Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Dec 1, 1997; substantive revision Mon Sep 18, 2006

Colors are of philosophical interest for two kinds of reason. One is that colors comprise such a large and important portion of our social, personal and epistemological lives and so a philosophical account of our concepts of color is highly desirable. The second reason is that trying to fit colors into accounts of metaphysics, epistemology and science leads to philosophical problems that are intriguing and hard to resolve. Not surprisingly, these two kinds of reasons are related. The fact that colors are so significant in their own right, makes more pressing the philosophical problems of fitting them into more general metaphysical and epistemological frameworks.

1. The Philosophy of Color

The visual world, the world as we see it, is a world populated by colored objects. Typically, we see the world as having a rich tapestry of colors or colored forms — fields, mountains, oceans, hairstyles, clothing, fruit, plants, animals, buildings, and so on. Colors are important in both identifying objects, i.e., in locating them in space, and in re-identifying them. So much of our perception of physical things involves our identifying objects by their appearance, and colors are typically essential to an object's appearance, that any account of visual perception must contain some account of colors. Since visual perception is one of the most important species of perception and hence of our acquisition of knowledge of the physical world, and of our environment, including our own bodies, a theory of color is doubly important.

Despite much thought, over thousands of years, by philosophers and scientists, however, we seem little closer now to an agreed account of color than we ever were. The disagreement is reflected in the fact that some theorists believe colors to be perceiver-relative, e.g., dispositions or powers to induce experiences of a certain kind, or to appear in certain ways to observers of a certain kind. Others take them to be objective, physical properties of objects. Among the latter group, some take these properties to be physical microstructures, while others regard colors as sui generis irreducible properties of physical bodies, and yet others take them to be dispositional properties to affect light. Finally, there are even some who deny that there are colors in the world at all: there are none of the colors, it is claimed, that we naturally and normally and unreflectingly attribute to objects.

The major problem with color has to do with fitting what we seem to know about colors into what science, particularly physics, tells us about physical bodies and their qualities. More specifically, we experience color as an intrinsic feature of the surfaces of physical bodies, or as a property spread throughout a volume, e.g., of wine. But, or so it seems, the physical account of these physical objects finds no place for such qualities. It is this problem that historically has led the major physicists who have thought about color, to hold a common view: that the colors we ordinarily and naturally take objects to possess, are such that physical objects do not actually have them. Oceans and skies are not blue in the way that we naively think, nor are apples red, (nor green). Colors of that kind, it is believed, have no place in the physical account of the world that has developed from the 16th Century to this century. Physicists who have subscribed to this doctrine include the luminaries: Galileo, Boyle, Descartes, Newton, Young, Maxwell and Helmholtz. In this doctrine, they were joined by a number of fellow travelers, including most famously, John Locke.

Such a view is clearly paradoxical, given what was said above, about the ubiquity of colors in the perceived world, and about the importance of colors in the identification and re-identification of physical objects. It is possible to mitigate the paradoxical character of the doctrine by drawing a distinction between two concepts of color: (i) color as a sensory, i.e., subjective, quality, intrinsic to our sensory experiences; (ii) color as a power, to induce sensory experiences with color, understood as a sensory quality. On this account, color terms have a systematic ambiguity. Provided we take account of the ambiguity, no harm is done, and much benefit derived. According to this view, then, in one sense of ‘color’, physical objects have colors, for they have the power to induce experiences of color, but in the other sense, they do not. That is to say, there is no problem if the second concept, color-as-it-is-in-experience, is restricted in its use so as to apply to the experiential quality. Problems arise, however, when it is used, naively and unreflectingly, to apply to physical bodies: we naively suppose the experiential quality to be an intrinsic quality of the physical object. When we enjoy visual experiences, then in some sense we project the sensory quality in our experience on to physical objects. One who exploited this idea to great effect was David Hume, who used our experience of color as a model for thinking about the way we attribute causal connections, necessity and moral predicates to objects and situations in the world (remembering that Hume adapted the model to his own terminology of ‘impressions’ and ‘ideas’).

With this in mind, the Descartes-Locke position is best expressed as implying that it is possible for perceivers when applying color concepts to physical bodies, to use different concepts, reflecting different attitudes which one may adopt. One attitude is what might be called a ‘natural’ attitude: a naive, pre-reflective, natural attitude; the other involves a more sophisticated attitude. One concept is a pre-reflective, pre-theoretical concept, the other is more sophisticated. While the Descartes-Locke view has had, and continues to have, a strong influence among many of the scientists who work on color, there has always been strong opposition to it among the philosophical community.

Various reasons have been given for dissatisfaction with the physicists' position. It has been variously argued that: (i) the notion of ‘color as it is in experience’ is incoherent; (ii) the physicists' doctrine encapsulates a confusion about what the ordinary, natural concept of color is; (iii) those who defend the doctrine forget that there are other sciences besides physics. For example, there are biological sciences such as zoology, botany, ecology, and so on, in which colors do have a role to play that they do not have in physics and chemistry; (iv) those who defend the doctrine forget that color has a social role to play; that colors are important in social life, and the criteria for application of color predicates are based on that social life; (v) the ordinary, natural concept of color, the ‘folk’ concept is not as the physicists and their friends believe.This last criticism takes several different forms:

  1. according to the natural notion, colors are simple, objective, intrinsic qualities of objects, qualities whose natures are manifest in perception: John Campbell, P.M.S.Hacker;
  2. according to the natural notion, colors are unknown qualities of physical bodies, qualities which appear to us in distinctive ways: Thomas Reid, Frank Jackson, David Lewis, Brian McLaughlin.
  3. according to the natural notion, colors are dispositional properties, powers to appear in appropriate ways: Michael Dummett, Gareth Evans.

The criticism of the physicists' position that their notion of ‘color as it is in experience’ is confused is widely held. [See Westphal (1987), Hacker (1987) and Evans (1980)]. This criticism has in turn been attacked on the ground that it is based on uncharitable interpretations of the texts, ones made without serious attempt to make sense of the physicists' position. [See Maund (1991) and (1995) pp. 6-24; 30-33 ]

The first of these formulations of the objection, we should note, opens the way for a modification of the physicists' position on color, as expressed by Descartes and Locke. It construes the natural/folk concept of color in such a way that colors are taken to be perceiver-independent, intrinsic, qualitative features of physical surfaces, volumes and other physical entities such as skies, rainbows and flames. This is the kind of color that our visual experiences represent objects as having. The Descartes-Locke position can be reframed so as to adopt this formulation of the folk concept, and to argue that no instances of this concept are physically actualised. According to this way of thinking, Descartes and Locke were right that given the natural (naive, pre-reflective) concept of color, we can conclude that, in this sense, objects do not have colors. Their way of characterising the concept, however, is at fault. It should not be described as ‘color as it is in experience’. There may very well be a coherent notion of ‘color-as-it-is-in-experience’ or ‘color as a subjective quality’, but that notion is not the natural concept of color. The natural concept is more plausibly construed as a concept of a certain kind of property: it is a perceiver-independent, intrinsic, qualitative feature of physical surfaces (i.e. it is not a dispositional property either to affect light or to appear to observers). This re-formulation of the Descartes-Locke view may be described as the Illusion theory of Colors.

It is possible, moreover, to specify the natural concept in more detail: to be red is to have a certain feature, one that satisfies a range of conditions. One such condition is that colors together form a system of qualitative features, that resemble and differ from each other in systematic ways. A second condition is that the color has a causal role to play in the visual identification or recognition of the color.

Given that colors can be specified as properties of this kind, it is then possible to argue that there are no actual properties that satisfy all the conditions set down. Accordingly, those in the Locke-Descartes-Helmholtz tradition who emphasize the need for a distinction between color-as-in-physical-objects and color-as-in-experience are best interpreted as thinking that there is no physical feature in physical objects that satisfies all the requirements (that serves all the required roles) of color, as it is naturally conceived. This reconstruction of the Descartes-Locke preserves the other element of that position, namely that the right way to think of colors is as mind-dependent dispositional properties. This is the best way, it is claimed, to make sense of colors, taken to be properties of physical bodies.

Clearly those in the Descartes-Locke tradition make two substantial claims. One concerns the character of the ordinary, naive, pre-reflective concept of color; the other is a proposal, of what form our color concepts should take, for scientific and metaphysical purposes, i.e., if we want to think clearly and scientifically about colors. The proposal is that color, thought of as a property that physical objects possess, should be thought of as dispositional property: a power to induce experiences of color, in normal perceivers, in the right kind of circumstances. [This concept of color, it should be noted, requires in addition, another concept of color, color-as-it-is-in-experience.]

There is a substantial body of opposition to this element in the Descartes-Locke tradition as well. For some thinkers, the ones referred to above, the opposition is coupled with, and allows for, the ordinary concept. For others, the question of what colors are essentially is decided on grounds separate from the question of how colors are conceptualized, by ordinary perceivers.

We can set out, in summary form, the set of leading rival theories:

  1. Colors are objective, intrinsic properties: they are sui generis, irreducible properties, supervenient on microstructural properties of the type cited in 2, below. [P.M.S. Hacker, J. Campbell]
  2. Colors are objective, intrinsic properties of physical bodies. They are to be identified with, or are reducible to, microstructural properties of the bodies that possess them. [T. Reid]
  3. Colors are objective properties of bodies but they are dispositional, light-related properties; dispositions to modify light (to emit, reflect, absorb, differentially reflect and absorb, transmit or scatter light), in the right way, and in the right proportion. [D.M. Armstrong, J. Westphal, D.R. Hilbert]
  4. Colors are dispositional properties: powers to induce in observers of a specifiable kind, physical responses of a kind that are peculiar to those observers.
  5. Colors are perceiver-dependent dispositional properties: powers to appear in distinctive ways, to normal perceivers, in contextualised standard conditions. [M. Dummett, G. Evans, J. McDowell]
  6. Colors are perceiver-dependent but hybrid properties: to have a specific color is to have some intrinsic feature by virtue of which the object has the power to appear in a distinctive way (e.g., as in 4). [R. Descartes, J. Locke]
  7. Colors are relational properties: they are physical properties, e.g., spectral reflectances, which are perceived in a distinctive way. [E. Thompson]
  8. Colors are objective, perceiver-independent properties: they are the occupants of certain perceiver-dependent functional roles, e.g. roles defined in terms of the way objects look. [B. McLaughlin, J. Cohen, M. Tye, A. Byrne & D. Hilbert]
  9. Colors are socially or culturally constructed properties. To be red is for an object to satisfy such criteria that make it worthy of having the predicate "red" applied. [J. Van Brakel]

2. The Aim of Philosophical Theories of Color

To assess the rival claims about the status of color, we need to clarify what the aim of a philosophical theory of color should be. Philosophical discussions of color are sometimes framed in terms of answering such questions as "what is the nature of color?" "what is color essentially?" "what is the essence of color?". Sometimes, they are framed in terms of answering the question of what kind of understanding a person must have in order to understand color concepts or to be able to use color terms with understanding. Here we are asking a question about color concepts and it will be important to clarify first, whether the concepts in question are concepts are concepts of natural language, or technical concepts introduced for scientific or industrial purposes, and then with respect to both, whether there are different kinds of concepts.

On the face of it, there are two different exercises here: identifying the nature of colors, i.e., what colors are essentially; and specifying what the concept of color is. It seems that one exercise requires looking at the world and the other looking at the thinkers. However both exercises would seem to be an integral part of any philosophical theory of color. For there appear to be two prominent facts about colors that any theory would need to respect: (1) that colors are properties in the world (i.e., properties of physical objects), to which one's color vision is sensitive; (2) that colors are qualities that perceptual experience represent (or presents) objects as having. At least, if any theory denies that these are facts about colors, then an extremely good explanation is called for. One theory that comes close to denying that the first is a fact is the Descartes-Locke tradition. This theory is more subtle, however, than this would suggest. It draws a distinction between two concepts or senses of color. In one sense objects do have colors but this is not the sense in which objects are represented as having colors; while in the other sense, objects are represented as having colors, but these are not properties which objects actually have.

There is a stronger reason for thinking that the two exercises might be related. This reason depends on the fact that there are different available models for thinking about concepts. For certain kinds of concepts, the understanding required in order to possess the concept of X provides the only answer to the question of what X's are essentially. (The nominal essence is the same as the real essence.) On the other hand, if externalists are right then the content of some mental states are broad. Hence, if concepts are constituents of the content then individuating these concepts will require identifying some object, property or natural kind. Accordingly, depending on which model for color concepts we adopt, the two exercises (looking at the world and looking at the thinkers) may be related.

In any case, if those in the Descartes-Locke tradition are right in drawing distinctions between different concepts of color, then there will be different answers to the question of what the essence of color is, depending on which concept we have in mind. There are, within this tradition, two important distinctions. One is between color as a property of physical bodies and color as a quality in experience, i.e a phenomenal or subjective quality: color-as-it-is-in-experience. In the second place, if we concentrate on color conceived as a property of physical bodies, we can distinguish between a naive, pre-reflective concept and a sophisticated, critical concept. For Descartes and Locke, the former concept is confused or at least has a faulty assumption built into it. Accordingly, the answer to the question of what colors are essentially, will be "none" for the pre-reflective concept and "a mind-dependent dispositional property" for the critical concept.

Much of the opposition to the Descartes-Locke account consists in challenging their characterization of the natural or folk concept. Some philosophers, Dummett, Evans, McDowell, argue that the natural concept is dispositional and does not need to be reconstructed in the way that Descartes and Locke suggest. A different form of opposition is found among the many objectivists who claim that the natural concept is objectivist. Opinion divides between those who hold that colors have hidden essences, e.g., microstructural features such as spectral reflectances, and those who hold that their essences are manifest. Most modern objectivists believe not only that colors have essences but that these essences have either been discovered by scientists, or are close to being discovered.

It is possible, however, to take a different view: that the natural concept of color is objectivist, that is, that colors are conceptualized as objective, intrinsic features of physical bodies but, so it happens, there are no such features in nature. The essences are virtual, not actual. On this account, colors are virtual properties (have virtual essences) just as phlogiston and caloric are virtual natural kinds. Given that color perceivers have experiences of color, i.e., experiences which represent objects as having colors, this account implies an ‘illusion theory’ or ‘error theory’ of color experience and perception. Objects are perceived as having colors which they do not in fact have: there are no such colors.

However the dispute about the natural pre-reflective concept is resolved, we still need to answer the question of how we ought to think of color. If Descartes and Locke are right, then the natural concept needs to be replaced by the critical concept. However, even if they are wrong and dispositionalists such as Dummett and Evans were right about the natural concept, we might want to argue that the concept should be either replaced by, or supplemented by, a reconstructed, revised concept, in the way for example, that concepts of heat, sound, force, and solidity have been refined or revised or supplemented by scientific concepts.

Caution is necessary, however. There appear to be two reasons why there might be a need for a reconstructed concept of color. One could be that the natural concept needs to be eliminated. The other might be that it needs to be supplemented by a new, technical concept. Each reason is related to the fact that the natural concept serves a range of purposes. If it turns out that all, or nearly all, the major purposes are best served by a new revised concept then that would be a case for replacing the old concept. If only certain of the purposes are better served, then that constitutes a case for supplementing the old concept. Given that there is a natural concept of color which is employed both in color vision and in the many social practices concerned with color, then it will be important to specify what the natural concept is, in order to appreciate how if at all it needs to be revised.

It is crucial to remember, moreover, that in the case of color, almost all the purposes to do with colors and hence reasons for having concepts of color have to do with the perception of color. Colors function predominantly as natural and conventional signs, i.e., for various practical epistemological and social purposes. To the extent, therefore, that the natural concept needs to be revised or replaced by any reconstructed concept, the new concept(s) would need to be capable of serving those various purposes. Accordingly an examination of what the natural concept is will be vital for the justification of any theory about how colors should be conceived.

3. The Natural Concept of Color

The physicists' account of color, both in its original and in its reconstructed version, depends on a certain view of the natural concept of color. So too, in their differing ways, do the accounts of their most important critics. Getting clear about the natural concept of color will thus be essential for resolving that philosophical debate. Quite apart from that, the natural concept is important to describe for its own sake. Getting clear about the natural concept of color is necessary for a philosophical understanding of color.

Discussions of what kind of property color can often be driven by epistemological and metaphysical concerns, which can cause us to lose sight of what seem to be the plainest and most obvious truths about colors. Two of the most obvious truths have already been cited: (1) that colors are properties in the world, (i.e., properties of physical objects) to which one's color vision is sensitive; (2) that colors are qualities that perceptual experience represent (or presents) objects as having. There might be a theory according to which these are not truths at all but only ‘truths’. Such a theory cannot be ruled out, but to be acceptable it would need to explain why the ‘truths’ have the force that they do as apparent truths.

There is another truth that is more often ignored: that colors play significant roles in the epistemological, personal and social lives of human beings. Colors are important epistemologically, as natural signs or indicators for the identification and re-identification of physical objects. From a social point of view, colors serve a variety of purposes. While retaining their function as natural signs, they also serve as conventional signs, e.g., as badges, uniforms, in ceremony, ritual etc. They may also be said to have a ‘life of their own’. As well as having emotional and aesthetic effects, colors are used in social life to amuse, to entertain, to delight, to shock, to impress, to astound, to warn, to attract, to be enjoyed, and so on, in contexts having to do with pageantry, ceremonial, courtship, painting, lighting, plays, clothing, dining, drinking, and so on.

Recognizing these obvious truths highlights the importance of the natural concept of color, for it is the way in which colors play their various roles that the natural concept is significant. In the first place, colors play their roles through the exercise of color vision, which in turn involves the exercise of color concepts. The perceiver must have perceptual experiences, or acquire perceptual states, which have a certain content. It is through such experiences that colors serve as natural signs, i.e., for the identification and re-identification of objects. Some account needs to be given of what constitutes the content of these perceptual experiences or states, i.e., of what kind of property color is presented or represented as being.

In the second place, there is a wealth of uses for color in our cultural and social life, giving rise to a flourishing color vocabulary. Examples of the sorts of practices are the use of color language, i.e., in the use of predicates such as ‘blue’, ‘red’, ‘white’ etc.; the teaching and learning of color predicates, by the use of paradigm examples; the sorting and classifying of objects; the placing of color samples in ordered structured arrays, the use of colors to impress, delight, astound, court, entertain, and so on. Central among such practices are those involving the use of colors as both natural signs or indicators, and as conventional signs.

If we concentrate on the use of color predicates such as ‘red’, ‘blue’, ‘olive’ etc., in natural language, it is possible to specify what we might call the ‘folk concept’ of color, one expressed by such terms. There is some advantage, however, in using the term ‘natural concept’ to emphasize that the folk concept is built upon the use of a biological endowment, one that is exhibited in the use of colors as natural signs, for the identification and re-identification of physical objects. Whatever it is called, it is clear that, if we wish to give an account of the epistemological, personal and social roles served by colors, then we need to give an account of the natural or folk concept of color, the concept which is embedded in the activities and practices that form the basis of such roles.

To specify the natural or folk concept of color, therefore, requires studying the variety of activities and practices, linguistic and non-linguistic, in which colors play a role. To specify this concept is a central task for any theory of colors to perform. Color is not just a topic for scientific experts. The ordinary folk are experts too. They have expertise in recognizing colors, in sorting and classifying them, in using colors and in responding to them. Color experts are not just those who study color in a scientific way, nor those who paint in colors, nor those who are industrial chemists. There are, in other words, different ranges and levels of expertise. Those of us who are competent with colors know a lot: we know what color blue is, how it differs from red and from yellow and green; we know how dark blue differs from light blue; we use terms such as rich, pale, faded, intense, brilliant, bright, pure, mixed, and so on to convey and exploit what we know.

Recognizing the expertise of the ‘folk’ should also make us alert to the dangers of using the term "the folk concept" of color. The term ‘natural concept’ is much safer to use. For one thing, ‘folk concept’ gets easily conflated with ‘folk theory’, i.e., some doctrine that we in our naive moments would articulate if asked, and if we had the time to reflect on. There are two things wrong with this slide. In the first place, the natural concept is a concept (or set of related concepts) not a theory (though its possession may presuppose certain beliefs). In the second place, by calling it a theory, it is easy is to over-intellectualize the concept. The concept is one embedded in a vast set of conceptual practices, engaged in by color experts, those who are competent in the perception, recognition and use of colors. The knowledge is implicit as well as explicit, and it involves know-how besides.

In providing an account of the natural/folk concept of color, there are two sorts of description that we can provide: (i) a description of the way color is conceptualized, i.e., the kind of property color is conceptualized as being; (ii) a description of the kind of concept the natural/folk concept is, i.e., a description of how the concept is acquired, how it is exercised, the purposes it serves, and so on. In this respect it is possible to describe the folk concept of color as follows:

  1. color concepts are perceptual concepts;
  2. color terms such as ‘red’, ‘green’, ‘blue’, etc are taught by the use of paradigm examples;
  3. there is a distinctive color vocabulary the terms of which are taught by paradigm examples.
  4. it is through the exercise of color concepts (through the way colored objects appear), that colors fulfil their (practical) epistemological role: to serve as the signs for identification and re-identification of physical objects.
  5. it is through the exercise of color concepts (through the way colored objects appear), that colors fulfil their social roles: to serve as conventional signs
  6. it is through the exercise of color concepts (through the way colored objects appear), that colors fulfil their aesthetic and emotional roles.

It is through the study of the activities and practices which involve the acquisition and exercise of such concepts, that we can state certain principles about the kind of properties colors are conceptualized as being. These principles are implicit or explicit in the activities and practices. One such principle is that colors are perceptually salient, i.e are the sorts of properties that color vision is sensitive to and which are presented or represented in perceptual experience. Other important principles are those having to do with fact that colors as a group form structured arrays, with characteristic internal structures.

This last feature is perhaps the most significant feature about colors, the colors objects are represented as having. Colors are properties that as a group, form an internally-related 4+2 structure, built on the four unique, primary hues: green, red, blue and yellow, and related to the black/white pair. Colors can be placed in systematically ordered arrays, along three dimensions, e.g., hue, saturation, and brightness. There are different arrays according to whether the colors are surface colors, film(aperture) colors, volume colors, light colors etc. Each array has a distinctive, complex character: a fourfold structure, based upon four distinctive, unique hues: green, red, blue and yellow. All colors can be mapped according to how near to or far from they are to any two of these unique, primary colors. Moreover, more than one such color system can be constructed even for the one mode of appearance: the Oswald, Munsell and Swedish Natural Color systems are examples. The last-named for example, uses dimensions of hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness, whereas the Munsell system uses hue, chroma and lightness. These dimensions are most suitable for surface colors, whereas hue, saturation and brightness are more appropriate for aperture colors.

In short, we can state that, given the natural/folk concept of color, colors are the following kind of properties:

  1. Colors are perceptually salient:
    • they are the sorts of properties that one discerns directly by looking, that one recognizes the objects as having.
    • they are qualities that are presented (or represented) in visual experiences. Visual experiences characteristically are experiences of colors, and of shapes and other qualities of objects in a 3-dimensional space.
    • they are properties causally connected with perception and identification of specific objects as red, yellow, blue, and so on.
  2. Colors are the sorts of properties that can be arranged systematically in ordered arrays. That is, a set of internal relationships hold between the range of colors.
  3. Colors comprise the kind of property which make true a wide range of first order color principles or statements. Some examples are the following:
    • tomatoes are red, so are sunsets and blood, and so on.
    • red merges gradually into yellow in one direction, and into blue in another direction, but not into green except through either yellow or blue; and so on.
    • ripening bananas goes from green to yellow, certain ripening apples go from green to red, and so on.

The statements cited in 3 are meant to be illustrative examples. There is a considerable variety in the types of statement involved. Some are causal truths e.g., ripening pears and wheat go from green to yellow, acids turn blue litmus paper red, spiders with red stripes on the back are venomous, black hair tends to grow grey with age, and so on. In the second place, there are certain aesthetic and emotional facts. For many people, green is soothing. Soft pastels are suitable in certain contexts; mauves and browns are not. Light colors and dark colors have different effects on mood, and so on. Certain colors are harmonious, and others jarring. In addition, there are truths comprising the way perceived colors vary with illumination, distance, orientation, and so on. There are other truths concerning how the color of surfaces is affected by the background against which an object is seen.

What has been just given is a partial characterisation of colors, given the natural or folk concept of color. It is plausible to hold that a fuller characterisation than this minimalist version can be provided. Unfortunately any such account is likely to be controversial. Frank Jackson (1996) describes what he calls ‘a prime intuition’ about colors that there is something peculiarly visually conspicuous about colors: "Redness is visually presented in a way that having inertial mass and being fragile, for instance, are not, When we teach the meanings of the color words, we aim to get our hearers to grasp the fact that they are words for the properties putatively presented in visual experience when things look colored." [p. 199.] This prime intuition, Jackson states, is simply that red is the property objects look to have when they look red. This deceptively simple prime intuition is said to tell us something important about the metaphysics of color when we combine it with plausible views about what is required for an experience to be the presentation of a property: a necessary condition for experience E to be the presentation of property P is that there be a causal connection in normal cases. [p. 200.]

The idea behind talk of ‘prime intuitions’ is that they are the intuitions formed by those competent in the use of color language, especially in the identification and recognition of colors. Those competent perceivers and users of color language are persons capable of reflecting on the way in which colors are presented (or represented) in color experience. Accordingly, it is plausible to hold that colors are presented as follows: as objective, perceiver-independent, intrinsic features of physical bodies, i.e., physical surfaces, volumes, light sources, illuminations, films, media, and so on.

The expression of this intuition adds little to the previous minimalist characterisation of the folk/natural concept of color. It is plausible to go further and hold that colors are not only intrinsic features of physical bodies, but are presented as manifest, sensuous properties. The way they are manifest is that their nature is open and manifest, not hidden. Some philosophers are prompted to respond to this claim by saying that it begs the question against those theorists who hold that colors have hidden essences, e.g., physical microstructures. The counter-reply to this response is that the view that colors have hidden essences is not the right theory about the natural concept or folk concept of color. It may be plausible as a theory of what a reformed concept of color is or should be, but not as a theory of what the folk concept is.

Admittedly it is not easy to convince people that there are manifest properties. One of the problems is that many concepts begin their life as concepts of manifest properties, but then evolve into more complex concepts. Children's concepts of say ‘horse’, ‘dog’, ‘man’ and so on, are cases in point. For them, the concept is almost exclusively defined by the corresponding appearances. There are, however, more sophisticated examples. Take concepts such as brilliant, dazzling, sprightly, po-faced, cheery, glum, picturesque, grim-faced, pale, etc. These are terms that characteristically apply to appearances. All of them, it is plausible to suggest, are manifest properties with essences they ‘wear on their faces’, and are not hidden.

Many properties are not manifest: being poisonous, being made by a robot, containing water as a constituent, coming from Virginia, and so on, but some clearly are. Included among these are colors. Someone who is taught color terms and who understands how they are used, knows what it is for something to be red, to be blue, or whatever: it is to have that feature which the perceiver is capable of recognizing. Reflecting on the way colors are represented, the thoughtful observer can say that the sort of property colors are represented as being are as color ‘stuffs’ spread on the surface of physical bodies (or through volumes, etc.). They are intrinsic features of physical surfaces (volumes, . . .), spread over the surface. It seems only too clear that we experience the redness of a ripe apple as an objective quality of the apple, the redness being in an objective space just as much as are the shape, the contour, the texture of the apple. This point can be neatly illustrated by quotes from two eminent workers on the physiology/psychology of color, Hering and Boynton. Hering for example, writes:

When we open our eyes in an illuminated room we see a manifold of spatially extended forms that are differentiated or separated from one another through differences in their colors . . . Colors are what fill in the outlines of these forms, they are the stuff out of which visual phenomena are built up; our visual world consists solely of differently formed colors; and objects, from the point of view of seeing them, that is, seen objects, are nothing other than colors of different kinds and forms. [Hering (1964), p. 1]

In similar vein, the physiological psychologist Robert Boynton writes in ‘Color in Contour and Object Perception’: "From early childhood we are easily able to recognize a property of objects, usually associated with their surfaces, that we call color. No child, and relatively few adults, will doubt that color is on (or sometimes in) objects." [Boynton (1978), p. 175] In addition, one is aware of the different character of the way colors appear in different modes, i.e., for object surfaces such as apples, patches of light on screens, volumes such as wine, scattering media such as skies, light sources such as globes, and so on.

There is one more prime intuition which is one of the most important. It is part of the folk concept, another ‘prime intuition’, that colors are represented as qualitative, sensuous features. This point will no doubt be controversial, but it ought not be. Reference to the sensuous nature of colors is crucial. These qualitative features that colors are represented as being are ‘sensuous’ in the widest sense. This is not an issue of deep metaphysics. The term "sensuous" is often used on such a way as to apply to phenomenal, i.e., to ontologically subjective qualities. However, there is a wider sense which does not have this commitment. There is a neutral use for the term. An illustration is an example which H.H.Price borrows from Husserl: ‘When I see a tomato hanging on a vine then a ripe tomato hanging on a vine is "leibhaft gegeben": it is given to me with its sensuous qualities.’ [Price (1932), p. 231.] This sound much better, of course, in German, but in English the point is that the tomato (better still, grapes) and the vine are given in perception with the sensuous features. English speakers understand that in perceiving tomatoes, grapes, etc one is acquainted with sensuous features. Price was acknowledging that whatever one's theory of perception, and especially whether one thought that the perceiver is directly aware of physical objects or sensory presentations, one was acquainted with sensuous features.

A similar point is made by Evan Thompson (1995) though with respect to the term ‘phenomenal’, rather than ‘sensuous’. Research in psychophysics and visual physiology, he writes, is constrained by the ‘phenomenal structure of color’. By this term he means to refer primarily to the three dimensions of color, known as hue, saturation and lightness, as well as to the relations that colors exhibit among themselves (p. 39). As he points out, textbooks often classify these properties of color as ‘subjective color phenomena’ or as features of ‘color experience’. Thompson prefers to use the term ‘phenomenal’ to describe them because they are first and foremost features of how colors appear: "I thus intend to use the term ‘phenomenal’ in its older sense of pertaining to appearances, not in the current sense of subjective."

The neutral notions of ‘sensuous’ and ‘phenomenal’ are ones that can be shared by writers with very different philosophical commitments. It is such a notion that Michael Tye employs, when he states that when philosophers appeal to the phenomenology of perceptual consciousness, in making claims about the phenomenal character of experience, they are mistaking intrinsic features of the content of experience for intrinsic features of experience itself.

Accordingly, we can represent writers as diverse as Price, Thompson and Tye, despite their philosophical differences, as in agreement. There is a neutral sense of ‘sensuous’, or ‘phenomenal’, according to which it is possible for physical objects to have sensuous or phenomenal properties. Most importantly, the color properties that the natural concept of color attributes to physical objects are sensuous properties. It is of course a separate question of whether physical objects do have the sensuous features that they are represented as having. Price thinks that they do not, but he also thinks that a further argument is required to show that they are not.

To conclude: given the characterisation of the natural concept of color, color is a certain kind of property. Which kind it is can be specified, in part, by saying that it is an objective, perceiver-independent, manifest and sensuous kind. In addition the property is one with certain kinds of causal powers vis a vis the presentation of color in the perception, recognition and identification of colors. Finally, colors are the kinds of properties that fit together in characteristic ways to form structured color arrays, with a distinctive 3-dimensional character. They are properties that as a group, form an internally related 4+2 structure, built on the four unique, primary hues: green, red, blue and yellow, and related to the black/white pair. Some parts of this characterisation of the natural concept are contentious, e.g., the claims that colors are manifest and sensuous. Some of the most significant parts of the characterisation which have the most far-reaching implications are not controversial: that colors have causal powers as described above, and that collectively form astructured system.

4. Science of Color or Color Science?

There is a flourishing field of color science, one that goes back to Newton and includes such famous figures as Young, Maxwell, Helmholtz, and Hering. Almost all of this field has to do with the perception of color, that is, to studying the conditions that cause or contribute to colors being seen, or to ways in which the colors as they appear may be studied. An example of the second kind of research is the many studies in colorimetry, involving the specification of colors. Typically these involve matching techniques in which the subject is asked to match some stimulus with one or another of a range of standardized cases.

One of the most vigorous areas of research, especially more recently, is the study of color vision, i.e., of the mechanisms involved in the perception of color. Helmholtz and Hering were pioneers in the physiology of this area, but much has been done recently in research on the neural processes involved in color perception. A crucial development has been the growth in opponent-process theory. [See Kaiser and Boynton (1996) for technical discussion. See Hardin (1988) and Thompson (1995) for philosophically-informed discussions.] Also of significance are the experiments by Land and his colleagues and the development of his retinex theory of color vision. [See Land (1983) and also Hardin (1988) and Thompson (1995) for critical discussion.] Uncovering the mechanisms that underlie color vision is an exciting current field of research. The major philosophical relevance of such research is that it promises to help explain why some of the appearances of color have the character that they do, e.g., why there are no reddish-greens nor bluish-yellows. If it becomes clear that appearances have a certain character which no set of objective physical features have, and that character can be found to based on the physiological/neural processes, then the research may be crucial in establishing that color is best thought of not as some objective feature of the world that color vision detects, but rather as something constructed by one's color vision.

Another area of color science has to deal with the construction of color systems, i.e., of ways of ordering the range of colors in a systematic fashion. Usually this is done by constructing three dimensional color solids. It is interesting, however that there are different systems that have been constructed. For one thing different dimensions are used depending on the way in which color appears. Colors as properties of surfaces, in general, have a different mode of appearance from colors as properties of volumes such as wine, and yet again from that for film color or aperture color. These different modes of appearance suit different dimensions of color. For surfaces the dimensions (at least in some systems) are hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness; for aperture or film colors the dimensions are hue, saturation and brightness.

Yet another field in which the way colors appear is crucial is the field of color psychology: the field in which color-constancy, simultaneous contrast, the effects of various backgrounds on color perceptions, and so on, are examined, and competing explanations debated.

Almost all of this research in color science is devoted to the way color appears, i.e., to the conditions under which one perceives color or experiences it or to the character of the way color appears. Almost none of it is concerned with the other color ‘truths’, that is, to what we might call ‘causal truths and principles’. This is not to say that those ‘truths’ or principles are false or are invalid. Biology and chemistry and indeed physics all use color concepts and claims in their theories (some of them) and explanations, but there has not developed what might be called a "science of color", except for the study of the way color appears, or one might say, of the way colors are represented, and of the causes and conditions conducive to the way they appear and are recognized. That there is a flourishing field of color science but not a science of color reflects the special place color has in science.

There is an important difference between color science, on the one hand, and the science of shapes, geometry, the science of heat and temperature, and the science of sound, on the other hand. In the case of shapes and heat/temperature, and sounds and weights, we have properties of physical objects which we can detect, naturally and unreflectingly, by the use of our senses. These properties, however, are different from colors. In the case of shape and heat and weight and sound, there has developed a science in which the principles of sound, weight, heat, and shape are studied. There is however no parallel science of color. There are few color principles to serve as the basis for a science of color. Color science is a large field, but it is built around the way that colors appear and to the conditions under which colors can be perceived, and the causes which lead to the perception of colors. If colors ceased to appear in the distinctive ways then color science would disappear.

The field of color science has developed through building up theories and color facts which contribute to our understanding of the perception of color, as well as to provide an objective specification of color. With both aims, the scientific account has to take account of a range of color facts that hold of the practices and behaviour of color-perceivers. That is, before we discovered any detailed scientific knowledge about color, we had - and still have - a considerable body of knowledge about color.

This body of color knowledge is contained within the conceptual practices specific to color. By studying these practices, we can draw up a set of general color principles and ‘truths’. The range and extent of the general principles, have been emphasized by Justin Broackes (1992). [For further discussion, see Maund (1995).] These general facts or principles include causal truths, although the nature of the causal powers may be difficult to discern. It is easy to see that color science has both filled out the details of some of the color principles described previously, e.g., in respect to the internal relations and to the conditions under which color is perceived, and in some case modified them. Furthermore, the discovery of color-mixing laws and of the mechanisms underlying color vision has added to our knowledge of color.

5. A Unifying Framework for Colors

There is a set of color truths and color principles that can be said to comprise our color-knowledge. It is to this body of knowledge that color science contributes. It is possible to find some unifying order that brings together in a unitary scheme these various color truths and principles. The set of truths and principles can be divided into separate categories, which bring out the different roles played by colors and color-concepts in (i) the acquisition of color terms in language; (ii) the appearances of colors (iii) the development of first-order truths or ‘truths’ about colors and (iv) servicing social and epistemological purposes.

L: Principles about the Use of Color Terms:
  1. Color terms are taught and learned by the use of paradigms. This is to say that the paradigms are identified and recognized by the way they look (appear).
  2. Colors are properties of bodies that play a causal role in the learning of color terms and the communication about colors.
  3. Cross-cultural comparisons indicate that there are certain basic color terms which are systematically related. [See Berlin and Kay (1969), and Boynton and Olson (1990), and for a contrary view, Van Brakel (1993)]
A: Principles about Appearances and the Perception of Color:
  1. Specific colors have distinctive appearances, characteristic of each color.
  2. The way colors are identified and recognized is by the way they appear to perceivers. There are no color thermometers or other measuring devices.
  3. Colors take a different mode of appearance, i.e., have a different characteristic appearance, when they are features of physical surfaces, films, volumes, light sources, etc.
  4. There are principles governing the conditions under which colors are perceived. Certain conditions are better than others for identifying colors; certain people are better than others at identifying colors. Colored bodies can appear differently when viewed at different distances, in different illuminations, and against different backgrounds.
  5. Among the principles in A4 are principles governing constancy effects: tendencies for objects to look the same under different conditions.
  6. There is a certain distinctive form to the way colors appear. Visual experiences represent colors in a certain way, as qualitative features which are "sensuous" in the widest sense.
T: Color Truths of the First Order:
  1. There is a vast range of specific color truths: ripe bananas are yellow; certain sunsets are golden; claret wine is claret red and so on.
  2. Colors can be combined together in structured, systematically ordered arrays, with a distinctive character. They are qualitative features which are "sensuous" in the widest sense. These arrays are different depending on whether the colors are colors of surfaces, volumes, films, scattering media, lights and so on.
  3. There are general causal truths e.g., ripening pears, bananas and wheat go from green to yellow, acids turn blue litmus paper red, spiders with red stripes on the back are venomous, black hair tends to grow grey with age, and so on.
  4. Different colors have different specific aesthetic effects, including principles of harmony, balance, contrast, etc.
  5. Different colors have different emotional effects.
R: Principles about Colors and Their Roles:
  1. Colors are natural signs, i.e., are easily identifiable features of objects that enable perceivers to identify and re-identify kinds of objects.
  2. Colors serve as conventional signs, for similar purposes as those in R1.
  3. Colors, often because of effects in T4 and T5, serve certain social and psychological roles.

It needs to be emphasized that these categories are not meant to be exclusive. For example, principle R3, concerning the social and psychological role of colors is related to principles T4 and T5, concerning the specific aesthetic and emotional roles of colors. Likewise the principles in A6 and T2 both refer to the sensuous nature of colors.

6. The Illusion Theory of Colors

The natural or folk concept of color conceptualizes color as a certain kind of property: an objective, perceiver-independent, intrinsic feature of physical bodies. The property is, moreover, one with a certain character and with certain causal properties. The most straight-forward view of colors is that they are what they seem. Colors are properties whose essences are manifest. Since colors here are taken to be simple, primary quality of objects, we might call this view "The Simple Objectivist View of Color". It stands in clear contrast to those forms of Objectivism according to which the essences of colors are hidden, not manifest. [See OBJ].

Opposed to both forms of Objectivism is another view: ‘The Illusion Theory of Colors’ or ‘Color Fictionalism’ [For a recent account, see Maund (2006)]. In this account, it is held that once we spell out the character of the features specified by the folk or natural concept, we discover that there is in nature no such features: colors as they are conceptualized are properties not found in nature. The colors objects are represented as having, in visual experience, are ones that no object actually has.

The natural concept of color conceptualizes color as a certain kind of property. Which kind it is can be specified, in part, by saying that it is an objective, perceiver-independent, manifest and sensuous kind. In addition the property is one with certain kinds of causal powers vis a vis the presentation of color in the perception, recognition and identification of colors. Finally, colors are the kinds of properties that fit together in characteristic ways to form structured color arrays, with a distinctive 3-dimensional character. They are properties that as a group, form an internally related 4+2 structure, built on the four unique, primary hues: green, red, blue and yellow, and related to the black/white pair. Some parts of this characterisation of the natural concept are contentious, e.g., the claims that colors are manifest and sensuous. Some of the most significant parts of the characterisation which have the most far-reaching implications are not controversial: that colors have causal powers as described above, and that collectively form a structured system.

Defenders of the Illusion Theory of Color exploit the presence of these features in the natural concept to argue that, given this concept of color, there are in fact no colors in nature, that objects are presented in experience as having colors which neither they nor any object have. Crucially, there are no properties that both have the causal powers in question and which collectively have the right character. In short, there are no colors that are intrinsic, non-relational, perceiver-independent properties and which satisfy the requirements of the three-dimensional color solid. None that is, that allow us to make sense of the way in which we perceive and identify and recognize colors.

No properties of physical objects stand, it has been said, in the right kinds or relations that are characteristic of the structured color arrays. It is true that we can arrange physical samples in ordered arrays but the ordering principles depend on the way they appear. What is crucial to the principle of ordering is the way the colors are represented as being, or rather, the character of the way colors are represented. It is because there is a distinctive appearance associated with each color that the colors are capable of being systematically ordered in the way that they are.

It would seem that, as far as our conceptual practices governing color are concerned, physical objects do not have the kinds of color they are represented as having. The colors that objects are represented as having are illusory: no physical object actually has those colors. The colors might be said to be "virtual properties": they are properties objects do not have, but might have had: in some other possible world but not in this one. If we speak of colors as having essences, then they have virtual essences. Colors are virtual properties, just as phlogiston and caloric are virtual natural kinds.

The illusion theory, or virtual essence theory, of colors leaves us with a problem. If there are no properties that satisfy the requirements for being colors: how did the natural concept develop? The solution to this problem is found in the fact that the way that the concepts of color operate, to serve their various functions and roles, is through the way colors appear. For these purposes and roles, objects do not need the actual colors. It will be sufficient if they appear to have colors. For these purposes, it is sufficient that "it is as if they have the colors".

There are two major functions for color concepts. One reflects an epistemological purpose: colors are signs used to indicate the presence of objects of interest. The signs are either natural or conventional, the latter being ones designed for various social purposes. The purposes are equally well served even if objects do not have colors, but have the right appearances. All that is needed is that they are represented as having colors. The second major purpose of color concepts is aesthetic, understood in the widest sense. Color is significant in painting, decorating, clothing, theatre, make-up, advertising, showing off, sexual appeal and so on. Again, it matters not in the least that objects do not have these properties. All that is required is that they be represented as having them.

The significance of appearances is widespread. As we have seen, they provide the basis for the ordering principles governing color systems. Likewise, the causal truths and principles that employ color terms are ones connected with the way colors appear. For example, we can explain how there are such ‘truths’ as "ripening pears (bananas, …) go from green to yellow". This is a truth. For a pear to be represented as green under the right conditions is a sign that the pear is not yet ripe; for it to be represented as yellow is a sign that it is ripe. In other words, whatever causal truths we have concerning color, can be explained by interpreting colors as signs or as indicators for other physical features, where those physical features serve the causal roles.

In a previous section a distinction was made between color science and the science of color. While the former field is flourishing there is little science of color. One way of understanding how this situation has arisen is that there are no actual colors in physical reality. What there are are experiences which represent objects as having colors, colors which in fact they do not have. That is, colors are virtual properties. Our visual experiences present us with systematic illusions. If this were the case, we would still have the same color science, exactly as we have now, for we would still need to know how colors are represented, and what causes them to be represented in the way that they are, and how the various conditions under which we have color experiences systematically differ can be explained. Since one of the central roles colors serve is to act as signs or indicators for physical objects, and any theory of color has to acknowledge this role anyway, it would seem that any fledgling science of color is best dispensed with in terms of other sciences, and color science left to the science of color perception. This does not stop it from being the case that there is an important theory of color vision and perception, and of the role colors play as signs or indicators.

Clearly, the concept of color can be used to serve many of its normal purposes even if the representations of color are illusory, provided that the illusions are systematic, which on a proper theory, of course, they will be.

7. Colors as Simple Intrinsic Objective Qualities

The Simple Objectivist View of Color is that there are in nature colors of the kind specified by the natural concept. Colors are simple intrinsic, non-relational, non-reducible properties, supervenient on micro-physical features. Such a view has been presented by P.M.S. Hacker (1987) and by J. Campbell (1994).

The main problem the illusion theorist finds with the Simple Objectivist View is with reconciling the putative character of the intrinsic color features that fit together to comprise color solids with the distinctive structure, with the causal role of such features in the recognition and identification of colors. The problem is addressed by Hacker in his defense of the claim that colors are intrinsic features of physical bodies. He forthrightly rejects not only the physicists' view, and Reid's view on colors, but also the dispositionalist account offered by McGinn, McDowell and Dummett. He insists that colors are properties which are used to provide causal explanations. There is no more reason to deny this, he says, than there is to deny the parallel claim for solidity and liquidity. In particular, he claims that we can provide causal explanations for why colors affect color perceivers. The explanation is not vitiated by the discovery that microstructural processes are involved, any more than explanations concerning solidity and liquidity are rendered otiose by the discovery of the microstructural base for these properties.

It is doubtful that this maneuvre works, for a number of reasons. One is that we would need to specify the criteria that make it the case that an object is intrinsically red. Not all perceivers agree in their judgements. It is not that there are color blind people who can, after all, be said to be color-deficient. There is a small but still significant number of color-anomalous people, who can make all the same color discriminations as regular people, but who disagree about which samples are pure red, green, etc. That is, it seems that their color solid is skewed from the normal. It seems arbitrary that we decide that the real color is the one that the majority pick. Secondly, if there were an evolutionary shift, or an eugenics program, the minority could become the majority.

There is a more important reason against Hacker's proposal, however, which depends on the fact that for colors, microstructural explanations cannot be provided for all the relevant, important features. Specifically the complex internal relationships between the colors cannot be explained by the microstructural properties of physical bodies, except through their affecting the perceivers. That is, to explain why the colors have the relationships they do requires giving an account of the structure of the perceiver's perceptual apparatus. At a minimum, this requires an account of the response curves of cells in the retinae, but also required would be an account of the appropriate neural processes. In short, the explanation will have to work via an explanation of how things appear, that is, of how one's perceptual experiences have the content that they do.

There is a difference between solidity/liquidity and the colors. In the case of solidity and its sister concepts, there is a range of features that are associated with them, including causal relationships. If we have been given adequate scientific explanations at the microstructural level for solidity, then adequate microstructural explanations will need to be given for these other features. The reason why it is important to preserve the concepts of solidity and liquidity is that such concepts unify sets of properties that are useful to have unified, and this unification is lost if we retreat to the microstructural level.The important difference for colors is that there are crucial features of colors that are not reproduced at the microstructural level of the physical objects, nor are they explained at that level. The features are those that colors have, by virtue of which they are capable of forming systems of properties with internal relationships. This structural property is not explained at the microstructural level of physical samples of colors. To try to explain the structure physically, the best we could hope to do is to try to explain it in terms of dispositions, e.g., to induce a certain ratio of light sensitive retinal cells. Even if that were to work, it is the wrong kind of explanation to help Hacker. He wants to hold that colors are intrinsic qualities of physical objects, not relational, dispositional ones.

8. Objectivism

The Simple Objectivist view is that the objective essences of colors are manifest. The more common form of objectivism, however, is that colors have hidden objective essences. Intuitively, the thought is that our color terms — blue, red, black white, etc. — name certain properties in the world, that are perceived in certain ways characteristic of each. These properties are to be identified with properties which to most of us are unknown, but which can be discovered by scientific investigation. Thomas Reid was probably the earliest advocate of this theory. More recent examples are D.M. Armstrong (1969), J. Westphal (1987), D. Hilbert (1987), M. Matthen (1988). Frank Jackson (1996), M. Tye (2000), A. Byrne & D.Hilbert (2003) and B. McLaughlin (2003).

Advocates of this view have differed, though, on whether the hidden essence of color is a microstructural feature, intrinsic to the colored body or, more commonly, whether it is a light-related dispositional property, e.g., one connected with reflectance profiles. Thomas Reid was probably the earliest example of the first type and Frank Jackson (1996) the latest. Recent examples of the second type are D.M. Armstrong (1969), J. Westphal (1987) and D. Hilbert (1987).

The attempt to locate the essence of color among the microstructural features of colored bodies seems unpromising. One of the major problems is ‘the problem of multiple realizations’. Given the range of bodies that have colors — surfaces, volumes, light-sources, illuminations, luminescent bodies, films, expanses — the intrinsic physical features that provide the causes for the way colors appear show a bewildering variety. Even if we concentrate on the first type of color, surface color, : we find that there is a wide variety of underlying physical microstructures, responsible for objects' appearing blue, yellow, etc. The causes of the colors objects appear to have are many and varied. The same type of micro-structure consistently appears the same color (within limits) under different conditions, but different microstructures may appear the same.

It would seem, therefore, that the most plausible candidates for objective essences are light-related dispositional properties, e.g., capacities to emit, reflect, absorb, transmit or scatter light to varying degrees. However, the problem of multiple realizations has merely been postponed for, depending upon the type of object in question, a different candidate for the objective essence has to be found. For physical surfaces, it would have to be related to the object's reflectance profile, e.g., the capacity to differentially reflect wavelengths from different regions of the incident illumination; in the case of volumes, it would be related to the object's transmittance; in the case of such objects as the sky, to the scatterance; in the case of aperture color or film color, it would be related to the pattern of light received at a particular place or at the source of the light (the reflecting source in the case of physical surfaces) and so on. Even in the case of ordinary objects, the colors may be caused in a variety of ways. The blue of a bird's coat may result from scatterance, the red in a different way.

Nevertheless, progress can be made if we concentrate on one type of color, surface color. The most plausible attempt is to try to identify surface color with a light-modifying disposition, e.g., with a disposition to reflect (or absorb) certain proportions of standardized illumination, or, if one prefers, certain proportions of light of the wavelengths from the visible spectrum. Objects with neutral or achromatic colors are ones which reflect all wavelengths to (roughly) the same degree, with whites reflecting a higher percentage than greys and blacks. Objects with chromatic colors are those which differentially reflect or absorb light at different wavelengths. Accordingly surface color would be identified with some feature of an object's spectral reflectance curve.

A special case of the problem of multiple realizations is posed by the occurrence of metamers. In the case of physical surfaces there are metamers, i.e objects with very different reflectance curves that have identical appearances of color. The situation is far more pronounced in the case of film colors or aperture colors. Here there are innumerable different combinations of light that will give the same hue. It would seem that the property shared by physical objects with the same film color is a disposition to incite the three light-sensitive cones in the retinae according to the same ratio: x: y: z.

The major problem, however, with any of the objectivist accounts of surface color is that, given the way the natural or folk concept has been characterized, it is hard to see how there could be an objective essence with the right characteristics. For, given the natural or folk concept of color, it seems that color is a certain kind of property: a perceiver-independent, intrinsic property of objects, one that satisfies certain constraints. But it is hard to see how there could be any intrinsic, physical features that satisfy all the constraints. The most crucial requirement is that colors, as a group, have to stand together in the right kind of relationships. There are no manifest, intrinsic features that satisfy this requirement. Nor does any set of microstructures stand the remotest chance of satisfying the appropriate constraints. In particular, there are no physical features, either of microstructure, or of the object's contribution to light, such that the right kind of internal relationships hold. [See Hardin (1988) and Maund (1995).] Neither can color be a dispositional property, say spectral reflectance, or a disposition to produce physiological responses of a certain kind, since spectral reflectances don't fit together in the right kind of ways.

There are two kinds of response an objectivist might make. One would be to deny the account of the natural concept of color as expounded here. Instead, it is held, it is part of the way color terms operate in the language, that it is understood that colors may well turn out to be hidden essences. The other response involves not challenging the account of the natural concept but insisting instead that it needs to be revised or reconstructed for, say, scientific purposes.

There are two different kinds of response the objectivists have made. One is to modify the objectivist account by making the kind of reflectance properties that are relevant, more complicated. The second is to combine the first step with a theory of how color terms name colors, which opposes the one implied in the discussion up until now.

David Hilbert (1987), illustrates the first type, with his account known as ‘Anthropocentric Realism’. It aims specifically to provide a solution to the multiple realisations problem but, he thinks, solves the second problem as well. On Hilbert's view, colors are identified with spectral reflectances, at least surface colors are. A distinction is drawn between this kind of color and anthropocentric color. Individual anthropocentric colors are associated with groups of spectral reflectances. Color perception and color language ‘give us anthropocentrically defined kinds of colors and not colors themselves’. (p. 27) Terms such as ‘red’, ‘blue’, ‘yellow’, etc are associated with anthropocentric colors. To be red, for example, is to have a reflectance that falls within a particular class of reflectances. These classes, in general, are highly anthropocentric, sharing few interesting causal powers, and being of little consequence, apart from how they connect with the peculiarities that underlie human color vision. The principle of grouping is that a given perceived color is associated with ‘a triple of integrated reflectances’. This association is based on the fact that human color vision depends on the use of ‘three types of broad band sensors’, i.e., the three types of light-sensitive receptors (p. 111).

It is Hilbert's claim that with this analysis, many of the common-sense claims about color can be preserved, e.g., that orange is more similar to red than it is to blue. The point is that the triples of integrated reflectances can be taken as co-ordinates in a three-dimensional space, thus defining a color space. Similar colors will be located at adjacent points in this space. It is claimed that the right interpretation of statements of color similarity and dissimilarity is in terms of statements about relative location in color space. It is with this claim that scepticism will most naturally arise. On the face of it, there is a certain qualitative character to ostensively defined color space, e.g., as expressed in the Munsell or Swedish Natural color systems, that is not captured by the triple-reflectance color space. One measure of this fact is that changes along the dimensions of brightness and saturation have a different character from changes of hue from unique green to unique yellow to red to blue. Changes in Hilbert's color space don't seem to be of the right kind — which of course is not to deny that they may not contribute to a causal explanation for why the psychological color spaces have the character that they do. [See Thompson (1995), Chapter 4, for an extended discussion.]

The objectivist may fare better, if she adopts the second approach mentioned above, that which specifies a certain theory of color naming. An example of such an approach is the ‘functionalist’ proposal: red is the property that disposes its bearers to look red. [Cohen (2001), McLaughlin (2003)] This proposal conforms to a more general approach: to hold that this disposition to appear is not of what colors are essentially, but it is part of the (folk) conceptualisation of a certain perceiver-independent property which is color. The folk, it is held, use the way colors appear in order to characterize a certain property, but the way objects appear is essential to the characterisation, not the property. Here we are depending on a distinction between a property and the mode of presentation (or Fregean-type sense) through which the property is presented (or thought about). Accordingly, appearances would be tied to the concept of colour, or to the way the color appears without being, even in part, constitutive of the property of color. It would then be open for us to identify the property through empirical, scientific investigation. The idea here is that the way colours appear fits with the way colours are presented (the mode of presentation) and, hence, the system of similarities and differences that are ordinarily taken to characterise the colors fits the appearances and not the colors themselves. Hence the account does not face the same problem as that defended by Hilbert.

McLaughlin presents an account of the spectral reflectances which is similar to that of Hilbert (1987) and the more recent version in Byrne & Hilbert (2003). The more important aim, he holds, is to solve what I have been calling the problem of ‘multiple realisations’ (he calls it ‘the problem of common ground’). McLaughlin sketches a strategy for dealing with the problem. Here is the basic strategy for appealing to opponent-processing theory to locate colours among light-dispositions as causing any color, C: look for a light disposition that, when activated, would affect the opponent-processing system in a manner that will produce a visual experience of C. [p. 498] The strategy thus involves appealing to opponent-processing theory ‘to try to find structure in the light (to use a Gibsonian phrase) that is supplied to the eyes’. The idea is that colours are dispositions to supply light with the relevant structure.

This sort of account, which is similar to that of Michael Tye (2000) and Byrne and Hilbert (2003) faces serious problems. One problem is whether the theory that these authors appeal to is accurate enough for the tasks set out. [See Thompson (1995), ch. 4; Matthen (2005) pp. 171-76.] Another set of problems have been brought out by C.L.Hardin (1988), (2003) and (2004). One major problem is that it is hard to see how the account can handle the important phenomenon of simultaneous contrast. In particular, there is a problem with such colors as black and brown, which are pure contrast colors. To treat them as illusory ‘is to eliminate two whole color categories’ [Hardin (2003), pp. 196-97]. Second, the phenomenon of color-constancy which objectivists heavily rely on is very weak-kneed. There are many situations in which it does not hold, and in those cases in which it does hold, it only does to varying degrees. To this point, we might add that there is considerable dispute on how the effect should be described.

Yet another serious problem that Hardin brings out is that the objectivist account will require that we will have to identify the ‘real’ color for object x as the reflectance profile that appears in a certain way to normal observers and in standard conditions. The problem is that there is no non-arbitrary way to specify ‘normal observer’ and ‘standard conditions’. In determining the right objectivist candidate, our aim is not simply to show how color vision enables, say, the observer to distinguish objects with different spectral reflectance characteristics. Rather we need to explain why one reflectance profile deserves to be classified as blue, and likewise why other profiles are related to similar and differing colors. Consequently to identify one reflectance profile as that corresponding to unique green, say, we need to be able to specify standard conditions and normal observers. As Hardin has persuasively pointed out, in Hardin (1988), but more particularly, in Hardin (2004), this cannot be done except in a highly arbitrary way. Not only is there a minority of color perceivers who are anomalous (only slightly, but appreciably so) with respect to normal observers, but there is a considerable statistical spread even within the group of normal observers. The reflectance profile for unique green will differ for different members of the "normal group". One can decide, of course, on a standard and fix one reflectance profile as green, but the procedure is highly arbitrary. As we have seen, there are few interesting causal powers associated with colors apart from the way objects affect perceivers.

McLaughlin does suggest that we might cope with this problem by extending the proposal by another pair of objectivists, Frank Jackson and Robert Pargetter (1987). They claim that each color can be identified with a physical property, but in a way that overcomes the problem of multiple realisations. They concede that there is no single physical feature that is the basis for each color say, blue, but maintain that this does not matter. Blue is identified with a different physical property on different occasions, depending on what kind of physical object has it. This means relativising the concept of color, to kinds of objects and circumstances. McLaughlin's suggestion is that we could relativise the objectivist concept of color to individual observers.

In principle, we may be able to specify a concept of physical color, in the way outlined by Jackson and Pargetter, and McLaughlin, but we might pause and ask why we should want to do so. Even if we can specify this physical concept, the account will imply that there is an important dispositional property that colored objects share: the disposition to appear in characteristic ways. This dispositional property can also be relativised to conditions and to observers. On the face of it, we have two concepts of colour; and why not, if what we are trying to do is to defend the best way of thinking of colour? It was what philosophers such as Descartes and Locke were doing when they specified two concepts of colour: colour as a subjective quality and colour as a secondary quality. The point is this. Descartes and Locke were actually introducing two concepts of colour to replace one (which the folk applied to both sensations and to physical objects). They may have been wrong in detail, but it is plausible that there is a place for both concepts. It is possible that the objectivist is giving us a third concept to go with the other two. Indeed there is reason to think that Descartes and Locke would have accepted such a proposal, had their science been as advanced as ours is. Jackson (1996) does provide an argument against color being thought of as a dispositional property, namely that colors have to play a causal role, which dispositions are unable to play (only their bases can be causally effective). This argument, however, is not one that the defender of spectral reflectances can rely on, for reflectances are also dispositional. (The argument in any case, overlooks the distinction between causal efficacy and causal relevance.)

McLaughlin might respond that his functionalist account of color is an account of the ordinary concept of color, and hence it follows that either his account is right or it is wrong — and his claim is that it is right. It is not clear whether there would be a good reason to support a claim of this sort, were he to make it.

9. Objectivist And Psychological Dispositionalist Accounts

In the previous section, I argued that it makes a crucial difference whether we take the objectivists (and their rivals) to be attempting to give an account of how our ordinary concepts of color operate, or alternatively, they are offering a reconstruction (or revision) of those concepts. The objectivist account of color has its best chance of success if it is thought of as a reconstruction of those concepts. This consideration is useful in comparing the account with its leading rivals.

Major opposition to the objectivists come from those philosophers who hold that colors are essentially mind-dependent dispositional properties: powers to appear in distinctive kinds of ways to perceivers of the right kind. Such accounts are often called “subjectivist”, though it would be more accurate to call them “psychological-dispositionalist”. In comparing the merits of objectivist and the dispositionalist accounts, it is helpful to study the examples of solidity and liquidity, for these examples provide a set of parallels for thinking about color.

In the case of solidity and liquidity, there is a range of causal capacities that historically have been thought to be constitutive of these properties. The growth of science has seen the discovery of the microstructural properties that form the causal ground of these capacities and powers (at least in broad terms). This discovery does not mean that such microstructures constitute the essences of solidity and liquidity. There are at least two ways of thinking about what solidity and liquidity are essentially. On one model, solidity is essentially the microstructural property and the description of the causal powers forms an essential part of the way the property is characterized, rather than an essential part of the property itself. There is a second way of thinking about solidity, according to which solidity is not identified withe microstructural basis even if the latter is unique. Rather the causal powers are essential to solidity, either because solidity is identified with them, or because solidity is taken to be a second order property: for something to be solid is for it to have some property which is the basis for the relevant causal powers.

As far as color is concerned, it would seem that the objectivist would need to depend on either of the last two models. For most objectivists take colors to be essentially dispositional properties, ones characterized in terms of reflectance profiles. An object's reflectance curve represents a dispositional property: a power to differentially absorb or reflect light from the range of wavelengths constituting daylight (or a standardized equivalent).

It would seem, therefore, that as far as revisionary accounts of color are concerned, the choice is between different kinds of dispositionalist accounts: objectivist and perceiver-dependent (subjectivist). On both analyses, what colors are essentially is given by a description of appropriate causal powers. In one case these causal powers are objective ones; in the other, they are special perceiver-dependent causal powers. Let us call the respective kinds of color ‘objective color’ and ‘psychological color’. In assessing these accounts as providing revisionary proposals, the important question to ask is what can be achieved by adopting the respective proposals. There is reason to think that psychological color is superior, or at least as good.

The psychological, i.e., mind-dependent property is usually presented as being a pure disposition: to call something ‘red’ is to say that it has the power to appear red to observers of the appropriate kind. A far better proposal, which can be found in the writings of Descartes and Locke, is one that presents color in terms of a mixed disposition:

x is red = x has some feature by virtue of which x appears red, …

This concept has all the advantages of the objectivist concept, and added virtues of its own. It allows for multiple realizations of the disposition, and hence of the color. It does not require that for each color there is a unique physical basis. Second, by placing emphasis on appearances, it provides the means to unite the various kinds of color: surface color, volume-color, aperture color, illumination-color, etc. And finally, it can perform the one function that the physical concept does very well: it shows how colors can have a causal role in relation to the perception of color, and the social roles played by colors.

That the mixed dispositionalist account readily solves the problem of multiple realizations is obvious. It is one of the central advantages of the psychological account, however, that it both provides a connecting link between all the various kinds of color: surface color, volume-color, aperture color, illumination-color, etc., in that it unites them all as colors while at the same time it makes intelligible their differences. For each of these colors, there is a distinct mode of appearance. For each mode of appearance, colors can be organized into systematic 3-dimension color arrays. And for each array, hue is one of the dimensions: colors can be ordered with respect to how close they are to red, green, yellow and blue. There are, however, important differences. For aperture colors, the other dimensions are saturation and lightness. for surface colors, they are chroma and value, or chromaticness and blackness/whiteness. As well, the greens, blues, yellows, etc of surfaces are different types of green, blue, yellow, etc from those of films — but they are greens, blues, yellows, etc, for all that. It is through characterising surfaces, films, illumination-sources, and so on, as providing appearances that sense can readily be made of the range of similarities and differences between the various kinds of color. The point of having a dispositional concept framed in terms of the way things appear is that it helps provide principles of unity and diversity for the available range of color systems.

Finally the mixed dispositional concept can perform the same function that the objectivist concept can serve: it can be used to show how colors are causally relevant to the perception of color. The mixed dispositional concept retains the emphasis on red objects having the right kind of power, but it allows that the object, in having that power, has some physical feature (which may be different in different objects) which is the basis for that power. Clearly, on this analysis, the underlying physical feature has all the causal powers one could wish. The mixed dispositional analysis combines this with the advantage of keeping colors tied to the way they appear.

In addition, there is reason to think that colored objects appear is an essential part of the range of conceptual practices. The point here is that while reflectances are causally relevant, as for that matter are microstructures, so too are appearances. In the case of color there is a deeply entrenched set of activities and practices central to which is the operation of causal powers to appear, i.e., powers to cause perception of objects as red, blue, etc. These causal powers are also central to the field of color science. Given this twofold fact, then if we are considering a revisionary concept of color, then, by analogy with solidity, there is good reason to propose a dispositionalist concept of color, for which the power to appear in a way distinctive for individual colors is essential.

The important point, as far as colors are concerned, is that colored objects have characteristic appearances and that those appearances are of great interest to us. It is because we have that interest that there is point to having a concept of dispositional color - the power to appear in characteristic ways. It is because of the way colors appear that they are important to us both biologically and socially. It is because colors have a characteristic appearance that: the colors can be ordered systematically in color arrays; they have emotional effects; principles of harmony and contrast apply; there are principles governing phenomena of color contrast. It is true that physical features both of physical objects and of retinal cells contribute causally to these phenomena, but central to all of these color principles is the way color appears.

At this stage, an objectivist might argue that there is a more fundamental causal power, one associated with reflectance curves, and for this reason it would be preferable to adopt, as a revisionary proposal, a concept of color whereby this more fundamental causal power is essential. If these two proposals are seen as competing theories, it is not clear that one is preferable to the other. Moreover it is not clear why we could not adopt both proposals and have two concepts of color, just as in the case of the geometrical property, size, we have two concepts: absolute (intrinsic) size, and angular size. That this ecumenical solution represents a viable option receives support from the consideration that if we are thinking of the proposal for the objectivist concept we have at least two proposals: one framed in terms of intrinsic microstructural properties, and one framed in terms of dispositional light-related properties. Again rather that having to choose between them, we could adopt both proposals and admit that there are different kinds of color.

In conclusion, therefore, it would appear that in so far as the objectivist is offering us a reconstruction of our original concept of color, there is reason to think that a dispositional analysis would provide a construction that is at least as good. There is strong reason, however, to think that an ecumenical solution to the problems of color can be found: that there is a place for different concepts of color, and with them different essences.

10. An Ecological View of Color

There is another theory of colors which has something in common with the illusion theory, in that it rejects objectivist accounts, but which is crucially different. It is the theory defended by Evan Thompson, the Ecological View of Colors, and is designed to be consonant with J.J.Gibson's views on perception. On this account, colors are taken to be dependent, in part, on the perceiver and so are not intrinsic properties of a perceiver-independent world. This account is not the same as an illusion theory. Being colored, instead, is construed as a relational property of the environment, connecting the environment with the perceiving animal. In the case of the color of physical surfaces, "being colored corresponds to the surface spectral reflectance as visually perceived by the animal". [Thompson (1995) Ch. 5, pp. 242-50.]

In more detail this account is spelled out in the following way: "being colored a particular determinate color or shade is equivalent to having a particular spectral reflectance, illuminance, or emittance that looks that color to a particular perceiver in specific viewing conditions" [p.245]. Thompson insists that this account is to be distinguished from both a Lockean dispositionalist account and an illusion theory of colors. It is difficult to see, however, how he can maintain this stand. For one thing, he concedes that we see colors as perceiver-independent properties of things while maintaining that colors are perceiver-dependent properties. His answer to this difficulty, i.e., to why this is not a form of the illusion theory, is that on the ecological view it is not possible to perceive color as relational. That is, the relational nature of color does not allow the perceiver to perceive colors as relational. But this answer is not an answer to the question posed. What it explains is why one should not be surprised to find that, on the ecological view, that colors are experienced as perceiver-independent properties. But this is to admit that the way colors are represented in experience is not the way they are. The illusion theory denies that objects have the property (the color) they are represented as having. It need not deny that it is possible to formulate another concept of color that objects do satisfy.

One of the most important recent contributions to the philosophy of color is the book by M. Matthen (2005). In this work, Matthen articulates a theory of sense-perception in which color plays a prominent role. The work is significant for the theory of color that he presents, one that draws heavily on comparative studies of color vision among different species. Matthen replaces his earlier objectivist views on color by an account that has more in common with the ecological theory favoured by Thompson. Matthen agrees with Hardin, Thompson and others that the phenomenology of color is not captured, or accounted for, by any of the standard objectivist accounts. Nevertheless, he claims to be defending a realist theory of color and to be rejecting standard irrealist theories, including Hardin's. Matthen's account is complex. The idea is that the senses (the visual sensory system) do categorise objects as ‘blue’, ‘yellow’, etc., but these qualities are related to actions that perceivers can perform, and in particular, to ‘epistemic affordances’.

The sensory systems are held to be devices that are in the business of classifying distal stimuli (physical objects) as having certain properties which stand in similarity and difference relations with each other. These categories are constructed by the system and do not, at least in the case of color, correspond to any objective properties that are independent of perceivers. When one has an experience of blue, then this state is a visual signal that system provides — a signal that it has classified the object as blue. In such a circumstance the object looks blue. This leaves us with the problem of saying what exactly it is for something to be blue. Matthen explains what it is, through his theory of ‘primary content’ of visual experiences, that is, in terms of the actions the perceiver is prepared to make on the basis of having the visual state. Where Matthen's account is distinctive is that for him, these actions are epistemic actions. As he says: x and y resemble each other in colour if there is a colour based epistemic practice E such that the colour looks presented by x and y signal that x and y are to be treated as equivalent with regard to E. The crucial question is whether what Matthen means by ‘color’ is the same as what others mean, especially the main opponents. He defines color-vision in a functional way, so that it covers comparative studies, i.e., so that it applies to honey bees, humans, pigeons, and so on. Accordingly, color is defined in a functional way: “A colour classification is one that is generated from the processing of difference of wavelength reaching the eye, and available to normal colour perceivers by such processing (p.167). On this account, there is no set of properties that color vision is always characterising (as color) and there is no class of types of experience that any colour perceiver must possess.

There is a revealing remark when he says, with respect to Lewis's definition of color (which mirrors that of McLaughlin): “Lewis was perhaps of the view that ‘red’, ‘blue’, etc., are our terms, human terms, and that the colours that a pigeon experiences should not be named by these terms.”; (p. 163] Matthen concedes that we might allow that Lewis's anthropocentric definitions of ‘red’, ‘blue’, etc., are appropriate for these human colors. However, he says, it is not so reasonable to define colour anthropocentrically. “Colour is not ‘our term’: we can make it so only at the exorbitant cost of abandoning the comparative (i.e., cross-species) study of colour vision.” But Matthen's conclusion does not follow. We can make all sorts of pragmatic moves in defining color-vision, so as to allow the comparative studies, while preserving a concept of color that applies to the terms ‘red’, ‘blue’, ‘yellow’, etc. All that Matthen has provided a case for, at best, is that we should have an additional concept to the anthropocentric one.

11. A Pluralist Framework

If analysis of the natural concept of color leads to an illusion theory, or to the theory of colors as virtual properties, we still need to develop an account that prescribes how we should, in the future, think about color, at least in general terms. For practical purposes, it does not matter at all that colors are virtual properties. For these purposes, it is sufficient if "it is as if there are colors"; i.e, these purposes are served equally as well if objects appear to be colored. They do not need to be really colored.

There are other, more theoretical purposes for which we need to develop a more comprehensive account of color, one that specifies other concepts of color. The best such account is one that sets out a pluralist framework, one that allows for a variety of different concepts of color, including objectivist and psychological concepts, and arguably, ecological and phenomenal concepts. Moreover, such a framework does not require us to reject the natural or folk concept.

That there is scope for more than one concept of color should not be surprising. The natural concept of color is intended to serve a range of purposes. We find, though, that nothing exists that satisfies all the requirements. However, all is not lost. It is possible to develop a new set of color concepts that as a whole serves all or most of the previous purposes. None of them taken singly serves all, but each serves some. It is built into the natural or folk concept that colors have, broadly speaking, two major roles: (i) colors have a causal role to play in color perception; (ii) colors serve a variety of epistemological, aesthetic and emotional purposes. Colors serve the latter set of purposes through the way colors appear. Once it is recognized that colors, as specified by the traditional concept, are virtual properties and that there is no property that serves all the functions relevant to that concept, the way is open to recognize two new concepts of color: dispositional, psychological color, to take over and consolidate the role served by the appearance, and physical color, to take over the causal role. Moreover, once it is revealed that the cause of color perception are complex, it is open for us to see the point of having several physical or objectivist concepts of color, one framed in terms of microstructural properties, the other in terms of light-related properties.

To argue in this way for the place of a number of concepts of color, and for the possibility of an objectivist concept, to supplement other concepts of color, is to argue for a pluralist framework for colors. This framework has the advantage of allowing a place for an objective concept of color, while not making it mandatory. Whether or not there is any point in having an objective concept, there is, as we have seen, a need for a dispositional concept, one tied to the appearance of color. The dispositional concept is a crucial part of the pluralist framework.

But once we become enlightened by accepting the theory of virtual colors, how should we then think of the dispositional concept? What exactly does the exercise of the disposition consist in? What exactly is the content of the dispositional concept? The right answer is that there are two parts to the dispositionalist concept. One part refers to the way objects appear, and the other to the feature, whatever it is, which is the causal basis for the appearance. That is, the disposition is not pure but ‘mixed’. BlueD objects are objects that have some feature by virtue of which they look as if they are blue, i.e., blue in the intrinsic sense, i.e., blue in the virtual-color sense. To say that this sense of color is the virtual-color sense is not to say that colors are ordinarily conceived of as virtual. It is to say that the properties colors are conceived of as being are virtual. The content of the dispositional concept thus presupposes the virtual-color concept. This means that there is point in retaining this concept, even when we come to know that no objects have the property. The fact that I do not believe that this property of intrinsic blueness is ever instantiated does not mean that I should give up the concept, any more than disbelievers in Satan should give up the concept of satanic.

In this state of theoretical sophistication, my use of the natural concept to describe things requires me to adopt the naive attitude to color or, preferably, the engaged attitude typical of the playgoer who, at the theatre, suspends his belief that ‘it is all a pack of lies’. Of course as philosophers, we need to understand why we have this virtual-color concept and what role it plays, and how it works. But none of that stops me from continuing to employ the virtual-color concept, whether as scientist, artist, consumer, town-planner, interior decorator or philosopher. As for serving functions such as being signs or as being aesthetically or emotionally significant, virtual colors are as good as real colors.

There is no need therefore to jettison the natural concept. Realizing however that the color properties are virtual properties means that, for our understanding of how such a concept should apply and why it is so beneficial. Part of this understanding is provided by the explanation for why we have the natural concept that we do. The explanation for why the natural concept is beneficial is that the purposes served by the concepts are equally well served if objects merely appear to be colored and are not actually colored.

12. Colors as Phenomenal Qualities

Given the virtual colors theory, there is a further problem that needs to be resolved: to explain how it is that the natural concept takes the form that it does, and in particular how it contains the basis for the structure that underpins the color systems for ordering colors. One of the characteristics of the color properties captured in the natural concept is that colors are the sorts of properties among which a set of internal relationships hold. That is, colors as a block, have a qualitative, sensuous character that enables objects having them to be systematically ordered and arranged. There are no physical features that have this character. One explanation for why this character is part of the virtual color property is that our sensory representations (or the elements/aspects in our visual experiences) have the qualitative character. It is because the sensory representations have the qualitative character that they do, that they represent physical objects as having the qualitative character in question.

The way that the phenomenal concept, i.e., the concept of color as a phenomenal property is introduced is that it serves to explain why the natural concept of color has the character that it does. When we have color experiences, typically we form sensory representations of the world. These representations represent objects in the physical world as having (virtual) colors, and they do so because the representations have the character implicit in three-dimensional color arrays. The representations do not have virtual colors (they have the right kind of structure, but they do not have the right causal powers), but they represent physical objects as having those colors. Sensory representations, in other words, have the phenomenological character that physical objects might have had but do not.

The qualitative character that the sensory representations have is sensory and phenomenal in the strongest sense. The character is ontologically subjective. In visual experience we experience the sensory color qualities as being in a public three dimensional space. That is, our experiences, and our sensory representations, represent the color qualities as being on the surfaces of physical objects, or as otherwise located in physical space. Contrary to what some philosophers believe, there is no more problem in experiencing phenomenal qualities in such a way than there is in feeling a pain in a foot or an elbow. In the case of pains, the phenomenal quality is felt on a bodily location, e.g., behind the eye, or in an elbow, etc. It needs to be said that although our sensory representations have phenomenal color qualities, which we are aware of, we are not aware of them as phenomenal qualities, that is, as phenomenal qualities of physical objects. We use the sensory representations as signs for physical objects, but we are not aware of the sign as a sign. It needs to be stressed that this account does not require colors, either phenomenal or virtual, to be projected into space. Just as they represent objects as having virtual colors, so they represent objects as having spatial properties (and relations) through themselves having phenomenal spatial properties.

13. Conclusion

It has been argued an adequate account of color must, in the first place, provide an account of the folk concept or natural concept of color. Such an account, there is reason to believe, is an illusion theory of color. Supposing that colors, as we normally think of them, are virtual properties, we are faced with the question of how, if at all, should we adjust our ideas in thinking of colors. If normally our perception of color involves ‘false consciousness’, what is the right way to think of colors? The answer to that is that for many purposes we should continue to think of them in the same way as we always did. In the case of color, unlike other cases, false consciousness should be a cause for celebration.

Although for most practical purposes, it does not matter that colors are virtual properties, there are more theoretical purposes, however, for which we need to develop a more comprehensive account, a pluralist account of color. The different elements of the natural concept of color reflect different functions that colors are meant to play. Given these different functions and the fact that there is no property that satisfies all of them, it is open to us to develop a pluralist framework in which different concepts of color take over different functions. This pluralist framework makes room for the introduction of objectivist concepts of color, but such concepts need to stand beside a dispositionalist concept which makes reference to the way colors appear to perceivers, and arguably, with the latter, a phenomenal concept. It is such a framework that is necessary to give an adequate account of the rich epistemological and socially important roles that colors play.


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concepts | Descartes, René | Locke, John | qualia | realism | reduction