Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Civil Disobedience

First published Thu Jan 4, 2007

What makes a breach of law an act of civil disobedience? When is civil disobedience morally justified? How should the law respond to people who engage in civil disobedience? Discussions of civil disobedience have tended to focus on the first two of these questions. On the most widely accepted account of civil disobedience, famously defended by John Rawls (1971), civil disobedience is a public, non-violent and conscientious breach of law undertaken with the aim of bringing about a change in laws or government policies. On this account, the persons who practice civil disobedience are willing to accept the legal consequences of their actions, as this shows their fidelity to the rule of law. Civil disobedience, given its place at the boundary of fidelity to law, is said to fall between legal protest, on the one hand, and conscientious refusal, revolutionary action, militant protest and organised forcible resistance, on the other hand.

This picture of civil disobedience raises many questions. Why must civil disobedience be non-violent? Why must it be public, in the sense of forewarning authorities of the intended action, since publicity gives authorities an opportunity to interfere with the action? Why must persons who practice civil disobedience be willing to accept punishment? A general challenge to Rawls's conception of civil disobedience is that it is overly narrow, and as such it predetermines the conclusion that most acts of civil disobedience are morally justifiable. A further challenge is that Rawls applies his theory of civil disobedience only to the context of a nearly just society, leaving unclear whether a credible conception of either the nature or the justification of civil disobedience could follow the same lines in the context of less just societies. Some broader accounts of civil disobedience offered in response to Rawls's view (Raz, 1979; Greenawalt, 1987) will be examined in the first section of this entry.

This entry has four main sections. The first considers some definitional issues and contrasts civil disobedience with both ordinary offences and other types of dissent. The second analyses two sets of factors relevant to the justification of civil disobedience; one set concerns the disobedient's particular choice of action, the other concerns her motivation for so acting. The third section examines the extent to which people may be said to have a right to engage in civil disobedience. The fourth considers what kind of legal response to civil disobedience is appropriate.

1. Definitions

The term ‘civil disobedience’ was coined by Henry David Thoreau in his 1848 essay to describe his refusal to pay the state poll tax implemented by the American government to prosecute a war in Mexico and to enforce the Fugitive Slave Law. In his essay, Thoreau observes that only a very few people – heroes, martyrs, patriots, reformers in the best sense – serve their society with their consciences, and so necessarily resist society for the most part, and are commonly treated by it as enemies (Thoreau, 1991, 30-1). Thoreau, for his part, spent time in jail for his protest. Many after him have proudly identified their protests as acts of civil disobedience and have been treated by their societies – sometimes temporarily, sometimes indefinitely – as its enemies.

Throughout history, acts of civil disobedience famously have helped to force a reassessment of society's moral parameters. The Boston Tea Party, the suffragette movement, the resistance to British rule in India led by Gandhi, the US civil rights movement led by Martin Luther King Jr., Rosa Parks and others, the resistance to apartheid in South Africa, student sit-ins against the Vietnam War, to name a few, are all instances where civil disobedience proved to be an important mechanism for social change. The ultimate impact of more recent acts of civil disobedience – anti-abortion trespass demonstrations, the damaging of military property in opposition to the Iraq war, or acts of disobedience taken as part of the environmental movement or the animal rights movement – remains to be seen.

Certain features of civil disobedience seem vital not only to its impact upon societies and governments, but also to its status as a potentially justifiable breach of law. Civil disobedience is generally regarded as more morally defensible than both ordinary offences and other forms of protest such as militant action or coercive violence. Before contrasting civil disobedience with both ordinary offences and other types of protest, attention should be given to the features exemplified in the influential cases noted above. These features include, amongst other things, a conscientious or principled outlook and the communication of both condemnation and a desire for change in law or policy. Other features commonly cited – publicity, non-violence, fidelity to law – will also be considered here though they prove to be less central than is sometimes assumed. The second part of this section contrasts civil disobedience with ordinary offences and the third part contrasts it with legal protest, rule departures by officials, conscientious objection, radical protest (often labelled ‘terrorism’), and revolutionary action.

1.1 Features of Civil Disobedience

Conscientiousness: This feature, highlighted in almost all accounts of civil disobedience, points to the seriousness, sincerity and moral conviction with which civil disobedients breach the law. For many disobedients, their breach of law is demanded of them not only by self-respect and moral consistency but also by their perception of the interests of their society. Through their disobedience, they draw attention to laws or policies that they believe require reassessment or rejection. Whether their challenges are well-founded is another matter, which will be taken up in Section 2.

On Rawls's account of civil disobedience, in a nearly just society, civil disobedients address themselves to the majority to show that, in their considered opinion, the principles of justice governing cooperation amongst free and equal persons have not been respected by policymakers. Rawls's restriction of civil disobedience to breaches that defend the principles of justice may be criticised for its narrowness since, presumably, a wide range of legitimate values not wholly reducible to justice, such as transparency, security, stability, privacy, integrity, and autonomy, could motivate people to engage in civil disobedience. However, Rawls does allow that considerations arising from people's comprehensive moral outlooks may be offered in the public sphere provided that, in due course, people present public reasons, given by a reasonable political conception of justice, sufficient to support whatever their comprehensive doctrines were introduced to support (Rawls, 1996). Rawls's introduction of this proviso allows that people often engage in the public sphere for a variety of reasons; so even when justice figures prominently in a person's decision to use civil disobedience, other considerations could legitimately contribute to her decision to act. The activism of Martin Luther King Jr. is a case in point. King was motivated to undertake strategies such as the Montgomery bus boycott by his religious convictions and his commitments to democracy, equality, and justice. Rawls maintains that, while he does not know whether King thought of himself as fulfilling the purpose of the proviso, King could have fulfilled it; and had he accepted public reason he certainly would have fulfilled it. Thus, on Rawls's view, King's activism is civil disobedience.

Since people can undertake political protest for a variety of reasons, civil disobedience sometimes overlaps with other forms of dissent. A US draft-dodger during the Vietnam War might be said to combine civil disobedience and conscientious objection in the same action. And, most famously, Gandhi may be credited with combining civil disobedience with revolutionary action. Despite the potential for overlap, some broad distinctions may be drawn between civil disobedience and other forms of protest in terms of the scope of the action and agents' motivations (Section 1.3).

Communication: In civilly disobeying the law, a person typically has both forward-looking and backward-looking aims. She seeks not only to convey her disavowal and condemnation of a certain law or policy, but also to draw public attention to this particular issue and thereby to instigate a change in law or policy. A parallel may be drawn between the communicative aspect of civil disobedience and the communicative aspect of lawful punishment by the state (Brownlee, 2004). Like civil disobedience, lawful punishment is associated with a backward-looking aim to demonstrate condemnation of certain conduct as well as a forward-looking aim to bring about a lasting change in that conduct. The forward and backward-looking aims of punishment apply not only to the particular offence in question, but also to the kind of conduct of which this offence is an example.

There is some dispute over the kinds of policies that civil disobedients may target through their breach of law. Some would exclude from the class of civilly disobedient acts those breaches of law that protest the decisions or policies of private agents such as trade unions, banks, private universities, etc. (Raz, 1979, 264). Others, by contrast, would maintain that disobedience in opposition to the decisions of private parties can reflect a larger challenge to the legal system that permits those decisions to be taken, which makes it appropriate to place this disobedience under the umbrella of civil disobedience. There is more agreement amongst thinkers that civil disobedience can be either direct or indirect. In other words, civil disobedients can either breach the law they oppose or breach a law which, other things being equal, they do not oppose in order to demonstrate their protest against another law or policy. Trespassing on a military base to spray-paint nuclear missile silos in protest against current military policy would be an example of indirect civil disobedience. It is worth noting that the distinction often drawn between direct civil disobedience and indirect civil disobedience is less clear-cut than generally assumed. For example, refusing to pay taxes that support the military could be seen as either indirect or direct civil disobedience against military policy. Although this act typically would be classified as indirect disobedience, a part of one's taxes, in this case, would have gone directly to support the policy one opposes.

Publicity: The feature of communication may be contrasted with that of publicity. The latter is endorsed by Rawls who argues that civil disobedience is never covert or secretive; it is only ever committed in public, openly, and with fair notice to legal authorities (Rawls, 1971, 366). Hugo A. Bedau adds to this that usually it is essential to the dissenter's purpose that both the government and the public know what she intends to do (Bedau, 1961, 655). However, although sometimes advance warning may be essential to a dissenter's strategy, this is not always the case. As noted at the outset, publicity sometimes detracts from or undermines the attempt to communicate through civil disobedience. If a person publicises her intention to breach the law, then she provides both political opponents and legal authorities with the opportunity to abort her efforts to communicate (Smart, 1991, 206). For this reason, unannounced or (initially) covert disobedience is sometimes preferable to actions undertaken publicly and with fair warning. Examples include releasing animals from research laboratories or vandalising military property; to succeed in carrying out these actions, disobedients would have to avoid publicity of the kind Rawls defends. Such acts of civil disobedience nonetheless may be regarded as ‘open’ when followed soon after by an acknowledgment of the act and the reasons for acting. Openness and publicity, even at the cost of having one's protest frustrated, offer ways for disobedients to show their willingness to deal fairly with authorities.

Non-violence: A controversial issue in debates on civil disobedience is non-violence. Like publicity, non-violence is said to diminish the negative effects of breaching the law. Some theorists go further and say that civil disobedience is, by definition, non-violent. According to Rawls, violent acts likely to injure are incompatible with civil disobedience as a mode of address. ‘Indeed’, says Rawls, ‘any interference with the civil liberties of others tends to obscure the civilly disobedient quality of one's act.’(Rawls, 1971, 366).

Even though paradigmatic disobedients like Gandhi and Martin Luther King Jr embody Rawls's image of non-violent direct action, opponents of Rawls's view have challenged the centrality of non-violence for civil disobedience on several fronts. First, there is the problem of specifying an appropriate notion of violence. It is unclear, for example, whether violence to self, violence to property, or minor violence against others (such as a vicious pinch) should be included in a conception of the relevant kinds of violence. If the significant criterion for a commonsense notion of a violent act is a likelihood of causing injury, however minor, then these kinds of acts count as acts of violence (See Morreall, 1991). Second, non-violent acts or legal acts sometimes cause more harm to others than do violent acts (Raz, 1979, 267). A legal strike by ambulance workers may well have much more severe consequences than minor acts of vandalism. Third, violence, depending upon its form, does not necessarily obscure the communicative quality of a disobedient's action as Rawls and Peter Singer suggests it does (Singer, 1973, 86). Limited violence used to achieve a specific objective might heighten the communicative quality of the act by drawing greater attention to the dissenter's cause and by emphasising her seriousness and frustration.

These observations do not alter the fact that non-violent dissent normally is preferable to violent dissent. As Raz observes, non-violence avoids the direct harm caused by violence, and non-violence does not encourage violence in other situations where violence would be wrong, something which an otherwise warranted use of violence may do. Moreover, as a matter of prudence, non-violence does not carry the same risk of antagonising potential allies or confirming the antipathy of opponents (Raz, 1979, 267). Furthermore, non-violence does not distract the attention of the public, and it probably denies authorities an excuse to use violent countermeasures against disobedients.

Non-violence, publicity and a willingness to accept punishment are often regarded as marks of disobedients' fidelity to the legal system in which they carry out their protest. Those who deny that these features are definitive of civil disobedience endorse a more inclusive conception according to which civil disobedience involves a conscientious and communicative breach of law designed to demonstrate condemnation of a law or policy and to contribute to a change in that law or policy. Such a conception allows that civil disobedience can be violent, partially covert, and revolutionary. This conception also accommodates vagaries in the practice and justifiability of civil disobedience for different political contexts: it grants that the appropriate model of how civil disobedience works in a context such as apartheid South Africa may differ from the model that applies to a well-ordered, liberal, just democracy. An even broader conception of civil disobedience would draw no clear boundaries between civil disobedience and other forms of protest such as conscientious objection, forcible resistance, and revolutionary action. A disadvantage of this last conception is that it blurs the lines between these different types of protest and so might both weaken claims about the defensibility of civil disobedience and invite authorities and opponents of civil disobedience to lump all illegal protest under one umbrella.

1.2 Ordinary Offences

In democratic societies, civil disobedience as such is not a crime. If a disobedient is punished by the law, it is not for civil disobedience, but for the recognised offences she commits, such as blocking a road or disturbing the peace, or trespassing, or damaging property, etc. Therefore, if judges are persuaded, as they sometimes are, either not to punish a disobedient or to punish her differently from other people who breach the same laws, it must be on the basis of some feature or features of her action which distinguish it from the acts of ordinary offenders.

Typically a person who commits an offence has no wish to communicate with her government or society. This is evinced by the fact that usually an offender does not intend to make it known that she has breached the law. Since, in most cases, she wishes to benefit or, at least, not to suffer from her unlawful action, it is in her interests to preserve the secrecy of her conduct. An exception might be where a person's breach is sufficiently minor, such as jaywalking, that concealment is unnecessary since sanction is unlikely to follow. Another exception might be where a person wishes to thumb her nose at authorities by advertising that she has committed a crime. By making an exception of herself and by distancing herself from a legal rule, this ordinary offender communicates a certain disregard for the law. This communication, however, does not normally reflect an aim either to demonstrate conscientiously held objections to that law or to lead society to reform the law. Civil disobedients, by contrast, seek to make their disobedience known to specific members of the community either before or after the fact to demonstrate both the seriousness of their condemnation of that law or policy and their sincere desire for policy change. The difference in communication between the civil disobedient and the ordinary offender reflects a deeper difference in motivation for breaching the law.

A further difference between civil disobedience and common crimes pertains to the willingness of the offender to accept the legal consequences. The willingness of disobedients to accept punishment is taken not only as a mark of (general) fidelity to the law, but also as an assertion that they differ from ordinary offenders. Accepting punishment also can have great strategic value, as Martin Luther King Jr observes: ‘If you confront a man who has been cruelly misusing you, and say “Punish me, if you will; I do not deserve it, but I will accept it, so that the world will know I am right and you are wrong,” then you wield a powerful and just weapon.’ (Washington, 1991, 348). Moreover, like non-violence, a willingness to accept the legal consequences normally is preferable, and often has a positive impact upon the disobedient's cause. This willingness may make the majority realise that what is for them a matter of indifference is for disobedients a matter of great importance (Singer, 1973, 84). Similarly, it may demonstrate the purity or selflessness of the disobedient's motives or serve as a means to mobilise more broad-based support (Raz, 1979, 265). And yet, punishment can also be detrimental to dissenters' efforts by compromising future attempts to assist others through protest (Greenawalt, 1987, 239). Furthermore, the link between a willingness to accept punishment and respect for law can be pulled apart. A revolutionary like Gandhi was happy to go to jail for his offences, but felt no fidelity toward the particular legal system in which he acted.

1.3 Other Types of Dissent

Although civil disobedience often overlaps broadly with other types of dissent, nevertheless some rough distinctions may be drawn between the key features of civil disobedience and the key features of these other practices.

Legal Protest: The obvious difference between legal protest and civil disobedience is that the former lies within the bounds of the law, but the latter does not. Most of the other features exemplified in civil disobedience can be found in legal protest including a conscientious and communicative demonstration of protest, a desire to bring about through moral dialogue some lasting change in policy or principle, an attempt to educate and to raise awareness, and so on. The difference in legality translates into a more significant, moral difference when placed against the backdrop of a general moral obligation to follow the law. If it is morally wrong to breach the law, then special justification is required for civil disobedience which is not required for legal protest. However, the political regime in which obedience is demanded may be relevant here. David Lyons maintains that the Jim Crow laws (racial segregation laws in force in the southern US until 1964), British colonial rule in India, and chattel slavery in antebellum America offer three refutations of the view that civil disobedience requires moral justification in morally objectionable regimes. According to Lyons, there can be no moral presumption in favour of obedience to the law in such regimes, and therefore no moral justification is required for civil disobedience. ‘Insofar as civil disobedience theory assumes that political resistance requires moral justification even in settings that are morally comparable to Jim Crow,’ says Lyons, ‘it is premised on serious moral error.’ (Lyons, 1998, 39). If one takes the view that there is no general moral obligation to follow the law (irrespective of regime), then both adherence to the law and breach of law must be judged not on their legality, but on their character and consequences. And this would mean that, even in morally reprehensible regimes, justification may be demanded for civil disobedience that either has significant negative consequences or falls below certain moral standards.

Although questions of justification will be addressed more fully in the next section, it is worth noting here one point in favour of civil disobedience over legal protest. As Bertrand Russell observes, typically it is difficult to make the most salient facts in a dispute known through conventional channels of participation. The controllers of mainstream media tend to give defenders of unpopular views limited space to make their case. Given the sensational news value of illegal methods, however, engaging in civil disobedience often leads to wide dissemination of a position (Russell, 1998, 635). John Stuart Mill observes, with regard to dissent in general, that sometimes the only way to make a view heard is to allow, or even to invite, society to ridicule and sensationalise it as intemperate and irrational (Mill, 1999). Admittedly, the success of this strategy depends partly upon the character of the society in which it is employed; but it should not be ruled out as a strategy for communication.

Rule Departures: A practice distinct from, but related to, civil disobedience is rule departure on the part of authorities. Rule departure is essentially the deliberate decision by an official, for conscientious reasons, not to discharge the duties of her office (Feinberg, 1979). It may involve a decision by police not to arrest offenders or a decision by prosecutors not to proceed to trial, or a decision by a jury or by a judge to acquit an obviously guilty person. Whether these conscientious acts actually contravene the general duties of the office is debatable. If an official's breach of a specific duty is more in keeping with the spirit and overall aims of the office than a painstaking respect for its particular duties is, then the former might be said to adhere better than the latter does to the demands of the office (Greenawalt, 1987, 281)

Rule departures resemble civil disobedience in that both involve dissociation from and condemnation of certain policies and practices. Moreover, both are communicative, though their audiences may differ. The official who departs from the rules of her office addresses her action principally to the individuals or groups whom she intends to assist through her breach of a specific duty. Her action demonstrates to these parties both that she disagrees with a policy that would treat them in a certain way and that her actions align with her commitments. Where civil disobedience and rule departure differ is, first, in the identity of their practitioners. Whereas rule departure typically is an action taken by an agent of the state (including juries), civil disobedience typically is an action taken by citizens (including officials acting as ordinary citizens and not in the capacity of their official role). Second these practices differ in their legality. Whether rule departure actually involves a breach of law is unclear. Civil disobedience, by contrast, involves the breach of a law currently on the books. A third difference between rule departure and civil disobedience is that, unlike civil disobedience, rule departure does not usually expose those who employ it to the risks of sanction or punishment (Feinberg, 1979)

Conscientious Objection: This kind of protest may be understood as a violation of the law motivated by the dissenter's belief that she is morally prohibited to follow the law because the law is either bad or wrong, totally or in part. The conscientious objector may believe, for example, that the general character of the law in question is morally wrong (as an absolute pacifist would believe of conscription), or that the law extends to certain cases which it should not cover (an orthodox Christian would regard euthanasia as murder) (Raz, 1979, 263). While commonly taken to refer to pacifist objections to military service, conscientious objection, says Raz, may apply to any law, negative or positive, that a person believes for moral reasons she is compelled to disobey. A narrower conception of conscientious objection, described as conscientious refusal, characterises this kind of disobedience as non-compliance with a more or less direct legal injunction or administrative order (Rawls, 1971, 368). Examples would be the refusal of Jehovah's Witnesses to salute the flag or Thoreau's refusal to pay his taxes (it is interesting that the action of the man who coined the term ‘civil disobedience’ is regarded by many as lying at the periphery of what counts as civil disobedience). Whereas conscientious refusal is undertaken with the assumption that authorities are aware of the breach of law, conscientious evasion is undertaken with the assumption that the breach of law is wholly covert. The devout person who continues to practice her religion in secret after it has been banned does not protest against the law, but breaches it covertly for moral reasons. The personal nature of this disobedience commands respect, as it suggests modesty and reflection, which more vocal and confident displays of conviction may lack.

The differences between civil disobedience and conscientious evasion are easier to identify than those between civil disobedience and conscientious refusal or conscientious objection. Although conscientious objection typically is not characterised by the aim to communicate to government and society either that a law has been breached or the reasons behind the breach, nevertheless many acts commonly classified as conscientious objection – tax avoidance and resistance to conscription – have a public or communicative component. Moreover, when such actions are taken by many people their collective impact can approximate the kind of communicative protest exemplified in civil disobedience.

A more obvious difference between civil disobedience and conscientious objection is that, whereas the former is invariably illegal, sometimes the latter is legal. In the context of military conscription, some legal systems regard conscientious objection as a legitimate ground for avoiding frontline military service.

Radical Protest: Some forms of dissent such as coercive violence, organised forcible resistance, militant action, intimidation, and terrorisation lie further outside the realm of tolerated (or tolerable) political action than civil disobedience does. There are reasons to avoid labelling such disobedience (or anything else) as ‘terrorism’. Not only is the term ‘terrorism’ inflammatory, but also it is bandied about by governments to capture an overly broad range of actions. Whereas ‘civil disobedience’ has developed as a positive term which many people apply to their own protests, ‘terrorism’ is an epithet applied only to the actions of others. Given the highly negative connotations of this term, its (philosophical) usefulness is questionable. Less loaded notions of intimidation, terrorisation, forcible resistance, and severe violence offer greater space for a proper analysis of the justifiability of using such measures in political protest.

While a civil disobedient does not necessarily oppose the regime in which she acts, the militant or radical protester is deeply opposed to that regime (or a core aspect of that regime). This protester uses modes of communication unlikely to persuade others of the merits of her position. Her aims are more urgent and extreme than those of the civil disobedient; she seeks rapid change through brutal strategies of coercion and intimidation, not through strategies of persuasion and moral appeal. And often her action includes force or extreme violence as a key component. Given the nature of her conduct and objectives, she is likely to try to evade the legal consequences of her action. This is less often the case for civil disobedients.

Revolutionary Action: The difference between radical protest and revolutionary action may be as difficult to specify as that between revolutionary action and civil disobedience. One point of difference amongst the three concerns the nature of the objectives. Acts of civil disobedience often have focused and limited objectives. Acts of terrorisation or large-scale coercive violence are typically associated with a general aim of generating fear and insecurity while keeping any specific aims or demands oblique. Revolutionary action is typified by a comprehensive objective to bring about a regime change. Both acts of radical protest and acts of civil disobedience can of course fall within a revolutionary project, and may even coincide with each other (as they perhaps did in the sabotage strategies used by Nelson Mandela and the African National Congress).

As a general practice, revolution, like radical protest, does not seek to persuade the government to change established policies. But, unlike much radical protest, revolutionary action may seek to persuade the society under that government that a change in regime is required. If revolutionaries seek to persuade the government of anything, it is that it should cease to be the government. In India, Gandhi had some success in this project. Once the movement became irresistible, the British left India fairly peacefully. But Gandhi's revolutionary project may be contrasted with other revolutions such as the French revolution, or even the South African revolution, where there were endorsements of revolutionary terror. Large-scale resistance that incorporates terrorisation is quite a different enterprise from the non-violent resistance that distinguished Gandhi's protest. Since, as noted above, people may engage in dissent for numerous reasons, acts of civil disobedience like Gandhi's that are guided by conscientious commitments can also be driven by revolutionary aims.

The various points of contact and overlap amongst different types of political protest suggest that there is no one-dimensional continuum from weak to strong dissent. There is more plausibility in the idea of a multi-dimensional continuum of protest, which recognises the complexities in such critical points of contrast as legality, violence, harm, communication, motivation, and persuasiveness.

2. Justification

On many views, an analysis of the justifiability of civil disobedience must consider not only the dissenter's particular action and its likely consequences, but also her motivation for engaging in this act of civil disobedience. Factors relevant to a disobedient's choice of action include: its illegality, its use as a last resort or first resort, any coordination with other dissenters, the likelihood of success, the directness or indirectness of the action, and the expected harm. Factors relevant to motivation include: the merit or lack thereof in the dissenter's cause, her reasons for defending that cause, and her reasons for engaging in this form of protest. Although they are examined separately below, these two sets of factors inevitably overlap.

2.1 Mode of Action

The task of defending civil disobedience is commonly undertaken with the assumption that in reasonably just, liberal societies people have a general moral obligation to follow the law. In the history of philosophy, many arguments have been given for legal obligation (often called ‘political obligation’). Plato's Socrates, in the Crito, offers at least two lines of argument for legal obligation in order to defend his decision not to escape from prison. First, Socrates emphasises the importance of moral consistency; he would prefer to give up his life than to compromise his principles. A basic principle for Socrates is that a person must never do wrong or injury in return for wrong. To escape without persuading the state would be to try to destroy it and its laws. Second, Socrates maintains that he has an obligation to follow the laws of Athens since he has tacitly agreed to do so and since he enjoys the rights and benefits of citizenship. This voluntarist line of argument is also espoused later by John Locke, who argues that we have a duty to follow the law only when we have consented to its rule. This view contrasts with the non-voluntarist position of David Hume, according to which the obligation to follow the law is rooted in the value of government under law. From these two traditions rise the principal contemporary arguments for legal obligation, which concern respectively consent, gratitude, promise-keeping, fairness, necessary institutions, and public good. Many of the contemporary voluntarist and non-voluntarist arguments have been criticised in recent debates, giving rise to the view that, while there are both ordinary reasons to follow the law and strong moral obligations to follow particular laws, there is no general moral obligation to follow the law. One reason to think there is no such obligation is that the legality of an action does not significantly affect its moral status (Smith, 1973). The claim is that jaywalking across an empty street, for example, is hardly reprehensible and its illegality does not make it more reprehensible. Similarly, spitting at someone's feet or refusing without cause to acknowledge that person is reprehensible and its legality does not diminish that.

On the assumption that people have a pro tanto obligation to follow the law (or at least those laws that are not excessively unjust), it follows that people then have a pro tanto obligation to use the proper legal channels of political participation before resorting to illegal methods. On this view, civil disobedience can be justified only when employed as a last resort. But since causes defended by a minority are often those most opposed by persons in power, legal channels may be less than wholly effective. Moreover, it is unclear when a person could claim to have reached the situation of last resort; she could continue to use the same tired legal methods without end. To ward off such challenges, Rawls suggests that, if past actions have shown the majority to be immovable or apathetic, then further attempts may reasonably be thought fruitless and one may be confident one's civil disobedience is a last resort.

Another condition for civil disobedience to be justified, according to Rawls, is that disobedients coordinate with other minorities. Since minority groups are equally justified in resorting to civil disobedience when they have sufficiently weighty objections, these groups should avoid undermining each others' efforts through simultaneous appeals to the attention of society and government. Some coordination of activities is required, says Rawls, to regulate the overall level of dissent (Rawls, 1971, 374-5). While there is some merit to this condition, civil disobedience that does not meet it might still be justifiable. In some cases, there will be no time or opportunity to coordinate with other minorities. And in other cases, other minority groups may be unable or unwilling to coordinate. It is an open question then whether the refusal or inability of other groups to cooperate should affect the ultimate defensibility of a person's decision to engage in civil disobedience.

A reason for Rawls to defend this coordination requirement is that, in most cases, it serves a more important concern, namely, the achievement of good consequences. It is often argued that civil disobedience can only be justified if there is a high probability of producing positive change through that disobedience. Only this can justify exposing one's society to the risk of harm. The harms usually identified with civil disobedience are as follows. First, civil disobedience can be a divisive force in society. Second, since civil disobedience is normally designed to attract public attention, it can lead people, as a result, to think of resorting to disobedience to achieve whatever changes in law or policy they find justified (Raz, 1979, 262). Third, civil disobedience can encourage more than just other civil disobedience; it can encourage a general disrespect for the law, particularly where the law is perceived as being lenient toward certain kinds of offences.

In response to these challenges, one might question the empirical claims that civil disobedience is divisive and that it has the consequence of leading others to use disobedience to achieve changes in policy. One might also question whether it necessarily would be a bad thing if civil disobedience had these consequences. Concerning likelihood of success, civil disobedience actually can seem most justifiable when the situation appears hopeless and when the government refuses to listen to conventional forms of communication. Additionally, even when general success seems unlikely, civil disobedience might be defended for any reprieve from harm that it brings to victims of a bad law or policy. Tree-hugging, for example, can delay or curtail a clear-cut logging scheme and thereby prolong the protection of an eco-system.

Two final factors concerning a disobedient's choice of action are non-violence and directness. Many theorists regard non-violence as necessary to the justifiability of civil disobedience. But, as noted earlier, there can be good reasons to prefer strategic use of violence in civil disobedience to the harm and injustice of the law. Sometimes the wrong that a dissenter perceives may be so iniquitous that it is right to use violence to root it out. Such violence may be necessary to preserve or to re-establish the rights and civil liberties that coercive practices seek to suspend (Raz, 1979). Concerning directness, some argue that civil disobedience is more justifiable the more direct it is since direct disobedience targets the specific legal wrong that prompted it (Greenawalt, 1987, 235). While directness may ensure that the objective of the dissent is understood, it has disadvantages; and in some contexts direct action cannot be justified. When direct disobedience would fail to treat others with respect or would cause far greater harm than either adherence to the law or indirect disobedience would cause, then indirect disobedience has a greater claim to justification. But, when indirect civil disobedience would be either misconstrued or viewed in isolation from the law opposed, then direct disobedience, assuming it meets certain moral requirements (which are determined by the content of the law opposed), may have greater justification. People who use indirect disobedience have, other things being equal, no objective reasons to breach the law that they breach. This means that the justification for their disobedience must turn solely on the value of that action as the appropriate vehicle through which to communicate their objection.

As a vehicle for communication, civil disobedience has much to be said for it. It was noted in Section 1.3 that civil disobedience can often better contribute to a dialogue with society and the state than legal protest can since controllers of mainstream media tend not to give unpopular views a hearing unless they are advocated through sensational means such as illegal protest. But, as the above points have indicated, the justifiability of an act of civil disobedience depends greatly upon its specific features. Civil disobedience sometimes serves primarily to inform and to educate the public about an issue. But other times, it acts by confronting the majority with the higher costs of retaining a given law or policy in the face of continued, concerted opposition. The nature of these strategies and, as discussed below, the motivations for selecting one over another inform an analysis of justifiability.

2.2 Motivation for Acting

On many views, for an act of civil disobedience to be justified, it is insufficient that the dissenter's act meet criteria such as those noted above. It is equally important that she choose that action for the right reasons. The first requirement she must satisfy is that her cause be well-founded. A dissenter may believe that her cause is just and that her disobedience is morally permissible, but she might be mistaken either about the facts or about her principles. Assuming her challenge is well-founded, there are two further issues. The first pertains to her reasons for supporting this cause. The second pertains to her reasons for taking this particular act of disobedience.

Concerning the former, if a person advocates a legitimate cause such as equal rights for black Americans simply for the reason that she seeks re-election or promotion or the admiration of friends while having no real sympathy for this cause, then she acts not for decisive reasons. To be fully justified in her defence of this cause, she must act on the basis of good reasons to support equality amongst peoples; such reasons could include her sense of injustice for the ill-treatment of black Americans or her respect for the dignity of persons or her appreciation that real equality of rights best serves the interests of all American people. It would be appropriate to judge negatively the character of a person who was improperly motivated to take praiseworthy action in defence of others' rights.

Concerning the latter, sometimes reasons apply to a situation but do not favour the particular action that a person takes. When deciding how best to defend a legitimate cause, a person must give thought to the appropriate strategy to adopt. A person may have reasons for engaging in one form of disobedience, but choose to engage in another form that is not supported by these reasons. For example, she may have an undefeated reason to participate in a road block because this action is well suited to her political concerns and is one that her government understands and responds well to or because this action has a public impact that does not greatly harm the interests of others; but, she has no undefeated reason, say, to trespass on government property or to engage in vandalism. In taking the latter actions, she is guilty of a certain error of judgment about which actions are supported by reasons that admittedly apply (See Gardner and Macklem 2002). Given her error, the best she could claim is that her conduct is excused, as she had reason to believe that she had reason to undertake that particular form of civil disobedience. When, by contrast, a person's civilly disobedient action is supported by undefeated reasons that apply to her situation then her choice of action is justified. The justification for her action stems from its appropriateness as the action to take. Its appropriateness is structured in part by the political regime, the tone of the social environment, the actions taken by other political participants, and so on. All of these factors bear on the appropriateness of a given action and the manner in which it is performed, and thus determine to what extent the reasons that support it provide a justification.

The various constraints and requirements discussed above do not amount to a complete defence for civil disobedience. A fuller defence would appeal to the social value of civil disobedience. Justified civil disobedience, says Rawls, can serve to inhibit departures from justice and to correct departures when they occur; thus it can act as a stabilising force in society (Rawls, 1971, 383). Justice aside, civil disobedience and dissent more generally contribute to the democratic exchange of ideas by forcing the champions of dominant opinion to defend their views. Mill maintains in On Liberty that if there are any persons who contest a received opinion, we should thank them for it, open our minds to listen to them, and rejoice that there is someone to do for us what we otherwise ought to do ourselves (Mill, 1999, 90). In fact, one could argue that those who breach the law in justified civil disobedience demonstrate responsible citizenship or civic virtue. Richard Dagger argues that

To be virtuous…is to perform well a socially necessary or important role. This does not mean that the virtuous person must always go along with the prevailing views or attitudes. On the contrary, Socrates and John Stuart Mill have persuaded many people to believe that questioning and challenging the prevailing views are among the highest forms of virtue (Dagger, 1997, 14).

This view of dissent and justified civil disobedience aligns with an increasingly common perception that our responsibilities as citizens go well beyond any obligation to follow the law.

3. Rights

An issue associated with, but distinct from, that of justification is whether people have a right to engage in civil disobedience. Most thinkers who have considered civil disobedience defend a limited right to such protest. Rawls, for example, maintains that, even in a nearly just society, a person may be supposed to have a right to engage in civil disobedience when three conditions are met. These are the conditions he sets for justified civil disobedience: it is undertaken 1) in response to an instance of substantial and clear injustice, 2) as a last resort and 3) in coordination with other minority groups. Rawls's approach has been criticised for not clearly distinguishing his account of justified civil disobedience from an account of the disobedience which people have a right to take. There is much disagreement over the kinds of actions that can be captured by rights. Some theorists, like John Mackie, argue that there can be no right to perform a morally wrong action since wrong actions are acts we are morally required not to perform (Mackie, 1978). Others, like Raz, argue that to restrict rights to morally right actions is to misunderstand the nature of rights. Rights of conduct protect a certain sphere of autonomy and liberty for the agent with which interference by others is restricted, that is to say, rights of conduct imply that interference with that conduct is unjustified even when the conduct is itself unjustified. One does not require a right, observes Raz, to do the right thing. But one often does require a right to do what one should not do (C.f. Waldron, 1981). On this view, the limits of the right to political participation, for example, are set not by the nature of people's political objectives, but by the form of the actions they employ to realise those objectives.

According to Raz, when one considers the idea of a moral right to civil disobedience, one must appreciate that this right extends to cases in which people should not exercise it. To say that there is a right to civil disobedience is to allow the legitimacy of resorting to this form of political action to one's political opponents. It is to allow that the legitimacy of civil disobedience does not depend on the rightness of one's cause (Raz, 1979, 268).

In his account of a right to civil disobedience, Raz places great emphasis upon the kind of regime in which a disobedient acts. Raz argues that only in an illiberal regime do certain individuals have a right to civil disobedience.

Given that the illiberal state violates its members' right to political participation, individuals whose rights are violated are entitled, other things being equal, to disregard the offending laws and exercise their moral right as if it were recognised by law… [M]embers of the illiberal state do have a right to civil disobedience which is roughly that part of their moral right to political participation which is not recognised in law (Raz, 1979, 272-273).

By contrast, in a liberal state, says Raz, a person's right to political activity is, by hypothesis, adequately protected by law. Therefore, in such a regime, the right to political participation cannot ground a right to civil disobedience. Against Raz, one could argue, however, that in such a regime the right to civil disobedience is grounded on something else such as a right to object. Whether the right to object could be said to fall under the right to political participation would depend upon the expansiveness of the latter right. When that right is understood to accommodate only legal protest, then the right to object, which commonsensically includes civil disobedience, must be viewed as distinct from political participation rights.

A further challenge to Raz might be that real societies do not align with this dichotomy between liberal and illiberal regimes; rather they fall along a spectrum of liberality and illiberality, being both more or less liberal relative to each other and being more or less liberal in some domains than in others. Given the stringency of Raz's notion of a liberal regime, it is unlikely that any society could be wholly liberal. So, although Raz may have grounds to hold that in the truly liberal society a right to civil disobedience would not exist and that, to the extent that our society approximates such a regime, the case for such a right diminishes, nevertheless in the majority of real societies, if not all real societies, a right to civil disobedience does exist. Note that to make legally protected participation fully adequate, the liberal society would have to address Russell's charge that controllers of the media give defenders of unpopular views few opportunities to make their case unless they resort to sensational methods such as disobedience.

Ronald Dworkin rests the right to civil disobedience not just on a person's right to political participation, but on all of the rights that she has against her government. People may be supposed to have a fundamental right against the government, such as freedom of expression, when that right is important to their dignity, to their standing as persons equally entitled to concern and respect, or to some other personal value of consequence. A person has a right to disobey a law, says Dworkin, whenever that law wrongly invades her rights against the government (Dworkin, 1977, 192). Thus, the moral right to breach the law is not a separate right, like a right of conscience, additional to other rights against the government. It is that part of people's rights against the government which the government fails to honour.

Together the three above positions bring out some key points of disagreement amongst philosophers on the issue of a right to civil disobedience. First, philosophers disagree over the grounds of this right. Is it derivative of a right to participate in the political decision-making process? Is it derivative of other rights? Is it founded on a person's equal status as a being worthy of concern and respect? Second, philosophers disagree over the parameters of the right. Does it extend to all acts of civil disobedience or only to those acts that meet certain conditions of justifiability? Third, philosophers differ over the kinds of regimes in which the right arises. Does it exist only in illiberal regimes or does it hold in all regimes including just regimes? A final issue, not brought out in any of the above views, is whether the right to civil disobedience extends to indirect civil disobedience. Presumably, it should, but none of the above positions offer arguments upon which one could base such a claim.

4. Punishment

The final issue to consider is how authorities should respond to civil disobedience. The question of appropriate legal response applies, first, to the actions of law-enforcers when deciding whether and how to intervene in a civilly disobedient action, whether to arrest, whether to charge, and so on. It applies, second, to the actions of prosecutors when deciding whether to proceed to trial. Finally, it applies to the actions of judges (and juries) when deciding whether to convict and (for judges) how much to punish. The focus here will be the issue of appropriate punishment.

4.1 Theories of Punishment

To determine when, if ever, punishment of civil disobedience is appropriate, it is necessary first to say a few things about the nature, purposes, and justification of lawful punishment by the state. The three basic issues of punishment are: Why punish?, Whom to punish?, and How much to punish? The justifications for punishment can be forward-looking, backward-looking or some combination of the two. Jeremy Bentham, for one, takes a forward-looking, consequentialist view of punishment. He holds that punishment is an evil that is only ever justified if its employment prevents some greater evil that would arise from not punishing (Bentham, 1970, 158).

A key variant of the consequentialist approach focuses on deterrence. Punishment is justified on deterrence grounds if it prevents and/or discourages both the offender and others from breaching the law. Deterrence theories are criticised for treating people as brutes not rational agents capable of responding to moral reasons because the deterrent element of punishment gives people a prudential reason (relating to the prospect of punishment), not a moral reason, to refrain from breaching the law. Deterrence theories also are criticised for allowing persons who are not proper objects of punishment to be punished when this succeeds in deterring other people from breaching the law. Finally, deterrence theories are criticised for making the parameters for appropriate punishment excessively broad in allowing that whatever punishment is needed to deter people is the justified punishment.

Desert theory, by contrast, takes a backward-looking view of the purpose and justification of punishment, focusing on what the offender deserves for her action. Desert theory is much more concerned than is deterrence theory with punishing only persons who are the proper objects of punishment and with punishing those persons only as much as they deserve. Desert theory aims at a response to the offence that is proportionate to its seriousness as an offence. Seriousness is determined by two factors: an offender's culpability and the harm caused by her action. Desert theories are criticised for insufficiently defending the view that the guilty always should be punished. Although the intuition that the guilty deserve to suffer is widely shared, it is not obvious why they deserve this. Desert theories are also criticised for assuming both that fact-finders can determine what offenders deserve and that the deserved punishment is necessarily the justified punishment: should people always be punished as they deserve?

A variant of desert theory is the communicative theory of punishment, which takes both a forward-looking and a backward-looking view of the purposes of punishment. The purposes of punishment on a communicative account are both to convey the state's condemnation of the action and to lead the offender to repent her action and to reform her conduct. On a communicative conception of punishment, the state aims to engage with the offender in a moral dialogue so that she appreciates the moral reasons she has to follow the law. According to some communicative theories, condemnation itself sufficiently justifies punishment. Punishment may be seen as a secular form of penance that vividly confronts the offender with the effects of her crime (Duff, 1998, 162). According to other, less monistic communicative theories, communication of censure alone is insufficient to justify punishment; added to it must be the aim of deterrence (von Hirsch, 1998, 171). Still other communicative theories add different considerations to the grounds for justification. On one pluralistic view, a distinction is drawn between the punishment that is deserved according to justice and the punishment that is actually justified. When, for example, an offender demonstrates repentance for her offence prior to punishment, the law has reason to be merciful toward her and to impose a less severe punishment than that which she deserves (Tasioulas, 2006). Mercy involves a charitable concern for the well-being of the offender as a potential recipient of deserved punishment. Given this offender's repentance, the justified punishment in this case is less than it would be were there no grounds for mercy.

4.2 Punishing Civil Disobedience

Deterrence systems of punishment recommend a simple approach to civil disobedience. Since the purpose and justification of punishment is to deter people from breaching the law, a deterrence system would impose on civil disobedients whatever punishment was necessary and sufficient to achieve that end. Whether that punishment would be less or more severe than, or equal to, that imposed on ordinary offenders depends on empirical considerations. Sometimes greater punishment than that required for ordinary offenders would be in order since disobedients who are serious in their moral conviction may not be deterred by standard punishments. Other times, however, less punishment than that for ordinary offenders would be in order since disobedients usually are not ‘hardened’ criminals and thus may need less severe treatment to deter them from offending.

In contrast to deterrence systems, monistic desert systems and communicative systems of punishment would only punish civil disobedients if, and to the extent that, they deserve to be punished. A pluralistic communicative system, which gives weight to considerations of mercy as well as retribution or desert, would only punish to the extent that the punishment was justified (not to the extent that it was deserved) since mercy toward the offender might recommend punishing her less than she deserves according to justice. The pluralistic approach raises the question whether being motivated by civil disobedience might give the law a reason to show mercy towards an offender. One might argue that a disobedient's conviction and commitments, which make it very difficult for her both to adhere to norms that violate those commitments and to desist from using effective means of protest, are facts about her circumstances that give the law reason to show mercy toward her. This would lessen the severity of any justified response from the law.

For desert and communicative theories concerned solely with justice-based desert, the key question is whether disobedients deserve censure, and if so, how much? There are at least three possible replies. One is that disobedients deserve the same punishment as the ordinary offenders who breach the same laws. There are several reasons to take this view. First, as Greenawalt puts it, the demands of proportionality would seem to recommend a uniform application of legal prohibitions. Since trespass is prohibited, persons who breach trespass laws in protest of either those laws or other laws are equally liable to persons who breach trespass laws for private purposes. Second, also from Greenawalt comes the suggestion that any principle that officials may excuse justified illegal acts will result in some failures to punish unjustified acts, for which the purposes of punishment would be more fully served. Even when officials make correct judgments about which acts to excuse, citizens may draw mistaken inferences, and restraints of deterrence and norm acceptance may be weakened for unjustified acts that resemble justified ones (Greenawalt, 1987, 273). Therefore all such violations, justified and unjustified, should be treated the same.

But much of this turns on the assumption that civilly disobedient breaches of law are in fact comparable to ordinary offences and deserve a comparable response from the law. The discussion in Section 1 of the key features of civil disobedience showed that it differs greatly from ordinary offences both in motivation and in mode of action, let alone moral justification. This would suggest that civil disobedience should be regarded in the eyes of the law as a different kind of disobedience from common crimes. This leaves two options: civil disobedience deserves greater censure or it deserves less censure than ordinary crimes do.

There are reasons to believe that civil disobedients should be dealt with more severely than ordinary offenders are. First, there is the fact that disobedients seem to have put themselves above the law in preferring their own moral judgment about a certain issue to that of the democratic decision-making process and the rule of law. (Although some judges have endorsed this caricature, it is worth noting that it clashes with how both dissenters and many theorists characterise their activities (Cf. Rawls, 1971; Greenawalt, 1987; Markovits, 2006).) Second, the communicative aspect of civil disobedience could be said to aggravate such offences since it usually is attended by much greater publicity than most covert violations are. This forces legal authorities to concern themselves with the possibility that law-abiding citizens will feel distressed, insecure and perhaps imposed upon if no action is taken. So, notes Greenawalt, while authorities may quietly let minor breaches pass, failure to respond to violations performed, in some respect, in the presence of authority, may undercut claims that the rules and the persons who administered them deserve respect (Greenawalt, 1987, 351-2). Third, any use of violence would seem to aggravate civil disobedience particularly when it increases the harm of the offence or when it directly incites further and unjustified instances of violence. And although violence may eloquently communicate a dissenter's seriousness and frustration, it changes the nature of the dialogue. It pushes authorities to respond in ways consonant with their stance on violence – responses which may be harsher than those they would otherwise wish to make toward acts of civil disobedience that defend values they can appreciate.

The final possible view is that civil disobedients should be dealt with more leniently than ordinary offenders are, at least when their disobedience is morally justified. These offenders are conscientiously motivated and often their protests serve the interests of society by forcing a desirable re-examination of moral boundaries. That said, moral justifications do not usually translate into legal justifications and disobedients have been notoriously unsuccessful at advancing a defence of necessity (a defence that their action was legally justified being the lesser of two evils). Whether the law should be more accommodating of their conscientious motivation and efforts to engage in moral dialogue with government and society is a topic for further debate.

5. Conclusion

Some theorists maintain that civil disobedience is an outdated, overanalysed notion that little reflects current forms of political activism, which tend toward more extreme modes of engagement. Herbert Storing has suggested that ‘The most striking characteristic of civil disobedience is its irrelevance to the problems of today.’ (Storing, 1991, 85). He said, shortly after the assassination of Martin Luther King Jr, that the fashion of civil disobedience is as likely to die out as it was to burst forth under the words of King. There is of course much evidence to show that Storing was mistaken in his predictions for the popularity of civil disobedience as a mode of dissent. Certainly though there have been shifts in the paradigm forms of civil disobedience in recent years; yet these shifts have occurred largely within the framework of conscientious communication discussed at the outset. The historical paradigms of Gandhi, King, the suffragettes, and Mandela are representative of that kind of civil disobedience which aims to guarantee legal protection for the basic rights of a specific constituency. Such disobedience contrasts with much contemporary civil disobedience, which focuses not on individuals' basic rights, but on broader issues or special interests such as the environment, animal rights, nuclear disarmament, globalisation, foreign policy, and so on.

Civil disobedience taken in support of concerns such as the environment or animal rights may be seen in part as a response to some breakdown in the mechanisms for citizen engagement in the decision-making process. This breakdown might be termed a democratic deficit (Markovits, 2005). Such deficits in that dialogue may be an inevitable part of real democracies, and disobedience undertaken to correct those deficits may be said to reflect, to varying degrees, dissenters' sensitivity to democratic ideals. Civil disobedience remains today very much a vibrant part of liberal democracies and there are significant issues concerning civil disobedience for philosophers to address, particularly in how this practice may be distinguished from more radical forms of protest and how this practice should be treated by the law.


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civil rights | legal obligation and authority | legal philosophy | punishment | Socrates | terrorism | Thoreau, Henry David


I thank Adrian Blau, Adam Cureton, Alan Hamlin, Jonathan Quong, Ben Saunders, Hillel Steiner, Zofia Stemplowska, and John Tasioulas for their useful suggestions. I thank Joseph Raz and John Tasioulas for valuable discussions on this topic.