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Legal Obligation and Authority

First published Mon Dec 29, 2003

Whatever else they do, all legal systems recognize, create, vary and enforce obligations. This is no accident: obligations are central to the social role of law and explaining them is necessary to an understanding of law's authority and, therefore, its nature. Not only are there obligations in the law, there are also obligations to the law. Historically, most philosophers agreed that these include a moral obligation to obey, or what is usually called “political obligation.” Voluntarists maintained that this requires something like a voluntary subjection to law's rule, for example, through consent. Non-voluntarists denied this, insisting that the value of a just and effective legal system is itself sufficient to validate law's claims. Both lines of argument have recently come under intense scrutiny, and some philosophers now deny that law is entitled to all the authority it claims for itself, even when the legal system is legitimate and reasonably just. On this view there are legal obligations that some of law's subjects have no moral obligation to perform.

1. Obligations In the Law

Every legal system contains obligation-imposing laws, but there is no decisive linguistic marker determining which these are. The term “obligation” need not be used, nor its near-synonym, “duty.” One rarely finds the imperative mood. The Canadian Criminal Code imposes an obligation not to advocate genocide thus: “Every one who advocates or promotes genocide is guilty of an indictable offence and liable to imprisonment for a term not exceeding five years.” The English Sale of Goods Act says that, “Where the seller sells goods in the course of a business, there is an implied condition that the goods supplied under the contract are of merchantable qualityÉ.” That these laws create obligations follows from the way “offence” and “implied condition” function in their respective areas of law, not from the language in which they are expressed.

On the face of it, some laws have other functions. A requirement that “a will must be signed” generally imposes no duty — not a duty to make a will, and not even a duty to have it signed if you do — it sets conditions in the absence of which the document simply does not count as a valid will. Nonetheless, some philosophers, including Jeremy Bentham and Hans Kelsen, argue that the content of every legal system can and should be represented solely in terms of duty-imposing and duty-excepting laws. Bentham asks, “What is it that every article of law has in common with the rest? It commands and by doing so creates duties or, what is another word for the same thing, obligations” (Bentham: 294.) (For a related contemporary view, see Harris: 84-106.) They think that analyzing laws this way reveals what legislators or subjects most need to know: under what conditions the coercive power of law will ultimately be met. Others argue that even if such a reduction were possible, it would be unwieldy, uninformative and unmotivated, concealing as it does the different social functions that laws fulfil (Hart 1994: 26-49) and the different kinds of reasons for action that they create(Raz, 1990). Others still, despairing of any principled way of knowing what a law is, have abandoned the problem entirely and tried to develop a theory of law that bypasses it. (Honoré; Dworkin, 1978: 71-78.) At a minimum, it does seem clear that whether or not all laws impose obligations, they can only be fully understood through their relations to those that do. Thus, a legal right is an interest that warrants holding others under an obligation to protect it, a legal power is the ability to create or modify obligations, and so forth.

What then are legal obligations? They are legal requirements with which law's subjects are bound to conform. An obligatory act or omission is something the law renders non-optional. Since people plainly can violate their legal obligations, “non-optional” does not mean that they are physically compelled to perform, nor even that law leaves them without any eligible alternative. On the contrary, people often calculate whether or not to perform their legal duties. Could it be then that obligations are simply weighty reasons to perform, even if sometimes neglected or outweighed? This cannot be a sufficient condition: high courts have important reasons not to reverse themselves too frequently, but no legal obligation to refrain. Nor is it necessary: one has an obligation, but only a trivial reason, not to tread on someone's lawn without his consent.

If their content does not account for the stringency of obligations, what does? An historically important, though now largely defunct, theory explained it in terms of penalty. Following Hobbes and Bentham, the English jurist John Austin says that to have a legal obligation is to be subject to a sovereign command to do or forbear, where a command requires an expression of will together with an attached risk, however small, of suffering an evil for non-compliance. “When I am talking directly of the chance of incurring the evil, or (changing the expression) of the liability or obnoxiousness to the evil, I employ the term duty, or the term obligation…” (Austin: 18.) Others conceived an indirect connection between duty and sanction. Hans Kelsen holds that what is normally counted as the content of a legal duty is in reality only part of a triggering condition for the mandatory norm which commands or authorizes officials to impose a sanction: “[A] norm: ‘You shall not murder’ is superfluous, if a norm is valid: ‘He who murders ought to be punished.’”(Kelsen: 55.) And thus, “Legal obligation is not, or not immediately, the behavior that ought to be. Only the coercive act, functioning as a sanction, ought to be.”(Kelsen: 119.)

None of these versions of the sanction theory survived H.L.A. Hart's criticisms (Hart 1994: 27-42; cf. Hacker.) First, they misleadingly represent a range of disparate legal consequences — including compensation and even invalidation — as if they all function as penalties. Second, they render unintelligible many familiar references to duties in the absence of sanctions, for example, the duty of the highest courts to apply the law. Third, they offer an inadequate explanation of non-optionality. “You have an obligation not to murder” cannot merely mean “If you murder you will be punished,” for the law is not indifferent between people, on the one hand, murdering and being jailed, and on the other hand not murdering at all. “The right to disobey the law is not obtainable by the payment of a penalty or a licence fee.”(Francome v. Mirror Group Newspapers Ltd. [1984] 2 All ER 408 at 412.) Such dicta are commonplace and reflect familiar judicial attitudes. Most important, the normal function of sanctions in the law is to reinforce duties, not to constitute them. It is true that one reason people are interested in knowing their legal duties is to avoid sanctions, but this is not the only reason nor is it, contrary to what Oliver Wendell Holmes supposed, a theoretically primary one. Subjects also want to be guided by their duties — whether in order to fulfil them or deliberately to infringe them — and officials invoke them as reasons for, and not merely consequences of, their decisions.

Sensitivity to such matters led Hart to defend a rule-based theory. He says that while sanctions might mark circumstances in which people are obligedto conform, they have an obligation only when subject to a practiced social rule requiring an act or omission. The fact that subjects use it as a rule marks it as normative. Three further features distinguish obligation-imposing rules: they must be reinforced by serious or insistent pressure to conform; they must be believed important to social life or to some valued aspect of it; and their requirements may conflict with the interests and goals of the subject (Hart 1994: 85-88.) This account of the nature of obligations is not an account of their validity. Hart does not say that a legal duty is binding whenever there is a willingness to deploy serious pressure in its support, etc. He holds that a duty is legally valid if it is part of the legal system (i.e., if it is certified as such by the tests for law in that system), and a legal duty is morally valid only if there are sound moral reasons to comply with it. But, at least in his early work, he offers the practice theory as an explanation of duties generally — legal duties are the creatures of legal rules, moral duties of moral rules and so on. (Hart later modified this view, see 1982: 255-68, and 1994: 256.)

The constitutive role of social pressure is sometimes considered an Austinian blemish on Hart's theory, but there are in any case more serious problems with it as a general account of obligations (Dworkin 1978: 50-54; Raz 1990: 53-8.) People readily speak of obligations when they are well aware that there are no relevant social practices, as might a lone vegetarian in a meat eating society. And Hart's practice conditions may be satisfied in cases where there is no obligation but only generally applicable reasons, as when victims are regularly urged to yield their wallets to a mugger. At best, Hart's theory will apply only to a special class of obligations in which the existence of a conventional practice is an essential part of the reasons for conformity, though even here, the theory is open to doubt. (See Dworkin 1978: 54-58; Green 1988: 88-121)

A third account is reason-based. On this view, what constitutes obligations is neither the social resources with which they are enforced, nor the practices in which they may be expressed, but the kind of reasons for action that they offer. Legal obligations are content-independent reasons that are both categorical and pre-emptive in force. The mark of their content-independence is that their force does not depend on the nature or merits of the action they require: in most cases, law can impose an obligation to do X or to refrain from doing X (Hart, 1958, 1982: 254-55; but cf. Markwick.) That they are pre-emptive means that they require the subject to set aside his own view of the merits and comply nonetheless. That they are categorical means that they do not condition their claims on the subject's own goals or interests.

This view is foreshadowed in both Hobbes and Locke, but its most influential contemporary version is due to Joseph Raz (1977; 1990: 35-84.) He argues that obligations are categorical reasons for action that are also protected by exclusionary reasons not to act on some of the competing reasons to the contrary. Obligations exclude some contrary reasons — typically at least reasons of convenience and ordinary preference — but they do not normally exclude all: an exclusionary reason is not necessarily a conclusive reason. The stringency of an obligation is thus a consequence not of its weight or practice features, but of the fact that it supports the required action by special normative means, insulating it from the general competition of reasons. Or at any rate this is what obligations do when they have the force the claim, i.e., when they are binding. The theory does not assume that all legal obligations actually are binding from the moral point of view, but it does suppose that the legal system puts them forth as if they were — a consequence that some have doubted. (Hart 1982: 263-67; Himma: 284-97) And while this account is invulnerable to the objections to sanction-based and practice-based theories, it does need to make good the general idea of an ‘exclusionary reason’, and some philosophers have expressed doubts on that score also (Perry, Regan): is it ever reasonable to exclude entirely from consideration an otherwise valid reason? The account has, nonetheless, been adopted by legal philosophers with otherwise starkly contrasting views of the nature of law. (Compare, e.g., Finnis: 231-59 and Marmor).

2. Authority, Obligation, and Legitimacy

A competitive market is not a legal system, even though people adjust their behaviour in response to relative prices and the whole constitutes a form of social order. Neither was the system of mutual nuclear deterrence, though it guided behaviour and generated norms that regulated the Cold War. Many philosophers and social scientists agree that a social order is a legal system only if it has effective authority. An effective (or de facto) authority may not be justified, but it does stand in a special relation to justified (de jure) authority. Justified authority is what effective authorities claim, or what they are generally recognized to have.

What is legal authority, and how is it related to obligations? It is a kind of practical authority, i.e. authority over action. On one influential view, “To claim authority is to claim the right to be obeyed.” (Wolff: 5.) There are, of course, authorities that make no such claim. Theoretical authorities, i.e., experts, are not characterized by claims to obedience — they need not even claim a right to be believed. And there are weaker forms of practical authority. To give someone authority to use your car is merely to permit him. But political authority, of which legal authority is one species, is normally seen as a right to rule, with a correlative duty to obey. On this account law claims the right to obedience wherever it sets out obligations. And to obey is not merely to comply with the law; it is to be guided by it. Max Weber says it is “as if the ruled had made the content of the command the maxim of their conduct for its very own sake.” (Weber: 946). Or, as Robert Paul Wolff somewhat more perspicuously puts it: “Obedience is not a matter of doing what someone tells you to do. It is a matter of doing what he tells you to do because he tells you to do it.” (Wolff: 9.) This is not to say that one obeys only in treating the authority's say-so as an indefeasible reason for action; but one must treat as a binding content-independent reason. The question whether there is an obligation of obedience to law is a matter of whether we should act from the legal point of view and obey the law as it claims to be obeyed (Raz 1979: 233-49.)

It is an interesting feature of this account that it supposes that one can tell what the authority requires independent of whether the requirement is justified on its merits. Richard Friedman argues: “[I]f there is no way of telling whether an utterance is authoritative, except by evaluating its contents to see whether it deserves to be accepted in its own right, then the distinction between an authoritative utterance and advice or rational persuasion will have collapsed.” (Friedman, 132.) An idea of this sort is developed by Raz into one of the leading arguments for the “sources thesis”, the idea that an adequate test for the existence and content of law must be based only on social facts, and not on moral arguments. (See nature of law: legal positivism.) Authority's subjects “can benefit by its decisions only if they can establish their existence and content in ways which do not depend on raising the very same issues which the authority is there to settle.” (Raz 1994: 219.) If law aims to settle disputes about moral issues, then law must be identifiable without resolving these same disputes. The law is therefore exhausted by its sources(such as legislative enactments, judicial decisions, and customs, together with local conventions of interpretation). This kind of argument has been generalized (see Shapiro), but also subjected to criticism. It is uncertain what sort of constraint is posed by the idea that it should not involve “the very same issues” — perhaps if morality is a necessary condition only there could be moral tests for authority that leave the relevant dependent reasons untouched (Coleman: 126-7.) And while law does indeed serve as a scheme for guiding and appraising behaviour, it may also have other functions, such as educating its subjects about right and wrong, and this may be ill-served the attitude that the rules are to be obeyed in part because they are the rules (Waluchow.)

The obligation-correlative view of authority is not universally accepted. Some argue that legal authority involves no claim right, but only a set of liberties: to decide certain questions for a society and to enforce their decisions. (Soper: 85 ff; cf. Ladenson; Greenawalt: 47-61; and Edmundson: 7-70). The liberty conception must answer two questions. First, is it not a feature of a right to decide that it requires subjects to refrain from acting on competing decisions? If the law says that abortion is permissible and the Church says that it is not, what does the denial of the Church's right to decide amount to if not that public policy should be structured by the former decision and not the latter, even if the latter is correct? Second, does the right to enforce include a duty of subjects to pay the penalty when required? If it does, then this is only a truncated version of the obligation-correlative theory — one that holds that punitive and remedial obligations, but not primary obligations, are binding. If not, it is starkly at variance with the actual views of legal officials, who do not think that subjects are at liberty to evade penalties if they can.

This reaches a methodological issue in the philosophy of law. Some consider that the character of law's authority is a matter for descriptive analysis fixed by semantic and logical constraints of official language and traditions of argument. Others maintain that such analysis is impossible or indeterminate, and that we are therefore driven to normative arguments about what legal authority should be (See: Soper; Finnis: 12-15.) Crudely put, they think that we should understand law to claim only the sort of authority it would be justifiable for law to have. Such is the motivation for Friedrich Hayek's suggestion that ‘The ideal type of law … provides merely additional information to be taken into account in the decision of the actor.’ (Hayek: 150.) Hayek favours the free market, and concludes that the nature of legal authority should be understood analogically. The most radical position of this sort is Ronald Dworkin's. He prefers what he calls a “more relaxed” understanding of legal authority (Dworkin 1986: 429.) Others have argued that the pre-emptive notion of authority is unsatisfactory because it is too rigid (e.g., Perry.) Dworkin's objection runs much deeper. His position is not that law communicates only a weaker form of guidance; it is that law is not to be understood as trying to communicate anything at all. A subject considering his legal duties is not listening to the law; he is engaged in “a conversation with oneself,” and is “ trying to discover his own intention in maintaining and participating in that practice” (Dworkin 1986: 58.) On this view there is no fact of the matter about what law claims that is independent of what each does well to regard it as claiming.

However we resolve the methodological question, there are two parallel normative questions:

What is the relationship between these? Some maintain that obligation comes first: “[T]hough obligation is not a sufficient condition for coercion, it is close to a necessary one. A state may have good grounds in some special circumstances for coercing those who have no duty to obey. But no general policy of upholding the law with steel could be justified if the law were not, in general, a source of genuine obligations.” (Dworkin 1986: 191.) The idea is that merely having justice on one's side is an inadequate ground for coercing others; one also needs a special title flowing from the moral status of the law. (Contrast, for example, Locke's view that everyone has an “executive power of the law of nature,” at least outside political society (§ 13).)

Others contend that this gets the relationship backwards. First, it is doubtful whether one could have an obligation to obey an illegitimate regime. As Rawls says, “[A]cquiesence in, or even consent to, clearly unjust institutions does not give rise to obligations.” (Rawls 1971: 343; but cf. Simmons 1979: 78-79.) If so, at least some conditions of legitimacy precede an obligation of obedience. Second, there are substantive reasons for thinking we would not have obligations to obey if the law were not already justified in upholding its requirements “with steel.” A legal system that could not justifiably coerce could not assure the law-abiding that the recalcitrant will not take them for suckers. Without being able to solve this assurance problem it would be unjust to impose obligations on them, and unjust to demand their obedience. Underlying this suggestion is that idea that familiar idea that effectiveness is a necessary — but certainly not sufficient — condition for justified authority. (See Kelsen: 46-50; cf. Finnis: 250)

3. Obligations to the Law

It may affirm our confidence in the obligation-correlative view to know that from earliest times philosophical reflection on political authority has focussed on the obligation to obey. The passive obligation of obedience is certainly not all we owe the law (Parekh; Green 2003: 543-47) but many have taken it to be law's minimum demand. This gives rise to a puzzle. As Wolff puts it: “If the individual retains his autonomy by reserving to himself in each instance the final decision whether to co-operate, he thereby denies the authority of the state; if, on the other hand, he submits to the state and accepts is claim to authority then … he loses his autonomy.”(Wolff: 9.) Wolff resolves the dilemma in favour of autonomy, and on that basis defends anarchism.

Some of Wolff's worries flow from the “surrender of judgement” itself — how can it ever be rational to act against reason as one sees it? Others flow from the fact that it is a surrender to the law. On the first point, it is relevant to notice that promises and contracts also involve surrender of judgement and a kind of deference to others (see Soper: 103-39), yet a rational anarchist needs such voluntary commitments to substitute for authoritative ordering. A principled objection to every surrender of judgment is thus self-defeating. Moreover, there seem to be cases in which by surrendering judgement on some matters one can secure more time and resources for reflection and decision on things that are more important, or with respect to which one has greater capacity for self-direction. A partial surrender of judgment may therefore enhance the agent's autonomy overall.

This suggests that Wolff's concern is better understood as scepticism about whether it is justifiable to surrender one's judgment wholesale to the law. Some philosophers have queried the intelligibility of this doubt; they say that it is of the nature of law that there is an obligation to obey it, at least in its central case ( Fuller: 100; Finnis: 14-15.) Some go so far as to conclude that it is therefore absurd to ask for any ground of the duty to obey the law: law is that which is to be obeyed (McPherson: 64.) We need a way into this circle, and the best entrance is in specifying the nature of law in a way compatible with various theories of its nature. Three features are especially important. (I draw on Hart 1994: 193-200; Raz 1990: 149-54; and Lyons: 66-68.) First, law is institutionalized: nothing is law that is not connected with the activities of institutions such as legislatures, courts, administrators, police, etc. Second, legal systems have a wide scope. Law not limited to the affairs of small face-to-face groups such as families or clans, nor does it only attend to a restricted domain of life such as baseball. Law governs open-ended domains of large, loosely structured groups of strangers and it regulates their most urgent interests: life, liberty, property, kinship, etc. But although law necessarily deals with moral matters, it does not necessarily do so well, and this is its third central feature: law is morally fallible. This is acknowledged by both positivists and natural lawyers, whose slogan “an unjust law is not a law” was never intended to assert the infallibility of law.

The question of political obligation, then, turns on whether there is are moral reasons to obey the mandatory requirements of a wide-ranging, morally fallible, institutionalized authority. This obligation purports to be comprehensive in that it covers all legal obligations and everyone whose compliance the law requires. It is not assumed to bind come what may, though it is to be one genuine obligation among others. Some philosophers also consider that it should bind people particularly to their own states, i.e., the states of which they are residents or citizens, and that an argument that could not show that one had more stringent duties to obey one's own country than a similarly just foreign one would be in that measure deficient (Simmons: 31-35, Green 1988: 227-28.) Finally, it is common ground the obligation exists only when a threshold condition of justice is met.

4. Non-voluntarist theories

A theory of political obligation is non-voluntarist if its principles justifying legal authority do not invoke the choice or will of the subjects among its reasons for thinking they are bound to obey. Three such arguments have some currency.

4.1 Constitutive Obligations

“[W]hy should I obey the government is an absurd question. We have not understood what it means to be a member of political society if we suppose that political obligation is something we might not have had and that therefore needs to be justified.” (McPherson, 64.) On this view, the many attempts to find independent moral principles to justify obligation are not merely mistaken, they are conceptually confused; they exhibit a “symptom of philosophical disorder.” (Pitkin, 75.) The matter is resolved by attending to the meaning of “member”. It is hard to find philosophers who still think that normative questions can be resolved by linguistic considerations, but there are, surprisingly, some who do think that this argument strategy is essentially correct. Ronald Dworkin, for instance, claims, “Political association, like family or friendship and other forms of association more local and intimate, is itself pregnant of obligation.” (Dworkin 1986: 206.) His obstetrical theory is parthenogenetic: politics is a form of association that in itself bears obligations. Having a virgin birth, obligation has no father among familiar moral principles such as consent, utility, fairness, and so on. We justify it by showing how it is a kind of “associative” or “communal” obligation constitutive of a certain kind of community.

People in organic associations do often feel obligations to other members, but we normally seek an independent ground to justify them (See Simmons 1996; Wellman 1997.) One version focuses on the value of obligations attached to social roles. The duty to obey is there explained by giving an account of the social role involved, for instance “member”, “citizen,” or “subject”. It is important to see that there is not one problem here, but two. There is a matter of content: what does the political role actually require? And there is the matter of validity: what makes these requirements binding on its occupants? (See Hardimon.) But these are intimately linked: one cannot solve the second independently of the first. There is no general answer to the question why role duties bind — it depends on the roles and the duties.

Dworkin, in contrast, believes we do generally have “a duty to honour our responsibilities under social practices that define groups and attach special responsibilities to membership,” (Dworkin 1986: 198) provided the group's members think that their obligations are special, personal, and derive from a good faith interpretation of equal concern for the well-being of all its members. In truth, however, these conditions are not a matter of the members’ actual feelings and thoughts — they are interpretive properties that we would do well to impute to them (201.) Even so, why do they ground a duty of obedience as opposed to a duty of respectful attention, or a duty to apologize for cases of non-compliance? Certainly obedience is not part of Dworkin's paradigm virtue of “fraternity” — mutual aid and support are the normal obligations there. Indeed, the classical associative model for political authority was not fraternity, but paternity, against which Locke argued so decisively. This is not to deny that we owe something to those decent associations of which we find ourselves non-voluntary members — but we do need some further argument to determine exactly what this amounts to.

4.2 Instrumental Justification

A more typical non-voluntarist theory says authority may be instrumentally justified as a way to help its subjects do what they ought.

The normal and primary way to establish that a person should be acknowledged to have authority over another person involves showing that the alleged subject is likely better to comply with reasons which apply to him (other than the alleged authoritative directives) if he accepts the directives of the alleged authority as authoritatively binding, and tries to follow them, than if he tries to follow the reasons which apply to him directly.(Raz, 1994:214; cf. Raz, 1986: 38-69)

Raz calls this the “normal justification thesis” (NJT.) It is satisfied only if the authority bases his directives on the reasons which apply to the subjects (the “dependence thesis”) and if the subjects take his directives as pre-emptive reasons, displacing their own judgments about what is to be done on the merits (the “pre-emption thesis”). Three points need emphasis. First, a normal justification is not a unique justification, but one typical to a variety of practical and theoretical authorities. At its core idea is that justified authorities help their subjects do what they already have good reason to do; it does not apply when it is more important for the subjects to decide for themselves than to decide correctly. Second, although NJT has similarities to rule-utilitarianism, it is not a utilitarian theory: that requires further commitments about what sort of reasons are relevant and how about indirect policies may be pursued. Third, NJT does not require valid authority to promote the subject's self-interest. For example, if there are investments it is immoral to make (e.g., in countries that tolerate slavery) then a consultant's recommendations merit deference only they steer one away from those investments: it is not enough (or permissible) for them to maximize one's financial returns. NJT is governed by whatever reasons correctly apply to the case, not reasons of which the agent is aware, or which serve his self-interest narrowly understood.

Something like this does capture the way we justify deferring to expert opinions of scientists or to the advice of doctors who know better than we do. Were we to try to second-guess them we could not profit from their expertise. To accept them as authoritative therefore requires deferring to their judgement, and allowing that to displace our own assessment of what is to be done. This is not blind deference: the subject remains attentive to higher-order considerations that determine whether the authority is trustworthy, acting in good faith, and so on. And the deference may be limited in scope and subject to checks of its effectiveness over time.

How far do such considerations apply to political authority? They do to some extent. A legislator or administrator may know better than most what is to be done to preserve the salmon fisheries or to slow global warming. But some scientists may know as well, or better, and in some areas there are be no criteria of relevant expertise at all. The only prospect of broadening NJT's reach therefore rests on its application to integrate the activity of many people who must cooperate but who disagree on these matters and more. If authority is able to create or support valuable schemes of social cooperation, subjects may be justified in obeying even though that is not the scheme they would themselves have chosen. It is sometimes argued that this is so in general “co-ordination problems” and in situations in which individual reasoning might be self-defeating, for instance, in prisoner's-dilemmas.

It is uncertain how far deference to authority is really needed here. The extent to which people need authoritative guidance to secure cooperation varies with context. And law can solve some problems of cooperation simply providing information or by restructuring incentives (see Green, 1988: 89-157.) That suggests that NJT covers only a narrow range of legitimate state activity. But in another way it seems too broad. We do not think that political authority should be acknowledged whenever the rulers can better ensure conformity to right reason. There are matters that are too trivial or otherwise inappropriate for political regulation. Perhaps some sort of threshold condition must first be met, and NJT should be confined to issues of general social importance.

4.3 Necessity

Arguments based on necessity may be motivated by just that worry. On this account, it is not enough that someone be able to help others track right reason, he must be able to do so within a certain domain. Locke thought the most urgent question for political philosophy was to “distinguish exactly the business of civil government” (Locke 1982: 26), to determine what things are properly Caesar's. Some contemporary writers take a related view. Elizabeth Anscombe argues that the domain of authority is the domain of necessary social functions. “If something is necessary, if it is, for example, a necessary task in human life, then a right arises in those whose task it is, to have what belongs to the performance of the task.”(Anscombe: 160.) There are, then, two questions: What tasks are necessary? What rights are needed to perform them?

Answers to the first question range widely. George Klosko ties it to the production of “presumptively beneficial public goods,” goods that any one would want and which require social co-operation to produce (Klosko, 1992.) Others are more extravagant. Finnis thinks law must provide a comprehensive framework for realizing a list of supposedly self-evident values including life, knowledge, play and religion (Finnis: 81-97, 154-56.) An influential intermediate answer ties political authority to the realm of justice and grounds obedience in a natural duty: “This duty requires us to support and comply with just institutions that exist and apply to us. It also constrains us to further just arrangements not yet established, at least when this can be done without too much cost to ourselves.” (Rawls 1971: 115)

The basis of Rawls's theory in necessity becomes evident if we explore what it might be for a just institution to “apply to us.” A.J. Simmons persuasively argues that an Institute for the Advancement of Philosophers cannot benefit us, however justly, and then demand that we pay its dues (Simmons 1979: 148.) He proposes therefore that a normatively relevant sense of application requires that one accept the benefits — but that is to transform a natural duty account into a weakly voluntarist one like fairness. (See below, § 5.3.) Jeremy Waldron diagnoses the force of such counterexamples as deriving from the fact that, although operating justly, the Institute is not something whose activities are required by justice: they are optional, not necessary (Waldron 1993.) This seems correct; but if we then restrict the domain of authority to necessity we will again leave many legal obligations behind. Many of the activities of a legitimate government are optional. It must save us from the state of nature, but law's ambitions are more expansive than that. It also does things that are permissible but not necessary: enacts residential zoning, declares official languages, establishes national holidays, supports education and the arts, and creates honors. And in the service of what is mandated by necessity, law draws lines and sets standards that are themselves merely permissible — an age of consent, an acceptable level of risk-imposition, formalities for wills and marriages, and so on — what Aquinas called “determinations” of just requirements. The content of all this valuable and permissible state action is underdetermined by the theory of legitimacy and is grounded in considerations other than necessity. So necessetarian arguments leave unsupported some — possibly a lot — of valuable state action. Moreover, it is unclear what is necessary for law to fulfil its socially necessary functions. Anscombe refers to the right to have what is necessary for the role, but what is that? Hume thought it obvious that political society could not exist without “exact obedience of the magistrate” but this is surely empiricism without the facts. Everyone knows that a legal system can, and does, tolerate a certain amount of harmless disobedience and that this in no way hampers its capacity to function.

5. Voluntarist Theories

5.1 Consent

“The Right of all Sovereigns,” says Hobbes in Leviathan (chap. 42) “is derived originally from the consent of everyone of those that are to be governed.” In the Second Treatise (§ 95) Locke says: “Men being … by nature all free, equal, and independent, no one can be put out of this estate and subjected to the political power of another without his own consent.” The ideological influence of such theories in the struggles for representative government and decolonisation was immense. Few now deny, in the words of the American Declaration of Independence, that all governments “deriv[e] their just powers from the consent of the governed.” It is perhaps not too much to say that consent has become the normal justification for political authority.

But whose consent, and to what? Not the consent of our ancestors, for such an “original” contract, as it was called in the seventeenth century, can have no authority over those who did not agree to it. A voluntarist theory requires the actual consent of each subject. But this cannot mean consent to every law or application thereof. The evident absurdity of that idea leads Finnis to declare consent “intrinsically implausible”: “the need for authority is, precisely, to substitute for unanimity in determining the solution of practical co-ordination problems which involve or concern everyone in the community.”(Finnis, 248.) Consent theorists, however, have not generally proposed the principle as a solution to “practical co-ordination problems.” Unanimous consent would be a very bad decision rule: the transaction costs would be enormous and hold-outs could block many desirable policies. Consent is more commonly proposed as a part of the constitution rule that sets up the political community in the first place. Consent theorists reject, therefore, Kant's idea in the Metaphysics of Morals (§ 44) that the mere capacity of A to violently affect B's interests is sufficient licence for anyone to subject them both to a regime of positive law. For consent theorists, an A-B interaction does not become a candidate for authoritative regulation until A and B agree to unite under one jurisdiction. We cannot ask which or what sort of authority is justified over both the Kurds and the Shiites in Iraq until we answer why there should be one at all. Beyond this foundational role, however, consent theorists take different views of whether it has any further significance in policy. Locke thinks it is then displaced by majority rule by delegates as the natural procedure for most decisions; for Rousseau, this is but another form of slavery.

Even in its confined role, however, consent has attracted powerful criticism. (For a good survey see Simmons 1979: 57-100; for a qualified defence see Beran.) These focus on the questions of whether it is in fact given and, if given, whether it would bind. Consent is not mere consensus or approval; it is a performative commitment that undertakes an obligation through the very act of consenting. Like other promises and oaths, however, there are limits to its validity. We need to ensure that consent is not defeated by mistake, coercion or duress. It must also respect substantive limits on its validity. Locke argues that one cannot consent to be killed, and thus not to slavery, and thus not to anything tantamount to slavery, including absolute government. One can imagine a similar argument to the conclusion that political consent must be revocable. But as we build in all these validity conditions the commitment itself seems to be doing less and less work. Pitkin thinks that in Locke's version it becomes “essentially irrelevant.” (Pitkin: 57.) Consent is saved from irrelevance only if we can explain why we also value a power to bind ourselves to obey. David Hume could conceive no reason at all: promise-keeping is an “artificial virtue” serving the public good, just like obedience to law. So long as law is tolerably legitimate — and Hume is prepared to give it a very wide berth — a promise to obey is redundant, for any plausible answer to the question why we are bound by the promise would “immediately, without any circuit, have accounted for our obligation to allegiance;” “being of like force and authority, we gain nothing by resolving the one into the other.” (Hume: 481.) A consent theory need not, however, “resolve” allegiance into a promise — there may also be non-promissory conditions on obedience — but it must explain why it should be conditional on it. Three sorts of arguments have been popular. First, there are instrumental reasons for wanting deliberate control over the liability to legal duties. In political authority, where the stakes are as high as they come, the power to give and withhold consent serves an ultimate protective function beyond what we could expect from the fallible institutions of limited government. Second, consent enables people to establish political allegiances by creating new political societies or joining existing ones without awaiting the gradual emergence of bonds of community and reciprocity; consent is an immediate passport to “perfect membership” in a commonwealth. (Locke: § 119). Third, though consent is defined by its performative character, ancillary non-performative features naturally accompany it: consent also expresses the acceptability, or at least tolerability, of the government. This may mark consented-to rulers as salient from among a number of possible contenders, and it may signal that they stand a good chance of being effective, which is itself a necessary condition for the justification of any political authority.

It is open to doubt how persuasive such considerations are. But matters are even worse, for it is in any case clear that many people have done nothing that counts as giving such consent. Even freely given oaths of office and naturalization do not usually amount to a general commitment to obey the law (Greenawalt.) Other acts are even less plausibly so interpreted. Plato's Crito introduces the idea that continued residence counts as some kind of tacit consent to obey, and Locke extends that to include any enjoyment of the benefits of government — “whether it be barely travelling freely on the highway” (§ 199.) Whatever the moral relevance of these facts, they do not count as consent, for people do these things without imagining they will create obligations, and they do them in circumstances in which they have no feasible alternative. Other non-promissory actions, for example voting or participating in politics, fare no better: many do not vote, and few who do regard it as undertaking any duties at all. Perhaps we can say that if people consent, and if the relevant legitimacy conditions are fulfilled, then they will have a duty to obey the law. That is obviously a far cry from establishing law's claims.

5.2 Expressive Obligations

Consent supposes that obligations of obedience must be somehow undertaken by acts the point of which is to assume an obligation. There are weaker forms of voluntarism. Some relationships that one may freely enter (or at least exit) are marked by obligations. In essence, this is a voluntarist version of the theory of constitutive obligations considered above in Section 4.1, and it offers the most plausible interpretation of arguments from gratitude (Walker; Klosko 1989) or community.

On such views we are bound to obey because that is an appropriate expression of emotions we have good reason to feel: gratitude to the law for all that it gives us, respect for its good-faith efforts to guide us, or a sense of belonging to the community. In the last case, the relationship cannot merely be that of being a subject of the law; it must be something like membership in the community whose law it is (Raz 1979: 250-61.) Friendship provides an analogy. People choose their friends, but not in order to have obligations to them. A flourishing friendship does, however, bring obligations in train. In addition to the familiar reasons for fulfilling its duties of support, honesty, reciprocity etc., it is plausible to suppose that doing so also expresses and is known to express loyalty to one's friends, and that that gives additional support to the duties. Similarly, suggests Raz, “A person identifying himself with his society, feeling that it is his and that he belongs to it, is loyal to his society. His loyalty may express itself, among other ways, in respect for the law of the community.” (1979: 259.) This is bound to be a somewhat loose fit — the institutional and bureaucratic structure of law means that it will generally be an imperfect expression of the society it regulates. And, as Raz notes, expressive arguments apply only to those who actually stand in this special relation; they do not show that it is obligatory to do so, nor that it is obligatory to express one's loyalty in this way rather than some other. Moreover, it is unclear why we should even think that obedience is a fitting expression of this sort of relationship in the first place. Is this a well-entrenched convention? Is it somehow normatively appropriate? Loyalty to one's friends is not normally shown in obeying them. Why should loyalty to the community be any different?

5.3 Fairness

Perhaps the most influential voluntarist argument grounds political obligation in neither nor performative nor expressive acts, but in a bare willingness to benefit from a system of mutual restraint. This is the territory of fairness, or fair play, as articulated by Hart (1955) and elaborated by Rawls (1964.) The core idea is that those who accept the benefits of fair scheme of cooperation have a duty to do their allotted part under that scheme: if others obey the law to our benefit, we owe them a duty not to take a free-ride on their compliance.

The idea that law's benefits must be accepted may not be a necessary condition for the validity of all obligations of fair play (Arneson; Klosko 1992), but it is essential for any that aspire to be consistent with political voluntarism. If a scheme of cooperation simply thrusts benefits on people as the unavoidable fall-out of the cooperative activity of others — even very valuable benefits — any duty of compliance would have to be justified by one of the non-voluntary principles considered above. Adding the acceptance condition does not of course reduce fairness to consent: those who jump subway turnstiles do not mean to assume an obligation to pay the fare. But it does renders fairness vulnerable to the very same objection: not enough people perform the relevant action. The central benefits of an effective legal system, including security and order, are all the sort of non-excludible public goods that Simmons (1979: 138-39) calls “open benefits.” They can be avoided only at great cost, and in many cases not at all. What's more, not all cases of disobedience can plausibly be represented as free-riding, and obligations of fairness track the jurisdiction of the law only in a rough-and-ready way. Fairness will give rise to obligations whenever there is a beneficial practice of mutual constraint and accepted benefit — it matters not whether this is sustained by a law claiming jurisdiction over the subjects.

6. Scepticism and anarchism

As the above survey suggests, there are plausible objections to each of the dominant justifications for the duty to obey the law. (For helpful assessments of other theories, see also Wasserstrom, Smith, and Simmons 1979.) Each leaves significant gaps in the authority of law. This is not an impossibility proof — only anarchists like Wolff think that justified political authority is impossible. But neither is it just the familiar problem that philosophical theories provide only a rough fit to our casuistic judgements. It is that the typical justifications for authority are all sensitive to context in a way that the claims of law are not. To put it another way, law itself purports to determine how far and in what contexts its authority binds.

The resulting scepticism about the obligation to obey has given rise to a debate about its significance (Senor; Gans: 90.) As in other areas of philosophy, some treat sceptical conclusions as a reductio against whatever premises seem to support them; others are inclined to follow the arguments where they lead. In assessing the significance of scepticism, one needs to bear in mind several points:

  1. Scepticism about political obligation flows from the special features of legal authority, in particular, its wide scope, its institutionalized character, and its moral fallibility. That is why the familiar principles by which we justify the authority of teachers, parents, doctors, or executors do not readily generalize to cover all laws. Most sceptical arguments are about over-reach. They do not deny that legal authority is often valuable, or that there is often content-dependent reason to do what law requires; they do not deny that some people have moral obligations to obey; they do not even deny that there are some laws that everyone has a moral obligation to obey. They deny only that the conscientious subject is bound to take the law at its word, that he must share the self-image of the state. It is important to see that this does not amount to endorsing a policy of “pick and choose.” It is consistent with a mixed policy: there may be areas and issues with respect to which one should accept an obligation of obedience and others where one should apportion one's compliance to the merits. Hart writes, “The recognition of an obligation to obey the law must as a minimum imply that there is at least some area of conduct regulated by law in which we are not free to judge the moral merits of particular laws and to make our obedience conditional on this judgment.” (Hart 1958.) Sceptical arguments need not deny that there is some such area; they deny that it coincides with law's actual claims.
  2. Scepticism about obligation does not entail scepticism about legitimacy: one may affirm that law is entitled to coerce while denying that all of law's subjects have a duty to obey it. (See Green 1988; Simmons 1979; and Edmundson). Scepticism about the possibility of legitimate government leads to anarchism of the ordinary sort; scepticism about political obligation leads only to what is called “philosophical anarchism”: the denial that law has the all authority it claims for itself.
  3. Scepticism is not the view that assuming an obligation to obey would be impermissible, a view of anarchists like William Godwin and Wolff and extreme individualists like Thoreau. Sceptics say that there are also other morally permissible attitudes to have towards the law. These attitudes may be more prevalent, and more justifiable, than some philosophers suppose.


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Austin, John | Bentham, Jeremy | free rider problem | law: and language | nature of law | nature of law: interpretivist theories | nature of law: legal positivism | nature of law: pure theory of law