Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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The Philosophy of Childhood

First published Fri Sep 13, 2002; substantive revision Fri Dec 9, 2005

The philosophy of childhood has recently come to be recognized as an area of inquiry analogous to the philosophy of science, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the many other "philosophy of" subjects that are already considered legitimate areas of philosophical study. Just as the philosophy of art, say, concerns itself  with philosophically interesting questions about art and about what people say and think about art, so the philosophy of childhood takes up philosophically interesting questions about childhood, about conceptions people have of childhood and attitudes they have toward children; about theories of what childhood is, as well theories of cognitive and moral development; about theories of children's rights, notions concerning the status and significance of child art and child poetry; about claims concerning the history of childhood, as well as comparative studies of childhood in different cultures; and finally about theories concerning the proper place of children in society. Almost all these theories, ideas, studies, and attitudes invite philosophical scrutiny, reflection, and analysis.

As an academic subject, the philosophy of childhood has sometimes been included within the philosophy of education. Recently, however, philosophers have begun to offer college and university courses specifically in the philosophy of childhood. And philosophical literature on childhood is increasing in both quantity and quality.

1. What is a Child?

Almost single-handedly, Philippe Ariès, in his influential book, Centuries of Childhood (Ariès, 1962), has made the reading public aware that conceptions of childhood have varied across the centuries. The very notion of a child, we now realize, is historically and culturally conditioned. But exactly how the conception of childhood has changed historically and how conceptions differ across cultures is a matter of scholarly controversy and philosophical interest. Thus Ariès argued, partly on the evidence of depictions of infants in medieval art (including the baby Jesus), that the medievals thought of children as simply "little adults." Shulamith Shahar (1990), by contrast, finds evidence that some medieval thinkers  understood childhood to be divided into fairly well-defined stages. And, whereas Piaget claims that his subjects, Swiss children in the first half of the 20th Century, were animistic in their thinking (Piaget, 1929), Margaret Mead (1967) presents evidence that Pacific island children were not.

One reason for being somewhat skeptical about any claim of radical discontinuity in at least Western conceptions of childhood arises from the fact that, even today the dominant view of children  embodies what we might call a broadly "Aristotelian conception" of childhood. According to Aristotle, there are four sorts of causality, one of which is Final causality and another is Formal Causality. Aristotle thinks of the final Cause of a living organism as the function that organism normally performs when it reaches maturity. He thinks of the Formal Cause of the organism as the form or structure it normally has in maturity, where that form or structure is thought to enable the organism to perform its functions well. According to this conception, a human child is an immature specimen of the organism type, human, which, by nature, has the potentiality to develop into a mature specimen with the structure, form, and function of a normal or standard adult.

Many adults today have  this broadly Aristotelian conception of childhood without having actually read any of Aristotle. It informs their understanding of their own relationship toward the children around them. Thus they consider the fundamental responsibility they bear toward their children to be the obligation to provide the kind of supportive environment those children need to develop into normal adults, where normal adults are supposed to have the biological and psychological structures in place to enable them to perform the functions we assume that normal, standard adults can perform.

Two modifications of this Aristotelian conception have been particularly influential in the last century and a half. One is the19th century  idea that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny (Gould, 1977), that is, that the development of an individual recapitulates the history and evolutionary development of the race, or species (Spock, 1968, 229). This idea is prominent in Freud (1950) and in the early writings of Jean Piaget (see, e.g. Piaget, 1933). Piaget, however, sought in his later writings to explain the phenomenon of recapitulation by appeal to general principles of structural change in cognitive development (see, e.g., Piaget, 1968, 27).

The other modification is the idea that development takes places in age-related stages of clearly identifiable structural change. This idea can be traced back to ancient thinkers, for example the   Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 49). Stage theory is to be found in various medieval writers (Shahar, 1990, 21-31) and, in the modern period, most prominently in Jean-Jacques Rousseau's highly influential work, Emile (1979). But it is Piaget who first developed a highly sophisticated version of stage theory and made it the dominant paradigm for conceiving childhood in the latter part of the 20th Century. (See, e.g., Piaget, 1971.).

How childhood is conceived is crucial for almost all the philosophically interesting questions about children. It is also crucial for questions about what should be the legal status of children in society, as well as for the study of children in psychology, anthropology, sociology, and many other fields.

2. Theories of Cognitive Development

Any well-worked out epistemology will provide at least the materials for a theory of cognitive development in childhood. Thus according to René Descartes a clear and distinct knowledge of the world can be constructed from resources innate to the human mind (Descartes, 1985, 131). John Locke, by contrast, maintains that the human mind begins as a "white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas." (Locke, 1959, 121) On this view all the "materials of reason and knowledge" come from experience. Locke's denial of the doctrine of innate ideas was, no doubt, directed specifically at Descartes and the Cartesians. But it also implies a rejection of the Platonic doctrine that learning is a recollection of previously known Forms. Few theorists of cognitive development today find either the extreme empiricism of Locke or the strong innatism of Plato or Descartes completely acceptable.

Behaviorism has offered recent theorists of cognitive development a way to be strongly empiricist without appealing to Locke's inner theater of the mind. The behaviorist program was, however, dealt a major setback when Noam Chomsky, in his review (1959) of Skinner's Verbal Behavior (1957), argued successfully that no purely behaviorist account of language-learning is possible. Chomsky's alternative, a theory of Universal Grammar, which owes some of its inspiration to Plato and Descartes, has made the idea of innate language structures, and perhaps other cognitive structures as well, seem a viable alternative to a more purely empiricist conception of cognitive development.

It is, however, the work of Jean Piaget that has been most influential on the way psychologists, educators, and even philosophers have come to think about the cognitive development of children. Piaget's early work, The Child's Conception of the World (1929), makes especially clear how philosophically challenging the work of a developmental psychologist can be. In that work alone Piaget discusses the nature of thinking, the "location": of dreams, what it is to be alive, and the philosophy of language. In other works he discusses space, time, and causality. Although his project is always to lay out identifiable stages in which children come to understand what, say, causality or thinking or whatever is, the intelligibility of his account presupposes that there are satisfactory responses to the philosophical quandaries that topics like causality,  thinking, and life raise.

Donaldson (1978) offers a psychological critique of Piaget on cognitive development. A philosophical critique of Piaget's work on cognitive development is to be found in Chapters 3 and 4 of Matthews (1994). Interesting post-Piagetian work in cognitive development includes Cary, 1985, Wellman, 1990, Flavel, 1995, Subbotsky, 1996, and Gelman, 2003.

3. Theories of Moral Development

Many philosophers in the history of ethics have devoted serious attention to the issue of moral development. Thus Plato, for example, offers a model curriculum in his dialogue, Republic, aimed at developing virtue in rulers. Aristotle's account of the logical structure of the virtues in his Nicomachean Ethics  provides a scaffolding for understanding how moral development takes place. And the Stoics (Turner and Matthews,1998, 45-64) devoted special attention to dynamics of moral development.

Among modern philosophers, it is again Rousseau (1979) who devotes the most attention to issues of development. He offers a sequence of five age-related stages through which a person must pass to reach moral maturity. He rejects Locke's maxim, ‘Reason with children,’ on the ground that attempts to reason with a child younger than thirteen years of age is developmentally inappropriate.(Locke, 1971)

It is, however, the cognitive theory of moral development formulated by Piaget in The Moral Judgment of the Child (1965) and then the somewhat later theory of Lawrence Kohlberg (1981, 1984) that have been most influential on psychologists, educators, and even philosophers. Thus, for example, what John Rawls has to say about children in his classic work, A Theory of Justice (1971) is almost solely derived from Piaget and Kohlberg.

Kohlberg presents a theory according to which morality develops in approximately six stages, though according to his research, few adults actually reach the fifth or sixth stages. The first two stages are "preconventional," the middle two are "conventional," and the last two are "postconventional." Where a given individual is to be placed in this scheme is determined by a test Kohlberg and his associates constructed based upon moral dilemmas.

One of the most influential critiques of the Kohlberg theory is to be found in Carol Gilligan's In a Different Voice (1982). Gilligan argues that Kohlberg's rule-oriented conception of morality has an orientation toward justice, which she associates with stereotypically male thinking, whereas women and girls are perhaps more likely to approach moral dilemmas with a "care" orientation. One important issue in moral theory that the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate raises is that of the role and importance of moral feelings in the moral life.

Another line of approach to moral development is to be found in the work of Martin Hoffman (1982). Hoffman describes the development of empathetic feelings and responses in four stages. Hoffman's approach allows one to appreciate the possibility of genuine moral feelings, and so of genuine moral agency, in a very small child. By contrast, Kohlberg's moral-dilemma tests will assign pre-schoolers and even early elementary-school children to a pre-moral level

A philosophically astute and balanced assessment of the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate, with appropriate attention to the work of Martin Hoffman, can be found in Pritchard, 1991. See also Likona, 1976, Kagan and Lamb, 1987, Matthews, 1996, Chapter 5, and Pritchard, 1996.

4. Children's Rights

Aristotle regarded children as property of the father. On the ground that there can be no injustice "in the unqualified sense" towards what is one's own, he reasoned that a father cannot be unjust to his own child. Until children reach their majority, according to Aristotle, they, like their father's chattel, are, as it were, "part of himself," and, since "no one chooses to hurt himself," there can be "no injustice towards oneself" and hence no injustice committed by father toward a child. (Nicomachean Ethics 5.6, 1134b8-12) With our present-day awareness of child abuse, we may find these words hard to take seriously. Yet, in certain important respects, we have not moved all that far from the view Aristotle expresses.

Today even pets and farm animals have minimal legal protection against abuse. Children enjoy, at least in principle, much more extensive legal protection; and certainly enlightened people have become much more sensitive to the prevalence of child abuse, which they strongly condemn. Nevertheless, there are many respects in which, legally and morally, children are still treated today as the property of their parents. Thus, for example, a court may award the custody of a child whose mother has died to the child's biological father, even though the child has never lived with him but has been taken care of by the mother's life-in partner, whom she loves and regards as her father. In general, the "property" conception of children makes it hard to be sure that children will enjoy the protection against abuse they need, and the love and support they both need and deserve.

John Locke suggested that parents hold their children in custody from God, until their maturity. According to him, all parents are placed

by the Law of Nature, under an obligation to preserve, nourish, and educate the Children they had begotten, not as their own Workmanship, but the Workmanship of their own maker, the Almighty, to who they were to be accountable for them. (Second Treatise of Government, sec. 56)

Locke added that the power "that Parents have over their Children, arises from that Duty which is incumbent on them to take care of their Offspring, during the imperfect state of Childhood." (ibid., sec. 58)

The idea that one holds one's children in custody from God might be a very attractive one in a society united by a common theology. But it seems to be of no general use in our own multi-cultural and largely secular society. On the other hand, if, like Plato, we thought of children as the property of the state, then parents could be thought of as having their children in custody for the state. But we are not, most of us, comfortable with that idea either. As it is, we can perhaps do little better than think of the society as having a legal and moral interest in protecting the welfare of its children – an interest that underlies and justifies legal protections against child abuse, as well as welfare measures that do something to promote their health and provide for their education. One might want to add, as I do, that a liberal society also has an interest in validating and protecting certain children's rights. But how such a claim could be justified goes well beyond the scope of this paper.

Recent contributions to this discussion include  Cohen (1980), which takes the position that children should have the same rights as adults even if, lacking the capacities needed to exercise a given right that adults have, they will need to borrow the capacities of others to exercise those rights. In contrast to the Cohen position, Purdy (1992) argues that affording equal rights to children would damage their own interests, as well as those of the society.

A useful introduction to the wide range of philosophical issues that concern children's rights is to be found in Ladd (1996). See also Gross, 1977,  Houlgate, 1980, Wringe, 1981, and Archard, 1993.

5. Childhood Agency

Closely connected with the issue of moral development and that of children's rights is the issue of whether, and if so, in what circumstances, children should be recognized as genuine agents. Some questions about childhood agency belong to what we can call "family ethics," to which Bluestein (1982) makes a pioneering contribution. Others have to do with child custody cases, in which, not just the best interest of the child, but the expressed preference of the child, say, to remain with a guardian rather than return to the custody of a parent might be the issue before a family court. This matter might become a question of legal rights for minors, but it needn't. It might just be a matter of counting the child's expressed preference along with other relevant considerations.

Another area in which the agency of children is coming to be recognized is the treatment of terminal or life-threatening illness. The classic work, The Private Worlds of Dying Children (Bluebond-Langner, 1980) shows how children in a pediatric oncology ward in the 1970's, when childhood leukemia was almost always terminal, were told, on paternalistic grounds, as little as possible about their diagnosis and prognosis. The children honored this conspiracy of silence by not questioning their parents or the medical staff, yet they discovered for themselves the general nature of their ailment and the likely course of treatment, as well as what it meant to say that they would likely die. Although, according to Bluebond-Langner, they came progressively to this understanding in identifiable stages, those stages were tracked their own individual experience with the disease and with other children suffering from it, and were largely independent of age.

Since the publication of Bluebond-Langner's book attitudes among medical professionals to children's agency in treatment decisions and possible disclosure of their diagnosis and prognosis have changed considerably. This has meant revising pre-conceptions concerning their cognitive and moral capacities, as well as increasing respect for them as persons, rather than merely prospective persons. (See Kopelman and Moskop, 1989.)

6. The Goods of Childhood

It has been recognized for some time now that as children of four or five or six years of age each of us was much more likely to produce a painting or drawing of genuinely aesthetic value we are now at forth or fifty or sixty. But, for most adults, the recognition of this fact goes no further than assuming that it is appropriate to put a child's drawing up on the refrigerator door, or display it in the schoolroom for parents' day. In general, adults are much more likely to denigrate the art of Klee or Miro or Dubuffet for being childlike ("My child could paint that!") than they are to assign real aesthetic value to a child's work for being Klee-like, or Miro-like, or Dubuffet-like. To call this evaluation into question one could do no better than check out Jonathan Fineberg's The Innocent Eye:Children's Art and the Modern Artist.(1994)

According to what we have called the "Aristotelian conception", childhood is an essentially prospective state. Given this, what is good for a child will tend to be understood as something that will contribute to its good in adulthood. Moreover, the goods of childhood will be, on the whole, derivative from the goods of adulthood. Child art seems to be a particularly good counterexample to this result.

Of course one could argue that adults who, as children, were encouraged to produce art, as well as make music and play games, are much more likely to be flourishing adults than those who were not allowed these "outlets." And that may well be true. But the fact that much child art has aesthetic value far beyond any art that might be produced by those same people as adults should make us suspicious of the idea that the goods of childhood are necessarily derivative from their value to the adults those children will become. Thus one should be suspicious of Michael Slote's claim that "just as dreams are discounted except as they affect (the waking portions of)our lives, what happens in childhood principally affects our view of total lives through the effects that childhood success or failure are supposed to have on mature individuals." (Slote, 1983, 14)

7. Philosophical Thinking in Children

Matthews (1980) presents evidence that young children often make comments, ask questions, and even engage in reasoning that professional philosophers can recognize as philosophical. Here are some of his examples:

TIM (about six years), while busily engaged in licking a pot, asked, "papa, how can we be sure that everything is not a dream?" Somewhat abashed, Tim's father said that he didn't know and asked how Tim thought that we could tell? After a few more licks of the pot, Tim answered, "Well, I don't think everything is a dream, ‘cause in a dream people wouldn't go around asking if it was a dream." (23)

URSULA [three years, four months], "I have a pain in my tummy". Mother, "You lie down and go to sleep and your pain will go away". Ursula, "Where will it go?" (17)

SOME QUESTION of fact arose between James and his father, and James said, "I know it is!" His father replied, "But perhaps you might be wrong!" Denis [four years, seven months] then joined in, saying, "But if he knows, he can't be wrong! Thinking's sometimes wrong, but knowing's always right!" (27)

IAN (six years) found to his chagrin that the three children of his parents' friends monopolized the television; they kept him from watching his favorite program. "Mother," he asked in frustration, "what is it better for three people to be selfish than for one?" (28)

A LITTLE GIRL of nine asked: "Daddy, is there really God?" The father answered that it wasn't very certain, to which the child retorted: "There must be really, because he has a name!" (30)

Michael (seven): "I don't like to [think] about the universe without an end. It gives me a funny feeling in my stomach. If the universe goes on forever, there is no place for God to live, who made it." (34)

These and other anecdotes provide substantial evidence that at least some children quite naturally engage in thinking that is genuinely philosophical. What implications does the conclusion have for the philosophy of childhood? There seem to be important implications for each of the topics discussed above. Consider first what we have been calling the "Aristotelian conception of childhood." Philosophical thinking in children can hardly be seen as primitive or early-stage efforts to develop a capacity that adults normally and standardly have in a mature form. In fact adults have no standard or normal capacity to do philosophy. Moreover, they are much less likely to think philosophical thoughts than are children. In this respect, child philosophy is somewhat like child art. Children often have a freshness, an openness, and a creativity in philosophical thinking, as in painting and drawing, that is missing in most adults.

If children can think philosophically interesting thoughts and engage in philosophically interesting reasoning without special adult or societal encouragement, should they be encouraged to think such thoughts and should their ability to do philosophy well be developed. This issue is addressed, for example, in Lipman, 1993, and in Matthews, 1984 and 1994, and, more generally,  in the entry, Philosophy for Children.

8. Children's Literature

Although developmental psychology has largely ignored philosophical thinking in children, writers of children's poems and stories have not. Perhaps the chief reason developmental psychologists have paid little attention to the philosophical thinking of children is that it does not fit the developmental model. Developmentalists, following Piaget, like to identify concepts, skills, and capacities that are present in children in only a primitive or immature form but develop in stages until one is standardly able, in adolescence or adulthood, to use the concept or skill or capacity in a fully mature way. But philosophy is not like that. Doing philosophy is not a skill or capacity the is present in children in only a primitive or immature form but develops until one is standardly able, in adolescence or adulthood, to exercise it in a fully mature way.

Some writers of children's stories and poems, however, are able to explore philosophical issues in a way that both children and their parents and teachers can enjoy and appreciate. Thus when Frank Baum, in the Wonderful Wizard of Oz, has the Tin Man tell the story of his survival through piece-by-piece replacement, he echoes the traditional story of the Ship of Theseus, whose boards were replaced one at a time.

In Ozma of Oz, one of Baum's sequels to the Wonderful Wizard, the heroine, Dorothy, upon encountering a copper man constructed to think and speak, but not live, recalls the Tin Man from the earlier episode: "Once … I knew a man made out of tin, who was a woodman named Nick Chopper. But he was alive as we are, ‘cause he was born a real man, and got his tin body a little at a time—first a leg and then a finger and then an ear—for the reason that he had so many accidents with his axe, and cut himself up in a very careless manner." (Baum,1907, 42)

Clearly Baum sees an argument from continuity for the persistence of Nick Chopper that differentiates him from  Tiktok, who was constructed to perform cognitive and linguistic functions without living.

For other examples of genuinely philosophical children's stories and poems see Matthews, 1980, Chapter 5, Matthews, 1988, and Matthews, 1994, Chapter 9.

The subject of children's literature belongs to the philosophy of childhood, not just because some children's poems and stories are philosophical, but also because the genre has sometimes been thought to be artistically inauthentic.(Rose, 1984) The worry has been that just because adults who write children's poems and stories are not writing for their own peer group, but rather for a relatively naive and vulnerable readership, what they write is necessarily exploitative and inauthentic.

Without discussing the fascinating topic of literary and artistic authenticity in general it may be enough to point out in this context that at least one way, though certainly not the only way, for a writer of children's literature to write authentically is for that writer to address genuinely philosophical issues. It isn't, of course, that writers who do that should be seen as covertly writing philosophical theses. It is rather that, among the things that might be as interesting and significant to the writer as to the child reader or auditor is a philosophical issue that story displays.

Children's literature is often rated as appropriate for children in some particular age bracket. Such ratings raise interesting issues concerning intellectual, social, and moral development. Thus, for example, Ellen Winner (1988) presents strong evidence that children younger than six can understand and use metaphors, but they cannot understand or use irony. Her findings have important implications for deciding whether a given story is appropriate for children of some particular age range. Matthews (2005), however, contends that Winner has failed to take into account what he calls "philosophical story irony," which children younger than six can certainly appreciate. His conclusion, in turn, has implications for whether there can be genuinely philosophical thinking in young children.

9. Other Issues

The topics discussed above hardly exhaust the philosophy of childhood. Thus we have said nothing about, for example, the figure of the child in literature (but see,e.g.,Coveny, 1980) or film. Nor have we discussed the burgeoning philosophical literature on personhood, as it bears on questions about the morality of abortion and the moral status of impaired human infants. These and many other topics bearing on children may be familiar to philosophers as they get discussed in other contexts. Discussing them under the rubric, ‘philosophy of childhood,’ as well in the other contexts, may help us see connections between them and other philosophical issues concerning children.


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