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Martin Buber

First published Tue Apr 20, 2004; substantive revision Tue Jan 23, 2007

The work of the prolific essayist, translator, and editor Martin Buber (1878-1965) is predominantly dedicated to three areas: the philosophical articulation of the dialogic principle (das dialogische Prinzip), the revival of religious consciousness among the Jews (by means of the literary retelling of Hasidic tales and an innovative German translation of the Bible), and to the realization of this consciousness through the Zionist movement. Such was the power of his spoken and written word that during the First World War many young men wrote to him for guidance in difficult moral, religious, and political crises. His answers were seen as those of an authority who rose above the ideologies of the day. A man of considerable organizational talent, Buber shunned responsibility for the nascent political institutions of Zionism. Instead, he attempted to transform the Zionist movement by articulating what he saw as its unique historic mission: the realization of a Hebraic humanism (Grete Schaeder). His advocacy of a binational solution to the Jewish-Arab conflict in Palestine is widely considered to be an indication of the political utopianism Buber developed together with his friend Gustav Landauer, an aesthetic politics shaped in the anarchist and religious socialist movements of the first two decades of the twentieth century.

A selection of Buber's works, edited by him in his eighties, comprises more than four thousand pages and is divided into writings on philosophy, the Bible, Hasidism, and (published posthumously) Judaism. There are several volumes of published letters, and the Bible translation begun with Franz Rosenzweig (1886-1929) and completed after WWII is still widely used by German Christian ministers who appreciate its poetic language. A complete edition of Buber's works, edited by Paul Mendes-Flohr and Peter Schäfer, is forthcoming.

1. Biographical Background

The setting of Buber's childhood and youth was the Austro-Hungarian empire of the fin-de-siècle, the multiethnic conglomerate whose collapse in the First World War ended a thousand years of rule by Catholic princes in the West. Its cosmopolitan capital Vienna was home to late Romantic music, sophisticated theatrical productions, and psychologically perceptive literature. Among the young Buber's first publications are essays and translations into Polish of the poetry of his older peers (e.g., Arthur Schnitzler, Hugo von Hofmannsthal). In historical and cultural terms, Buber's philosophical and literary voice is best understood as related to the Viennese culture of his youth which saw the rise of radically new approaches to psychology (Otto Weininger, Sigmund Freud) and philosophy (Ludwig Wittgenstein), and where solutions to the burning social and political issues of city and empire were often expressed in grandly theatrical oratory (Lueger, Hitler) and in estheticizing rhetoric and self-inscenation (Theodor Herzl).

Buber's parents (Carl Buber and Elise née Wurgast) separated in 1882. For the next ten years, Martin lived with his paternal grandparents, Solomon and Adele Buber, in Lemberg (Lvov). Solomon, a ‘master of the old Haskala’ (Martin Buber) who called himself ‘a Pole of the Mosaic persuasion’ (Friedman [1981] p. 11), produced the first modern editions of rabbinic midrash literature yet was greatly respected even by the ultraorthodox establishment. His reputation opened the doors for Martin when he began to show interest in Zionism and Hasidic literature. The wealth of his grandparents was built on the Galician estate administered by Adele and enhanced by Solomon through mining, banking, and commerce. It provided Martin with financial security until the German occupation of Poland in 1939, at which time the estate was destroyed. Home-schooled and pampered by his grandmother, Buber became a bookish aesthete with few friends his age and the play of the imagination as his diversion. He easily absorbed local languages (Hebrew, Yiddish, Polish, German) and acquired others (Greek, Latin, French, Italian, English). German was the dominant language at home, while the language of instruction at the Franz Joseph Gymnasium was Polish. This multilingualism nourished Buber's life-long obsession with words and meanings.

In 1900, after his years of study (see below), Buber and his partner, Paula Winkler, moved to Berlin where the anarachist Gustav Landauer (1870-1919) was among their closest friends. Landauer played an important role in Buber's life when, in 1916, he criticized Buber for his public enthusiasm for the German war effort. This critique from a trusted friend had a sobering effect, triggering Buber's turn from an aestheticizing social mysticism to the philosophy of dialogue. 1916 was also the year Martin, Paula, and their two children left the big city and moved to the small town of Heppenheim, near Frankfurt on the Main where, since 1904, Buber had been employed as an editor. In Frankfurt, Buber met Franz Rosenzweig (1886-1929) with whom he was to develop a close intellectual companionship. After the war, Rosenzweig recruited Buber as a lecturer for the newly established center for Jewish adult education (Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus), he persuaded Buber to take on a widely visible lectureship in Jewish religious studies and ethics at Frankfurt University, and Rosenzweig became Buber's chief collaborator in the project, initiated by the young Christian publisher Lambert Schneider, to produce a new translation of the Bible into German. Buber lived and worked in Frankfurt until his emigration to Palestine in 1937. The remainder of his life he lived and taught mostly in Jerusalem, teaching social philosophy.

2. Zionism

Recruited by his older compatriot, the Budapest-born and Vienna-based journalist Theodor Herzl, Buber briefly edited the main paper of the Zionist party, Die Welt, but soon found a more congenial place in the ‘democratic faction’ led by Chaim Weizmann, then living in Zurich. Buber's phases of engagement in the movement's political institutions alternated with extended phases of disengagement, but he never ceased to write and speak about what he understood to be the distinctive Jewish brand of nationalism. Buber seems to have derived an important lesson from the early struggles between political and cultural Zionism for the leadership and direction of the movement. He realized that his place was not in high diplomacy and political education but in the search for psychologically sound foundations on which to heal the rift between modernist realpolitik and a distinctively Jewish theological-political tradition. Very much in keeping with the nineteenth-century Protestant yearning for a Christian foundation of the nation-state, Buber sought a healing source in the integrating powers of the religious experience.

After a hiatus of more than ten years during which Buber spoke to Jewish youth groups (most famously the Prague Bar Kokhba) but refrained from any practical involvement in Zionist politics, he reentered Zionist debates in 1916 when he began publishing the journal Der Jude which served as an open forum of exchange on any issues related to cultural and political Zionism. In 1921 Buber attended the Zionist Congress in Carlsbad as a delegate of the socialist Hashomer Hatzair (“the young guard”). In debates following violent riots in 1928 and 29 on whether to arm the Jewish settlers in Palestine Buber represented the pacifist option; in debates on immigration quotas following the 1936 Arab boycott Buber argued for demographic parity rather than trying to achieve a Jewish majority. Finally, as a member of Brit Shalom Buber argued for a bi-national rather than for a Jewish state in Palestine. At any of these stages Buber harbored no illusion about the chances of his political views to sway the majority but he believed that it was important to articulate the moral truth as one saw it rather than hiding one's true beliefs for the sake of political strategy. Needless to say, this politics of authenticity made him few friends among the members of the Zionist establishment.

3. Early Philosophical Influences

Among Buber's early philosophical influences were Kant's Prolegomena which he read at the age of fourteen, and Nietzsche's Zarathustra. Whereas Kant had a calming influence on the young mind troubled by the aporia of infinite versus finite time, Nietzsche's doctrine of “the eternal recurrence of the same” constituted a powerful negative seduction. By the time Buber graduated from Gymnasium he felt he had overcome this seduction, but Nietzsche's prophetic tone and aphoristic style are evident in Buber's subsequent writings. Between 1896 and 1899 he studied history of art, German literature, philosophy, and psychology in Vienna, Leipzig (97/98), Berlin (98/99), and Zurich (99). In Vienna he absorbed the latest literature and poetry, most importantly the oracular poetry of Stefan George which influenced him greatly, although he never became a disciple of George. In Leipzig and Berlin he developed an interest in the ethnopsychology of Wilhelm Wundt, the social philosophy of Georg Simmel, the psychiatry of Carl Stumpf, and the lebensphilosophisch approach to the humanities of Wilhelm Dilthey. In Leipzig he attended meetings of the Society for Ethical Culture (Gesellschaft für ethische Kultur), then dominated by the thought of Lasalle and Tönnies.

From his early reading of philosophical literature Buber retained some of the most basic convictions found in his later writings. In Kant he found two answers to his concern with the nature of time. If time and space are pure forms of perception, then they pertain to things only as they appear to us (i.e., to phaenomena) and not to things-in-themselves (nooumena). Thus time primarly concerns the way in which we experience the Other. But can the Other be experienced at all or is it necessarily reduced to the scope of our phenomenal knowledge, to what Buber later called the I-It relation? Yet Kant also indicated ways of meaningfully speaking of the noumenal, even though not in terms of theoretical reason. Practical reason, i.e., the categorical imperative that considers the Other as an end in itself rather than the means to an end, as well the teleological (aesthetic) judgment developed in Kant's Third Critique, seem to admit the possibility of a rational faith, a faith that resonated with Buber's feeling that the phenomenon is always the gateway to the noumenon, just as the noumenal cannot be encountered other than in the concrete phenomena. Thus Buber managed to infuse the seemingly dry Kantian distinctions with an immediate sense of reality. Before this measured view dominated Buber's thought, however, he leaned toward Nietzsche's enthusiastic endorsement of the primacy of life in its immediacy and its superiority to an Apollonian world of distance and abstraction.

4. Social Philosophy

Although his earliest writings were literary and theatrical reviews, Buber's major interest was the tension between society and community. Just as he had enlivened Kant's distinction between phenomenon and noumenon with his literary imagination, so too he transformed the value-theoretical distinction between types of social aggregation of Ferdinand Tönnies (Gesellschaft und Gemeinschaft) into a wellspring for his political speeches and writings. The political arena for his social, psychological, and educational engagement was the Zionist movement. Buber's interest in social philosophy was stimulated by his close friendship with Gustav Landauer who was also among the authors Buber recruited for the forty volume series on “Society” (Die Gesellschaft) that he edited for the Frankfurt publishing house Ruetten & Loening. As a pioneer of social thought and a student of Georg Simmel, Buber participated in the 1909 founding conference of the German sociological association. While Buber's social-psychological approach to the study and description of social phenomena was soon eclipsed by quantitative approaches, his interest in the constitutive correlation between the individual and his and her social experience remained an important aspect of his philosophy of dialogue.

5. I and Thou: The Dialogic Principle

Buber's best known work is the short philosophical essay Ich und Du (1923), first translated into English in 1937 by Ronald Gregor Smith. In the 1950's and 60's, when Buber first traveled and lectured in the USA, the essay became rather popular in the English speaking world. Since then it has been associated with the intellectual culture of the student movement's spontaneity, authenticity, and anti-establishment sentiment.

I and Thou is considered to have inaugurated “a Copernican revolution in theology (…) against the scientific-realistic attitude” (Bloch [1983], p. 42), but it has also been criticized for its reduction of fundamental human relations to just two — the I-Thou and the I-It — of which the latter appears as a mere ‘cripple’ (Franz Rosenzweig in a letter to Buber in Sept. 1922). Walter Kaufmann, who produced a second English translation of I and Thou, went further in his criticism. While he did not regard the lack of deep impact of Buber's contributions to biblical studies, Hasidism, and Zionist politics as an indication of failure, he considered I and Thou a shameful performance in both style and content. In style the book invoked “the oracular tone of false prophets” and it was ‘more affected than honest.’ Writing in a state of “irresistible enthusiasm,” Buber lacked the critical distance needed to critique and revise his own formulations. His conception of the I-It was a “Manichean insult” while his conception of the I-Thou was ‘rashly romantic and ecstatic,’ and Buber ‘mistook deep emotional stirrings for revelation.’ (Kaufmann [1983], pp. 28-33)

Buber always insisted that the dialogic principle, i.e., the duality of primal relations that he called the I-Thou and the I-It, was not a philosophical conception but a reality beyond the reach of discursive language. In the initial exuberance of making this discovery Buber briefly planned for I and Thou to serve as the prolegomenon to a five-volume work on philosophy, but he realized that, in Kaufmann's words, “he could not build on that foundation” and hence abandoned the plan. It has been argued, however, that Buber nevertheless solved the inherent “difficulty of dialogics that it reflects on, and speaks of, a human reality about which, in his own words, one cannot think and speak in an appropriate manner” (Bloch [1983] p. 62) by writing around it, inspired by one's conviction of its veracity.

The debate on the strength and weakness of I and Thou as the foundation of a system hinges on the perhaps fallacious assumption that the five-volume project Buber intended to write but soon abandoned was indeed a philosophical one. Buber's contemporaneous lectures at the Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus and at the University of Frankfurt as well as his letters to Rosenzweig indicate quite clearly that he was concerned with the development of a new approach to the study of religion (Religionswissenschaft) (cf. Schottroff) rather than with a new approach to the philosophy of religion.

6. The Vagueness of Buber's Language

The preponderance in Buber's writings of abstract nouns such as “experience,” “realization,” and “encounter,” and his predilection for utopian political programs such as anarchism, socialism, and a bi-national solution to the conflict in Palestine point to a characteristic tension in his personality. The philosopher of the “I and Thou” allowed very few people to call him by his first name; the theorist of education suffered no disturbance of his rigorous schedule by children playing in his own home; the utopian politician alienated most representatives of the Zionist establishment; and the innovative academic lecturer could hardly find a proper place in the university he had helped to create — the Hebrew University of Jerusalem. Some of the most dedicated students of this inspiring orator and writer found themselves irritated by the conflict between their master's ideas and their own attempts at putting them into practice. In the final analysis it seems as if Buber always remained the well-groomed, affected, prodigiously gifted, pampered Viennese boy whose best company were the works of his own imagination, and whose overtures to the outside world were always tainted by his enthusiasm for words and for the stylized tone of his own voice.

7. Man of Letters

Buber's wide range of interests, his literary abilities, and the general appeal of his philosophical orientation are reflected in the far flung correspondence he conducted over the course of his long life. As the editor of Die Gesellschaft Buber corresponded with Georg Simmel, Franz Oppenheimer, Ellen Key, Lou Andreas-Salomé, Werner Sombart, and many other authors. Among the poets of his time with whom he exchanged letters were Hugo von Hofmannsthal, Hermann Hesse, and Stefan Zweig. He was particularly close to the socialist novellist Arnold Zweig. With poet Chaim Nachman Bialik and novellist Sh. Y. Agnon he shared a deep interest in the revival of Hebrew literature. He published the works of the Jewish Nietzschean story-teller Micha Josef Berdiczewsky. He was a major inspiration to the young Zionist cadre of Prague Jews (Hugo Bergmann, Max Brod, Robert Weltsch) and became a major organizer of Jewish adult education in Germany where he lived until 1937. Buber's name is intimately linked with that of Franz Rosenzweig and his circle (Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy, Hans Ehrenberg, Rudolf Ehrenberg, Victor von Weizsäcker, Ernst Michel, etc.), an association that manifested itself, among others, in the journal Die Kreatur (1926-29). Der Jude and his many speeches on Judaism made Buber the central figure of the Jewish cultural renaissance of the 1920's. Younger intellectuals from highly assimilated families, such as Gershom Scholem and Ernst Simon, were awakened to a modern form of Judaism through Buber and developed their own profiles in struggling against Buber's influence. Buber also counted among his friends and admirers Christian theologians such as Karl Heim, Friedrich Gogarten, Albert Schweitzer, and Leonard Ragaz. Buber's philosophy of dialogue entered into the discourse of psychoanalysis through the work of Hans Trüb, and is today among the most popular approaches to educational theory in German-language studies of pedagogy.

8. Honors and Legacy

Among the honors Buber received are the Goethe-Prize of the City of Hamburg (1951), the Friedenspreis des Deutschen Buchhandels (Frankfurt am Main, 1953), and the Erasmus Prize (Amsterdam, 1963). Significant students who considered their own work a continuation of Buber's legacy were Nahum Glatzer (Buber's only doctoral student during his years at the university in Frankfurt, 1924-1933, later an influential teacher of Judaic Studies at Brandeis University), Akiba Ernst Simon (historian and theorist of education in Israel who first met Buber at the Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus in Frankfurt, founded by Franz Rosenzweig, and who returned from Palestine to work with Buber and Ernst Kantorowicz for the Mittelstelle für jüdische Erwachsenenbildung from 1934 until 1938), Maurice Friedman (Buber's American translator and a prolific author in his own right who introduced Buber to American religious scholarship), Walter Kaufmann (who, despite his critique of Buber's I and Thou as a poeticized philosophy helped to popularize it in the USA), and several significant Israeli scholars (Shmuel Eisenstadt, Amitai Etzioni, Jochanan Bloch) who knew Buber in his later years when he taught seminars on social philosophy and education at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem.


Works Cited


Selected Early Works By Martin Buber

Collections and Editions of Writings and Letters

Buber in English

Major Edited Volumes on Martin Buber

On Buber's Philosophy of Dialogue

Literature on Other Aspects of Buber's Life and Work

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Dilthey, Wilhelm | education, philosophy of | Lebensphilosophie | Nietzsche, Friedrich | Rosenzweig, Franz | Wundt, Wilhelm Maximilian