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René Descartes

First published Wed Dec 3, 2008

René Descartes (1596–1650) was a creative mathematician of the first order, an important scientific thinker, and an original metaphysician. During the course of his life, he was a mathematician first, a natural scientist or “natural philosopher” second, and a metaphysician third. In mathematics, he developed the techniques that made possible algebraic (or “analytic”) geometry. In natural philosophy, he can be credited with several specific achievements: co-framer of the sine law of refraction, developer of an important empirical account of the rainbow, and proposer of a naturalistic account of the formation of the earth and planets (a precursor to the nebular hypothesis). More importantly, he offered a new vision of the natural world that continues to shape our thought today: a world of matter possessing a few fundamental properties and interacting according to a few universal laws. This natural world included an immaterial mind that, in human beings, was directly related to the brain; in this way, Descartes formulated the modern version of the mind–body problem. In metaphysics, he provided arguments for the existence of God, to show that the essence of matter is extension, and that the essence of mind is thought. Descartes claimed early on to possess a special method, which was variously exhibited in mathematics, natural philosophy, and metaphysics, and which, in the latter part of his life, included, or was supplemented by, a method of doubt.

Descartes presented his results in major works published during his lifetime: the Discourse on the Method (in French, 1637), with its essays, the Dioptrics, Meteorology, and Geometry; the Meditations on First Philosophy (i.e., on metaphysics), with its Objections and Replies (in Latin, 1641); the Principles of Philosophy, covering his metaphysics and much of his natural philosophy (in Latin, 1644); and the Passions of the Soul, on the emotions (in French, 1649). Important works published posthumously included his Letters (in Latin and French, 1657–67); World, or Treatise on Light, containing the core of his natural philosophy (in French, 1664); Treatise on Man (in French, 1664), containing his physiology and mechanistic psychology; and the Rules for the Direction of the Mind (in Latin, 1704), an early, unfinished work attempting to set out his method.

Descartes was known among the learned in his day as the best of the French mathematicians, as the developer of a new physics, and as the proposer of a new metaphysics. In the years following his death, his natural philosophy was widely taught and discussed. In the eighteenth century aspects of his science remained influential, especially his physiology, and he was remembered for his failed metaphysics and his method of doubt. In the nineteenth century he was revered for his mechanistic physiology and theory that animal bodies are machines (that is, are constituted by material mechanisms, governed by the laws of matter alone). The twentieth century variously celebrated his famous “cogito” starting point, reviled the sense data that some alleged to be the legacy of his skeptical starting point, and looked to him as a model of the culturally engaged philosopher. He has been seen, at various times, as a hero and as a villain; as a brilliant theorist who set new directions in thought, and as the harbinger of a cold, rationalistic, and calculative conception of human beings.

1. Intellectual Biography

1.1 Early life and education

Descartes was born on 31 March 1596 in his maternal grandmother's house in La Haye, in the Touraine region of France. His father Joachim, a lawyer who lived in Châtteleraut (22 kilometers southwest of La Haye, across the Creuse River in the Poitou region), was away at the Parliament of Brittany in Rennes. The town of La Haye, which lies 47 kilometers south of Tours, has subsequently been renamed Descartes.

When Descartes was thirteen and one-half months old, his mother, Jeanne Brochard, died in childbirth. The young René spent his first years with his grandmother, Jeanne Sain Brochard, in La Haye, together with his older brother Pierre and older sister Jeanne. It is likely that he then moved to the house of his great uncle, Michel Ferrand, who, like many of René's male relatives, was a lawyer, and who was Counselor to the King in Châtteleraut. When Descartes met Isaac Beeckman in 1618, Descartes introduced himself as “Poitevin,” or from Poitou (10:46, 51–4; Rodis-Lewis 1998, 26; see also 2:642). At this time (and now and again later on), he signed letters as “du Perron” and called himself “sieur du Perron” (Lord of Perron), after a small farm in Poitou he had inherited from his mother's family (Watson 2007, 81, 230). But he did not neglect his birth place in La Haye: in a letter of 1649, he described himself as “a man who was born in the gardens of Touraine” (5:349).

In 1606 or 1607, Descartes entered the newly founded Jesuit College of La Fleche, where he remained until 1614 or 1615. He followed the usual course of studies, which included five or six years of grammar school, including Latin and Greek grammar, classical poets, and Cicero, followed by three years of philosophy curriculum. By rule, the Jesuit curriculum was based on the philosophy of Aristotle, and divided into the then-standard topics of logic, morals, physics, and metaphysics. The Jesuits also included mathematics in the final three years of study.

Aristotle's philosophy was approached through textbooks and commentaries. Even within this framework, and taking into account the reading of Cicero, Descartes would have been exposed to the doctrines of the ancient atomists, Plato, and the Stoics, and he would have heard of the skeptics. Further, important intellectual events were known at La Fleche, including the discovery of the moons of Jupiter by Galileo in 1610.

Famously, Descartes wrote in the autobiographical portion of the Discourse that, when he left school, “I found myself beset by so many doubts and errors that I came to think I had gained nothing from my attempts to become educated but increasing recognition of my ignorance” (6:4). And yet in the next paragraph he allowed that he did not “cease to value the exercises done in the schools” (6:5), for languages, fables, oratory, poetry, mathematics, morals, theology, and philosophy all had their value, as did jurisprudence, medicine, and the other sciences (including engineering), which serve as professions and which one might study after attending a school such as La Fleche. He went on to note the contradiction and disagreement that beset philosophy and so infected the higher sciences (including medicine) “insofar as they borrow their principles from philosophy” (6:8). A year later, in 1638, he advised a correspondent on the virtues of sending the correspondent's son to La Fleche (even if he wanted his son subsequently to transcend the learning of the schools), while also suggesting that the son might study at Utrecht with Henry le Roy, a disciple of Descartes (2:378–9). Descartes was, in the Discourse, suggesting that it was no accident that the philosophy he learned at La Fleche was uncertain: previous philosophy was bound to be uncertain, since he (Descartes) was now offering a first glimpse of the one true philosophy that he had only recently discovered. Until it could be promulgated, La Fleche, or another good school, would be the best on offer.

His family wanted Descartes to be a lawyer, like his father and many other relatives. To this end, he went to Poitiers to study law, and obtained a degree in 1616. But he never practiced law or entered into the governmental service such practice would make possible. Instead, he became a gentleman soldier, moving in 1618 to Breda, to support the Protestant Prince Maurice against the Catholic parts of the Netherlands (later, Belgium), which were controlled by Spain—a Catholic land, like France, but at this point an enemy.

1.2 First results, a new mission, and method

While in Breda, Descartes met Isaac Beeckman, a Dutch mathematician and natural philosopher. Beeckman set various problems for Descartes, including questions about falling bodies, hydrostatics, and mathematical problems. Descartes and Beeckman engaged in what they called “physico-mathematica,” or mathematical physics (10:52). Since antiquity, mathematics had been applied to various physical subject matters, in optics, astronomy, mechanics (focusing on the lever), and hydrostatics. Beeckman and Descartes brought to this work a commitment to atoms as the basic constituents of matter; as had ancient atomists, they attributed not only size, shape, and motion but also weight to those atoms (10:68). Descartes opened a section in his notebook entitled “Democritica” (10:8), in honor of the ancient atomist Democritus.

At this time, Descartes discovered and conveyed to Beeckman the fundamental insight that makes analytic geometry possible: the technique for describing lines of all sorts by using mathematical equations involving ratios between lengths. Descartes himself did not foresee replacing geometrical constructions with algebraic formulas; rather, he viewed geometry as the basic mathematical science and he considered his algebraic techniques to provide a powerful alternative to actual compass-and-ruler constructions when the latter became too intricate. When, in the nineteenth century, algebra and analysis took precedence over geometry, the rectilinear coordinate system of algebraic geometry came to be called “Cartesian coordinates” in honor of Descartes' discovery.

Descartes left Breda in 1619 to join the Catholic army of Maximilian I (Duke of Bavaria and ally of France). The war concerned the authority of Ferdinand V, a Catholic, who had been crowned emperor of the Holy Roman Empire in September. Descartes attended the coronation and was returning to the army when winter caught him in the small town of Ulm (or perhaps Neuburg), not far from Munich. On the night of November 10, 1619, Descartes had three dreams that seemed to provide him with a mission in life. The dreams themselves are interesting and complex (see Sebba 1987). Descartes took from them the message that he should set out to reform all knowledge. He decided to begin with philosophy, since the principles of the other sciences must be derived from it (6:21–2).

Descartes' activities over the next nine years are not well documented. He lived part of the time in Paris, visited Poitou to sell some inherited properties, and also traveled to Italy. During this time he worked on some mathematical problems, and he derived the sine law of refraction (later published in the Dioptrics). His major effort was on a work to convey his new method, the Rules.

In the Rules, he sought to generalize the methods of mathematics so as to provide a route to clear knowledge of everything that human beings can know. His methodological advice included a suggestion that is familiar to every student of elementary geometry: break your work up into small steps that you can understand completely and about which you have utter certainty, and check your work often. But he also had advice for the ambitious seeker of truth, concerning where to start and how to work up to greater things. Thus, Rule 10 reads: “In order to acquire discernment we should exercise our intelligence by investigating what others have already discovered, and methodically survey even the most insignificant products of human skill, especially those which display order” (10:403). As examples of “simple” arts “in which order prevails,” he offered carpet-making and embroidery, and also number-games and arithmetic games. He went on to discuss the roles of the “cognitive faculties” in acquiring knowledge, which include the intellect, imagination, sense perception, and memory. These faculties allow the seeker of knowledge to combine simple truths in order to solve more complex problems, such as the solution to problems in optics (10:394), or the discovery of how a magnet works (10:427).

By the end of 1628 Descartes had abandoned work on the Rules, having completed about half of the projected treatise. In that year he moved to the Dutch Netherlands, and after that he returned to France infrequently, prior to moving to Sweden in 1649. While in the Netherlands, he endeavored to keep his address a secret and he changed locations frequently, in accordance with his motto, “to live well, live secretly.”

1.3 Metaphysical turn, comprehensive physics, Discourse

Upon arriving in the Netherlands, Descartes undertook work on two sorts of topics. In Summer, 1629, an impressive set of parhelia, or false suns, were observed near Rome. When Descartes heard of them, he set out to find an explanation. (He ultimately hypothesized that a large, solid ice-ring in the sky acts as a lens to form multiple images of the sun [6:355].) This work interrupted his investigations on another topic, which had engaged him for his first nine months in the Netherlands (1:44)—the topic of metaphysics, that is, the theory of the first principles of everything that there is. The metaphysical objects of investigation included the existence and nature of God and the soul (1:144, 182). However, these metaphysical investigations were not entirely divorced from problems such as the parhelia, for he claimed that through his investigations into God and the human self, he had been able “to discover the foundation of physics” (1:144). Subsequently, Descartes mentioned a little metaphysical treatise in Latin—presumably an early version of the Meditations—that he wrote upon first coming to the Netherlands (1:184, 350). And we know that Descartes later confided to Mersenne that the Meditations contained “all the principles of my physics” (3:233).

While working on the parhelia, Descartes conceived the idea for a very ambitious treatise. He wrote to Mersenne that he had decided not to explain “just one phenomenon” (the parhelia), but rather to compose a treatise in which he explained “all the phenomena of nature, that is to say, the whole of physics” (1:70). This work eventually became The World, which was to have had three parts: on light (a general treatise on visible, or material, nature), on man (a treatise of physiology), and on the soul. Only the first two survive (and perhaps only they were ever written), as the Treatise on Light and Treatise on Man. In these works, which Descartes decided to suppress upon learning of the condemnation of Galileo (1:270, 305), he offered a comprehensive vision of the universe as constituted from a bare form of matter having only length, breadth, and depth (three-dimensional volume) and carved up into particles with size and shape, which may be in motion or at rest, and which interact through laws of motion enforced by God (11:33–4). These works contained a description of the visible universe as a single physical system in which all its operations, from the formation of planets and the transmission of light from the sun, to the physiological processes of human and nonhuman animal bodies, can be explained through the mechanism of moving matter arranged into shapes and structures and moving according to three laws of motion.

After suppressing his World, Descartes decided to put forward, anonymously, a limited sample of his new philosophy, in the Discourse with its attached essays. The Discourse recounted Descartes' own life journey, explaining how he had come to the position of doubting his previous knowledge and seeking to begin afresh. It offered some initial results of his metaphysical investigations, including mind–body dualism. It did not, however, engage in the deep skepticism of the later Meditations, nor did it claim to establish, metaphysically, that the essence of matter is extension. This last conclusion was presented merely as a hypothesis whose fruitfulness could be tested and proven by way of its results, as contained in the attached essays on Dioptrics and Meteorology. The latter subject area comprised “atmospheric” phenomena. In his Meteorology, Descartes described his general hypothesis about the nature of matter, before continuing on to provide accounts of vapors, salt, winds, clouds, snow, rain, hail, lightning, the rainbow, coronas, and parhelia.

Near the beginning of the Meteorology, Descartes wrote that he was working from the following “supposition” or hypothesis: “that the water, earth, air, and all other such bodies that surround us are composed of many small parts of various shapes and sizes, which are never so properly disposed nor so exactly joined together that there do not remain many intervals around them; and that these intervals are not empty but are filled with that extremely subtle matter through the mediation of which, I have said above, the action of light is communicated” (6:233). He presented a corpuscularian basis for his physics, which denied the atoms-and-void theory of ancient atomism and affirmed that all bodies are composed from one type of matter, which is infinitely divisible (6:239). In the World, he had presented his non-atomistic corpuscularism, but without denying void space outright and without affirming infinite divisibility (11:12–20).

In the Meteorology, he also proclaimed that his natural philosophy had no need for the “substantial forms” and “real qualities” that other philosophers “imagine to be in bodies” (6:239). He had taken the same position in the World, where he said that in conceiving his new “world” (i.e., his conception of the universe), “I do not use the qualities called heat, cold, moistness, and dryness, as the Philosophers do” (11:25). Indeed, Descartes claimed that he could explain these qualities themselves through matter in motion (11:26), a claim that he repeated in the Meteorology (6:235–6). In effect, he was denying the then-dominant scholastic Aristotelian ontology, which explained all natural bodies as comprised of a “prime matter” informed by a “substantial form,” and which explained qualities such as hot and cold as really inhering in bodies in a way that is “similar” to the qualities of hot and cold as we experience them tactually.

Unlike Descartes' purely extended matter, which can exist on its own having only size and shape, scholastic Aristotelians held that prime matter cannot exist on its own. To form a substance, or something that can exist by itself, prime matter must be “informed” by a substantial form (a form that renders something into a substance). The four Aristotelian elements, earth, air, fire, and water, had substantial forms that combined the basic qualities of hot, cold, wet, and dry: earth is cold and dry; air is hot and wet; fire is hot and dry; and water is cold and wet. These elements can themselves then serve as “matter” to higher substantial forms, such as the form of a mineral, or a magnet, or a living thing. Whether in the case of earth or of a living rabbit, the “form” of a thing directs its characteristic activity. For earth, that activity is to approach the center to the universe; water has the same tendency, but not as strongly. For this reason, Aristotelians explained, the planet earth has formed at the center, with water on its surface. A new rabbit is formed when a male rabbit contributes, through its sperm, the “form” of rabbithood to the seed-matter of the female rabbit. This form then organizes that matter into a the shape of a rabbit, including organizing and directing the activity of its various organs and physiological processes. The newborn rabbit's behavior is then guided by its rabbit-specific “sensitive soul,” which is the name for the substantial form of the rabbit. Other properties of the rabbit, such as the whiteness of its fur, are explained by the “real quality” of white inhering in each strand of hair.

Although in the World and Meteorology Descartes avoided outright denial of substantial forms and real qualities, it is clear that he intended to deny them (1:324; 2:200; 3:420, 500, 648). Two considerations help explain his tentative language: first, when he wrote these works, he was not yet prepared to release his metaphysics, which would support his hypothesis about matter and so rule out substantial forms (1:563); and, second, he was sensitive to the prudential value of not directly attacking the scholastic Aristotelian position (3:298), since it was the accepted position in university education (3:577) and was strongly supported by orthodox theologians, both Catholic and Protestant (1:85–6; 3:349).

After publication of the Discourse in 1637, Descartes received in his correspondence queries and challenges to various of the doctrines, including his account of the sequence of phenomena during heart-beat and the circulation of the blood; his avoidance of substantial forms and real qualities; his argument for a distinction between mind and body; and his view that natural philosophical hypotheses could be “proven” through the effects that they explain (6:76). Descartes' correspondence from the second half of the 1630s repays close study, among other things for his discussions of hypothesis-confirmation in science, his replies to objections concerning his metaphysics, and his explanation that he had left the most radical skeptical arguments out of this work, since it was written in French for a wide audience (1:350, 561).

In 1635, Descartes fathered a daughter named Francine. Her mother was Descartes' housekeeper, Helena Jans. They lived with Descartes in the latter 1630s, until Francine's untimely death in September 1640. Descartes subsequently contributed a dowry for Helena's marriage in 1644 (Watson 2007, 188).

1.4 The metaphysics and comprehensive physics revealed

In a letter of 13 November 1639, Descartes wrote to Mersenne that he was “working on a discourse in which I try to clarify what I have hitherto written” on metaphysics (2:622). This was the Meditations, and presumably he was revising or recasting the Latin treatise from 1629. He announced to Mersenne a plan to put the work before “the twenty or thirty most learned theologians” before it was published. In the end, he and Mersenne collected seven sets of objections to the Meditations, which Descartes published with the work, along with his replies. Some objections were from theologians, one set was from the Jesuit philosopher Pierre Bourdin, and others were from Mersenne himself, the philosophers Pierre Gassendi and Thomas Hobbes, and the philosopher-theologian Antoine Arnauld.

As previously mentioned, Descartes considered the Meditations to contain the principles of his physics. But there is no Meditation labeled “principles of physics.” The principles in question, which are spread through the work, concern the nature of matter (that its essence is extension), the activity of God in creating and preserving the world, the nature of mind (that it is unextended, thinking substance), mind–body union and interaction, and the ontology of sensory qualities.

Once Descartes had presented his metaphysics, he felt free to proceed with the publication of his entire physics. However, he needed first to teach it to speak Latin (3:523), the lingua franca of the seventeenth century. He hatched a scheme to publish a Latin version of his physics (the Principles) together with a scholastic Aristotelian work on physics, so that the comparative advantages would be manifest. For this purpose, he chose the Summa philosophiae of Eustace of St. Paul. That part of his plan never came to fruition. His intent remained the same: he wished to produce a book that could be adopted into the schools, even Jesuit schools such as La Fleche (3:233, 523). Ultimately, he had some success in having his physics taught in the Netherlands and England; but for the Catholic lands, teaching of his philosophy was dampened when his works were placed on the Index of Prohibited Books in 1663.

The Principles appeared in Latin in 1644, with a French translation following in 1647. Descartes added to the French translation an “Author's Letter” to serve as a preface. In the letter he explained important elements of his attitude toward philosophy, including the view that in matters philosophical one must reason through the arguments and evaluate them for one's self (9B:3). He also presented an image of the relations among the various parts of philosophy, in the form of a tree:

Thus the whole of philosophy is like a tree. The roots are metaphysics, the trunk is physics, and the branches emerging from the trunk are all the other sciences, which may be reduced to three principal ones, namely medicine, mechanics and morals. By “morals” I understand the highest and most perfect moral system, which presupposes a complete knowledge of the other sciences and is the ultimate level of wisdom. (9B:14)

The extant Principles offer metaphysics in Part I; the general principles of physics, in the form of his matter theory and laws of motion, are presented in Part II, as following from the metaphysics; Part III concerns astronomical phenomena; and Part IV covers the formation of the earth and seeks to explain the properties of minerals, metals, magnets, fire, and the like, to which are appended discussions of how the senses operate and a final discussion of methodological issues in natural philosophy. His intent had been also to explain the origins of plants and animals, human physiology, mind–body union and interaction, and the function of the senses. In the end, he had to abandon the discussion of plants and animals (Princ. IV.188), but he included some discussion of mind–body union in his account of the senses.

1.5 Theological controversy, Passions, and death

From early in his correspondence with Mersenne, Descartes showed a concern to avoid becoming embroiled in theological controversy or earning the enmity of church authorities (1:85–6, 150, 271). In the end, he was drawn into theological controversy with Calvinist theologians in the Netherlands. In the latter 1630s, Henry le Roy, or Regius, a professor of medicine in Utrecht, taught Descartes' system of natural philosophy. Already by 1640, Gisbert Voetius, a theologian at Utrecht, expressed his displeasure over this to Mersenne (3:230). Controversy brewed, at first between Regius and Voetius, with Descartes advising the latter. Voetius, who was rector of the University, convinced the faculty senate to condemn Descartes' philosophy in 1642. He and his colleagues published two works (in 1642 and 1643) attacking Descartes' philosophy, to which Descartes himself responded by publishing a Letter to Voetius (1643). The controversy simmered through the mid 1640s. Descartes eventually had a falling out with Regius, who published a broadsheet or manifesto, in which Regius departed from Descartes' theory of the human mind. Descartes replied with his Comments on a Certain Broadsheet (1648).

In the mid 1640s, Descartes continued work on his physiological system, which he had pursued throughout the 1630s. He had his Treatise on Man recopied, and he began a new work, Description of the Human Body. During this period he corresponded with Princess Elisabeth, at first on topics in metaphysics stemming from her reading of the Meditations, and then on the passions and emotions. Eventually, he wrote the Passions of the Soul, which gave the most extensive account of his behavioral physiology to be published in his lifetime, and which contained a comprehensive and original theory of the passions and emotions. Portions of this work constitute what we have of Descartes' moral theory.

In 1649, Descartes accepted the invitation of Queen Christina of Sweden to join her court. At the Queen's request, he composed the Statutes of the Swedish Royal Academy. On the day he delivered them to her, he became ill. He never recovered. He died on 11 February 1650.

2. Philosophical Development

In general, it is rare for a philosopher's positions and arguments to remain the same across an entire life. This means that, in reading philosophers' works and reconstructing their arguments, one must pay attention to the place of each work in the philosophical development of the author in question. Readers of the philosophical works of Immanuel Kant are aware of the basic distinction between his critical and precritical periods. Readers of the works of G. W. Leibniz are also aware of his philosophical development, although in his case there is less agreement on how to place his writings into a developmental scheme.

Scholars have proposed various schemes for dividing Descartes' life into periods. I favor a relatively simple division between the era when mathematics provided the model for his method, and the period after the “metaphysical turn” of 1629, when his conception of the role of the intellect in acquiring knowledge changed, and when he came to conceive the truth of his special or particular hypotheses in natural philosophy as less than certain, and so as subject to the scheme of confirmation through consequences mentioned above. In effect, he adopted a hypothetico-deductive scheme of confirmation, but with this difference: the range of hypotheses was limited by his metaphysical conclusions concerning the essence of mind and matter, their union, and the role of God in creating the preserving the universe. Consequently, some hypotheses, such as the “substantial forms” of scholastics, were ruled out. I explain argumentative differences among the World, Discourse, and Meditations and Principles as stemming from the fact that in the 1630s Descartes was arguing without yet having presented his metaphysics, and so he adopted an empirical mode of justification, whereas after 1641 he could appeal to his published metaphysics in seeking to secure the general framework of his physics.

Other scholars see things differently. John Schuster (1980) finds that the epistemology of the Rules lasted into the 1630s, and was superseded (unhappily, in his view) only by the metaphysical quest for certainty of the Meditations. Daniel Garber (1992, 48) also holds that Descartes abandoned his early method after the Discourse. Machamer and McGuire (2006) believe that Descartes expected natural philosophy to meet the standard of absolute certainty through the time of the Meditations, and that he in effect admitted defeat on that score in the final articles of the Principles, adopting a lower standard of certainty for his particular hypotheses (such as the explanation of magnetism by cork-screw shaped particles). They see the Principles as marking Descartes' “epistemic turn” away from the methodological stance of realism found in the Rules, Discourse, and Meditations.

These contrasting views of Descartes' intellectual development suggest different relations between his metaphysics and physics. Schuster (1980) treats Descartes' metaphysical arguments as a kind of afterthought. Machamer and McGuire (2006) see Descartes' alleged “epistemic turn” and his retreat from realism as a response to philosophical criticism in 1641; they find more continuity between Descartes' Rules and his writings up to 1641 than do Garber or I. In the version I have presented, Descartes was working on physical problems first, but his metaphysical insights of 1628–9 allowed him to achieve a general conception of matter as having only “geometrical” properties, viz., size, shape, and motion.

There are also differences among interpreters concerning the relative priority in Descartes' philosophical endeavors of epistemology or the theory of knowledge as opposed to metaphysics or first philosophy. In the account of Descartes' development that I have given, he was interested in epistemological and methodological questions first, and these interests came to a head in the Rules. Thereafter, his aim was to establish a new natural philosophy based on a new metaphysics. In the extant works from the 1630s, the World and Discourse plus essays, he argued for the general principles of his physics, including his conception of matter, on empirical grounds. He argued from explanatory scope and theoretical parsimony. As regards parsimony or simplicity, he pointed out that his reconceived matter had only a few basic properties (especially size, shape, and motion), from which he would construct his explanations. He claimed great explanatory scope by contending that his explanations could extend to all natural phenomena, celestial and terrestrial, inorganic and organic. But throughout the 1630s, Descartes claimed that he also was in possession of a metaphysics that could justify the first principles of his physics. His arguments to establish that metaphysics are found in the Meditations and Principles.

Some scholars emphasize the epistemological aspects of Descartes' work, starting with the Rules and continuing through to the Principles. Accordingly, the main change in Descartes' intellectual development is the introduction of skeptical arguments in the Discourse and Meditations. Many interpreters, represented prominently in the latter twentieth century by Richard Popkin (1979), believe that Descartes took the skeptical threat to knowledge quite seriously and sought to overcome it in the Meditations. By contrast, in the main interpretive thread that I follow here, skeptical arguments were a cognitive tool that Descartes used in order to guide the reader of the Meditations into the right cognitive frame of mind for grasping the first truths of metaphysics.

The reader who is curious about these issues should read the relevant works of Descartes, together with his correspondence from the latter half of the 1630s and early 1640s.

3. A New Metaphysics

Descartes first presented his metaphysics in the Meditations, and then reformulated it in textbook-format in the Principles. His metaphysics sought to answer these philosophical questions: How does the human mind acquire knowledge? What is the mark of truth? What is the actual nature of reality? How are our experiences related to our bodies and brains? Is there a benevolent God, and if so, how can we reconcile his existence with the facts of illness, error, and immoral actions?

3.1 How do our minds know?

Descartes had no doubt that human beings know some things and are capable of discovering others, including (at least since his metaphysical insights of 1629) fundamental truths about the basic structure of reality. Yet he also believed that the philosophical methods taught in the schools of his time and used by most of his contemporaries were deeply flawed. He believed that the doctrines of scholastic Aristotelian philosophy contained a basic error about the manner in which fundamental truths, such as the truths of metaphysics, are to be gained. He expressed this mistaken view in the First Meditation, by saying (not in his own voice, but in a voice for the reader): “Whatever I have up till now accepted as most true I have acquired either from the senses or through the senses” (7:18). He then went on to challenge the veridicality of the senses with the skeptical arguments of First Meditation, including arguments from previous errors, the dream argument, and the evil-deceiver argument.

In the Aristotelian scheme against which Descartes is moving, all knowledge arises from the senses, in accordance with the slogan “There is nothing in the intellect that was not previously in the senses” (7:75, 267). Similarly, orthodox scholastic Aristotelians agreed that there is “no thought without a phantasm,” or an image. Descartes explained these convictions as the results of childhood prejudice (7:2, 17, 69, 107; Princ. I.71–3). As children, we are naturally led by our senses in seeking benefits and avoiding bodily harms. As a result, when we grow into adults we are “immersed” in the body and the senses, and so we accept the philosophical view that the senses are the basis for learning about the nature of the reality (7:38, 75, 82–3).

Descartes denied that the senses reveal the natures of substances. He held that in fact the human intellect is able to perceive the nature of reality through a purely intellectual perception. This means that in order to procure the fundamental truths of metaphysics, we must “withdraw the mind from the senses” (7:4, 12, 14) and turn toward our innate ideas of the essences of things, including the essences of mind, matter, and an infinite being (God). Descartes constructed the Meditations so as to secure this process of withdrawal from the senses in Meditation I. Meditation II brings the discovery of an initial truth, in the cogito (7:25), which is elsewhere summarized as the argument “cogito, ergo sum,” or “I think, therefore I am” (7:140). Descartes then observes that the cogito result is known only from the fact that it is “clearly and distinctly” perceived by the intellect (7:35). Hence, he sets up clear and distinct intellectual perception, independent of the senses, as the mark of truth (7:35, 62, 73).

Descartes then unfolds the results of clear and distinct perception in Meditations III–VI, and he repeats and extends these results in Principles I–II. We consider these results in Secs. 3.3–5. For now, let us examine what Descartes thought about the senses as a source of knowledge that was different from the pure intellect.

Descartes famously calls the senses into doubt in the First Meditation, and he affirms in Meditation Six that the senses are not meant to provide knowledge of the “essential nature” of external objects (7:83). In that way, his position in the Meditations differs from that in the Rules, for in that work he allowed that some “simple natures” pertaining to corporeal things can and should be considered through the images of the senses (10:383, 417). In the Meditations, he held that the essence of matter could be apprehended by innate ideas, independently of any sensory image (7:64–5, 72–3). To that extent, his later position agrees with the Platonic tradition in philosophy, which denigrated sensory knowledge and held that the things known by the intellect have a higher reality than the objects of the senses. Descartes, however, was no Platonist, a point to which we will return. His attitude toward the senses in his mature period was not one of total disparagement.

Descartes assigned two roles to the senses in the acquisition of human knowledge. First, he acknowledged that the senses are usually adequate for detecting benefits and harms for the body. Indeed, he considered their natural function to be “to inform the mind of what is beneficial or harmful for the composite of which the mind is a part” (7:83), that is, for the composite of mind and body. In this connection, he was agreeing with the conception of the function of the senses that was widely shared in the traditional literature in natural philosophy, including the Aristotelian literature, as well as in the medical literature on the natural functions of the senses.

Second, he recognized that the senses have an essential role to play in natural philosophy. The older literature on Descartes sometimes had him claiming that he could derive all natural philosophical or scientific knowledge from the pure intellect, independent of the senses. But Descartes knew full well that he could not do that. He distinguished between the general principles of his physics and the more particular mechanisms that he posited to explain natural phenomena, such as magnetism or the properties of oil and water. He claimed to derive the general principles “from certain seeds of truth” that are innate in the mind (6:64). These include the fundamental doctrine that the essence of matter is extension (Princ. II.3–4, IV.203). As to particular phenomena, in general he had to rely on observations to determine their properties (such as the properties of the magnet), and he acknowledged that multiple hypotheses about subvisible mechanisms could be constructed to account for those phenomena. The natural philosopher must, therefore, test the various hypotheses by their consequences, and consider empirical virtues such as simplicity and scope (Disc. VI; Princ. IV.201–6). Further, Descartes knew that some problems rely on measurements that can only be made with the senses, including determining the size of the sun (7:80) or the refractive indexes of various materials (Met. VIII).

In considering Descartes' answer to how we know, we can distinguish classes of knowledge. Metaphysical first principles are known by the intellect acting alone. Such knowledge should attain absolute certainty. Practical knowledge concerning immediate benefits and harms is known by the senses. Such knowledge is usually good enough. Objects of natural science are known by a combination of pure intellect and sensory observation: the pure intellect tells us what properties bodies can have, and we use the senses to determine which particular instances of those properties bodies do have. For submicroscopic particles, we must reason from observed effects to potential cause. In these latter cases, our measurements and our inferences may be subject to error, but we may also hope to arrive at the truth.

3.2 The mark of truth

At the beginning of the Third Meditation, Descartes declares “I now seem to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive very clearly and distinctly is true” (7:35). Clarity and distinctness of intellectual perception is the mark of truth.

In the fifth set of Objections to the Meditations, Gassendi suggestions that there is difficulty concerning

what possible skill or method will permit us to discover that our understanding is so clear and distinct as to be true and to make it impossible that we should be mistaken. As I objected at the beginning, we are often deceived even though we think we know something as clearly and distinctly as anything can possibly be known. (7:318)

Gassendi has in effect asked how it is that we should recognize clear and distinct perceptions. If clarity and distinctness is the mark of truth, what is the method for recognizing clarity and distinctness?

In reply, Descartes claims that he has already supplied such a method. What could he have in mind? It cannot be the simple belief that one has attained clarity and distinctness, for Descartes himself acknowledges that individuals can be wrong in that belief (7:35, 361). Nonetheless, he does offer a criterion. We have a clear and distinct perception of something if, when we consider it, we cannot doubt it (7:145). That is, in the face of genuine clear and distinct perception, our affirmation of it is so firm that it cannot be shaken.

Descartes held that any act of judgment, such the affirmation “I think, therefore I am,” involves both the intellect and will. The intellect perceives or represents the content of the judgment; the will affirms or denies that content. In the face of genuine clarity and distinctness, “a great light in the intellect” is followed by “a great inclination of the will” (7:59). The inclination of the will is so strong that it amounts to compulsion; we cannot help but so affirm. Descartes thus makes unshakable conviction the criterion. But can't someone be unshakable in their conviction merely because they are stubborn? Assuredly so. But Descartes is talking about the conviction that remains unshakable in face of serious and well-thought out challenges (7:22). To be immune from doubt does mean simply that you do not doubt a proposition, or even that it resists a momentary attempt to doubt; the real criterion for truth is that the content of a proposition is so clearly perceived that the will is drawn to it in such a way that the will's affirmation cannot be shaken even by the systematic and sustained doubts of the Meditations. Perhaps because the process for achieving knowledge of fundamental truths requires sustained, systematic doubt, Descartes indicates that such doubt should be undertaken only once in the course of a life (7:18; 3:695).

Having extracted clarity and distinctness as the criterion of truth at the beginning of the Third Meditation, Descartes immediately calls it into question. He re-introduces an element of the radical doubt from the First Meditation: that a powerful God might have created him with “a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident” (7:36). Descartes therefore launches an investigation of “whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver” (7:36).

In the course of the Third Meditation, Descartes constructs an argument for the existence of God that starts from the fact that he has an idea of an infinite being. The argument is intricate. It invokes the metaphysical principle that “there must be at least as much reality in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause” (7:40). This principle is put forward as something that is “manifest by the natural light” (7:40), which itself is described as a cognitive power whose results are indubitable (7:38), like clear and distinct perception (7:144). Descartes then applies that principle not to the mere existence of the idea of God as a state of mind, but to the content of that idea. Descartes characterizes that content as infinite, and he then argues that a content that represents infinity requires an infinite being as its cause. He concludes, therefore, that an infinite being, or God, must exist. He then equates an infinite being with a perfect being, and asks whether a perfect being could be a deceiver. He concludes: “It is clear enough from this that he cannot be a deceiver, since it is manifest by the natural light that all fraud and deception depend on some defect” (7:52).

The second and fourth sets of objections drew attention to a problematic characteristic of this argument. In the words of Arnauld:

I have one further worry, namely how the author avoids reasoning in a circle when he says that we are sure that what we clearly and distinctly perceive is true only because God exists. But we can be sure that God exists only because we clearly and distinctly perceive this. Hence, before we can be sure that God exists, we ought to be able to be sure that whatever we perceive clearly and evidently is true. (7:214).

Arnauld here raises the well-known problem of the Cartesian circle, which has been much discussed by commentators in recent years.

In reply to Arnauld, Descartes claims that he avoided this problem by distinguishing between present clear and distinct perceptions and those that are merely remembered (7:246). He is not here raising a question the reliability of memory (Frankfurt 1962). Rather, his strategy is to suggest that the hypothesis of a deceiving God can only present itself when we are not clearly and distinctly perceiving the infinity and perfection of God, because when we are doing that we cannot help but believe that God is no deceiver. It is as if this very evident perception is then to be balanced with the uncertain opinion that God might be a deceiver (7:144). The evident perception wins out, and the doubt is removed.

Descartes explicitly responds to the charge of circularity in the manner just described. Over the years, scholars have debated whether this response is adequate. Some scholars have constructed other responses on Descartes' behalf, or have found such responses embedded in his text at various locations. One type of response appeals to a distinction between the natural light and clear and distinct perception, and seeks to vindicate the natural light without appeal to God (Jacquette 1996). Another response suggests that, in the end, Descartes was not aiming at metaphysical certainty concerning a mind-independent world, but was merely seeking an internally coherent set of beliefs (Frankfurt 1965). A related response suggests that Descartes was after mere psychological certainty (Loeb 1992). The interested reader can follow up this question by turning to the literature here cited (including Carriero 2008, Doney 1987, and Hatfield 2005).

Building on his claim that clear and distinct perceptions are true, Descartes claims to establish various results concerning the nature of reality, including the existence and fraudlessnes of God, and the natures of mind and matter, to which we turn in the next subsection. Here we must ask: What is the human mind that it can perceive the nature of reality? Descartes has a specific answer to this question: the human mind comes supplied with innate ideas that allow it to perceive the main properties of God (infinity and perfection), the essence of matter, and the essence of mind. For readers in Descartes' day, this claim would naturally raise a further question: assuming that these innate ideas concern “eternal truths” about God, matter, and mind, do these truths hold independent of God, or do they instead reflect the contents of God's own intellect?

Descartes had an interesting answer to this question. He rejected, with many of his contemporaries, the notion that there are eternal truths that obtain independently of the existence of God. Some Neoplatonist philosophers held that the eternal truths in the human mind are copies, or ectypes, of the archetypes in the mind of God. Some Aristotelian philosophers just prior to Descartes, including Francisco Suarez, held that the eternal truths reflect God's own understanding of his creative power; God's power includes that, if he creates a rabbit, it must be an animal. Eternal truths are latent in God's creative power, and he understands this, so that if human beings understand the eternal truths as eternal, they do so by understanding the creative power of God.

Descartes had a different account. He held that the eternal are the free creations of God (1:145, 149, 151; 7:380, 432). God decides what the essence of circle is, or to make 2 + 3 = 5. He might have created other essences, although we are unable to conceive what they might have been. Our conceptual capacity is limited to the innate ideas that God has implanted in us, and these reflect that actual truths that he created. God creates the eternal truths (concerning logic, mathematics, the nature of the good, the essences of mind and matter), and he creates the human mind and provisions it with innate ideas that correspond to those truths.

3.3 The nature of reality

Descartes reveals his ontology implicitly in the Meditations, more formally in the Replies, and in textbook fashion in the Principles. The main metaphysical results that describe the nature of reality assert the existence of three substances, each characterized by an essence. The first and primary substance is God, whose essence is perfection. In fact, God is the only true substance, that is, the only being that is capable of existing on its own. The other two substances, mind and matter, are created by God and can only exist through his ongoing act of preservation or conservation, called God's “concurrence” (Princ. I.51).

Descartes' arguments to establish the essences of these substances appeal directly to his clear and distinct perception of those essences. The essence of matter is extension in length, breadth, and depth. One might speak here of “spatial extension,” but with this proviso: that Descartes denied the existence of space separate from matter. Cartesian matter does not fill a distinct spatial container; rather, spatial extension is constituted by extended matter (there is no void, or unfilled space). This extended substance possesses the further “modes” of size, shape, position, and motion. Modes are properties that exist only as modifications of the essential (principal) and the general attributes of a substance. In addition to its essence, extension, matter also has the general attributes of existence and duration. The individual parts of matter have durations as particular modes. All the modes, of matter, including size, shape, position, and motion, can exist only as modifications of extended substance.

The essence of mind is thought. Besides existence and duration, minds have two chief powers or faculties: intellect and will. The intellectual (or perceiving) power is further divided into the modes of pure intellect, imagination, and sense perception. Pure intellect operates independent of the brain or body; imagination and sense perception depend upon the body for their operation. The will is also divided into various modes, including desire, aversion, assertion, denial, and doubt. These always require some intellectual content (whether pure, imagined, or sensory) upon which to operate. Perhaps for that reason, Descartes describes the mind as an “intellectual substance” (7:78; also, 7:12). It seems he held that the mind essentially has a will, but that the intellectual (or perceptive, or representational) power is more basic, because the will depends upon it in its operation.

What role does consciousness play in Descartes' theory of mind? Many scholars believe that, for Descartes, consciousness is the defining property of mind. There is some support for this position in the Second Replies. There Descartes defines mind as “the substance in which thought immediately resides” (7:161). He says of the term “thought” that it extends to “everything that is within us in such a way that we are immediately aware of it” (7:160). If mind is thinking substance and thoughts are essentially conscious, perhaps consciousness is the essence of thought?

Descartes in fact did hold that all thoughts are, in some way, conscious (7:226). He did not mean by this that we have reflective awareness of, and can remember, every thought that we have (5:220). In the Second Meditation, he describes himself as a thinking thing by enumerating all the modes of thoughts of which he is conscious: understanding (or intellection), willing, imagining, and (at this point, at least seeming to have) sense perceptions (7:28). He thus sets up consciousness as a mark of thought. But is it the essence? There is another possibility. If perception (intellection, representation) is the essence of thought, then all thoughts might be conscious in a basic way because the character of the intellectual substance is to represent, and any representation present in an intellectual substance is thereby conscious. Similarly, any act of will present in an intellectual substance also is available to consciousness, because it is of the essence of such a substance to perceive its own states (11:343). Accordingly, perception or representation is the essence of mind, and consciousness follows as a result of the mind's being a representing substance.

3.4 Mind–body relation

In the Discourse, Descartes presented the following argument to establish that mind and body are distinct substances:

Next I examined attentively what I was. I saw that while I could pretend that I had no body and that there was no world and no place for me to be in, I could not for all that pretend that I did not exist. I saw on the contrary that from the mere fact that I thought of doubting the truth of other things, it followed quite evidently and certainly that I existed; whereas if I had merely ceased thinking, even if everything else I had ever imagined had been true, I should have had no reason to believe that I existed. From this I knew I was a substance whose whole essence or nature is simply to think, and which does not require any place, or depend on any material thing, in order to exist. (6:32–3)

This argument moves from the fact that he can doubt the existence of the material world, but cannot doubt the existence of himself as a thinking thing, to the conclusion that his thoughts belong to a nonspatial substance that is distinct from matter.

The problem with this argument is that it is fallacious. It relies on conceivability based in ignorance. For Descartes has not included anything in the argument to ward off the possibility that he, as a thinking thing, is not in fact a complex material system. He has merely relied on the fact that he can doubt the existence of matter to conclude that matter is distinct from mind. But this argument is clearly inconclusive. From the fact that the Joker cannot, at a certain moment, doubt the existence of Batman (because he is with him), but he can doubt the existence of Bruce Wayne (who might, for all the Joker knows, have been killed by the Joker's henchmen), it does not follow that Bruce Wayne is not Batman. In fact, he is Batman. The Joker is merely ignorant of that fact.

In the Meditations, Descartes changed the structure of the argument. In the Second Meditation, he established that he could not doubt the existence of himself as a thinking thing, but that he could doubt the existence of matter. However, he explicitly refused to use this situation to conclude that his mind was distinct from body, on the grounds that he was still ignorant of his nature (7:27). Then, in the Sixth Meditation, having established, to his satisfaction, the mark of truth, he used the mark to frame a positive argument to the effect that the essence of mind is thought, and that a thinking thing is unextended; and that the essence of matter is extension, and that extended things cannot think (7:78). He based this argument on clear and distinct intellectual perceptions of the essences of mind and matter, not on the fact that he could doubt the existence of one or the other.

The conclusion of the Sixth Meditation constitutes the well-known substance dualism of Descartes. That dualism leads to problems. As Princess Elisabeth, among others, asked Descartes: if mind is unextended and matter is extended, how do they interact? This problem vexed not only Descartes, who admitted to Elisabeth that he didn't have a good answer (3:694), but it also vexed Descartes' followers and other metaphysicians. It seems that, somehow, the states of mind and body must be brought into relation, because when we decide to pick up a pencil our arm actually moves, and when light hits our eyes we experience the visible world. But how do mind and body interact? Some of Descartes' followers adopted an occasionalist position, according to which God mediates the causal relations between mind and body; mind does not affect body, and body does not affect mind, but God gives the mind appropriate sensations at the right moment, and he makes the body move by putting it into the correct brain states at a moment that corresponds to the volition to pick up the pencil. Other philosophers adopted yet other solutions, including the monism of Spinoza and the pre-established harmony of Leibniz.

In the Meditations and Principles, Descartes did not focus on the metaphysical question of how mind and body interact. Rather, he discussed the functional role of mind–body union in the economy of life. As it happens, our sensations serve us well in avoiding harms and pursuing benefits. Pain-sensations warn us of bodily damage. Pleasure leads us to approach things that (usually) are good for us. Our sense perceptions are reliable enough that we can distinguish objects that need distinguishing, and we can navigate as we move about. As Descartes saw it, “God or nature” set up these relations for our benefit. They are not perfect. Sometimes we feel pain because a nerve has been damaged, and yet there is no tissue damage at the place in which the pain is felt. Descartes observed that amputees may feel pain in their fingers when they have no fingers (Princ. IV.196). Sometimes we experience sensory illusions. All the same, he regarded the union of mind and body to have been instituted by God in the best manner possible for finite beings such as ourselves (7:88). Further, we can use our intellects to interpret illusions or other false sensations (7:438).

3.5 God and error

In discussing the mark of truth, Descartes suggested that the human intellect is as reliable as it is because it was created by God. In discussing the functioning of the senses to preserve or maintain the body, he explained that God has arranged the rules of mind–body interaction in a manner that is conducive to the good of the body. Nonetheless, in each case, errors occur, just as, more broadly, human beings make poor moral choices, even though God has given them a will that is intrinsically drawn to the good (1:366, 5:159, Princ. I.42).

Descartes responded these problems differently. He explained cognitive and moral errors as resulting from human freedom. God provides human beings with a will, and wills are intrinsically free. In this way, there is no difference in degree in freedom between God and man. But human beings have finite intellects. And because they are free, they can choose to judge in cognitive or moral situations for which they do not have clear and distinct perceptions of the true or the good. If human beings restricted their acts of will to cases of clear and distinct perception, they would never err. But the vicissitudes of life may require judgments in less than optical circumstances, or we may decide to judge even though we lack a clear perception. In either case, we may go wrong.

Matters are different for the errors of the senses. The senses depend on media and sense organs, and on nerves that must run from the exterior of the body into the brain. God sets up the mind–body relation so that our sensations are good guides for most circumstances. But the media may be poor (the light may not be good), circumstances may be unusual (as with the partially submerged stick that appears as if bent), or the nerves may be damaged (as with the amputee). In these cases, the reports of the senses are suboptimal. Since God has set up the system of mind–body union, shouldn't God be held accountable for the fact that the senses can mislead? Here Descartes does not appeal to our freedom not to attend to the senses, for in fact we must often use the senses in suboptimal cognitive circumstances when navigating through life. Rather, he points out that God was working with the finite mechanisms of the human mind and body, and he suggests that God did the best he could (7:88).

4. The New Science

When Descartes was at La Fleche, there already were signs that the conception of the universe was changing. Recall that Galileo's discovery of four moons of the planet Jupiter was celebrated at La Fleche in 1610. More generally, Copernicus had, in the previous century, offered a forceful argument for believing that the sun, not the earth, is at the center of the solar system. Early in the seventeenth century, Johannes Kepler announced new results in optics, concerning the formation of images, the theory of lenses, and the fact that the retinal image plays a central role in vision. By the early 1630s, Descartes was aware (1:263) of William Harvey's claim that the blood circulates in the body.

Descartes himself contributed some specific new results to the mathematical description of nature, as co-discoverer of the sine law of refraction, and as developer of an accurate model of the rainbow. Nonetheless, as significant as these results are, his primary contribution to the “new science” lay in the way in which he described a general vision of a mechanistic approach to nature and sketched in the details of that vision to provide a comprehensive alternative to the dominant Aristotelian physics.

In the textbooks of Aristotelian physics of Descartes' day, it was common to divide physics into “general” and “special.” General physics pertained to the basic Aristotelian principles for analyzing natural substances: form, matter, privation, cause, place, time, motion. Special physics concerned actually existing natural entities, divided into inanimate and animate. Inanimate physics further divided into celestial and terrestrial, in accordance with the Aristotelian belief that the earth was at the center of the universe, and that the earth was of a different nature than the heavens (including the moon, and everything beyond it). Inanimate terrestrial physics first covered the four elements (earth, air, fire, and water), then the “mixed” bodies composed from them, including the various mineral kinds. Animate terrestrial physics concerned the various powers that Aristotelians ascribed to the ensouled beings, where the soul is considered as a principle of life (possessing vital as well as mental or cognitive powers). In the simplest textbooks, the powers of the soul were divided into three groups: vegetative (including nutrition, growth, and reproduction), which pertained to both plants and animals; sensitive (including external senses, internal senses, appetite, and motion), which pertain to animals alone; and rational powers, pertaining to human beings alone. All the bodies in both inanimate and animate terrestrial physics were governed by a “form” or active principle, as described in Section 1.3.

Descartes' ambition was to provide replacements for all the main parts of Aristotelian physics. In his physics, there is only one matter and it has no active forms. Thus, he dissolved the boundary that had made the celestial and the terrestrial differ in kind. His one matter had only the properties of size, shape, position, and motion. The matter is infinitely divisible and it constitutes space; there is no void, hence no spatial container distinct from matter. The motions of matter are governed by three laws of motion, including a precursor to Newton's law of inertia (but without the notion of vector forces), and a law of impact. Descartes' matter possessed no “force” or active agency; the laws of motion were decreed by God and were sustained by his activity. Earth, air, fire, and water were simply four among many natural kinds, all distinguished simply by the characteristic sizes, shapes, positions, and motions of their parts.

Although Descartes nominally subscribed to the Biblical story of creation, in his natural philosophy he presented the hypothesis that the universe began as a chaotic soup of particles in motion and that everything else was subsequently formed as a result of patterns that developed within this moving matter. Thus, he conceived that many suns formed, around which planets coalesced. On these planets, mountains and seas formed, as did metals, magnets, and atmospheric phenomena such as clouds and rain. The planets themselves are carried around the sun in their orbits by a fluid medium that rotates like a whirlpool or vortex. Objects fall to earth not because of any intrinsic “form” that directs them to the center of the universe, and also not because of a force of attraction or other downward-tending force. Rather, they are driven down by the whirling particles of the surrounding ether. Descartes insisted that all cases of apparent action at a distance, including magnetism, must be explained through the contact of particle on particle. He explained magnetism as the result of cork-screw shaped particles that spew forth from the poles of the earth and flow from north to south, causing magnetized needles to align with their flow.

Descartes also wanted to provide an account of the formation of plants and animals by mechanical causes, but he did not succeed during his lifetime in framing an account that he was willing to publish. He did, however, develop an extensive physiological description of animal bodies, in which he explained the functions of life in purely mechanical manner, without appeal to a soul or vital principle.

In mechanizing the concept of living thing, Descartes did not deny the distinction between animate and inanimate, but he redrew the line between ensouled and unensouled beings. In his view, among earthly beings only humans have souls. He thus equated soul with mind: souls account for intellection and volition, including conscious sensory experiences, conscious experience of images, and consciously experienced memories. Descartes regarded nonhuman animals as machines, devoid of mind and consciousness. This meant that he was required to explain all of the powers that Aristotelians had ascribed to the vegetative and sensitive soul by means of purely material and mechanistic processes (11:202). These mechanistic explanations extended, then, not merely to nutrition, growth, and reproduction (which he wrote about but never achieved results that were published during his lifetime), but also to the functions of the external and internal senses, including the ability of nonhuman animals to respond via their sense organs in a situationally appropriate manner: to approach things that are beneficial to their body (including food), and to avoid danger (as the sheep avoids the wolf).

In the Treatise on Man and Passions, Descartes described purely mechanical processes in the sense organs, brain, and muscles, that were to account for the functions of the sensitive soul. These processes involved “animal spirits,” or subtle matter, as distilled out of the blood at the base of the brain and distributed down the nerves to cause muscle motions in accordance with brain structures and current sensory stimulation. The brain structures that mediate behavior may be innate or acquired. Descartes ascribed some things that animals can do to instinct; other aspects of their behavior he explained through a kind of mechanistic associative memory. He held that human physiology is similar to nonhuman animal physiology, as regards both vegetative and (some) sensitive functions—those sensitive functions that do not involve consciousness or intelligence:

Now a very large number of the motions occurring inside us do not depend in any way on the mind. These include heartbeat, digestion, nutrition, respiration when we are asleep, and also such waking actions as walking, singing, and the like, when these occur without the mind attending to them. When people take a fall, and stick out their hands so as to protect their head, it is not reason that instructs them to do this; it is simply that the sight of the impending fall reaches the brain and sends the animal spirits into the nerves in the manner necessary to produce this movement even without any mental volition, just as it would be produced in a machine. (7:229–30)

Many of the behaviors of human beings are actually carried out without intervention from the mind.

The fact that Descartes offered mechanistic explanations for many features of nature does not mean that his explanations were successful. Indeed, his followers and detractors debated the success of his various proposals for nearly a century after his death. His accounts of magnetism and gravity were challenged. Leibniz challenged the coherence of Descartes' laws of motion and impact. Newton offered his own laws of motion and an inverse square law of gravitational attraction. His account of orbital planetary motions replaced Descartes' vortexes. Others struggled to make Descartes' physiology work. There were also deeper challenges. Some wondered whether Descartes could actually explain how his infinitely divisible matter could coalesce into solid bodies. Why shouldn't collections of particles act like whiffs of smoke, that separate upon contact with large particles? Indeed, how do particles themselves cohere?

Such problems were real, and Descartes' physics was abandoned over the course of the eighteenth century. Nonetheless, it provided a conception for a comprehensive replacement of Aristotelian physics that persisted in the Newtonian vision of a unified physics of the celestial and terrestrial realms, and that continued in the mechanistic vision of life that was revived in the latter part of the nineteenth century.

5. Theory of Sense Perception

As the new “mechanical philosophy” of Descartes and others replaced the Aristotelian physics, the theory of sensory qualities had to undergo substantial change. This was especially true for what came to be known as the secondary qualities (in the terminology of Robert Boyle and John Locke). The secondary qualities include colors, sounds, odors, tastes, and tactile qualities such as hot and cold. The Aristotelians maintained that these qualities exist in objects as “real qualities” that are like instances or samples of the quality as experienced. A red thing possesses the quality red in just the same way it possesses a shape: it simply is red, and we experience that very redness when we see a red object.

Descartes sought to replace “real qualities” with a mechanistic account of qualities in objects. He rendered light as a property of particles and their motions: it is a “tendency to move” as found in a continuous medium and radiating out from a luminous body. When light strikes an object, the particles that constitute light alter their rotation about their axis. “Spin” is what makes light have one color rather than another. When particles with one or another degree of spin interact with the nerves of the retina, they cause those nerves to jiggle in a certain way. This jiggling is conveyed to the brain where it affects the animal spirits, which in turn affect the mind, causing the mind to experience one or another color, depending on the degree of spin and how it affects the brain. Color in objects is thus that property of their surface that causes light particles to spin in one way or another, and hence to cause one sort of sensation or another. There is nothing else in the surface of an object, as regards color, than a certain surface-shape that induces one or another spin in particles of light.

Descartes introduced this new theory of sensory qualities in the first six chapters of the World. There, he defended it on the grounds of that his explanation of qualities in bodies in terms of size, shape, and motion are clearly understood, by comparison with the Aristotelian qualities (11:33). Subsequently, in the Meditations and Principles, he defended this account by appeal to the metaphysical result that body possesses only geometrical modes of extension. Real qualities are ruled out because they are not themselves instances of size, shape, or motion (even if patches of color have a size and a shape, and can be moved about).

In addition to a new theory of sensory qualities, Descartes offered theories of the way in which the spatial properties—size, shape, distance, and position—are perceived in vision. Optics had been an area of inquiry since antiquity. Euclid and Ptolemy had each written on optical problems. During the Middle Ages, the Arabic natural philosopher Ibn al-Haytham produced an important new theoretical work in which he offered an extensive account of the perception of spatial properties.

The theoretical terrain in optics changed with Kepler's doctrine that vision is mediated by the retinal image and that the retina is the sensitive body in the eye. Previous theorists generally believed that the “crystalline humor,” now known as the lens, was the sensitive body. Descartes accepted Kepler's result and framed a new theory of spatial perception. Some of his theorizing simply adapted Ibn al-Haytham's theories to the newly discovered retinal image. Thus, Ibn al-Haytham held that size is perceived by combining the visual angle that a body subtends with perception of its distance, to arrive at a perception of the true size of the object. In al-Haytham's scheme, visual angle is registered at the surface of the crystalline humor. Descartes held that size is perceived by combining visual angle with perceived distance, but now he treated visual angle as the extent of an object's projection onto the retina.

In Ibn al-Haytham's account, distance may be inferred if the size of an object is known; then, its visual angle is an inversely proportional to its distance. Descartes recognized this traditional account, depending as it does on past experience of an object's size and on an inference or rapid judgment that combines perceived visual angle with known or remembered size. Ibn al-Haytham also explained that distance can be perceived by an observer's being sensitive to the number of equal portions of ground space that lie between the observer and a distant object. Descartes did not adopt this explanation. However, Descartes used his mechanistic physiology to frame a new account of how distance might be perceived, a theory different from anything that could have been found in Ibn al-Haytham.

In Kepler's new theory of how the eye works, an image is formed on the retina as a result of refraction by the cornea and lens. For objects at different distances, the focal properties of the system must be changed, just as the focal length of a camera is changed. There were several theories of how this might occur, but Descartes accepted the view that the lens changes shape or “accommodates” for near and far vision. He then theorized that this change in the shape of the lens must be controlled by muscles, which themselves are controlled by nerve processes in the brain. He realized that the central nervous state that controls accommodation would vary directly in proportion to the distance of objects. However, unlike the case of inferring distance from known size and visual angle, Descartes did not suppose that the mind is aware of the apparatus for controlling the accommodation of the eye. Rather, he supposed that, by an innate mechanism, the central brain state that varies with distance directly causes an idea of distance in the mind (6:137; 11:183). This physiologically produced idea of distance could then be combined with perceived visual angle in order to perceive an object's size, as in al-Haytham's theory of size perception.

6. Legacy

The things that readers find valuable in Descartes' work have changed over the centuries. We have seen that his natural philosophy had an immediate impact that lasted into the eighteenth century. His theory of vision was part of that heritage, as were his results in mathematics. We have also seen that his mechanistic account of the psychology of the sensitive soul and his view that animals are like machines were revived in the nineteenth century.

The fortune of the metaphysical and epistemological aspects of Descartes' philosophy is complex. In his own time, he inspired a raft of followers, who sought to develop his metaphysics, epistemology, natural philosophy, and even to add a worked-out ethics. These authors included Geraud de Cordemoy, Arnold Geulincx, Antoine Le Grand, Nicolas Malebranche, Pierre Regis, and Jacques Rohault. The British philosopher Henry More at first followed Descartes but subsequently turned against him. Other major philosophers, including Benedict de Spinoza and G. W. Leibniz, were influenced by Descartes' thought but developed their own, distinct systems.

Philosophers in subsequent ages have stressed various aspects of Descartes' philosophy, in some cases without undertaking close study of his writings. In the eighteenth century, Hume and Kant (each in his own way) rejected the metaphysical aspirations of Descartes, to know the nature of reality as it is in itself. They did not merely deny his particular metaphysical theories; they rejected his sort of metaphysical project altogether.

During the twentieth century, two aspects of his philosophy became widely invoked and perhaps just as widely misinterpreted. The first is Descartes' skepticism. In the early twentieth century, one response to the threat of skepticism was to retreat to the position that we can only know our own sense data, where “sense data” are equated with the supposed contents of immediate sensory experience: for vision, color patches having a shape. Some authors then treated Descartes' project in the Meditations as that of reducing human knowledge to immediate sense data, from which knowledge of the external world was then to be constructed.

As a reading of Descartes, this position has little to offer. As we have seen, in the Second and Third Meditations Descartes argues from the indubitability of the cogito reasoning to the trustworthiness of intellectual perception to the existence of a perfect being (God). In the latter argument, he does indeed seek to infer the reality of a being external to himself. But the inference has nothing to do with sensory experience. The inference proceeds from a nonsensory and innate idea of God to the existence of that God. Whatever one may think of the quality of the argument, it has nothing to do with sense data. Descartes used skeptical arguments as a tool to disengage the reader from the sensory world in order to undertake metaphysical investigations. There did result, in the Sixth Meditation, a re-evaluation of the senses in relation to metaphysics. But again, sense data were not in the mix.

Another prominent line of twentieth-century interpretation also focuses on the isolation of the subject in the Second Meditation. In the course of that Meditation, Descartes accepts that he knows the contents of his mind, including putative sensory experiences, even though he doubts the existence of his body. Some philosophers have concluded from this that Descartes believed that human beings actually can, in their natural state, have sensory experiences even if they lack a body. But Descartes in fact denied that possibility. In his metaphysics, sense perception and imagination depend for their existence on mind–body union. There can be intellectual perceptions that do not depend on the brain. But acts of imagination and sense perception depend on the brain for their occurrence (Pass. I.19–20, 43). Thus, Descartes did not in fact hold that we might have all of our sense experiences even if we had no brain. Rather, he allowed that he could conceive his sensory experiences independent of the brain, and that, if God were not supremely good, God could produce those experiences in us independent of the brain. But conceivability does not in all cases—and especially not in cases of mere ignorance, as in the Second Meditation—yield metaphysical possibility (as we have seen in the Discourse argument for the mind–body distinction).

In Descartes' view, it is impossible that a deceiving God would cause our sensory experiences (since God is essentially perfect and so supremely good). Descartes denied that human beings can clearly conceive that God is a deceiver (7:144), and he also maintained that it is “self-contradictory that men [human beings] should be deceived by God” (7:428). But, as he argued in the Sixth Meditation, if our sensory perceptions were not in fact caused by bodies, God would be a deceiver (7:80). Since we can neither clearly conceive of him as a deceiver nor allow the possibility that he is a deceiver, we cannot take seriously the possibility that he produces our sensory experiences in the absence of the existence of material things and, more specifically, in the absence of the relevant brain states.

In the end, Descartes' legacy in part consists of problems he raised, or brought into prominence, but did not solve. The mind–body problem is a case in point. Descartes himself argued from his ability clearly and distinctly to conceive mind and body as distinct beings to the conclusion that they really are separate substances. Most philosophers today accept neither the methodological basis for his claim nor the claim itself. Indeed, since the time of Kant, few philosophers have believed that the clear and distinct thoughts of the human mind are a guide to the absolute reality of things. Hence, the notion that even clear conceivability discerns metaphysical possibility is not accepted. Moreover, few philosophers today are substance dualists.

All the same, the mind–body problem persists. In distinguishing the domain of the mental from that of the physical, Descartes struck a chord. Many philosophers accept the conceptual distinction, but remain uncertain of the underlying metaphysics: whether mind is identical with brain; or the mental emerges from complex processes in the brain; or constitutes a property that is different from any purely physical property, even while being instantiated by the brain. In this case, a problem that Descartes made prominent has lived far beyond his proposed solution.


NOTE: In referring to Descartes' works, I have used the pagination of the Adam and Tannery volumes (AT), Oeuvres de Descartes, 11 vols. The citations give volume and page numbers only (dropping the abbreviation “AT”). Whenever possible, I have used the Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny translation, The Philosophical Writings Of Descartes, 3 vols., which shows the AT pagination in the margins. The AT volume numbers provide a guide to which work is being cited in translation: vols. 1–5, correspondence; vol. 6, Discourse; vol. 7, Meditations; vol. 10, Rules; vol. 11:1–118, World, or Treatise on Light; vol. 11:119–222, Treatise on Man; vol. 11:301–488, Passions. Where there is no accessible translation for a citation from AT, I show the citation in italics. I also cite works that are broken into articles by abbreviated title, part, and article: Princ. for the Principles, and Pass. for the Passions.


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Related Entries

Arnauld, Antoine | Cordemoy, Geraud de | Descartes, René: and the pineal gland | Descartes, René: epistemology | Descartes, René: ethics | Descartes, René: life and works | Descartes, René: modal metaphysics | Descartes, René: ontological argument | Descartes, René: physics | Descartes, René: theory of ideas | emotion: 17th and 18th century theories of | Gassendi, Pierre | Le Grand, Antoine | More, Henry | Regius, Henricus


The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us of a variety of typographical errors in this entry.