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Wilhelm Dilthey

First published Wed Jan 16, 2008

Wilhelm Dilthey was a German philosopher who lived from 1833-1911. He is best known for the way he distinguished between the natural and human sciences. Whereas the primary task of the natural sciences is to arrive at law-based explanations, the core task of the human sciences is the understanding of human and historical life. Dilthey's aim was to expand Kant's primarily cognitive Critique of Pure Reason into a Critique of Historical Reason that can do justice to the full scope of lived experience. Understanding the meaning of history requires both an inner articulation of the temporal structures of our own experience and the interpretation of the external objectifications of others. Dilthey's reflections on history and hermeneutics influenced thinkers in the twentieth century, especially Ortega, Heidegger, Gadamer and Ricoeur.

1. Dilthey's Life and Thought

1.1 Brief Overview of Dilthey's Philosophical Development

Wilhelm Dilthey was born in Biebrich on the Rhine in 1833, two years after Hegel had died. Dilthey's ambivalent attitude towards Hegel can provide some initial clues about his own philosophical approach. He admired the depth of Hegel's insights into the historical nature of philosophical thought, but rejected the speculative and metaphysical forms he imposed on them. Like the Neo-Kantians, Dilthey proposed a return to the more focused viewpoint of Kant, but not without also taking account of the broader perspective of later idealists like Hegel.

Dilthey characterized his own expansive view of philosophy as one of establishing integral relations to all the theoretical disciplines and historical practices that attempt to make sense of the world. Instead of demarcating the boundaries that set philosophy apart from other ways of engaging life, Dilthey conceives its critical task as articulating the overall structures that define the human spirit in general. Relatively early in his career, philosophy is defined as "an experiential science of spiritual phenomena" that seeks to "cognize the laws governing social, intellectual and moral phenomena" (Dilthey 1924a, 27). Philosophy should aim to preserve the scope that idealists such as Fichte, Schelling and Hegel once gave it, but it must do so by recapturing the Kantian rigor that had been lost and by applying it empirically.

These goals, as formulated in the inaugural lecture that Dilthey gave in 1867 on assuming his first professorship in Basel, were already prefigured in his early journals. Thus in 1859 Dilthey wrote that a new Critique of Reason must proceed on the basis of the psychological laws and impulses from which art, religion and science all derive. All intellectual systems are mere crystallizations of more generic schemata rooted in life (Dilthey 1960, 80).

The early Dilthey conceived his goal as a broadening of the critical project that would ground the human sciences as Kant had grounded the natural sciences. His hope then was that the human sciences would be able to arrive at lawful explanations just like the natural sciences. Up until at least 1887, when he published his Poetics, Dilthey was confident that inner explanations of human creativity could be arrived at. He himself formulated three laws of the imaginative metamorphosis to account for the powerful effect that poets can have on us.

But through his efforts to work out the psychology that could be appealed to by such inner explanations, Dilthey came to modify some of his basic assumptions. He increasingly stresses that our access to the human world of history is much more direct than our access to nature. Although Dilthey is still willing to accept that objects of outer experience are phenomenal, he no longer accepts the Kantian thesis that the contents of inner experience are phenomenal as well. They are real and the time that relates us to history is not merely the ideal form that Kant had exposited.

This second phase of Dilthey's thought is characterized by a stress on the reality of lived experience and on the immediate understanding of human life that this makes possible. It is in the Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology of 1894 that Dilthey works out his explanation-understanding distinction. "We explain through purely intellectual processes, but we understand through the cooperation of all the powers of the mind activated by apprehension" (Dilthey 1924a, 172). The human sciences will henceforth be conceived as primarily concerned with the understanding of the meaning of human action and interaction. Also central to this second phase of Dilthey's thought is the essay "The Origin of Our Belief in the Reality of the External World and Its Justification" of 1890. Our initial access to the external world is not inferential, but is felt as resistance to the will. The world of lived experience is not merely a theoretical representation, but is directly present to us as embodying values that are relevant to our purposes. The stress on feeling and immediacy in this second phase amounts to a rejection of Hegel's dialectical approach.

If the first phase was characterized by a search for inner explanation and the second phase by direct understanding, the third phase can be characterized by the need for interpretation. This final phase can be said to span the last decade of Dilthey's life until his death in 1911. It begins with the realization in the essay "The Rise of Hermeneutics" of 1900 that the inner intelligibility of lived experience does not yet constitute understanding. Self-understanding can only come from without. The way we express ourselves, whether in communication or in action, is a crucial intermediary in defining ourselves. Understanding can only be reliable if it proceeds through the interpretation of human objectifications. Thus we understand ourselves not through introspection but through history. It is in this last phase of his thought that Dilthey, who now occupied the chair that Hegel had once held in Berlin, revives his predecessor's theory of objective spirit as the medium relating us to the past. In 1906 Dilthey published a seminal work on the young Hegel that made use of recently discovered theological and political fragments. These unknown early fragments disclosed Hegel's historical geniality before it became constrained by the dialectical systematization that Dilthey had always objected to. Dilthey's student Herman Nohl was helpful in deciphering some of these fragments and went on to publish them as well as to gather a whole volume of Dilthey's writings on the history of German Idealism going back to Kant, Beck and Fichte and leading up to such contemporaries of Hegel as Schelling, Schleiermacher, Schopenhauer and Fries.

1.2 The Religious Background of Dilthey's Philosophy

Dilthey followed family tradition by starting his university studies at Heidelberg in theology. There he was also introduced to the philosophical systems of the idealists by Kuno Fischer. Because Fischer was accused of being a pantheist, his right to teach was withdrawn in 1853. Dilthey then moved to the University of Berlin, where he came under the influence of two of Schleiermacher's students, Friedrich von Trendelenburg and August Boeckh. Increasingly, Schleiermacher became the focus of Dilthey's interests. In 1859 he was asked to complete the editing of Schleiermacher's letters. That year the Schleiermacher Society also organized an essay competition. Dilthey's submission entitled "Schleiermacher's Hermeneutical System in Relation to Earlier Protestant Hermeneutics (1860)," was awarded the first prize and led to a second commission, namely, to write Schleiermacher's biography. The first volume of this biography was published in 1870. It places Schleiermacher not only in his theological setting but also in the context of the literary and philosophical movements astir in Berlin from 1796 to 1807. The work displays Dilthey's own expanding interests in aesthetical and philosophical issues. He also wrote his dissertation on Schleiermacher's ethics.

As a theology student, Dilthey had begun a study of many early formulations of the Christian worldview, which though never completed, continued to influence his subsequent writings. In 1860 Dilthey writes that "it is my calling to apprehend the innermost nature of religious life in history and to bring this to the attention of our times which are moved exclusively by matters of state and science." This means looking for religiosity not so much in its institutional practices and its theological doctrines as in the recesses of human experience. In a similar vein, he asserts that it is necessary to recover the "religious-philosophical worldview that is buried under the ruins of our theology and philosophy" (Dilthey 1960, 140).

Dilthey conceives religious experience as an extension of Schleiermacher's feeling of absolute dependence. It is a total experience that interweaves a feeling of dependence with an awareness of a higher life independent of nature. Religious life is also regarded as the enduring background of human intellectual development, and that development can manifest itself in mythical representation, in theological doctrine, in metaphysical conceptualization as well as in scientific theory. For Dilthey, myth is not a primitive mode of religion as is often thought, but a primitive mode of scientific theory. Whereas religious experience directly presents reality through feeling, myth represents it. Myth is not simply religious because like science it is an attempt to explain the connectedness of natural and social phenomena.

Later as he reflected on the nature of worldviews, Dilthey would occasionally return to the problem of religion. What distinguishes the religious worldview from artistic and philosophical worldviews is that it relates the visible to what is invisible, life to our awareness of death. In a striking late passage, Dilthey writes that when life is experienced religiously "according to its true nature—full of hardships and a singular blend of suffering and happiness throughout—[it] points to something strange and unfamiliar, as if it were coming from invisible sources, something <pressing in> on life from outside, yet coming from its own depths" (Dilthey 2002, 285).

The same non-transcendent perspective on religion is to be found in Dilthey's last essay, written during the final days of his life in 1911 while he was on vacation in the Dolomites. This essay on "The Problem of Religion" points to the fact that the Enlightenment has made it increasingly difficult to acknowledge the mystical features of religious experience. From its perspective, mysticism seems irrational. But according to Dilthey, Schleiermacher was able to void the charge of irrationalism by relating some core aspects of religious experience to the insights of transcendental philosophy. Instead of interpreting the mystical feeling of communion as an esoteric union with God, Schleiermacher explicates it as a general awareness that is attuned to the invisible coherence of things (Dilthey 1924b, 295). He gives a transcendental reading of what is intuited and felt in the religious mood by transforming it into a creative principle. Whereas traditionally mysticism tended to devalue our life in this world, Schleiermacher's mysticism is seen as affirming it.

2. Dilthey's Main Philosophical Works

2.1 The 1880s: Broadening the Critical Framework

Dilthey's first important theoretical work is the Introduction to the Human Sciences of 1883. The human sciences (Geisteswissenschaften) encompass both the humanities and the social sciences. They range from disciplines like philology, literary and cultural studies, religion and psychology, to political science and economics. Dilthey insists that the human sciences be related not by some logical construct on the order of a Comte or a Mill, but by means of reflective considerations that take their historical genesis into account. Dilthey writes that "the human sciences as they exist and as they are practiced according to the reason of things that were active in their history … contain three classes of assertions" (Dilthey 1989, 78). These are 1) descriptive and historical statements, 2) theoretical generalizations about partial contents and 3) evaluative judgments and practical rules. The human sciences are more obviously normative in nature than the natural sciences, where formal norms related to objective inquiry suffice. The fact that the human sciences are forced to confront substantive normative issues puts a limit on the kind of theoretical regularities that can be established in the human sciences. Given the core role that human beings play in the socio-historical world, the understanding of individuality is as important in the human sciences as are the explanations to be found through generalizations.

But the human science of psychology that deals with human beings cannot examine them apart from interactions with society. "Man as a fact prior to history and society is a fiction" (Dilthey 1989, 83). This means that psychology can be a foundational human science only if it is conceived as being primarily descriptive. Psychological explanations may still be possible, but only by starting with a non-hypothetical base that describes how our experience assimilates social and cultural features. Many human character traits are not purely psychological. Thus when we speak of a person as thrifty we are combining economic and psychological features.

Individual human beings are important for the understanding of history, but instead of making them the monadic building blocks of history, they are to be considered as points of intersection. Only a multidisciplinary approach to human history can do it justice. Qua conscious living beings, individuals are the carriers of history, but they are just as much the products of history. Individuals are not self-sufficient atoms. But neither are they to be regarded as swallowed up by encompassing communities like nations or peoples. Concepts that posit the spirit or soul of a people "are no more usable in history than is the concept of life-force in physiology" (Dilthey 1989, 92). Suspicion of overarching forces like peoples led Dilthey to distance himself from the nationalism of his contemporary Heinrich von Treitschke and to ally himself with a political gradualism reminiscent of Kant and Wilhelm von Humboldt.

Dilthey conceives of most of the human sciences as analyzing human interactions at a level that can mediate between individual initiative and communal tradition. These sciences deal with what he calls "cultural systems" and "external organizations of society." Cultural systems are associations that individuals join voluntarily for certain purposes that they can only achieve through cooperation. These systems are cultural in the widest possible sense and include all aspects of our social life. They can be political, economic, artistic, scientific or religious in nature and are not bound by local or national interests. External organizations of society by contrast are those institutional structures like a family and a state that we already are born into. Here "enduring causes bind the wills of many into a single whole" (Dilthey 1989, 94) within which relations of power, dependence and property can be established. It is important to cross-reference cultural systems and institutional organizations. Enlightenment thinkers had focused on cultural systems and their potential universal scope while overlooking how they are rooted in real life. Although Dilthey received his training from members of the Historical School, he recognized that many of them had been equally one-sided by stressing the distinctive institutional organizations that separate different peoples while ignoring the role of generalizations made possible through the analysis of cultural systems.

Dilthey aims to combine these two approaches to liberalize the historicist perspective and give it a methodological rigor. To understand the role of the law in historical life we must consider it both as a cultural system that frames legal issues in universal terms and as an external organization of society that examines them in terms of the positive laws of particular institutions. The Historical School was wrong to regard individuals as completely subordinate to the bonds of family and state and to think that the positive laws of institutions define the full reality of life. The authority of the state "encompasses only a certain portion … of the collective power of the populace" and even when state power exerts a certain preponderance it can do so only "through the cooperation of psychological impulses" (Dilthey 1989, 132).

In the preface to the Introduction to the Human Sciences, Dilthey refers to his project as a Critique of Historical Reason. We can now see that this is first of all a critique of the metaphysical thesis that there can be an overarching "universal explanatory framework for all historical facts" (Dilthey 1989, 141). If universal explanations are to be possible for history as well as for nature, then we must recognize that they are only possible for correlating partial contents of reality. The reason that the natural sciences have been so successful in discovering causal laws of nature is that they abstract from the full scope of the external world. "The conditions sought by the mechanistic explanation of nature explain only part of the contents of external reality. This intelligible world of atoms, ether, vibrations, is only a calculated and highly artificial abstraction from what is given in experience and lived experience" (Dilthey 1989, 203). The human sciences cannot similarly construct an abstract phenomenal world that focuses on physical and chemical processes and appeals to hypothetical atomic or even subatomic elements. It is incumbent on the human sciences to deal with the more complex networks of the historical world and the actual givens of human beings. Explanations that are adequate for the historical world will require an analysis of the multiple partial contents that are relevant in a particular context. According to Dilthey the human sciences must replace the abstract methodology of the natural sciences with an analytic counterpart. "Abstraction is distinguished from analysis in that the former singles out one fact and disregards the others, whereas the latter seeks to apprehend the majority of the facts that make up the factors of a complex whole" (Dilthey 1989, 433). The more facts that explanations seek to correlate, the more limited their scope must be. Thus the laws to be discovered in the human sciences will apply not to history in general, but to specific cultural systems or social organizations only. It may be possible to arrive at laws of economic growth, of scientific progress or of literary development, but not overarching historical laws of human progress.

So far Dilthey has argued for a relative independence of the human sciences vis-à-vis the better established natural sciences. However, from the transcendental perspective that considers the conditions our consciousness brings to experience, the human sciences must claim a reflective priority. The realization that the human sciences not only ascertain what is—as do the natural sciences—but also make value judgments, establish goals and prescribe rules, discloses that they are much more directly related to the full reality of lived experience. The I-think that is the basis of the conceptual cognition (Erkenntnis) of the natural sciences is preceded by a direct knowing (Wissen) that is rooted in the more inclusive thinking-feeling-willing of lived experience (see Dilthey 1989, 228, 263–68). The natural sciences merely construct a phenomenal or ideal world that abstracts from the real nexus of lived experience. The world that is formed by the human sciences is the historical-social reality in which human beings participate. It is a real world that is directly possessed or present in what Dilthey calls Innewerden. This term is best translated as "reflexive awareness" to indicate a self-givenness. Reflexive awareness is an "original form of consciousness" (Dilthey 1989, 255) that "does not place a content over against the subject of consciousness (it does not re-present it)" (Dilthey 1989, 253). Reflexive awareness involves a direct knowing that reality is present-for-me prior to there being any reflective act-content, subject-object distinctions that characterize the representational world of conceptual cognition.

The human sciences must tap the original and direct presence of this known world even when they attempt to use the intellectual tools of conceptual cognition in their analysis of partial contents. The way the historical world is represented and explained must in some way reflect the way history has been lived and understood. Understanding (Verstehen) for Dilthey is a process that employs all our capacities and is to be distinguished from pure intellectual understanding (Verstand). And if the human sciences are going to be capable of expanding the scope of our understanding beyond what is available to each of us in our particular circumstances, it must be rooted in the original fullness and richness of our lived experience.

In attempting to convey the genuine richness and depth of lived experience, the human sciences sometimes consider the contribution of the arts. Aesthetics constitutes an important cultural system in that it can provide a sense of how the arts can contribute to human understanding in general. Dilthey's Poetics of 1887 represents an effort to develop certain psychological concepts to explain the workings of the poetic imagination. Even in ordinary life, the images we extract from experience are subject to metamorphosis. With time all our images are transformed, for "the same image can no more return than the same leaf can grow back on a tree the following spring" (Dilthey 1985, 102). The first law of metamorphosis involves the exclusion of those constituents of images that are not valuable to us. Not every apprehended constituent is worth remembering. According to Dilthey we do not just passively assimilate every impression that comes our way. We filter out what is not worth perceiving by a process of apperception. This apperception is guided by what is called an "acquired nexus of psychic life." Because this gradually acquired nexus differs for each subject, the process of exclusion never has the same outcome.

Some of what has not been excluded by the first law of imaginative metamorphosis can then become the focus of special attention. According to Dilthey's second law of imaginative metamorphosis "Images are transformed when they expand or contract, when the intensity of the sensations of which they are composed is increased or decreased" (Dilthey 1985, 102). Such a change in intensity can apply to either the reproductive imagination of ordinary memory or the productive imagination of the poet. In the former case of memory an increase of intensity tends to be a function of a present practical interest. In the latter case of the poetic imagination an increase of intensity is more likely to be regulated by the acquired psychic nexus. What distinguishes the imagination of great poets according to Dilthey is their capacity to ignore the constant distractions of daily life. Only they can unfold imagery in a way that reflects their overall values.

The third law of imaginative metamorphosis involves their completion, by which Dilthey means a process "by which something outer is enlivened by something inner or something inner is made visible and intuitable by something outer" (Dilthey 1985, 104). In completion there is an interpenetration between inner feeling and outer perception so that the very nucleus of an image can symbolize the overall acquired psychic nexus. Dilthey writes, "Only when the whole acquired psychic nexus becomes active can images be transformed on the basis of it: innumerable, immeasurable, almost imperceptible changes occur in their nucleus. And in this way, the completion of the particular originates from the fullness of psychic life" (Dilthey 1985, 104).

This last law of imaginative completion applies only to artists and allows them to articulate the essential meaning of life-situations—through them we come to understand what is typical in life. These laws of metamorphosis are conceived as explanative to the extent that they appeal to an overall acquired psychic nexus as a definitive context.

After 1887 Dilthey backs away from inner psychological explanations. In the essay "Three Epochs of Modern Aesthetics" of 1892 he redescribes imaginative metamorphosis structurally. A portrait painter is said to acquire the structure of what is perceived "from one especially noticeable point, which I will call the aesthetic point of impression. Every carefully observed face is understood on the basis of such a dominant impression …. On the basis of this impression and repeated memory, indifferent features are excluded, while telling features are stressed and refractory ones de-emphasized. The remaining whole is unified ever more decisively" (Dilthey 1985, 217). Now exclusion, intensification and unifying completion are understood as part of a process of articulating the structure of lived experience.

2.2 The 1890s: Understanding as Structural Articulation

This new, more descriptive structural approach is inaugurated in the essay "The Origin of Our Belief in the Reality of the External World and Its Justification" of 1890. Here Dilthey writes that the structure of all psychic life consists of impressions "evoking purposive reactions in the system of our lives and the feelings connected with them" (Dilthey 1924a, 96). Rather than basing our initial sense of an external world on theoretical inferences from effects to causes, he roots it in a felt resistance to the will. But resistance must be internalized as a restraint of a volitional intention for it to signify the existence of something independent. Thus Dilthey is not merely replacing a representational phenomenalism with a direct perceptual realism. Each perceptual process has "an inner side" that involves "an energy and affective tone deriving from inner stirrings that connect it to our own life" (Dilthey 1924a, 96). All aspects of our own life are brought into play as we respond to the world.

In 1894 Dilthey published his "Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology" and established how it differs from traditional explanative psychologies. He admits that even a descriptive psychology will seek to explicate the causal relationships of life, but that it must differ from explanative psychology by not trying to "derive a comprehensive and transparent cognition of psychological phenomena from a limited number of univocally determined elements" (Dilthey 1924a, 139). Unlike the associationists, Dilthey will not posit simple, stable impressions that are then combined into more complex ideas. "In psychology it is precisely the connectedness which is originally and continually given in lived experience: life presents itself everywhere only as a continuum or nexus" (Dilthey 1924a, 144). It is the task of a descriptive and analytic psychology to explicate how different processes converge in the nexus of consciousness. This nexus is lived and must be distinguished from the overall acquired psychic nexus discussed earlier. The lived nexus is available to reflexive awareness and can be described as itself an ongoing process. Analysis then shows this process to have a rather uniform cross-sectional structure. Almost every momentary state of consciousness can be seen "to simultaneously contain some level of representing, feeling and willing" (Dilthey 1924a, 201).

If we were merely representational beings, the conditions of psychic life would be merely causal. But we at the same time estimate the value of what we represent through feeling. "Once external conditions evoke a sense of pressure or intensification in the sphere of feeling, a striving comes about to either maintain or to modify a given state" (Dilthey 1924a, 205). The interest of feeling that attaches to the play of impressions brings them to our attention as serious perceptions and allows us to act on their basis.

To the extent that the parts are connected structurally so as to link the satisfaction of the drives and happiness and to reject suffering, we call this nexus purposive. It is solely in psychic structure that the character of purposiveness is originally given, and when we attribute this to an organism or to the world, this concept is only transferred from inner lived experience. For every relation of parts to a whole attains the character of purposiveness from the value that is realized in it. This value is experienced only in the life of feelings and drives. (Dilthey 1924a, 207)

Psychic life is not constructed from discrete elements, but is always already a continuum that is constantly differentiating itself from within. By first explicating the structural unity of this nexus we bring out the breadth of its scope. When we then consider the development of the nexus we display its temporal length. As purposive, this development is characterized as teleological, but this does not entail positing any final telos to which all previous stages are to be subsumed. The purposiveness of life and its structural systems is immanent and adaptive rather than external and predetermined. Each stage of life can be understood as an epoch with its distinctive value.

Nothing can be more erroneous than viewing maturity as the goal of the development that constitutes life and thus transforming the early years into mere means. How could those years serve as means to a goal which in each case is so uncertain? Instead, it is part of the nature of life to strive to fill each moment with a richness of value. (Dilthey 1924a, 219)

A further task of Dilthey's descriptive and analytic psychology is to show how the development of psychological structure produces the individuation of human life. Individuality is not conceived in terms of unique qualities that we are endowed with, but as something that each of us acquires historically. It is embodied in what was referred to earlier as a subject's acquired psychic nexus and is only gradually articulated. Even when people share the same qualities their relative intensity will differ. Sometimes qualities are present to such a small extent as to be, in effect, unnoticeable. Prominent qualities, however, tend to reinforce certain related qualities and suppress others. Each individual can thus be understood as a structural configuration of a set of dominant qualities in tension with some subordinate qualities. This tension may be unresolved for a long time until finally some articulation or Gestalt is reached that defines a person's character. Dilthey gives the example of strong ambition leading someone to gradually overcome shyness in public. Once a person recognizes that low self-confidence when speaking in public stands in the way of an important goal being fulfilled, that person can begin to cultivate the requisite qualities.

The initial response to Dilthey's descriptive psychology was rather negative. Hermann Ebbinghaus wrote an extended review which claimed that Dilthey still relies on hypotheses and that the differences between explanative and descriptive psychologies are minimal. Dilthey defended his position by showing that he never meant to banish hypotheses from psychology altogether, merely from its descriptive foundations. Husserl later expressed his regret that the Ebbinghaus review deflected him from reading this "genial" anticipation of phenomenology until much later.

Another source of criticism came from the Neo-Kantians, most of whom wanted to divorce philosophy from psychology. In 1894 the Baden School Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband delivered a lecture in which he claimed that psychology has no real relevance for the historical sciences and should be considered a natural science rather than a human science. He sees psychology as searching for laws just as the natural sciences do and historical studies as interested in unique patterns. Thus Windelband proposed that the natural sciences are nomothetic and the historical or cultural sciences ideographic. Dilthey rejects Windelband's distinction by showing that many natural sciences have ideographic elements and many human sciences such as linguistics and economics have nomothetic aims. Moreover, Dilthey argues that the description of singular historical data only becomes meaningful if understood in the framework of regularities: "What is most characteristic of the systematic human sciences is their consideration of individuation in connection with general theories…" (Dilthey 1924a, 258). Not only is it the case that universal considerations are as important as ideographic specificity, but also the understanding of individuality is not possible without reference to some broader context.

2.3 1900–1911: Historical Understanding and Hermeneutics

The final phase of Dilthey's philosophy can be said to begin at the turn of the twentieth century with his essay "The Rise of Hermeneutics." Whereas the early prize-essay on Schleiermacher's hermeneutics had been more focused on textual and theological interpretation, the new essay makes hermeneutics a connecting link between philosophy and history. Dilthey argues that the study of history can be reliable only if it is possible to raise the understanding of what is singular to the level of universal validity. Here he also comes to the realization that "the inner experience through which I obtain reflexive awareness of my own condition can never by itself bring me to a consciousness of my own individuality. I experience the latter only through a comparison of myself with others" (Dilthey 1996, 236). Others cannot be assumed to be mere extensions of myself. They are accessible to me only from the outside. It is the task of understanding to confer "an inside" to what is first given as "a complex of external sensory signs" (Dilthey 1996, 236).

Whereas up to then lived experience had been assumed to provide us an understanding of ourselves, now Dilthey asserts that we understand ourselves only by means of our objectifications. The understanding of self requires me to approach myself as others do, that is, from the outside to the inside. "The process of understanding, insofar as it is determined by common conditions and epistemological means, must everywhere have the same characteristics" (Dilthey 1996, 237). To the extent that rules can guide the understanding of the objectifications of life it constitutes interpretation. Hermeneutics is the theory of interpretation that relates to all human objectifications—that is, not only speech and writing, but also visual artistic expressions, more casual physical gestures as well as observable actions or deeds.

This new perspective that approaches the inside from the outside also alters Dilthey's conception of psychic structure. In a 1904 study entitled "The Psychic Structural Nexus," Dilthey considers what linguistic expressions can teach us about the intentionality of consciousness. No longer merely explicating the breadth of psychic life through the interweavings of acts of cognition, feeling and willing, Dilthey uses an expression such as "I am worried about something" to disclose the referential structure of a lived experience. Psychic acts have contents that are related to the objects of the world by means of what Dilthey calls attitudinal stances. Our attitudes toward the world are "indefinite in number. Asking, believing, presuming, claiming, taking pleasure in, approving, liking and its opposite, wishing, desiring, and willing are such modifications of the psychic attitude" (Dilthey 2002, 43). These attitudinal stances are not just cognitive, but predelineate something more encompassing, which Dilthey calls "knowledge." Knowledge (Wissen) adds to the conceptual cognition (Erkenntnis) of reality, "the positing of values" and "the determination of purposes and the establishment of rules" (Dilthey 2002, 25).

While the kind of epistemology (Erkenntnistheorie) established by Kant and others suffices for the natural sciences, the human sciences require a more full-blooded theory of knowledge (Theorie des Wissens). Knowledge is to be "distinguished from a mere representation, presumption, question, or assumption by the fact that a content appears here with a sense of objective necessity" (Dilthey 2002, 27–28). This objective necessity is to be located in the evidentness that accompanies thinking that is properly executed and reaches its goal whether through the self-given reality of lived experience or the "givenness that binds us to an outer perception" (Dilthey 2002, 28).

For the human sciences, things in the world are not merely cognitively apprehended as phenomenal objects, but known as real for our life-concerns (Lebensbezüge). Thinking of the unfinished manuscripts in his office, Dilthey writes:

I am tired from overworking; having reviewed my files, I worry about their unfinished contents, whose completion demands incalculably more work from me. All this "about," "of," and "toward," all these references of what is remembered to what is experienced, in short, all these structural inner relations, must be apprehended by me, since I now want to apprehend the fullness of the lived experience exhaustively. And precisely in order to exhaust it, I must regress further in the structural network to the memories of other lived experiences. (Dilthey 2002, 50)

Every attempt to characterize a lived experience leads beyond it to other structurally related experiences that ground it. This involves not just an observational process of willful attention, but also an involuntary "being-pulled-along by the state of affairs itself" to ever more constituent parts of the nexus of human knowledge.

Some of these refinements incorporated into Dilthey's descriptive program were inspired by reading Husserl's Logical Investigations (1900–01). Dilthey specifically follows Husserl in his account of how language contributes to "significative apprehension" (Dilthey 2002, 60). In using words we do not represent them as words but fulfill their meaning by representing their objects. There is a triadic structural relation between the intuitive content of a linguistic expression, an act that gives it meaning and the object that embodies that meaning as what is expressed. But whereas Husserl's phenomenology focused in the conceptual structures of objective apprehension, Dilthey gives equal attention to the structures of what he calls "objective having" (Dilthey 2002, 66). In objective apprehension we progress from attitude to objects, in objective having we regress from objects to attitude. This regressive structure is characteristic of our lived experiences of feeling and tends to "lose itself in the depth of the subject" (Dilthey 2002, 69). At root feelings can be said to explicate the self-givenness of the reflexive awareness that Dilthey attributes to consciousness in general. But feelings also assess what is given in consciousness as either furthering or diminishing one's state. That is why we often distinguish them as pleasurable or painful. Dilthey summarizes:

Bodily feelings and moods that are unattached to objects form the lower limit of the structural unity of lived experiences of feeling. Both are feelings, for they have the distinctive mark of the opposition of pleasure and pain. And just as they contain within themselves this opposition, they also gnaw at, pierce, or penetrate one's body in ways that are distinguishable from pleasure and displeasure. (Dilthey 2002, 71)

Feelings are further related to the way we evaluate the world. Our values express adjudicative attitudes based on feeling. Although the setting of purposes is grounded in the lived experience of values, the life of feelings has an immanent teleology that does not require it to go over into the desire to act. The structural nexus of willing is thus different from that of feeling. There are many feelings that evoke further feelings rather than the impulse to do something in response to them. A feeling of suffering can for instance elicit a kind of self-pity that, far from reproducing the suffering, elicits a "distinctively mellow" (Dilthey 2002, 76) mood that immobilizes.

The final general attitude relevant to the structural nexus of knowledge is that of willing. In the lived experiences of willing "we possess a reflexive awareness of an intention to realize a state of affairs" (Dilthey 2002, 82). If we call this state of affairs to be realized a "purpose" then what is expected from this purpose is a satisfaction of some kind.

Dilthey's most important work is The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences of 1910. Here Dilthey applies the same kind of structural analysis that we saw him develop for lived experience to the understanding of history. The human sciences give form to the historical world by analyzing the structural systems in terms of which human beings participate in history. In the Introduction to the Historical Sciences Dilthey had conceived the psychic nexus, cultural system and the external organization of society as purposive systems. Now a more neutral covering concept is used to capture all the ways the forces of life can converge. This is the concept of the "productive nexus or system" (Wirkungszusammenhang). The efficacy of life and of the historical world is to be understood in terms of productivity before any causal or teleological analysis is applied. The carriers of history, whether they be individuals, cultures, institutions, or communities, are productive systems capable of producing value, meaning, and, in some cases, realizing purposes. Each is to be considered structurally as centered in itself.

Each individual is a psychic productive system inherently related to other more inclusive productive systems that are also at work in history. These larger productive systems come about because of the need for communication, interaction, and cooperation among individuals. But they can also take on a life of their own and survive the individuals that formed them. Dilthey's category of Wirkung or productivity is at the root of Gadamer's theory of effective history (Wirkungsgeschichte). In the Introduction to the Human Sciences, Dilthey had been unwilling to consider these larger groupings as subjects or carriers of history. In The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences, he qualifies his opposition to transpersonal subjects by allowing them to be considered as logical rather than real subjects. It is possible to regard cooperative productive systems as logical subjects that transcend individuals without positing them as superempirical real subjects.

Even when individuals are participate in more encompassing cultural systems and organizations of society, they are never completely submerged by them. This is because any such productive system only engages some aspects of an individual. Moreover, the individuals active in a cultural system often put their stamp on its mode of productivity so that not just the rationally agreed upon function of the system is achieved. Summing up these two points, Dilthey discerns a difficulty in conceptualizing the sciences of these cultural systems in terms of the idea of purposes alone:

The individuals who cooperate in such a function belong to the cultural system only through those processes by which they contribute to the realization of the function. Nevertheless, they participate in these processes with their whole being, which means that a domain based purely on the system's functional purpose can never be constructed. (Dilthey 2002, 208)

Individuals give only part of themselves to these more inclusive systems, yet they can express their whole being through this part. No cultural system will embody merely the purposes it was meant to fulfill. That is why it is crucial to reconceive purposive systems as productive systems. A productive nexus or system may be purposive in a general sense without fulfilling a determinate purpose. It is to be understood more generally as producing objectifications that express human values as well as purposes—leaving open the extent to which specific goals are achieved. The important thing is how human values and purposes are expressed in productive systems and how their meaning is to be understood.

As in the essay "The Rise of Hermeneutics," understanding is said to involve a process of referring back from outer sensory phenomena to a reality that is inner. But now in The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences Dilthey recognizes that this inner reality need not be psychological in nature. He uses the example of how the statutes of a state express the common will of a community. The inner content of the laws on the books is a legal meaning formation. The expressions we read in law books articulate an inner relation among legal imperatives. What is expressed in these laws is not the mental states of individual legislators, but a general way of regulating human relations. Dilthey makes the same claim for individual poetic creations. What is expressed in a drama is "not the inner processes in the poet; it is rather a nexus created in them but separable from them. The nexus of a drama consists in a distinctive relation of material, poetic mood, motif, plot, and means of presentation" (Dilthey 2002, 107).

The interpretation of history must deal with all manifestations of life, not merely expressions that are intended to communicate a state of mind. In the section entitled "The Understanding of Other Persons and Their Manifestations of Life," Dilthey distinguishes three classes of life-manifestations. The first class consists of concepts, judgments and larger thought-formations. They are intended to communicate states of affairs, not states of mind. Thus the proposition "two plus two equals four" means the same in all contexts and says nothing about the person uttering it. Actions form a second class of manifestations of life. Actions as such are not meant to communicate anything, but they often do reveal something about the intentions of the actor. Thus if someone picks up a hammer nearby some nails and wooden boards, it is legitimate to assume that he or she wants to assemble the boards into some artifact. If this occurs in a large workshop, it is also plausible to think the person is a carpenter. This might also tell us something about the person's livelihood, but not much more. There is a third class of life-manifestations that Dilthey calls "expressions of lived experience" and which disclose more about the individual uttering them. Expressions of lived experience can range from simple exclamations and gestures to personal self-descriptions and reflections to works of art. Often these expressions are more disclosive than was intended:

An expression of lived experience can contain more of the nexus of psychic life than any introspection can catch sight of. It draws from the depths not illuminated by consciousness. But at the same time, it is characteristic of the expression of lived experience that its relation to the spiritual or human content expressed in it can only be made available to understanding within limits. Such expressions are not to be judged as true or false but as truthful or untruthful. (Dilthey 2002, 227)

A work of art is often more disclosive of human life in general than of the specific life of the artist. It may disclose something about the state of mind or the attitude of the artist, but a work of art will only be great if its "spiritual content is liberated from its creator" (Dilthey 2002, 228).

After having analyzed these three kinds of manifestations of life, which can be called theoretical, practical and disclosive respectively, Dilthey proceeds to distinguish various modes of understanding them. Elementary understanding goes back to the associative relation that normally exists between an expression and what is expressed in it. It assimilates the meanings that are commonly attached to expressions in the community that we grow up in. Dilthey uses Hegel's concept of "objective spirit" to account for this commonality of meaning. Objective spirit embodies "the manifold forms in which a commonality existing among individuals has objectified itself in the world of the senses," allowing the past to become "a continuously enduring present for us" (Dilthey 2002, 229). Whereas Hegel restricted objective spirit to the legal, economic and political aspects of historical life, Dilthey expands the concept to include the sciences, religion, art and philosophy that Hegel had assigned to absolute spirit. But most of all, objective spirit embodies the everyday, mundane aspects of life that we grow up with.

From earliest childhood, the self is nurtured by this world of objective spirit. It is also the medium in which the understanding of other persons and their life-manifestations takes place. For everything in which spirit has objectified itself contains something that is common to the I and the Thou. Every square planted with trees, every room in which chairs are arranged, is understandable to us from childhood because human tendencies to set goals, produce order, and define values in common have assigned a place to every square and every object in the room. (Dilthey 2002, 229)

This common background suffices for the elementary understanding of everyday life. But whenever the common meaning of life-manifestations is called into question for some reason, higher understanding becomes necessary. This can occur because of an apparent inconsistency among judgments or expressions, or because of an ambiguity that attaches to them or because of a complexity that we have not come upon before. Higher understanding cannot continue to rely on the common meanings of an expression that derive from a shared local background between speaker and listener, writer and reader. Higher understanding must replace the sphere of commonality, where inference by analogy suffices, with that of universality, where inductive inference must take over. Here the human sciences become relevant by offering the appropriate universal disciplinary contexts that can help to deal with uncertainties of interpretation. These universal systematic contexts can be social or political, economic or cultural, secular or religious. When expressions can be determined to be functioning in a specific disciplinary context then ambiguities tend to disappear. Literary scholars may be able to clarify a puzzling poetic passage by showing it to contain a literary allusion to a classical work with a foreign vocabulary. Or they can perhaps clarify it by seeing it as a way of accommodating certain technical demands of the genre as such. These cases of higher understanding establish a larger context of reference.

However, higher understanding can also focus on more specific contexts related to the work or its author. The consideration of such contexts should come only at the conclusion of the interpretive process and represents a shift from exploring the relation "of expression to what is expressed" toward the relation "of what has been produced to productivity" (Dilthey 2002, 233). Here we move from meaning relationships to something like a productive relationship to which knowledge about the authors becomes relevant. But the first recourse here is to consult more of the products of the author. How does a sentence fit into a paragraph, a chapter, a whole work, or a corpus as a whole? Only if these contexts fail to resolve the problem may we consider psychological claims about the author. The understanding of the individuality of an author should only bring in psychological factors as a last resort. Dilthey writes "we understand individuals by means of their affinities, their commonalities. This process presupposes the connection between the universally human and individuation. On the basis of what is universal, we can see individuation extended to the manifoldness of human existence" (Dilthey 2002, 233–34).

However, the highest form of understanding is not the reconstruction of the individuality of the author. It involves something that has been confused with reconstruction, but is distinct. What Dilthey points to is a process of re-creation or re-experiencing, which he contrasts with understanding as such: "Understanding as such is an operation running inverse to the course of production. But a fully sympathetic reliving requires that understanding go forward with the line of the events themselves" (Dilthey 2002, 235).

Re-experiencing develops understanding by completing the hermeneutical circle. If understanding goes "back" to the overall context, re-experiencing goes "forward" by following out the parts that give focus to the whole. A re-experiencing is not an actual re-construction but produces a better understanding that refines the original. This is made clear by the following example: "A lyrical poem makes possible, through the sequence of its verses, the re-experiencing of a nexus of lived experience—not the real one that stimulated the poet, but the one that, on its basis, the poet places in the mouth of an ideal person" (Dilthey 2002, 235).

Whereas the arts can expand the horizon of our lived experience by means of the ideal and imaginary means of fiction, history must do so by a process of structural articulation. The task of the human sciences is to analyze the productive nexus of history as it exhibits itself in stable formations or systematic structures. The productive nexus of history differs from the causal nexus of nature in producing values and arriving at purposes.

The carriers of this constant creation of values and goods in the world of human spirit are individuals, communities, and the cultural systems in which individuals cooperate. This cooperation is determined by the fact that, in order to realize values, individuals subject themselves to rules and set themselves purposes. All these modes of cooperation manifest a life-concern connected to the human essence that links individuals with each other—a core, as it were, that cannot be grasped psychologically but is revealed in every such system of relations among human beings. (Dilthey 2002, 175–76)

Each such system can be regarded as being centered within itself on the basis of some function, whether it be economic, political, cultural or religious. The structures to be analyzed here provide various cross-sections of what takes place in history. But there are also relatively enduring socio-historical contexts that we can delineate as nation-states and historical periods.

A nation organized as a state can be considered as a composite structural unity of productive systems. The individual members of a nation-state exhibit commonalities which produce a solidarity. And when cultural systems transcending the scope of this nation come into contact with other local productive systems, they begin to assume commonalities distinctive of that nation. Finally, integration of associations comes about through relations of "domination and obedience, as well as of community, that are combined in the sovereign will of a state" (Dilthey 2002, 196).

Nation-states are spatially defined historical wholes, but we can also delineate temporal composite wholes such as historical phases. What characterizes generations, ages and epochs according to Dilthey is that they are general, "permeating tendencies" (Dilthey 2002, 198). Each epoch defines a life-horizon by which people orient their life. "Such a horizon places life, life-concerns, life-experience, and thought-formation in a certain proportion" (Dilthey 2002, 198), which tends to restrain the way individuals can modify their outlooks. But an epoch is only a dominating tendency that will encompass opposing tendencies. In fact, a new epoch will come about when opposing tendencies take advantage of the inevitable tensions and dissatisfactions produced by any dominant tendency.

Whereas the structural analysis of history in terms of cultural systems and the external organization of society can be correlated with specific human sciences, the appeal by historians to the more composite structures of nation-states and epochs must be sanctioned by good judgment. History is an art as well as a science. Only historical reflection can create the right balance that will transform the conceptual cognition of the human sciences into adequate historical knowledge.

This shift to historical knowledge is the main theme of the notes for a second volume of The Formation of the Historical World in the Human Sciences which were published posthumously as Drafts for a Critique of Historical Reason. Here Dilthey analyzes the categories of life that are relevant to historical knowledge. He distinguishes between formal and real categories. Formal categories stem from elementary logical operations that are at work in all apprehension: they include the processes of comparing, noting sameness, differentiating and relating. Although such elementary operations are prediscursive, they provide the basis for discursive thought. The prediscursive noting of sameness prepares the way for the unifying concepts of discursive thought and the process of relating provides the basis for synthetic procedures. These prediscursive and discursive modes of thought account for the formal categories of unity, plurality, identity, difference, degree and relation that are shared by the natural and human sciences.

But the real categories are not the same in the natural and human sciences. Whereas time is an ideal abstract form for the natural sciences, for the human sciences it has an experienced content. It is experienced as advancing into the future and "always contains the memory of what has just been present" (Dilthey 2002, 216). The relation between the past and the present becomes the source for the category of meaning which is Dilthey's main historical category. The present never is in the sense of being observable, but it can be understood meaningfully to the extent that the past asserts its presence in it. When the present is merely lived, "the positive or negative value of the realities that fill it are experienced through feeling. And when we face the future, the category of purpose arises through a projective attitude" (Dilthey 2002, 222). Each of these three central categories of the human sciences is rooted in a response to temporality. What is valued by feeling focuses on the momentary present, but for the will everything in the present tends to be subordinated to some future purpose. Only the category of meaning can expand the present into a presence that overcomes the mere juxtaposition or subordination of the various aspects of life to each other. The understanding of meaning involves the encompassing sense of knowledge that attempts to relate cognition to evaluation and the setting of goals.

Dilthey's distinction between the natural and human sciences is not a metaphysical distinction. For that reason he does not create a dualism between nature as the domain of causality and history as the domain of freedom. There are determining forces at work in history because it cannot be divorced from natural conditions. But to understand how individuals participate in history we must replace the purely external relation of cause and effect with the integral relation of "agency and suffering, of action and reaction" (Dilthey 2002, 219).

The doing and undergoing that characterizes human involvement in history can be brought home most forcefully in autobiography. "Here a life-course stands as an external phenomenon from which understanding seeks to discover what produced it within a particular environment. The person who understands it is the same as the one who created it. This results in a special intimacy of understanding (Dilthey 2002, 221). Autobiography begins with what memory has selected as significant life-moments, which reflection then gives a certain coherence. Thereby the initial tasks of "explicating a historical nexus are already half solved by life itself" (Dilthey 2002, 221).

But the fact that history derives a special intimacy through our capacity for autobiography does not mean that we should be content to understand history through individuals alone. This also becomes evident in relation to Dilthey's own work as a biographer of Schleiermacher. It became ever more clear to Dilthey that his biography could not solve its task of understanding the life of Schleiermacher without comprehending the history of the period in which he so actively participated. Biography can satisfy the scientific aim of the historian to be objective because an "individual does not face a limitless play of forces in the historical world: he dwells in the sphere of the state, religion, or science—in brief, in a distinctive life-system or in a constellation of them. The inner structure of such a constellation draws the individual into it, shapes him, and determines the direction of his productivity" (Dilthey 2002, 266–67). Yet the individual can in turn exert an influence on his or her historical surroundings.

When turning to the nexus of universal history, we must move beyond the individual life-courses focused on by autobiography and biography. Universal-historical understanding presupposes not only autobiography, biography, but also the history of nations, cultural systems, and organizations. "Each of these histories has its own center to which the processes are related and consequently the values, purposes, and significance that result from this relationship" (Dilthey 2002, 291).

The ultimate task of a Critique of Historical Reason is to bring out the reciprocal relation between the doing of human subjects that makes it possible for "the connectedness of the world of human spirit" to dawn in them and the undergoing that makes it necessary for them to find the actual connections in an independent "progression of spirit directed at an objective knowledge of this world" (Dilthey 2002, 213). Historical knowledge is rooted in lived experience but finds its fulfillment in an understanding of the objectifications of spirit. What holds these subjective and objective poles together is that both are aspects of life. Ultimately, the understanding of universal history requires reflection about the relation between life and history. In historical knowledge, epistemology must go over into anthropological reflection about the possibility of an objective valid universal history.

Anthropological reflection expects history to teach what life is and yet history is dependent on life. There is a hermeneutical circularity here that could be escaped "if unconditioned norms, purposes, or values [could] set the standard for contemplating an apprehending history" (Dilthey 2002, 281). Unlike such Neo-Kantian contemporaries as Hermann Cohen and Heinrich Rickert, Dilthey does not accept unconditional or transcendent values. The spiritual nexus of history "is that of life itself insofar as life produces connectedness under the conditions of its natural environment" (Dilthey 2002, 280). Life is the ultimate context behind which we cannot go. It is the horizon of productivity which encompasses the organic and the mental, but cannot be defined by either. Since "life is intimately related to temporal fulfillment" (Dilthey 2002, 249) historicity is part of its essence. Consequently, the objective validity that is to be attached to any value cannot be separated from our temporal engagement with life. Values are not simply given by life, but produced as part of the human process of explicating the meaning of history. Dilthey's project of the formation (Aufbau) of the historical world is to be distinguished from an a priori construction that imposes form determinantly. Yet the formative project is critical in not simply assimilating the connectedness of life and in giving it a reflective articulation that can be objectively analyzed.

In lectures and reflections dating from 1904–11 about the logic of what is normative, Dilthey characterizes knowledge as cognition accompanied by a consciousness of validity. Ultimately, our knowledge of history must produce a philosophical capacity to distinguish what in history is contingently factical and which of its achievements possess universal validity.

The normative implications of anthropological reflection about life and history also led Dilthey to address the issue of worldviews. Just as the nature of universal history forces us to conceive of history as more than a human science, so worldviews are more broadly based attempts at acquiring a unified perspective on life. The sciences are by their nature partial and cannot provide a comprehensive worldview. A worldview attempts to provide not only a cognitive picture of the world, but also an estimation of what in life is valuable and worth striving for. Worldviews have been developed in literary, religious and philosophical works. Philosophers have produced metaphysical formulations of worldviews that attempt to give them a universal conceptual determinacy. Dilthey analyzes three recurrent types of such metaphysical formulations: naturalism, the idealism of freedom and objective idealism. The naturalism of Democritus, Hobbes and others reduces everything to what can be cognized and is pluralistic in structure; idealism of freedom as found in Plato, Kant and others insists on the irreducibility of the will and is dualistic; objective idealism as found in Heraclitus, Leibniz and Hegel affirms reality as the embodiment of a harmonious set of values and is monistic. The three types of metaphysical worldviews are incommensurable in that each is reductive in some way. No metaphysical formulation can have more than relative validity because it attempts to arrive at a totalization that transcends experience. All that is humanly possible is to probe reality on the basis of life-experience and to settle for the more limited philosophical insights provided by universal history. Ultimately, our reflective understanding of life and history must remain determinate-indeterminate.


A. Works by Dilthey

B. Works on Dilthey

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Gadamer, Hans-Georg | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Heidegger, Martin | hermeneutics | history, philosophy of | Kant, Immanuel | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst