselm's version, but to Anselm's formula he adds “being itself” and “the highest truth.” While each of these three descriptions casts a different light on why the inference to God's existence is valid, Bonaventure here seems to prefer “the highest truth” because the definition of truth as “indivision” is the basis for re-conceiving the ontological argument as establishing an “indivision” between the middle term and the predicate “exists.” If the “highest truth” is “pure indivision,” then the highest truth cannot be divided off from existence.

In On the Mystery of the Trinity, Bonaventure changes the focus of the ontological argument to goodness, with a memorable result. The basic notion of goodness is not by itself sufficient to mount an ontological argument, but analysis of goodness uncovers the relevant terms:

No one can be ignorant of the fact that this is true: the best is the best; or think that it is false. But the best is a being which is absolutely complete. Now any being which is absolutely complete, for this very reason, is an actual being. Therefore, if the best is the best, the best is. In a similar way, one can argue: If God is God, then God is. Now the antecedent is so true that it cannot be thought not to be. Therefore, it is true without doubt that God exists.[57]

The logic of “the best” (optimum) is different from the logic of “the good.” Since goodness completes or perfects something, “the best” must be “a being which is fully complete (ens completissimum).” Now what is absolutely complete must possess all possible perfections. But existence is not just a perfection, one component among many making up such ontological completeness, it is the most fundamental feature of such completeness. Consequently, such an absolutely perfect being must exist. Bonaventure's argument runs from the subject “God,” through the middle terms “the best” and “absolutely complete being,” to the predicate “exists.” In the shorter and even more memorable formulation, “If God is God, God is,” the premise If God is God is not an empty tautology (Seifert 1992, 216-217). It means ‘if the entity to which the term God refers truly possesses the divine essence.’ And the conclusion means that such an entity must exist.

Bonaventure was well aware of criticisms of the ontological argument, beginning with Gaunilo's retort that the greatest of all possible islands should also really exist. His reply is more effective than Anselm's because it uses the transcendentals. An island is an inherently imperfect being (ens defectivum) because categorical; but ens completissimum is not because a transcendental.[58]

In The Journey of the Mind to God, c. 5, Bonaventure focuses the ontological argument on “being” and develops it far beyond anything he had previously done. He qualifies esse in two different ways, creating two different middle terms: “divine being” (esse divinum) and “completely pure being (esse purissimum).” First he uses “completely pure being” to deduce the predicate “exists,” then uses “divine being” to ensure that it is God who is so proven to exist. In this way the basic steps of this argument closely parallel those of the argument based on goodness: ‘God (Deus) who is divine being (esse divinum) is also seen to be completely pure being (esse purissimum) and therefore must exist (est).’

Bonaventure begins[59] by repeating the essentials of the earlier versions of the argument, but then moves well beyond them:

For completely pure being itself occurs only in full flight from non-being, just as nothingness is in full flight from being. Therefore, complete nothingness contains nothing of being or its attributes, so by contrast being itself contains no non-being, neither in act nor in potency, neither in reality nor in our thinking about it.[60]

If “being itself” (ipsum esse) distinguishes the being (esse) of a creature from its independent existence (existere), adding the superlative completely pure to being itself (esse purissimum) refers to the notion of an essence that does not involve non-being in any way: a completely pure or perfect essence. The notion of esse purissimum does not presuppose the real existence of God; rather, it implies that real existence. But at this point this inference may not yet be clear, so Bonaventure devotes the rest of this short text to showing why the notion of completely pure being itself actually entails the real existence of God.

In contrast with creatures, which are mid-level on the scale of being because they are open to existence and non-existence, the notions of complete nothingness (omnino nihil) and completely pure being (esse purissimum) have absolutely opposed implications for existence. “Complete nothing-ness” is logically inconsistent with real existence, so there is a perfectly valid inference from the notion of nothing to non-being (non-esse). Nothing cannot exist. If the nature of nothing entails its non-existence, the nature of its opposite, completely pure being, entails its real existence. Making use of the categories of his own metaphysics in this way shows more effectively than merely backing the mind into a contradiction why the ontological inference is valid.

The basis for the argument thus far is a notion, not of God but of an essence, completely pure, of non-being. One might ask where Bonaventure acquires this notion, seemingly drawn from thin air. His reply is that conceptual analysis of the first of all notions, transcendental being (ens), reveals this purely metaphysical notion.

Now since non-being is the privation of being, it does not fall into the mind except through being; while being does not fall into the mind through something else. For everything which is thought of is either thought of as a non-being, or as a being in potency, or as a being in act. Therefore, if a non-being is intelligible only through a being, and a being in potency is intelligible only through a being in act, and being denominates the pure actuality of a being, it follows that being is that which first falls into the intellect, and that this being is that which is pure actuality.[61]

Here Bonaventure peers into the notion of “a being” (ens) and finds it has two component principles: independent existence (existere), which gives the being the potential to have a certain essence; and being (esse), the actuality of such an essence. It is esse rather than existere which “denominates the pure actuality of a being.” Here “actuality” (actus) means ‘that which makes the being actually intelligible, by giving it the actual essence it has.’ This movement of conceptual analysis opens the mind to see that we can understand a creature as “a being” (ens) only by referring to the notion of an act of being which is pure from non-being (esse purum), indeed, which is pure from any non-being (esse purissimum). Implicit within the very notion of transcendental “being” and a presupposition of our understanding the notion of transcendental being, is the notion of being with no hint of non-being (esse purissimum). Even if only implicit, this notion must be present in the mind of anyone who understands being (ens), that is, everyone who understands anything at all.

Once it has been shown that esse purissimum is a notion which implies real existence and that we all possess this notion as a component of the fundamental notion of a being (ens), it remains only to identify esse purissimum with God.

But this is not particular being, which is limited being because mixed with potency, nor is it analogous being, because that has the least actuality, since it is to the least degree. Therefore, the result is that this being is divine being.[62]

If esse purissimum really exists, as has been proven, it must exist in one of three modes. But since particular and intentional being cannot be completely perfect, esse purissimum must be identical with the divine being.

The real but initially hidden starting point for Bonaventure's ontological argument in the Journey is the notion of esse purissimum, taken not subjectively as existing as a concept in a human mind, but in its objective meaning,[63] that is, as signifying a certain kind of quiddity or essence. The achievement of the ontological argument, as Bonaventure saw it, is twofold: it shows that this essence must really exist, and it shows that this essence is none other than God.

Bonaventure locates knowledge of God's existence within all three parts of an Aristotelian science–as demonstrated conclusion, as common axiom, and as proper postulate. It can be proven through two kinds of demonstrations of the fact, by an illumination argument starting inside the mind and an aitiological argument starting outside. Such proofs proceed from created truth as a vestige to the one God as its cause. But “God exists” is also a principle recognized by virtually all humans, a kind of axiom built upon creatures conceived as shadows of the one divinity for whom explicit arguments specifying God's causality are no more needed than for other axioms. Finally, there are two ways God's existence is known as a postulate: first, through the ontological argument, where the transcendental attributes found in creatures function as vestiges providing the mind the notions it uses in the argument for the one God's existence; and second, as an article of faith. Here faith is postulated on the authority of revelation and is certain, but its certainty comes from God, not human reason. And here, too, features of intellectual creatures, especially humans, function as images and likenesses of the Trinitarian God. Knowledge of God's existence, in sum, is ubiquitous. Thus spoke the follower of Francis.


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Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aristotle | Augustine, Saint | divine: illumination | epistemology | existence | faith | matter | metaphysics | truth