Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Sep 10, 2007

It is not easy to say what metaphysics is. Ancient and Medieval philosophers might have said that metaphysics was, like chemistry or astrology, to be defined by its subject matter: metaphysics was the “science” that studied “being as such” or “the first causes of things” or “things that do not change.” It is no longer possible to define metaphysics that way, and for two reasons. First, a philosopher who denied the existence of those things that had once been seen as constituting the subject-matter of metaphysics—first causes or unchanging things—would now be considered to be making thereby a metaphysical assertion. Secondly, there are many philosophical problems that are now considered to be metaphysical problems (or at least partly metaphysical problems) that are in no way related to first causes or unchanging things; the problem of free will, for example, or the problem of the mental and the physical.

This entry examines a large selection of the problems that have been classified as metaphysical. It does not examine them “for their own sake,” however, but as illustrations of metaphysical problems. (The discussions of these problems in this entry, therefore, are not meant to be in competition with the entries specifically devoted to them.) It considers—and finds no satisfactory answer to—the question, “In virtue of what common feature are these problems classified as metaphysical problems?” It also considers various attempts to show that metaphysics—however defined—is an impossible enterprise.

1. The word ‘metaphysics’ and the concept of metaphysics.

The word ‘metaphysics’ is notoriously hard to define. Twentieth-century coinages like ‘meta-language’ and ‘metaphilosophy’ encourage the impression that metaphysics is a study that somehow “goes beyond” physics, a study devoted to matters that transcend the mundane concerns of Newton and Einstein and Heisenberg. This impression is mistaken. The word ‘metaphysics’ is derived from a collective title of the fourteen books by Aristotle that we currently think of as making up “Aristotle's Metaphysics.” Aristotle himself did not know the word. (He had four names for the branch of philosophy that is the subject-matter of Metaphysics: ‘first philosophy’, ‘first science’, ‘wisdom’, and ‘theology’.) At least one hundred years after Aristotle's death, an editor of his works (in all probability, Andronicus of Rhodes) entitled those fourteen books “Ta meta ta phusika”—“the after the physicals” or “the ones after the physical ones”—, the “physical ones” being the books contained in what we now call Aristotle's Physics. The title was probably meant to warn students of Aristotle's philosophy that they should attempt Metaphysics only after they had mastered “the physical ones,” the books about nature or the natural world—that is to say, about change, for change is the defining feature of the natural world.

This is the probable meaning of the title because Metaphysics is about things that do not change. In one place, Aristotle identifies the subject-matter of first philosophy as “being as such,” and, in another, as “first causes.” It is a nice—and vexed—question what the connection between these two definitions is. Perhaps this is the answer: The unchanging first causes have nothing but being in common with the mutable things they cause—like us and the objects of our experience, they are, and there the resemblance ceases. (For a detailed and informative recent guide to Aristotle's Metaphysics, see Politis (2004).)

The Greek plural noun-phrase ‘ta meta ta phusika’ became in Medieval Latin the singular noun ‘metaphysica’—much as the Greek plural ‘ta biblia’ (‘the books’) became the Latin singular ‘biblia’ (‘the bible’). The word was used both as a title for Aristotle's book (now thought of as a single entity) and as the name of the “science” that was its subject-matter. The word for ‘metaphysics’ in every modern European language (‘la métaphysique’, ‘die Metaphysik’, ‘la metafisica’…) is an adaptation of the Latin word to the orthographic and phonetic requirements of that language. This is true even of the non-Indo-European languages (like Finnish and Hungarian) that are spoken in Europe. Works written in some non-European languages, however, use words constructed from native materials both to translate the European word ‘metaphysics’ and to refer to writings in their own philosophical traditions whose subject-matter is similar to the subject-matter of Western metaphysics. For example, the Chinese phrase that is the customary translation of ‘metaphysics’ is an allusion to a statement in the I Ching: “that which is above matter is the Tao”; the phrase can be literally translated as ‘[that which is above matter]-ology’, the final word of the phrase being a “discipline marker” that performs much the same function as the English suffix ‘-ology’. The word that is the usual Arabic translation of ‘metaphysics’ means ‘the science of divine things’. Unlike the Chinese phrase and the Arabic word, however, the European words derived from ‘metaphysica’ carry no internal indications of their meaning. (The word has, as we have seen, an etymology, but as is so often the case, etymology is no guide to meaning.) It is uncontroversial that these words all mean exactly what ‘metaphysics’ means in English—or, less parochially, that all the European words derived from ‘metaphysica’ mean exactly the same thing. But what is it that they all mean?

Can the origin of the word help us to answer this question? Can we say that the word ‘metaphysics’ is a name for that “science” (that episteme, that scientia, that study, that discipline) whose subject-matter is the subject-matter of Aristotle's Metaphysics? If we do say this, we shall be committed to some thesis in the neighborhood of the following theses: “The subject-matter of metaphysics is ‘being as such’”; “The subject-matter of metaphysics is the first causes of things”; “The subject-matter of metaphysics is that which does not change.” Any of these three theses might have been regarded as a defensible statement of the subject-matter of what was currently called “metaphysics” till the seventeenth century, when, rather suddenly, many topics and problems that Aristotle and the Medievals would have classified as belonging to physics (the relation of mind and body, for example, or the freedom of the will, or personal identity across time) began to be “reassigned” to metaphysics. One might almost say that in the seventeenth century “metaphysics” began to be a catch-all category, a repository of philosophical problems that could not be otherwise classified: “not epistemology, not logic, not ethics … ”. (It was at about that time that the word “ontology” was invented—to be a name for the science of being as such, an office that the word ‘metaphysics’ could no longer fill.) The academic rationalists of the post-Leibnizian school were aware that the word ‘metaphysics’ had come to be used in a more inclusive sense than it had once been. Christian Wolff attempted to justify this more inclusive sense of the word by this device: while the subject-matter of metaphysics is being, being can be investigated either in general or in relation to objects in particular categories. He distinguished between “general metaphysics,” (or ontology) the study of being as such, and the various branches of “special metaphysics,” which study the being of objects of various special sorts, such as souls and material bodies. (He does not assign “first causes” to general metaphysics, however: the study of first causes belongs to natural theology, a branch of special metaphysics.) It is doubtful whether this maneuver is anything more than a verbal ploy. In what sense, for example, is the practitioner of rational psychology (the branch of special metaphysics devoted to the soul) engaged in a study of “being”? Has a soul a different sort of being from that of other objects?—so that in studying the soul one learns not only about its nature (that is, its properties: rationality, immateriality, immortality, its capacity or lack thereof to affect the body …), but about its “mode of being,” and hence learns something about being? It is certainly not true that all, or even very many, rational psychologists said anything, qua rational psychologists, that could plausibly be construed as a contribution to our understanding of being.

Perhaps this development, this wider application of the word ‘metaphysics’, was due to the fact that the word ‘physics’ was coming to be a name for a new, quantitative science, the science that bears that name today, and was becoming increasingly inapplicable to the investigation of many traditional philosophical problems about changing things (and of some newly discovered problems about changing things). Whatever the reason for the change may have been, it would be flying in the face of current usage (and indeed of the usage of the last three or four hundred years) to stipulate that the subject-matter of metaphysics was to be the subject-matter of Aristotle's Metaphysics (or that it was to be “that which is above matter” or “divine things”). It would, moreover, fly in the face of the fact that, in the current sense of the word, there are and have been paradigmatic metaphysicians who deny that there are first causes—this denial is certainly a metaphysical thesis in the current sense—, others who insist that everything changes (Heraclitus and any modern philosopher who is both a materialist and a nominalist), and others still (Parmenides and Zeno) who deny that there is a special class of objects that do not change.

2. The problems of metaphysics: the “old” metaphysics

If metaphysics now considers a wider range of problems than those studied in Aristotle's Metaphysics, those problems continue to belong to its subject-matter. “Being as such” (and existence as such, if existence is something other than being), for example, is one of the matters that belong to metaphysics on any conception of metaphysics. Thus, the following statements are all paradigmatically metaphysical: ‘Being is; not-being is not’ [Parmenides]; ‘Essence precedes existence’ [Avicenna, paraphrased]; ‘Existence in reality is greater than existence in the understanding alone’ [St Anselm, paraphrased]; ‘Existence is a perfection’ [Descartes, paraphrased]; ‘Being is a logical, not a real predicate’ [Kant, paraphrased]; ‘Being is the most barren and abstract of all categories’ [Hegel, paraphrased]; ‘Affirmation of existence is in fact nothing but denial of the number zero’ [Frege]; ‘Universals do not exist but rather subsist or have being’ [Russell, paraphrased]; ‘To be is to be the value of a bound variable’ [Quine]. (Does Berkeley's ‘Esse est percipi’ belong in this list? Not obviously, and this for reasons connected with our earlier worries about Wolff's contention that “special metaphysics” addresses the topic “being.” It is a plausible position that Berkeley's Latin slogan is not really about the being of chairs and mountains but about their natures: it means that such things, perceptible things, are essentially perceived by someone. It may be contrasted with Russell's statement about universals, which—it seems clearly to be Russell's intention to assert this—is a statement not only to the effect that universals have very different properties or natures from those of the things that “exist,” but enjoy a different mode of being. It would seem, too, that Sartre's famous epitome of existentialism, ‘Existence precedes essence’, although it is an allusion to a classical theory about existence, is not itself a statement about existence but rather about the nature of human freedom.)

It seems reasonable, moreover, to say that investigations into non-being belong to the topic “being as such” and thus belong to metaphysics. (This did not seem reasonable to Meinong, who wished to confine the subject-matter of metaphysics to “the actual” and who therefore did not regard his Theory of Objects as a metaphysical theory. According to the conception of metaphysics adopted in this article, however, his thesis [paraphrased] ‘Predication is independent of being’ is a paradigmatically metaphysical thesis.)

The two topics “the first causes of things” and “things that do not change” must also be assigned to metaphysics in the post-Medieval sense as well as in the Aristotelian/Medieval sense. The first three of Aquinas's Five Ways are thus metaphysical arguments on any conception of metaphysics. But we must not take this to imply that the thesis that there are no first causes and the thesis that there are no things that do not change are not metaphysical theses. For, in the current conception of metaphysics, the denial of a metaphysical thesis is a metaphysical thesis. No post-Medieval philosopher would say anything like this: “I study the first causes of things, and am therefore a metaphysician. My colleague Dr McZed denies that there are any first causes and is therefore not a metaphysician; she is rather, an anti-metaphysician. In her view, metaphysics is a science with a non-existent subject-matter, like astrology.” This feature of the modern conception of metaphysics is nicely illustrated by a statement of Sartre's (Sartre (1949), p. 139): “I do not think myself any less a metaphysician in denying the existence of God than Leibniz was in affirming it.” (It is instructive to compare this statement with Aristotle's thesis that first philosophy is unlike the other sciences in that it must prove the existence of its subject-matter. Cf. Loux (2006b).) And an anti-metaphysician in the modern sense is not a philosopher who denies that there are objects of the sorts that an earlier philosopher might have said formed the subject-matter of metaphysics (first causes, things that do not change, universals, substances, …), but rather a philosopher who denies the legitimacy of the question whether there are objects of those sorts.

In addition to these three topics—the nature of being; the first causes of things; things that do not change—(the latter two being understood as including attempts to show that there are no first causes or things that do not change), the topics that fall under the “old” or “Aristotelian/Medieval” conception of metaphysics, we must recognize attention to a large range of “new” or “post-Medieval” topics as no less the proper business of metaphysics than these three. (Many of these topics were well known to Aristotle and the Medievals, but they would not have classified them as belonging to protophilosophia or metaphysica.) Before we turn to these topics, however, we must consider a topic that occupies an intermediate position between them and the topic “the nature of being”. (It will be observed that many of the objects that figure in various philosophical theories that pertain to this intermediate topic are supposed to be changeless—but not first causes, since, as Aristotle noted, they are causally inactive.) We may call this topic:

2.1 The categories of being

We human beings sort things into various classes. And we generally suppose that the classes into which we sort things are rarely if ever without some kind of “internal unity.” In this respect they differ from sets in the strict sense of the word. (And no doubt in others. It would seem, for example, that we think of the classes we sort things into—biological species, say—as comprising different members at different times.) The classes into which we sort things are in most cases “natural” classes, classes whose membership is in some important sense “uniform,” — “kinds.” We shall here attempt no account or definition of “natural class.” Examples must suffice. There are certainly sets whose members do not make up natural classes: a set that contains all dogs but one, and a set that contains all dogs and exactly one cat do not correspond to natural classes in anyone's view. And it is very tempting to suppose that there is a sense of “natural” in which dogs make up a natural class, to suppose that in dividing the world into dogs and non-dogs, we “cut reality at the joints.” It is, however, a respectable philosophical thesis that the idea of a natural class cannot survive philosophical scrutiny. If that respectable thesis is true, the topic “the categories of being” is a pseudo-topic. Let us simply assume that the respectable thesis is false and that things fall into various natural classes—hereinafter, simply classes.

Some of the classes into which we sort things are more comprehensive than others: all dogs are animals, but not all animals are dogs; all animals are living organisms, but not all living organisms are animals … . Now the very expression “sort things into classes” suggests that there is a most comprehensive class: the class of things, the class of things that can be sorted into classes. But is this so?—and if it is so, are there classes that are “just less comprehensive” than this universal class? If there are, can we identify them?—and are there a vast (perhaps even an infinite) number of them, or some largish, messy number like forty-nine, or some small, neat number like seven or four? Let us call any such “just less comprehensive” classes the categories of being or the ontological categories. (The former term, if not the latter, presupposes a particular position on one question about the nature of being: that everything is, that the universal class is the class of beings, the class of things that are. It thus presupposes that Meinong was wrong to say that “there are things of which it is true that there are no such things.”)

The topic “the categories of being” is intermediate between the topic “the nature of being” and the topics that fall under the post-Medieval conception of metaphysics for a reason that can be illustrated by considering the problem of universals. (The problem of universals is the first of several philosophical problems we shall consider in some detail. It should be noted that our purpose is not to discuss these problems “for their own sake.” We are rather concerned with the classification of these problems as metaphysical problems—with what makes them metaphysical problems and not philosophical problems of some other sort.)

Universals, if they indeed exist, are, in the first instance, things like “whiteness” or “ductility” (properties or qualities or attributes), things supposedly universally “present in” the members of classes of things—and things like “being to the north of” (relations) that are supposedly universally present in the members of classes of sequences of things. “In the first instance”: it may be that other things than qualities and relations are universals, although qualities and relations are the items most commonly put forward as examples of universals. It may be that the novel War and Peace is a universal, a thing that is in some mode present in each of the many tangible copies of the novel. It may be that the word ‘horse’ is a universal, a thing that is present in each of the many audible utterances of the word. And it may be that natural classes or kinds are themselves universals—it may be that there is such a thing as “the horse” or the species Equus caballus, distinct from its defining attribute “being a horse” or “equinity,” and in some sense “present in” each horse. (Perhaps some difference between the attribute “being a horse” and the attribute “being either a horse or a kitten” explains why the former is the defining attribute of a kind and the latter is not. Perhaps the former attribute exists and the latter does not; perhaps the former has the second-order attribute “naturalness” and the latter does not; perhaps the former is more easily apprehended by the intellect than the latter.)

The thesis that universals exist—or at any rate “subsist” or “have being”—is variously called ‘realism’ or ‘Platonic realism’ or ‘platonism’. (All three terms are objectionable. Aristotle, as we shall see, believed in the reality of universals, but it would be at best an oxymoron to call him a platonist or a Platonic realist. And ‘realism’ tout court has served as a name for a variety of philosophical theses.) The thesis that universals do not exist—do not so much as subsist; have no being of any sort—is generally called ‘nominalism’. (This term, too is objectionable. At one time, those who denied the existence of universals were fond of saying things like: “There is no such thing as ‘the horse’: there is only the name [nomen, gen. nominis] ‘horse’, a mere flatus vocis [puff of sound].” Present-day “nominalists,” however, are aware, if earlier nominalists were not, that if the phrase ‘the name “horse” ’ designated an object, the object it designated would itself be a universal or something very like one. It would not be a mere puff of sound but would rather be what was common to the many puffs of sound that were its “tokens.”)

The old debate between the nominalists and the realists—let us settle on this term—continues to the present day. In the works of some recent authors, this debate is conducted in terms that are similar to those that figured in Medieval and early modern debates about the reality of universals. (See, for example, Armstrong (1989), and most of the essays contained in Part I of Loux (2001).) But a new twist was added to the old debate in W. V. Quine's mid-twentieth-century writings on “ontological [ontic] commitment.” (Quine (1948) and Ch. VII of Quine (1960).) Quine made a very simple observation that has had far-reaching consequences for the old debate. The observation was this. If our best scientific theories are recast in the “canonical notation of (first-order) quantification” (in sufficient depth that all the inferences that users of these theories will want to make are valid in first-order logic), then many of these theories, if not all of them, will have as a logical consequence the existential generalization on a predicate F such that F is satisfied only by objects whose existence is incompatible with nominalism. It would seem, therefore, that our best scientific theories “carry ontological commitment” to objects whose existence is denied by nominalism. (These objects may not be universals in the classical sense. They may, for example, be sets.) The meaning of this abstract statement may be illustrated by an example. Consider the simple theory, ‘There are homogeneous objects, and the mass of a homogeneous object in grams is the product of its density in grams per cubic centimeter and its volume in cubic centimeters’. A typical “recasting” of this theory in the canonical notation of quantification is:

x Hx & ∀x (HxMx = Dx × Vx),

(‘Hx’: ‘x is homogeneous’; ‘Mx’: ‘the mass of x in grams’; ‘Dx’: ‘the density of x in grams per cubic centimeter’; ‘Vx’: ‘the volume of x in cubic centimeters’.) A first-order logical consequence of this “theory” is

xyz (x = y × z)

That is: there exists at least one thing that is a product (at least one thing that, for some x and some y is the product of x and y). And a “product” must be a number, for the operation “product of” applies only to numbers. Our little theory, at least if it is “recast” in the way shown above, is therefore, in a very obvious sense, “committed” to the existence of numbers. It would seem, therefore, that a nominalist cannot consistently affirm that theory. (In this example, the role played by ‘the predicate F’ in the abstract statement of Quine's “observation” is played by the predicate ‘is a product’.)

Most realists suppose that universals constitute one of the categories of being. This supposition could certainly be disputed without absurdity. Perhaps there is a “natural” class of things to which all universals belong but which contains other things as well (and is not the class of all things). Perhaps, for example, numbers and propositions are not universals, and perhaps numbers and propositions and universals are all members of a class of “abstract objects,” a class that some things do not belong to. Or perhaps there is such a thing as “the whiteness of the Taj Mahal” and perhaps this object and the universal “whiteness”—but not the Taj Mahal itself—both belong to the class of “properties.” Let us call such a class—a proper subclass of an ontological category, a natural class that is neither the class of all things nor one of the ontological categories—an ontological sub-category. It may indeed be that universals make up a sub-category of being and are members of the category of being “abstract object.” But few if any philosophers would suppose that universals were members of forty-nine sub-categories—much less of a vast number or an infinity of sub-categories. Most philosophers who believe in the reality of universals would want to say that universals, if they do not constitute an ontological category, at least constitute one of the “higher” sub-categories. If dogs form a natural class, this class is—by the terms of our definition—an ontological sub-category. And this class will no doubt be a subclass of many sub-categories: the genus canis, the class (in the biological sense) mammalia, …, and so through a chain of sub-categories that eventually reaches some very general sub-category like “substance” or “material object.” Thus, although dogs may compose an ontological sub-category, this sub-category—unlike the category “universal”—is one of the “lower” ones. These reflections suggest that the topic “the categories of being” should be understood to comprehend both the categories of being sensu stricto and their “immediate” sub-categories. (Let us adopt this suggestion. In the sequel, we shall use the phrase ‘the topic “the categories of being”’ as shorthand for the admittedly vague phrase ‘the topic “the categories of being and their higher sub-categories”’.)

Does the topic “the categories of being” belong to metaphysics in the “old” sense? A case can be made for saying that it does, since the problem of universals falls under that topic and a case can be made for saying that the problem of universals belongs to metaphysics in the old sense. That case rests on the fact that Plato's theory of forms (universals, attributes) is a recurrent theme in Aristotle's Metaphysics. In Metaphysics, two of Plato's central theses about the forms come in for vigorous criticism: (i) that things that would, if they existed, be “inactive” (the forms) could be the primary beings, the “most real” things, and (ii) that the attributes of things exist “separately” from the things whose attributes they are. We shall be concerned only with (ii). In the terminology of the Schools, that criticism can be put this way: Plato wrongly believed that universals existed ante res (prior to objects); the correct view is that universals exist in rebus (in objects). It is because this aspect of the problem of universals—whether universals exist ante res or in rebus—is discussed at length in Metaphysics, that a strong case can be made for saying that the problem of universals falls under the old conception of metaphysics. (And the question whether universals, given that they exist at all, exist ante res or in rebus is as controversial in the twenty-first century as it was in the thirteenth century and the fourth century B.C.) If we do decide that the problem of universals belongs to metaphysics on the old conception, then, since we have “liberalized” the old conception by applying to it the “modern” rule that the denial of a metaphysical position is to be regarded as a metaphysical position, we shall have to say that the question whether universals exist at all is a metaphysical question under the old conception—and that nominalism is therefore a metaphysical thesis.

There is, however, a case to made against classifying the problem of universals as a problem of metaphysics in the (liberalized) old sense, for there is more to the problem of universals than the question whether universals exist and the question whether, if they do exist, their existence is ante res or in rebus. Many of them are questions that Aristotle did not consider in Metaphysics. (He discussed some of them in the Organon—particularly Categories—and others he did not discuss at all.) In addition to questions about universals “in themselves,” the problem of universals comprehends questions about the relation between universals (if such there be) and the things that are not universals, the things usually called particulars. One might therefore plausibly contend that only one part of the problem of universals (the part that pertains to the existence and nature of universals) belongs to metaphysics in the old sense.

On the current conception of metaphysics, however, it is not possible to assign only one part of the problem of universals to metaphysics. Philosophers have for a long time seen problems about the existence and nature of universals (on the one hand) and their relation to non-universals (on the other) as aspects of one problem. At one time, a philosopher might have said, “The universal ‘doghood’ is a thing that does not change. Therefore, questions about its nature belong to metaphysics, the science of things that do not change. But dogs are things that change. Therefore, questions concerning the relation of dogs to doghood do not belong to metaphysics.” No modern philosopher would divide philosophical topics that way—not even if he or she believed that doghood existed and was a thing that did not change. A modern philosopher—if that philosopher concedes that there is any problem that can properly be called ‘the problem of universals’—will see the problem of universals as a problem properly so called, as a single problem, a problem having the kind of internal unity that leads philosophers to speak of “a” philosophical problem. A modern philosopher will thus be unwilling to say that one part of the problem belongs to one division of philosophy and another part to some other division. And the same point applies to the topic “the categories of being”: every philosopher who is willing to say that ‘What are the categories of being?’ is a meaningful question will assign every aspect of that question to metaphysics.

Let us consider some aspects of the problem of universals—and, more generally, of the topic “the categories of being”—that concern changing things. (That is, that concern particulars—for even if there are particulars that do not change, most of the particulars that figure in discussions of the problem of universals as examples are things that change.) Let us consider two white particulars—the Taj Mahal, say, and the Washington Monument. And let us suppose that both these particulars are white in virtue of (i.e., their being white consists in) their bearing some one, identifiable relation to the universal “whiteness.” Let us suppose that we are able to single out this relation by some sort of act of intellectual attention or abstraction, and that (having done so) we have given it the name “falling under” All white things and only white things fall under whiteness, and falling under whiteness is what it is to be white. (We pass over many questions that would have to be addressed if we were discussing the problem of universals “for its own sake.” For example, both blueness and redness are spectral color-properties, and whiteness is not. Does this fact imply that “being a spectral color-property” is, as one might say, a second-order universal? If so, does blueness “fall under” this universal in the same sense as the sense in which a copy of Philosophical Studies falls under blueness?)

Now what can we say about this relation, this “falling under”? What is it about the two objects whiteness and the Taj Mahal that is responsible for the fact that the latter falls under the former? Is the Taj perhaps a “bundle” of universalia ante res, and does it fall under whiteness in virtue of the fact that whiteness is one of the universals that is a constituent of the bundle that it is? Or might it be that a particular like the Taj, although it indeed has universals as constituents, is something more than its universal constituents? Might it be that the Taj has a constituent that is not a universal, a “substrate,” a particular that is in some sense property-less and that holds the universal constituents of the Taj together—that “bundles” them? (If we take that position, then we may want to say, with Armstrong (Armstrong (1989), 94-96), that the Taj is a “thick particular” and its substrate a “thin particular”: a thick particular being a thin particular taken together with the properties it bundles.) Or might the Taj have constituents that are neither universals nor substrates? Might we have been too hasty when we defined “particulars” as things that are not universals? Could there perhaps be two kinds of non-universals, concrete non-universals or concrete individuals (those would be the particulars, thick or thin), and abstract non-universals or abstract individuals (“accidents” or “tropes” or “property instances”), things that are properties or qualities (and relations as well), things like “the (individual) whiteness of the Taj Mahal”? Is the Taj perhaps a bundle not of universals but of accidents? Or is it composed of a substrate and a bundle of accidents? And we cannot neglect the possibility that Aristotle was right and that universals exist only in rebus. If that is so, we must ask what the relation is between the matter that composes a particular and the universals that inhere in it—that inhere simultaneously in “this” matter and in “that” matter.

The series of questions that was set out in the preceding paragraph was introduced by the observation that the problem of universals comprehended not only questions about the existence and nature of universals but questions about how universals are related to the particulars that fall under them. It will be observed that many of the theories that were alluded to in that series of questions could be described as theories of the “ontological structure” of non-universals. (We may oppose ontological structure to mereological structure. A philosophical question concerns the mereological structure of an object if it is a question about the relation between that object and those of its constituents that belong to the same ontological category as the object. For example, the philosopher who asks whether the Taj Mahal has a certain block of marble among its constituents essentially or only accidentally is asking a question about the mereological structure of the Taj, since the block and the building belong to the same ontological category. But the philosopher who asks whether the Taj has “whiteness” as a constituent and the philosopher who supposes that the Taj does have this property-constituent and asks, “What is the nature of this relation ‘constituent of’ that ‘whiteness’ bears to the Taj?” are asking questions about its ontological structure.)

Many philosophers have supposed that particulars fall under universals by somehow incorporating them into their ontological structure. And other philosophers have supposed that the ontological structure of a particular incorporates individual properties or accidents—and that an accident is an accident of a certain particular just in virtue of being a constituent of that particular.

It is necessary at this point to say something about the place of the topic “ontological structure” in metaphysics. Some writers do not see questions about the ontological structure of objects as making up the subject-matter of one branch of or one specialty within metaphysics, but as the primary metaphysical questions, the central questions of metaphysics in comparison with which all other metaphysical questions (if any other questions can properly be called metaphysical) are peripheral. It is a presupposition of this article that this attitude is overly restrictive, and that many philosophical questions unrelated to these questions have an equally good claim to be called metaphysical questions. To assign a central position in metaphysics to theories of ontological structure, moreover, presupposes a particular kind of theory about the relation of universals and/or accidents to particulars: that x's “falling under” or “having” F (here F may be either a universal or an accident) is identical with F's being a constituent of x. But not all theories of “falling under” or “having” see this relation as consisting in one term of the relation being a constituent of the other. It is perfectly possible to suppose that objects have no ontological structure—that the only constituents of particulars are other, smaller particulars (their parts). An advocate of ante res universals, for example, may well maintain that the property being blue is in no sense a constituent of any blue object. The relation between a blue book and the color-property being blue (this philosopher may say) is a bloodless, external, abstract, purely logical relation, a relation that could be compared, in its bloodless external abstraction, to the relation “numbers” that the number two bears to the moons of Mars and the epics of Homer. Following Nicholas Wolterstorff (1970) and Michael Loux (2006a), we may say that philosophers who contend that objects have an ontological structure are proponents of a “constituent ontology” and that philosophers who deny that objects have an ontological structure (and who are nevertheless realists about universals) are proponents of a “relational ontology.”

Advocates of the existence of ante res universals, and particularly those who deny that these universals are constituents of particulars, tend to suppose that universals “abound”—that there is not only such a universal as whiteness but such a universal as “being both white and round and either shiny or not made of silver.” Advocates of other theories of universals are almost always less liberal in the “range” of universals whose existence they will allow. The advocate of in rebus universals is unlikely to grant the existence of “being both white and round and either shiny or not made of silver,” even in the case in which there is an object that is both white and round and either shiny or not made of silver (such as a non-shiny white plastic ball).

The two topics “the categories of being” and “the ontological structure of objects” are intimately related to each other and to the problem of universals. It is not possible to propose a solution to the problem of universals that does not have implications for the topic “the categories of being.” (Even nominalism implies that at least one popular candidate for the office “ontological category” is non-existent or empty.) It is certainly possible to maintain that there are ontological categories that are not directly related to the problem of universals (“proposition,” “state of affairs,” “event,” “mere possibile”), but any philosopher who maintains this will nevertheless maintain that if there are universals they make up at least one of the higher ontological sub-categories. And one can believe that it is possible to speak of ontological structure only if one supposes that there are objects of different ontological categories. Our conclusion is that, whatever metaphysics comprehends, it must comprehend every aspect of the problem of universals and every aspect of the topics “the categories of being” and “the ontological structure of objects.” For a recent investigation of the problems that have been discussed in this section, see Lowe (2006).

We turn now to a topic that strictly speaking belongs to “the categories of being,” but which is important enough to be treated separately.

2.2 Substance

Some things (if they exist at all) are present only “in” other things: a smile, a haircut (product, not process), a hole. … Such things may be opposed to things that exist “in their own right.” Metaphysicians call the things that exist in their own right ‘substances’. Aristotle called them ‘protai ousiai’ or “primary beings.” They make up the most important of his ontological categories. Several features define protai ousiai: they are subjects of predication that cannot themselves be predicated of things (they are not universals); things exist “in” them, but they do not exist “in” things (they are not accidents like Socrates' wisdom or his ironic smile); they have determinate identities (essences). This last feature could be put this way in modern terms: if the prote ousia x exists at a certain time and the prote ousia y exists at some other time, it makes sense to ask whether x and y are the same, are numerically identical (and the question must have a determinate answer); and the question whether a given prote ousia would exist in some set of counterfactual circumstances must likewise have an answer (at least if the circumstances are sufficiently determinate—if, for example, they constitute a “possible world”). It is difficult to suppose that smiles or holes have this sort of determinate identity. To ask whether the smile Socrates smiled today is the smile he smiled yesterday (or is the smile he would have smiled if Crito had asked one of his charmingly naïve questions) can only be a question about descriptive identity.

Aristotle uses ‘(prote) ousia’ not only as a count-noun but as a mass term. (He generally writes ‘ousia’ without qualification when he believes that the context will make it clear that he means ‘prote ousia’.) For example, he not only asks questions like ‘Is Socrates a (prote) ousia?’ and ‘What is a (prote) ousia’?, but questions like ‘What is the (prote) ousia of Socrates?’ and ‘What is (prote) ousia?’ (Which question he is asking sometimes has to be inferred from the context, since there is no indefinite article in Greek.) In the count-noun sense of the term, Aristotle identifies at least some (protai) ousiai with ta hupokeimena or “underlying things.” Socrates, for example, is a hupokeimenon in that he “lies under” the in rebus universals under which he falls and the accidents that inhere in him. ‘To hupokeimenon’ has an approximate Latin equivalent in ‘substantia’, “that which stands under.” (Apparently, “to stand under” and “to lie under” are equally good metaphorical descriptions of the relations a thing bears to its qualities and accidents.) Owing both to the close association of (protai) ousiai and hupokeimena in Aristotle's philosophy and to the absence a suitable Latin equivalent of ‘ousia’ (the closest Latin analogue, ‘essentia’, a made-up Latin word formed in imitation of the real Greek word ‘ousia’, was used for another purpose), ‘substantia’ became the customary Latin translation of the count-noun ‘(prote) ousia’.

The question whether there in fact are substances continues to be one of the central questions of metaphysics. Several closely related questions are: How, precisely, should the concept of substance be understood?; Which of the items (if any of them) among those we encounter in everyday life are substances?; If there are substances at all, how many of them are there?—is there only one as Spinoza contended, or are there many as most of the rationalists supposed?; What kinds of substances are there?—are there immaterial substances, eternal substances, necessarily existent substances?

It must be emphasized that there is no universally accepted and precise definition of ‘substance’—or, alternatively, that “substance” is not a very clear concept. Depending on how one understood the word (or the concept) one might say either that Hume denied that there were any substances or that he held that the only substances (or the only substances of which we have any knowledge) were impressions and ideas. It would seem, however, that most philosophers who are willing to use the word ‘substance’ at all would deny that any of the following (if they exist) are substances:

We now proceed to topics that belong to metaphysics only in the post-Medieval sense.

3. The problems of metaphysics: the “new” metaphysics

3.1 Modality

It has long been recognized by philosophers that there is an important distinction to be made within the class of true propositions: the distinction between those that might have been false and those that could not have been false (or those that have to be true). Consider, for example, the proposition that Paris is the capital of France and the proposition that there is a prime between every number greater than 1 and its double. Both are true, but the former could have been false and the latter could not have been false.

Philosophers have, moreover, recognized that there is a corresponding distinction to be made within the class of false propositions: between those that could have been true and those that could not have been true (or those that had to be false). That there are false propositions of both kinds is also easily proved by example.

Some Medieval philosophers supposed that the fact that true propositions are of the two sorts “necessarily true” and “contingently true” (and the corresponding fact about false propositions) showed that there were two “modes” in which a proposition could be true (or false): the mode of contingency and the mode of necessity—hence the term ‘modality’. Few modern philosophers if any would regard this as a useful thing to say. In current philosophy, ‘modality’ is a mere label, a word that reflects no particular theory. It means no more than ‘pertaining to possibility and necessity’. The modality of propositions is called modality de dicto (‘dictum’ means ‘proposition’, or close enough). If modality were—and this has been a popular view—coextensive with modality de dicto, it would be at least a defensible position that the topic of modality belongs to logic rather than to metaphysics. But modality would seem to be an undeniably metaphysical topic if one admits the existence of modality de re—the modality of things. (The modality of substances, certainly, and perhaps of things in other ontological categories.) We assign modality de re to the “new metaphysics” because, although one can ask modal questions about things that do not change—God, for example, or universals—, a large proportion of the work that has been done in this area concerns the modal features of changing things, of “ordinary objects.”

Consider first the existence of things—of human beings, for example. If Sally, an ordinary human being, says, “I might not have existed,” almost everyone will take her to have stated an obvious truth. (Anyone who does not will almost certainly be a metaphysician with a theory.) And if what she has said is indeed true, then she exists contingently. That is to say, she is a contingent being: a being who might not have existed. And if there is such an idea as the idea of a contingent being—if ‘contingent being’ is a meaningful phrase—, then there would seem to be such an idea as the complement of that idea, the idea of a necessary being, the idea of a being of which it is false that it might not have existed. (Which is not to say that this idea would be a possible idea—after all, there is such an idea as “a method of trisecting the angle by Euclidian means,” but it can be shown that nothing in reality could correspond to this idea.)

Consider next the properties of things. Like the existence of things, the possession of properties by things is subject to modal qualification. If Sally, who speaks English, says, “I might have spoken only French,” almost everyone will take that statement to be no less obviously true than her statement that she might not have existed. And if what she has said is indeed true, then “speaking English” is a property that she has only contingently or (the more usual word) only accidentally. And if there is such an idea as “having a property accidentally,” there is such an idea as having a property but not having it accidentally: the idea of having a property essentially. (A thing has a property essentially if it could not exist without having that property.) The examples that philosophers have offered of a thing's having a property essentially tend to be controversial, but this is largely because the most plausible examples of a certain object's possessing a property essentially are only as plausible as the thesis that that object possesses those properties at all. For example, if Sally is a physical object, as physicalists suppose, then it is very plausible for them to suppose further that she is essentially a physical object—but it is controversial whether they are right to suppose that she is a physical object. And, of course, the same thing can be said, mutatis mutandis, concerning dualists and the property of being a non-physical object. It would seem, however, that Sally is either essentially a physical object or essentially a non-physical object. And many would find it plausible to suppose that (whether she is physical or non-physical) she has the property “not being a poached egg” essentially.

The most able and influential enemy of modality (both de dicto and de re) was W. V. Quine, who vigorously defended both of the following theses: That modality de dicto can be understood only in terms of the concept of analyticity (a problematical concept in his view), and that modality de re cannot be understood in terms of analyticity and therefore cannot be understood at all. If modality de re makes any sort of sense, Quine contended ((1960) 199-200), cyclists must be regarded as essentially bipedal—for ‘Cyclists are bipedal’ would be regarded as an analytic sentence by those who believe in analyticity—, and mathematicians as accidentally bipedal (‘Mathematicians are bipedal’ is not analytic by anyone's lights). What then, Quine proceeded to ask, of someone who is both a mathematician and a cyclist?—is that person bipedal essentially or only accidentally? Most philosophers are now convinced, however, that Quine's “mathematical cyclist” argument has been adequately answered by Saul Kripke (1972) and Alvin Plantinga (1974) and various other defenders of modality de re. (Plantinga pointed out, moreover, that if modality de re makes sense, then modality de dicto certainly makes sense as well: a necessarily true proposition is a proposition that has the property “truth” essentially.)

The arguments of Kripke and Plantinga in defense of modality are paradigmatically metaphysical (except insofar as they directly address Quine's linguistic argument). Both turn on the concept of a possible world. Leibniz was the first philosopher to use ‘possible world’ as a philosophical term of art, but Kripke's and Plantinga's use of the phrase is different from his. For Leibniz, a possible world was a possible creation: God's act of creation consists in his choosing one possible world among many to be the one world that he creates—the “actual” world. For Kripke and Plantinga, however, a possible world is a possible “whole of reality.” For Leibniz, God and his actions “stand outside” all possible worlds. For Kripke and Plantinga, no being, not even God, could stand outside the whole system of possible worlds. A Kripke-Plantinga (KP) world is an abstract object of some sort. Let us suppose that a KP world is a possible state of affairs (this is Plantinga's idea; Kripke says nothing so definite). Consider any given state of affairs; let us say, Socrates' being snub-nosed. This state of affairs obtains, since Socrates was snub-nosed. By contrast, the state of affairs “Socrates' having a long straight nose” does not obtain. The latter state of affairs does, however, exist, for there is such a state of affairs. (Obtaining thus stands to states of affairs as truth stands to propositions: although the proposition that Socrates has a long straight nose is not true, there nevertheless is such a proposition.) The state of affairs x is said to include the state of affairs y if it is impossible for x to obtain and y not to obtain. If it is impossible for both x and y to obtain, then each precludes the other. A possible world is simply a possible state of affairs that for every state of affairs x either includes or precludes x, and the actual world is the one such state of affairs that obtains.

Having the concept of a possible world at our disposal, we may define any modal concept. For example, a necessarily true proposition is a proposition that would be true no matter what possible world was actual. Socrates is a contingent being if there is some possible world such that he would not exist if that world were actual, and he has the property “being human” essentially if every possible world that includes his existence also includes his being human. Kripke and Plantinga have greatly increased the clarity of modal discourse (and particularly of modal discourse de re), but at the expense of introducing a modal ontology, an ontology of possible worlds.

Theirs is not the only modal ontology on offer, however. The modal ontology of David Lewis (Lewis (1986)) stands in stark opposition to the KP modal ontology. Lewis's modal ontology also appeals to objects called possible worlds, but these “worlds” are concrete objects. What most of us call the universe is just exactly what Lewis calls “the actual world.” Non-actual worlds are other universes, “non-actual” only in that we are not among their inhabitants, for two “worlds” share no part. (There is, Lewis contends, a vast array of non-actual “worlds,” an array that contains at least those worlds that are generated by an ingenious “principle of recombination,” a principle that can be stated without the use of modal language ((1986), 87).) For Lewis, ‘actual’ is an indexical term: when I speak of the actual world, I refer to the world of which I am an inhabitant—and so for any speaker who is “in” (who is a part of) any world.

In the matter of modality de dicto, Lewis's theory proceeds in a manner that is at least parallel to the KP theory: there could be flying pigs if there are flying pigs in some possible world (if some world has flying pigs as parts). But the case is otherwise with modality de re. Since every ordinary object is in only one world, Lewis must either say that each such object has all its properties essentially or else adopt a treatment of modality de re that is not parallel to the KP treatment. He chooses the latter alternative. Although Socrates is in only the actual world, Lewis holds, he has “counterparts” in some other worlds, objects that play the role in those worlds that he plays in this world. If all Socrates' counterparts are human, then we may say that he is essentially human. If one of Hubert Humphrey's counterparts won (the counterpart of) the 1968 presidential election, it is correct to say of Humphrey that he could have won that election.

In addition to the obvious stark ontological contrast between the two theories, they differ in two important ways in their implications for the philosophy of modality. First, if Lewis is right, then modal concepts can be defined in terms of paradigmatically non-modal concepts, since “world” and all the Lewis's other technical terms can be defined using only ‘is spatio-temporally related to’, ‘is a part of’ and the vocabulary of set theory. For Kripke and Plantinga, however, modal concepts are sui generis, indefinable or having only definitions that appeal to other modal concepts. Secondly, Lewis's theory implies a kind of anti-realism concerning modality de re. This is because there is no one relation that is the counterpart relation, for there are various ways or respects in which one could say that objects in two worlds “play the same role” in their respective worlds. Socrates, therefore, may well have non-human counterparts “under” one counterpart relation and no non-human counterparts under another. And the choice of a counterpart relation is a pragmatic or interest-relative choice. But on the KP theory, it is an entirely objective question whether Socrates fails to be human in some world in which he exists: the answer must be Yes or No and is independent of human choices and interests.

Whatever one may think of these theories when one considers them “in their own right” (as theories of modality, as theories with various perhaps objectionable ontological commitments), one must concede that they are paradigmatically metaphysical theories. They bear witness to the “resurgence” of metaphysics in analytical philosophy in the last third of the twentieth century.

3.2 Problems of space and time

Long before the general theory of relativity represented space and time as aspects of or abstractions from a single entity, spacetime, philosophers saw space and time as intimately related. (A glance through any dictionary of quotations suggests that the philosophical pairing of space and time reflects a natural, pre-philosophical tendency: “Had we but world enough, and time …”; “Dwellers all in time and space.”) Kant, for example , treated space and time in his Transcendental Aesthetic as things that should be explained by a single, unified theory. And his theory of space and time, revolutionary though it may have been in other respects, was in this respect typical of philosophical accounts of space and time. Whatever may be the source of the conviction of philosophers that space and time are two members of a “species” (and the only two members of that species), they certainly raise similar philosophical questions. It can be asked whether space extends infinitely in every direction, and it can be asked whether time extends infinitely in either of the two temporal “directions.” And just as one can ask whether, if space is finite, it has an “end” (whether it is bounded or unbounded), one may ask of time whether, if it is finite, it had a beginning or will have an end or whether it might have neither, but rather be “circular” (be finite but unbounded). As one can ask whether there could be two extended objects that were not spatially related to each other, one can ask whether there could be two events that were not temporally related to each other. One can ask whether space is (a) a real thing—a substance—, a thing that exists independently of its “inhabitants,” or (b) a mere “system of relations” among those inhabitants. And one can ask the same question about time.

It has also been generally recognized by philosophers that time raises philosophical questions that have no spatial analogues—or at least no obvious and uncontroversial analogues. There are, for example, questions about the ground of various “asymmetries” between the past and the future—why is our knowledge of the past better than our knowledge of the future?; why do we regard an unpleasant event that is about to happen differently from the way we regard an unpleasant event that has recently happened? There is the question whether the past and the future are “real” in the same sense as that in which the present is real. There is the question of “temporal passage”—the question whether the apparent “movement” of time (or the apparent movement of ourselves and the objects of our experience through or in time) is a real feature of the world or some sort of illusion.

It is true, and less often remarked on, that space raises philosophical questions that have no temporal analogues—or at least no obvious and uncontroversial analogues. Why, for example, does space have three dimensions and not four or seven? On the face of it, time is essentially one-dimensional and space is not essentially three-dimensional. It would seem, however, that all the metaphysical problems about space that have no temporal analogues—the “problem of incongruous counterparts,” for example—depend on the fact that space, unlike time, has more than one dimension. (The problem of incongruous counterparts can be raised even for objects in one-dimensional space if those objects are assumed to have non-topological but local properties such as color, or if objects may be non-connected, i.e. “not in one piece.”) It is less clear whether the problems about time that have no spatial analogues are connected with the one-dimensionality of time.

There are, moreover, metaphysical problems about things in time that have at best only very weak spatial analogues, particularly the problem of the identity of things “across time” and its important special case, the problem of personal identity across time. Problems of identity across time, moreover, raise questions about the extent to which the way in which things in time are related to time is similar to the way in which things in space are related to space; for example, are temporal things extended in time in a way that is at all like the way in which they are extended in space?—and if they are, does their being temporally extended imply they have “temporal parts”?

Finally, one can raise questions about whether space and time are real at all—and, if they are real, to what extent (so to speak) they are real. Might it be that space and time are not constituents of reality as God perceives reality but nevertheless “well-founded phenomena” (as Leibniz held)? Was Kant right when he denied spatial and temporal features to “things as they are in themselves”?—and right to contend that space and time are “forms of our intuition”? Or was McTaggart's position the right one: that space and time are wholly unreal? (For a selection of readings on the metaphysical problems of space and time, see van Inwagen and Zimmerman (1998), 67-219.)

The positions on the reality of space and time alluded to in the preceding paragraph point to another sort of difference between modern metaphysics and Medieval-Aristotelian metaphysics. This difference is not a difference in underlying conceptions of the subject-matter of metaphysics but consists rather in a different conception of the sort of conclusion that it is permissible for a metaphysician to come to. Aristotle and most of the Medievals took it for granted that, at least in its most fundamental aspects, the ordinary person's picture of the world is “correct as far as it goes.” But many post-Medieval metaphysicians have refused to take this for granted. Some of them, in fact, have been willing to defend the thesis that the world is very different from, perhaps radically different from, the way people thought it was before they began to reason philosophically—to defend even the thesis that all or most of our ordinary beliefs are illusory. (Not that this conception of the kind of truths that metaphysics can demonstrate is a modern invention; it is simply a recovery of or a reversion to a pre-Aristotelian conception of a “permissible metaphysical conclusion,” a conception that is illustrated by Zeno's arguments against the reality of motion and Plato's Allegory of the Cave.)

If these problems about space and time belong to metaphysics only in the post-Medieval sense, they are nevertheless closely related to questions about first causes and universals. First causes are generally thought by those who believe in them to be eternal and non-local. God, for example—both the impersonal God of Aristotle and the personal God of Medieval Christian, Jewish, and Muslim philosophy—is generally said to be eternal, and the personal God is said to be omnipresent. To say that God is eternal is to say either that he is everlasting or that he is somehow outside time. And this raises the metaphysical question whether it is possible for there to be a being—not a universal or an abstract object of some other sort, but an active substance—that is everlasting or non-temporal. An omnipresent being is a being that does not occupy any region of space (not even the whole of it, as the luminiferous ether of 19th-century physics would if it existed), and whose causal influence is nevertheless equally present in every region of space (unlike universals, to which the concept of causality does not apply). The doctrine of divine omnipresence raises the metaphysical question whether it is possible for there to be a being with this feature. Ante res universals are said by some of their proponents (precisely those who deny that universals are constituents of particulars) to have no relations to space and time but “vicarious” ones: the ante res universal “whiteness” may be said to be present where each white particular is, but only in a way analogous to the way in which the number two is present where each pair of spatial things is. But it is doubtful whether this is a position that is possible for a metaphysician who says that a white thing is a bundle composed of whiteness and various other universals. Those who believe in the existence of in rebus universals are fond of saying, or have been in recent years, that these universals (“immanent universals” is a currently popular name for them) are “multiply located”—“wholly present” at each place at which the things that fall under them are present. And by this they certainly do not mean that whiteness is present in many different regions of space only vicariously, only as a number might be said to be present wherever there are things in that number, only in virtue of bearing the non-spatial relation “being had by” to a multitude of particulars each of which is present in a single region of space. All theories of universals, therefore, raise questions about how things in various ontological categories are related to space. And all these questions have temporal analogues.

3.3 Problems about the mental and the physical

If it is natural both to pair and to oppose time and space, it is also natural to pair and to oppose the mental and the physical. The modern identity theory according to which all mental events or states are a special sort of physical event or state does not represent a natural tendency of the human mind. Perhaps the reason for this is epistemological: whether our thoughts and sensations are physical or not, the kind of awareness we have of them is of a radically different sort from the kind of awareness we have of the flight of a bird or of a flowing stream, and it seems to be natural to infer that the objects of the one sort of awareness are radically different kinds of object from the objects of the other. That the inference is logically invalid is (as is so often the case) no barrier to its being made. Whatever the reason may be, philosophers have generally (but not universally) supposed that the world of concrete particulars can be divided into two radically different realms, the mental and the material. (As the twentieth century passed and physical theory rendered “matter” an increasingly problematical concept, it became increasingly common to say “the mental and the physical.”) If one takes this view of things, one faces philosophical problems that modern philosophy assigns to metaphysics. Prominent among them are problems about causation. If thoughts and sensations belong to an immaterial or non-physical portion of reality—if, for example, they are changes in immaterial or non-physical substances—, how can they have effects in the physical world? How, for example, can a decision or act of will cause a movement of a human body? How, for that matter, can changes in the physical world have effects in the non-physical part of reality? If one's feeling pain is a non-physical event, how can a physical injury to one's body cause one to feel pain? Both questions have troubled “two realm” philosophers—or dualists to give them their more usual name—, but the former has troubled them more, since modern physics is founded on principles that assert the conservation of various physical quantities. If a non-physical event causes a change in the physical world—dualists are repeatedly asked—, does that not imply that physical quantities like energy or momentum fail to be conserved in any physically closed causal system in which that change occurs? And does that not imply that every voluntary movement of a human body involves a violation of the laws of physics—that is to say, a miracle?

A wide range of metaphysical theories have been generated by the attempts of dualists to answer these questions. Some have been less than successful for reasons that are not of much intrinsic philosophical interest. C. D. Broad, for example, proposed (Broad (1925), 103-113) that the mind affects the body by momentarily changing the electrical resistance of certain synapses in the brain, (thus diverting various current pulses, which literally “follow the path of least resistance,” into paths other than those they would have taken). And this, he supposed, would not imply a violation of the principle of the conservation of energy. But it seems impossible to suppose that an agent could change the electrical resistance of a physical system without expending energy in the process, for to do this would necessitate changing the physical structure of the system, and that implies changing the positions of bits of matter on which forces are acting (think of turning the knob on a rheostat or variable resistor: one must expend energy to do this). If this example has any philosophical interest it is this: it illustrates the fact that it is impossible to imagine a way for a non-physical thing to affect the behavior of a (classical) physical system without violating a conservation principle.

The various dualistic theories of the mind treat the “interaction problem” in different ways. The theory called dualistic interactionism does not, of itself, have anything to say about the problem—although its various proponents (Broad, for example) have proposed solutions to it. The theory called occasionalism simply concedes that the “local” counterfactual dependence of the behavior of a physical system on a non-physical event requires a miracle. The theory of the pre-established harmony, which substitutes “global” for local counterfactual dependence of voluntary physical movements on the mental states of agents, avoids problems with conservation principles—but secures this advantage at a great price. (Like occasionalism, it presupposes theism, and, unlike occasionalism, it entails either that free will does not exist or that free will is compatible with determinism.) The theory called epiphenomenalism simply denies that the metal can affect the physical, and contents itself with an explanation of why the mental appears to affect the physical.

In addition to these dualistic theories, there are monistic theories, theories that dissolve the “interaction problem” by denying the existence of either the physical or the non-physical: idealism and physicalism. (Present-day philosophers for the most part prefer the term ‘physicalism’ to the older term ‘materialism’ for reasons noted above.) Most current work in the philosophy of mind presupposes physicalism, and it is generally agreed that a physicalistic theory that does not simply deny the reality of the mental (that is not an “eliminativist” theory), raises metaphysical questions. Such a theory must, of course, find a place for the mental in a wholly physical world, and such a place exists only if mental events and states are certain special physical events and states. The three most important metaphysical questions raised by theories of this sort—“identity theories”—are: Granted that all particular mental events or states are identical with particular physical events or states, can it also be that some or all mental universals (‘event-types’ and ‘state-types’ are the usual terms) are identical with physical universals?; Does physicalism imply that mental events and states cannot really be causes (does physicalism imply a kind of epiphenomenalism)?; Can a physical thing have non-physical properties—might it be that mental properties like “thinking of Vienna” or “perceiving redly” are non-physical properties of physical organisms? This last question, of course, raises a more basic metaphysical question, ‘What is a non-physical property?’. And all forms of the identity theory raise fundamental metaphysical questions, ontological questions, questions like, ‘What is an event?’ and ‘What is a state?’. Metaphysicians have been heard to complain that philosophers of mind have not paid sufficient attention to these fundamental metaphysical questions.

3.4 The problem of free will

This problem, which was certainly known to the ancients, became especially acute in the seventeenth century with the invention of celestial mechanics, which first gave philosophers a certain picture of a way the world might be: it might be a world whose future states were entirely determined by the past and the laws of nature (of which Newton's laws of motion and law of universal gravitation served as paradigms). In the nineteenth century the thesis that the world was indeed this way came to be called ‘determinism’. The problem of free will can be stated as a dilemma. If determinism is true, there is only one physically possible future. But then how can anyone ever have acted otherwise? For, as Carl Ginet has said (1990, 103), our freedom can only be the freedom to add to the given past; and if determinism holds, then there is only one way that the given—the actual—past can be “added to.” But if determinism does not hold, if there are alternative physically possible futures, then which one comes to pass must be a mere matter of chance. And if it is a mere matter of chance whether I lie or tell the truth, how can it be up to me whether I lie or tell the truth? Unless there is something wrong with one of these two arguments, the argument for the incompatibility of free will and determinism or the argument for the incompatibility of free will and the falsity of determinism, free will is impossible. The problem of free will may be identified with the problem of discovering whether free will is possible—and, if free will is possible, the problem of giving an account of free will that displays an error in one of (or both) these arguments.

For a recent account of the free-will problem, see van Inwagen (1998b). In this essay, van Inwagen defends the position that, although the modern problem of free will has its origin in philosophical reflections on the consequences of supposing the physical universe to be governed by deterministic laws, the problem cannot be evaded by embracing a metaphysic (like dualism or idealism) that supposes that agents are immaterial or non-physical.

3.5 Problems of material constitution

We may also call attention to a closely knit family of problems involving mereology and the nature of material objects. Two central notions in this family of problems are “parthood” and “constitution.” (Indeed one of this family of problems is exactly that of the relation between these two concepts: Is parthood the fundamental concept, and constitution to be defined in terms of parthood, or are the two concepts logically independent?)

One such problem is the “problem of the statue and the lump.” Consider a gold statue. Many metaphysicians contend that there is at least one material object that is spatially co-extensive with the statue, the “lump of gold.” This is easily shown, they say, by an appeal to Leibniz's Law (the principle of the non-identity of discernibles). There is a statue here and there is a lump of gold here, and—if the causal story of the statue's coming to be is of the usual sort—the lump of gold existed before the statue. And even if God has created the statue (and perforce the lump) ex nihilo and will at some point annihilate the statue (and thereby annihilate the lump), they further argue, the statue and the lump, although they exist at exactly the same times, have different modal properties: the lump has the property “can survive radical deformation” and the statue does not. Or so these metaphysicians conclude. But it has seemed to other metaphysicians that this conclusion is absurd, for it is absurd to suppose (these others say) that there could be spatially coincident physical objects that share all their “momentary” non-modal properties. Hence, the problem: What, if anything, is the flaw in the argument for the non-identity of the statue and the lump?

A second problem in this family is the “problem of Tib and Tibbles.” Tibbles is a cat. Call his tail ‘Tail’. Call “all of him but his tail” ‘Tib’. Suppose Tail is cut off—or, better, annihilated. Tibbles still exists, for a cat can survive the loss of its tail. And it would seem that Tib will exist after the “loss” of Tail, because Tib lost no part. But what will be the relation between Tib and Tibbles? Can it be identity? No, that is ruled out by the non-identity of discernibles, for Tibbles will have become smaller and Tib will remain the same size. But then, once again, we seem to have a case of spatially coincident material objects that share their momentary non-modal properties.

Both these “constitution” problems, it will be observed, turn on questions about the identities of spatially coincident objects—and, indeed, of objects that share all their (proper) parts. (A third famous problem of material constitution—the problem of the Ship of Theseus—raises questions of a different sort.) Some metaphysicians contend that the relation between the lump and the statue, on the one hand, and the relation between Tib and Tibbles, on the other, cannot be fully understood in terms of the concepts of parthood and (non-) identity, but require a further concept, a non-mereological concept, the concept of “constitution”: the pre-existent lump at a certain point in time comes to constitute the statue (or a certain quantity of gold or certain gold atoms that first constituted only the lump come to constitute them both); pre-existent Tib at a certain point in time comes to constitute Tibbles (or certain cat-flesh or certain molecules …). (Baker (2000) is a defense of this thesis.) Others contend that all the relations between the objects that figure in both problems can be fully analyzed in terms of parthood and identity.

Rea (1997) is an indispensable collection of essays on the problems of material constitution.

Both the problem of free will and the various problems of material constitution are problems that are currently seen as metaphysical problems but would once have been assigned to “physics,” to the part of philosophy that deals with change.

4. The Nature of Metaphysics

How, then is metaphysics to be defined? Is metaphysics (as metaphysics is now understood) simply a compendium of philosophical problems that cannot be assigned to epistemology or logic or ethics or aesthetics or to any of the parts of philosophy that have relatively clear definitions?

There is no entirely satisfying answer to this question. One answer to this question, Wolff's, was mentioned in Part 1: Metaphysics studies being; “general metaphysics” studies being as such; “special metaphysics” studies the being (mass term) of particular kinds of being (count noun). It was pointed out that this answer was objectionable (if for no other reason) because it was not evident that the problems of “special metaphysics” do, in any non-trivial sense, involve being. Present-day attempts to define metaphysics, however, are hardly more satisfactory. An examination of one recent account, perhaps the most detailed one available, must suffice for this article. The metaphysician Peter van Inwagen (1998a) has suggested that the essence of metaphysics consists in an attempt to describe (in a sufficiently general way) ultimate reality. (He of course attempts to give an account of “ultimate reality” and “sufficiently general way.”) But even if possible difficulties with the concepts “ultimate reality” and “sufficiently general way” are laid to one side, this suggestion faces serious problems. In the first place (unless the positivist view of science is correct: that the only business of science is to “save the appearances”), it is not clear why science, or at any rate the more theoretical parts of science, should not count as “metaphysics” by this definition. One might attempt to resolve this difficulty by appealing to some account or other of “philosophy,” and proceeding to define metaphysics as that part of philosophy that is an attempt to describe ultimate reality in a sufficiently general way. But even if the appeal to an unspecified prior account of philosophy is legitimate (such an appeal obviously rules out any attempt to understand the nature of philosophy by examining metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and the other branches of philosophy to see what they have in common), it could be objected that the proposed account makes metaphysics co-extensive with philosophy—or at least that it assigns to metaphysics many philosophical problems that most philosophers would be strongly inclined to say did not belong to metaphysics. Is epistemology not an attempt to give an account of knowledge, and is not knowledge one part or aspect of reality? And is there any reason to suppose that knowledge is somehow a significantly less “general” concept than personal identity or parthood or the ability to act otherwise? (Or if knowledge is an illusion, if knowledge belongs to appearance rather than to reality, will the statement “Knowledge is an illusion” not be one component of a description of ultimate reality—and an extremely important one at that?) Similar questions can be asked with respect to many of, if not all, the traditional sub-areas of philosophy.

These puzzles arise only in relation to the problems of the “new,” more extensive post-Medieval metaphysics. In the end, it is not evident that any useful “essence” can be ascribed to this range of problems. It is not evident that there is any account of the boundaries of post-Medieval metaphysics that is any more satisfactory than Wolff's.

5. Is Metaphysics Possible?

At least since the time of Hume, there have been those who have presented arguments for the impossibility of metaphysics (whatever metaphysics may be). This entry will examine only certain recent arguments for this conclusion.

The thesis that metaphysics is impossible comes in what might be called strong and weak forms. Let us suppose that we are confident that we are able to identify every statement as either “a metaphysical statement” or “not a metaphysical statement.” (We need not suppose that this ability is grounded in some non-trivial definition or account of metaphysics.) The strong form of the thesis is this: All metaphysical statements are meaningless. (At one time, an enemy of metaphysics might have been content to say that all metaphysical statements were false. But this is obviously not a possible thesis if the denial of a metaphysical statement must itself be a metaphysical statement.) The weak form of the thesis is this: metaphysical statements are meaningful, but human beings can never discover whether any metaphysical statement is true or false (or probable or improbable or warranted or unwarranted).

Let us briefly examine an example of the strong form of the thesis that metaphysics is impossible. The logical positivists maintained that the meaning of a (non-analytic) statement consisted entirely in the predictions it made about possible experience. They maintained, further, that metaphysical statements (which were obviously not put forward as analytic truths) made no predictions about experience. Therefore, they concluded, metaphysical statements are meaningless—or, better, the ‘statements’ we classify as metaphysical are not really statements at all: they are things that look like statements but aren't, rather as mannequins are things that look like human beings but aren't.

But (many philosophers asked) how does the logical positivist's central thesis

The meaning of a statement consists entirely in the predictions it makes about possible experience

fare by its own standards? Does this thesis make any predictions about possible experiences? Could some observation show that it was true? Could some experiment show that it was false? It would seem not. It would seem that everything in the world would look the same—like this—whether this thesis was true or false. (Will the positivist reply that the offset sentence is analytic? This reply is problematical in that it implies that the multitude of native speakers of English who reject the logical positivists' account of meaning somehow cannot see that that sentence is true in virtue of the meaning of the word ‘meaning’—which is no technical term but a word of ordinary English.) And, therefore, if the statement is true it is meaningless; or, what is the same thing, if it is meaningful, it is false. Logical positivism would therefore seem to say of itself that it is false or meaningless; it would be seem to be, to use a currently fashionable phrase, “self-referentially incoherent.”

Current advocates of “metaphysical anti-realism” also advocate a strong form of the thesis that metaphysics is impossible. Insofar as it is possible to find a coherent line of argument in the writings of any anti-realist, it is hard to see why they, like the logical positivists, are not open to a charge of self-referential incoherency. Indeed, there is much to be said for the conclusion that all forms of the strong thesis fall prey to self-referential incoherency. Put very abstractly, the case against proponents of the strong thesis may be put like this. Dr. McZed, a “strong anti-metaphysician,” contends that any piece of text that does not pass some test she specifies is meaningless (if she is typical of strong anti-metaphysicians, she will say that any text that fails the test represents an attempt to use language in a way in which language cannot be used). And she contends further that any piece of text that can plausibly be identified as “metaphysical” must fail this test. But it invariably turns out that various sentences that are essential components of McZed's case against metaphysics themselves fail to pass her test. A test-case for this very schematic and abstract refutation of all refutations of metaphysics is the very sophisticated and subtle critique of metaphysics (it purports to apply only to the kind of metaphysics exemplified by the seventeenth-century rationalists and current analytical metaphysics) recently presented in van Fraassen (2002). It is a defensible position that van Fraassen's case against metaphysics depends essentially on certain theses that, although they are not themselves metaphysical theses, are nevertheless open to many of the criticisms he brings against metaphysical theses.

The weak form of the thesis that metaphysics is impossible is this: there is something about the human mind (perhaps even the minds of all rational agents or all finite rational agents) that unfits it for reaching metaphysical conclusions in any reliable way. This idea is at least as old as Kant, but a version of it that is much more modest than Kant's (and much easier to understand) has recently been carefully presented in McGinn (1993). McGinn's argument for the conclusion that the human mind is (as a matter of evolutionary contingency, and not simply because it is “a mind”) incapable of a satisfactory treatment of a large range of philosophical questions (a range that includes all metaphysical questions), however, depends on speculative factual theses about human cognitive capacities that are in principle subject to empirical refutation and which are at present without significant empirical support.


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abstract objects | Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | categories | dualism | existence | free will | incompatibilism: arguments for | logical positivism | material constitution | mereology | nominalism: in metaphysics | ontology and ontological commitment | physicalism | Platonism: in metaphysics | properties | substance | time